Notes to David Lewis’s Metaphysics

1. A significant oversimplification of Lewis’s actual view, as will be apparent in the (forthcoming) article on Lewis’s applied metaphysics.

2. Note that all Lewis means by “Nominalist” here is one who denies the existence of universals.

3. Phillip Bricker has pointed out (personal communication) that this constraint injects “a kind of arbitrariness into logical space. For example, if there are perfectly natural asymmetric relations (such as ‘is earlier than’), the converse of such a relation (‘is later than’) could not also be perfectly natural.” As Bricker further notes, Lewis seems not to have noticed this consequence.

4. A bit more carefully, its intrinsic nature is exhausted by the perfectly natural properties it instantiates, together with the perfectly natural properties and relations instantiated by its parts. Of course the simpler formulation will do if we are talking about fundamental particulars, as they have no proper parts.

5. Again, a bit more carefully: x and y are perfect duplicates just in case they and their parts can be put into a one-to-one correspondence that preserves the facts about which perfectly natural properties and relations are instantiated.

6. As Phillip Bricker has pointed out, this statement needs a qualification. For Lewis considers it an open epistemic possibility that there are two (or more) metaphysically possible worlds that are perfect duplicates of each other. And he holds that propositions simply are sets of possible worlds. If the given epistemic possibility in fact obtains, then there will automatically be propositions—the unit-sets of duplicate worlds—that vary in truth value between two worlds, which worlds themselves do not differ with respect to the geometrical arrangement of their spacetime points, or with respect to which perfectly natural properties are instantiated at those points. So Lewis needs a way to slightly restrict the scope of the thesis. He does not always notice this need. For example, discussing Humean Supervenience in his 1994, he writes, without qualification “I claim that all contingent truth supervenes just on the pattern of coinstantiation…” (p. 474).

7. Lewis cites a brief 1961 discussion in Kripke (2017, 230–32) on the analogy between identity through time and identity across worlds as an important influence (see Beebee and Fisher 2020: Letter 121 and Letter 527). Lewis exploited the analogy mapping his perdurantist account of identity across time over to possible worlds and their inhabitants. The science fiction of L. Sprague de Camp (e.g. 1940, “The Wheels of If”, Unknown Fantasy Fiction, Street & Smith) seems to also have provided some inspiration. Lewis, at least, credits de Camp with the locution that someone’s counterpart is the person they would have been if the world had been otherwise (Lewis 1968, 115, fn. 3). An anticipation of key counterpart-theroretic ideas occur in a letter by Peter Geach—in a 1964 letter to A.N. Prior, Geach suggests a treatment of de re modality in terms of “replacements” which, though brief and incomplete, is interestingly similar to Lewis’ own account (see David Lewis Papers, C1520, ‘Prior, A.N.’ Box B-000673, Folder 3, Princeton University Library). Lewis only saw the Geach letter in 1967 after having already developed his counterpart theory (see Beebee and Fisher 2020: Letter 124). Notably, Geach explicitly links his idea of replacements with the different Sexti Tarquinii of Leibniz’s fable concerning the palace of the fates.

8. For example, Leibniz’s discussion of “an infinity of possible Adams” (see Letters to Arnauld, Philosophical Essays, 72–73, translated and edited by Ariew and Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989), as well as in his parable concerning the palace of the fates. Leibniz says that in different possible worlds there are Sexti who resemble the actual Sextus but also differ from him in certain ways – “a Sextus, indeed, of every kind and endless diversity of forms” (Leibniz’s Theodicy §414, translated by Huggard, La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1985). Lewis never explored the relation between his views and the views of Leibniz. He only made the following comment: “[W]hen I read what serious historians of philosophy have to say, I am persuaded that it is no easy matter to know what his views were. It would be nice to have the right sort of talent and training to join in the work of exegesis, but it is very clear to me that I do not. Anything I might say about Leibniz would be amateurish, undeserving of others’ attention, and better left unsaid.” (Lewis 1986e, viii).

9. For properties, Lewis prefers an account with simple trans-world identity (Lewis 2009). See Heller (1998) and Heller (2005) for a counterpart-theoretic alternative.

Notes to the Supplement on Reduction

10. Together, perhaps, with a “totality” fact to the effect that these are all the pixels.

11. Though, in an earlier version of this essay, I managed to completely overlook it, its obviousness notwithstanding. Thanks to Phillip Bricker for pointing it out to me.

Notes to the Supplement on Physicalism

12. Lewis provides various reasons for thinking that physicalism involves more than this; we won’t go into them.

Notes to the Supplement on Humean Supervenience

13. For how could you view them as base-level, without already believing in multiply-located particulars—hence, without already abandoning spacetime monism?

Notes to the Supplement on Physical Magnitudes

14. Along with many others: e.g., Maudlin considers magnitudes whose values are represented by fiber bundles.

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