Notes to Metaethics

1. Metaethical issues were central to both Hume and Kant, although they predictably disagreed; they also figured prominently in Plato’s defense of the value of justice and Aristotle’s argument that virtue and vice are in some way up to us. Two key issues are whether (and if so, in what sense) “ought” implies “can” and whether what is distinctive about moral agents is that their actions are under their control in a way the actions of other agents, say dogs and cats, are not. It is worth noting, though, that questions of freedom and responsibility are often thought of as more a matter of moral psychology or metaphysics, than metaethics. Nonetheless, to the extent these questions turn on what responsibility presupposes and whether those presuppositions are (for instance) compatible with determinism, one is squarely in metaethics.

2. See, for instance, A. J. Ayer’s Language, Truth, and Logic, and C.L. Stevenson’s “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms”.

3. Moreover, as Leibniz argued,

In saying… that things are not good according to any standard of goodness, but simply by the will of God, it seems to me that one destroys, without realizing it, all the love of God and all his glory; for why praise him for what he has done, if he would be equally praiseworthy in doing the contrary? Where will be his justice and his wisdom if he has only a certain despotic power, if arbitrary will takes the place of reasonableness, and if in accord with the definition of tyrants, justice consists in that which is pleasing to the most powerful? Besides it seems that every act of willing supposes some reason for the willing and this reason, of course, must precede the act.

Discourse on Metaphysics II, trans. by George R. Montgomery (Open Court, 1902).

4. Conventionalist accounts of morality were offered by Thomas Hobbes, in The Leviathan and, on some interpretations, by David Hume in A Treatise of Human Nature, as well as more recently by, for instance, David Gauthier in Morals by Agreement. Glaucon offers an early articulation of the view in Book II of Plato’s Republic. Non-conventionalist yet naturalist accounts of morality are offered by Mill (1863), Perry (1926), Railton (1986), Boyd (1988), Brink (1989) and Foot (2001), among many others.

5. See his A Treatise of Human Nature, Book III, Part I, Section I, p. 469.

6. See his Principia Ethica.

7. See, for instance, Ross (1930), Huemer (2005) and Enoch (2011).

8. The first line of criticism is characteristic of those who defend some sort of non-cognitivism (e.g., Stevenson, Ayer, Hare, Blackburn, and Gibbard), while the second is often embraced by naturalistically inclined cognitivists (e.g., Railton, Boyd, and Brink).

9. See Ogden and Richards, The Meaning of ‘Meaning’ (1923) as well as C. L. Stevenson (1937) and Ayer (1946). A strikingly similar view was defended earlier by John Stuart Mill (1843).

10. Geach (1964), relying on Frege, pressed the point, challenging non-cognitivists to explain the validity of inferences such as “If lying to my brother hurts him, then lying to my brother is wrong”; “Lying to my brother hurts him”; “Therefore, lying to my brother is wrong”. The inference looks perfectly valid. But it is valid only if “…is wrong” has the same meaning in the first premise as it does in the conclusion. But on non-cognitivist accounts it looks as if the occurrences don’t have the same meaning, either because they have no meaning at all, or, if they do have a meaning of sorts (in virtue of expressing a stand, or an emotion, or a prescription) the meaning must be different as between the premise and the conclusion, since in accepting the premise I need have no particular attitude at all concerning lying to my brother, whereas (on the non-cognitivist accounts) accepting the conclusion is specifically a matter of having some particular attitude towards lying to my brother. If the premises require the conclusion, as the apparent validity of the argument attests, how can this be unless (as the cognitivists suppose) the premises entail the conclusion thanks to the propositions they express?

11. See especially Simon Blackburn (1993) and (1998), Allan Gibbard (1990) and (2003), and Mark Schroeder (2008) for detailed developments of expressivism.

12. See J. L. Mackie (1977) and Richard Joyce (2001). Sharon Street (2006) does not so much reject moral thought as she rejects the Moorean picture of what moral thought requires. See also Gilbert Harman’s (1977).

13. See Korsgaard (1996) for an argument that, following Kant, appeals to the nature of rationality and Jackson (1998) and Smith (2004) for arguments that appeal instead to the nature of the concepts we rely on in thinking about morality. One apparent advantage of these approaches is that they see the constraints morality imposes as flowing from either our nature or our concepts, rather than the nature of properties (goodness, rightness, etc.) that exist independently of us and how we think.

14. The claim that some such necessary connection holds is identified as a version of (what has come to be called) moral internalism. Exactly why people describe the relevant necessary connections as ‘internal’ is hard to say. It might be because the necessity of the connection – say the connection between something being good and it providing reasons – is supposed to be explained by the idea that the very concept of something being good contains within it (that is, has internal to it) the requirement that whatever satisfies the concepts provides reasons. Alternatively, it might be because many of the supposed connections are thought to be between things internal to a moral agent or a moral judge or, at least, to tie things that might be external to an agent (say the goodness of something) to something internal to her (perhaps her motivational states). In any case, the collection of putatively necessary connections that have been nominated as distinctive of morality is so heterogeneous that one does better focusing on the individual proposals than one could possibly do by discussing “moral internalism” as if it was a label of a single interesting position.

15. See W. D. Falk (1947), Bernard Williams (1981), and Michael Smith (1994).

16. See David Brink (1989) and Sigrún Svavarsdóttir (1999).

17. Hume (1739) relies heavily on the connection between moral judgment and motivation when criticizing rationalist accounts of morality that, he claims, cannot properly explain morality’s practical impact. Although it is important to note that he believed one could make a sincere, and true, moral judgment without being motivated to act accordingly.

18. See Hobbes’ discussion of the Foole who

hath sayd in his heart… [that] to make, or not make; keep, or not keep Covenants, was not against Reason, when it conduced to one’s benefit. He does not therein deny, that there be Covenants; and that they are sometimes broken, sometimes kept; and that such breach of them may be called Injustice, and the observance of them Justice: but he questioneth, whether Injustice, taking away the feare of God, (for the same Foole hath said in his heart there is no God,) may not sometimes stand with that Reason, which dictateth to every man his own good; and particularly then, when it conduceth to such a benefit, as shall put a man in a condition, to neglect not onely the dispraise, and revilings, but also the power of other men. [(1839), Part I, chapter XV.]

See also Hume’s observation that

a sensible knave, in particular incidents, may think that an act of iniquity or infidelity will make a considerable addition to his fortune, without causing any considerable breach in the social union and confederacy. That honesty is the best policy, may be a good general rule, but is liable to many exceptions; and he, it may perhaps be thought, conducts himself with most wisdom, who observes the general rule, and takes advantage of all the exceptions. [(1751) Section IX, Part II.]

Copyright © 2023 by
Geoff Sayre-McCord <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free