Nietzsche’s Life and Works

First published Fri May 30, 1997; substantive revision Fri Sep 10, 2021

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) was a German philosopher of the late 19th century who challenged the foundations of Christianity and traditional morality. He was interested in the enhancement of individual and cultural health, and believed in life, creativity, power, and down-to-earth realities, rather than those situated in a world beyond. Central to his philosophy is the idea of “life-affirmation,” which involves an honest questioning of all doctrines that drain life’s expansive energies, however socially prevalent and morally entrenched those views might be. Often referred to as one of the first existentialist philosophers along with Søren Kierkegaard (1813–1855), Nietzsche’s revitalizing philosophy has inspired leading figures in all walks of cultural life, including dancers, poets, novelists, painters, psychologists, philosophers, sociologists and social revolutionaries.

1. Life: 1844–1900

In the small German village of Röcken bei Lützen, located in a rural farmland area about 20 miles southwest of Leipzig, Friedrich Wilhelm Nietzsche was born at approximately 10:00 a.m. on October 15, 1844. The date coincided with the 49th birthday of the Prussian King, Friedrich Wilhelm IV, after whom Nietzsche was named, and who had been responsible for Nietzsche’s father’s appointment as Röcken’s town pastor.

Nietzsche’s uncle and grandfathers were also Lutheran ministers, and his paternal grandfather, Friedrich August Ludwig Nietzsche (1756–1826), was further distinguished as a Protestant scholar, one of whose books (1796) affirmed the “everlasting survival of Christianity.” Nietzsche’s grandparents on both sides were from the Province of Saxony, with his paternal grandfather, paternal grandmother (Erdmuthe Dorothea Krause, 1778–1856), maternal grandfather (David Ernst Ohler, 1787–1859) and maternal grandmother (Johanna Elisabeth Wilhelmine Hahn, 1794–1876) having been born respectively in the small towns of Bibra (just south of Jena), Reichenbach (southeast of Jena), Zeitz (between Jena and Leipzig), and Wehlitz (just northwest of Leipzig).

When Nietzsche was nearly 5 years old, his father, Karl Ludwig Nietzsche (1813–1849) died from a brain ailment (July 30, 1849) and the death of Nietzsche’s two-year-old brother, Ludwig Joseph, followed traumatically six months later (January 4, 1850). Having been living only yards away from Röcken’s church in the house reserved for the pastor and his family, the Nietzsche family left their home soon after Karl Ludwig’s death. They moved to nearby Naumburg an der Saale, where Nietzsche (called “Fritz” by his family) lived with his mother, Franziska (1826–1897), his grandmother, Erdmuthe, his father’s two sisters, Auguste and Rosalie (d. 1855 and 1867, respectively), and his younger sister, Therese Elisabeth Alexandra (1846–1935).

From the ages of 14 to 19 (1858–1864), Nietzsche attended a first-rate boarding school, Schulpforta, located about 4km from his home in Naumburg, where he prepared for university studies. The school’s rigid educational atmosphere was reflected in its long history as a former Cistercian monastery (1137–1540), with buildings that included a 12th century Romanesque chapel and a 13th century Gothic church. At Schulpforta—a school whose alumni included the German Idealist philosopher, Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762–1814) and the philologist, Ulrich von Wilamowitz-Möllendorff (1848–1931)—Nietzsche met his lifelong friend, Paul Deussen (1845–1919), who was confirmed at Nietzsche’s side in 1861, and who was to become an Orientalist, historian of philosophy, and in 1911, the founder of the Schopenhauer Society. During his summers in Naumburg, Nietzsche led a small music and literature club named “Germania,” and became acquainted with Richard Wagner’s music through the club’s subscription to the Zeitschrift für Musik. The teenage Nietzsche also read the German romantic writings of Friedrich Hölderlin and Jean-Paul Richter, along with David Strauss’s controversial and demythologizing Life of Jesus Critically Examined (Das Leben Jesu kritisch bearbeitet, 1848).

After graduating from Schulpforta, Nietzsche entered the University of Bonn in 1864 as a theology and philology student, and his interests soon gravitated more exclusively towards philology—a discipline which then centered upon the interpretation of classical and biblical texts. As a student of philology, Nietzsche attended lectures by Otto Jahn (1813–1869) and Friedrich Wilhelm Ritschl (1806–1876). Jahn was a biographer of Mozart who had studied at the University of Berlin under Karl Lachmann (1793–1851)—a philologist known both for his studies of the Roman philosopher, Lucretius (ca. 99–55 BCE), and for having developed the genealogical, or stemmatic, method in textual recension; Ritschl was a classics scholar whose work centered on the Roman comic poet, Plautus (254–184 BCE).

Inspired by Ritschl, and following him to the University of Leipzig in 1865—an institution located closer to Nietzsche’s hometown of Naumburg—Nietzsche quickly established his own academic reputation through his published essays on two 6th century BCE poets, Theognis and Simonides, as well as on Aristotle. In Leipzig, he developed a close friendship with Erwin Rohde (1845–1898), a fellow philology student and future philologist, with whom he would correspond extensively in later years. Momentous for Nietzsche in 1865 was his accidental discovery of Arthur Schopenhauer’s The World as Will and Representation (1818) in a local bookstore. He was then 21. Schopenhauer’s atheistic and turbulent vision of the world, in conjunction with his high praise of music as an art form captured Nietzsche’s imagination, and to this day, the extent to which the “cadaverous perfume” of Schopenhauer’s world-view continued to permeate Nietzsche’s mature thought remains a matter of scholarly debate. After discovering Schopenhauer, Nietzsche read F.A. Lange’s newly-published History of Materialism and Critique of its Present Significance (1866)—a work that criticizes materialist theories from the standpoint of Kant’s critique of metaphysics, and that attracted Nietzsche’s interest for its view that metaphysical speculation is an expression of poetic illusion.

In 1867, as he approached the age of 23, Nietzsche entered his required military service and was assigned to an equestrian field artillery regiment close to Naumburg, during which time he lived at home with his mother. While attempting to leap-mount into the saddle, he suffered a serious chest injury and was put on sick leave after his chest wound refused to heal. He returned shortly thereafter to the University of Leipzig, and in November of 1868, met the composer Richard Wagner (1813–1883) at the home of Hermann Brockhaus (1806–1877), an Orientalist who was married to Wagner’s sister, Ottilie. Brockhaus was himself a specialist in Sanskrit and Persian whose publications included (1850) an edition of the Vendidad Sade—a text of the Zoroastrian religion, whose prophet was Zarathustra (Zoroaster).

Wagner and Nietzsche shared an enthusiasm for Schopenhauer, and Nietzsche—who had been composing piano, choral and orchestral music since he was a teenager—admired Wagner for his musical genius, magnetic personality and cultural influence. Wagner was the same age Nietzsche’s father would have been, and he had also attended the University of Leipzig many years before. The Nietzsche-Wagner relationship was quasi-familial and sometimes-stormy, and it affected Nietzsche deeply. Early on, he could write (in 1869) that his friendship with Wagner was the “greatest achievement” [die größte Errungenschaft] of his life, and he was still energetically engaged in appraising and pondering Wagner’s cultural significance twenty years later at the end of his writing life. But Nietzsche broke with Wagner personally and intellectually in the late 1870s, and his assessments became increasingly negative (and more and more explicit) as time went on. Nevertheless, even after their break, Nietzsche was still reminiscing wistfully in 1882 about how his days with Wagner had been the best of his life. During the months surrounding Nietzsche’s initial meeting with Wagner, Ritschl recommended Nietzsche for a position on the classical philology faculty at the University of Basel. The Swiss university offered Nietzsche the professorial position, and he began teaching there in May, 1869, at the age of 24.

At Basel, Nietzsche’s satisfaction with his life among his philology colleagues was limited, and he established closer intellectual ties to the historians Franz Overbeck (1837–1905) and Jacob Burkhardt (1818–1897), whose lectures he attended. Overbeck—who roomed for five years in the same house as Nietzsche—became Nietzsche’s close and enduring friend, exchanging many letters with him over the years, and rushing to Nietzsche’s assistance in Turin immediately after his devastating collapse in 1889. Nietzsche also cultivated his friendship with Richard Wagner and visited him often at his Swiss home in Tribschen, a small town near Lucerne. Never in outstanding health, further complications arose from Nietzsche’s August-October 1870 service as a 25-year-old hospital attendant during the Franco-Prussian War (1870–71), where he participated in the siege of Metz. He witnessed the traumatic effects of battle, took close care of wounded soldiers, and contracted diphtheria and dysentery.

Nietzsche’s enthusiasm for Schopenhauer, his studies in classical philology, his inspiration from Wagner, his reading of Lange, his interests in health, his professional need to prove himself as a young academic, and his frustration with the contemporary German culture, all coalesced in his first book—The Birth of Tragedy (1872)—which was published in January 1872 when Nietzsche was 27. Wagner showered the book with praise, but a vitriolic, painfully-memorable and yet authoritative critical reaction by Ulrich von Wilamowitz-Möllendorff—who later became one of Germany’s leading philologists—immediately dampened the book’s reception, not to mention Nietzsche’s class enrollments in Basel.

Wilamowitz-Möllendorff came from an aristocratic family of distant Polish descent and knew Nietzsche as a student at Schulpforta. In his critique, he referred to Nietzsche as a disgrace to Schulpforta, and said that in light of the latter’s prophetic, soothsaying, exaggerated and historically uninformed style of writing, Nietzsche should instead “gather tigers and panthers about his knees, but not the youth of Germany.” It is intriguing that in Thus Spoke Zarathustra, written thirteen years later, Nietzsche invokes the comparable imagery of a lion nuzzling warmly at the knees of Zarathustra in the book’s concluding and inspirational scene, as if to acknowledge that his proper audience is, indeed, not a set of university professors.

As Nietzsche continued his residence in Switzerland between 1872 and 1879, he often visited Wagner at his new (1872) home in Bayreuth, Germany. In 1873, he met Paul Rée (1849–1901), who, while living in close company with Nietzsche in Sorrento during the autumn of 1876, would write On the Origin of Moral Feelings (1877). During this time, Nietzsche completed a series of four studies on contemporary German culture—the Unfashionable Observations (1873–76)—which focus respectively upon (1) the historian of religion and culture critic, David Strauss, (2) issues concerning the social value of historiography, (3) Arthur Schopenhauer and (4) Richard Wagner, both as heroic inspirations for new cultural standards.

Near the end of his university career, Nietzsche completed Human, All-Too-Human (1878)—a book that marks a turning point in his philosophical style and that, while reinforcing his friendship with Rée, also ends his friendship with the anti-Semitic Wagner, who comes under attack in a thinly-disguised characterization of “the artist.” Despite the damage done by the unflattering review of The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche remained respected in his professorial position in Basel, but his deteriorating health, which led to migraine headaches, eyesight problems and vomiting, necessitated his resignation from the university in June, 1879, at age 34. At this point, he had been a university professor for ten years, and had just less than another ten years of productive intellectual life remaining.

From 1880 until his collapse in January 1889, Nietzsche led a wandering, Roma-like existence as a stateless person (having given up his German citizenship, and not having acquired Swiss citizenship), circling almost annually between his mother’s house in Naumburg and various French, Swiss, German and Italian cities. His travels took him through the Mediterranean seaside city of Nice (during the winters), the Swiss alpine village of Sils-Maria (during the summers, located near the present-day ski resort of St. Moritz), Leipzig (where he had attended university, and had been hoping to resume his teaching career in 1883), Turin, Genoa, Recoaro, Messina, Rapallo, Florence, Venice, and Rome, never residing in any place longer than several months at a time.

On a visit to Rome in 1882, Nietzsche, now at age thirty-seven, met Lou von Salomé (1861–1937), a 21 year old Russian woman who was studying philosophy and theology in Zurich. They had an active intellectual relationship and Nietzsche appears to have fallen in love with her. Their relationship did not develop on a romantic level, and their friendship took a turn for the worse when Salomé and Paul Rée left Nietzsche and moved to Berlin. In the years to follow, Salomé would write a book about Nietzsche (Friedrich Nietzsche in seinen Werken [Friedrich Nietzsche in his Works]) in 1894, and would later become an associate of Sigmund Freud, who she met in 1911. Salomé’s insightful book on Nietzsche is one of the first to propose the division of Nietzsche’s writings into early, middle, and late periods.

These nomadic years were the occasion of Nietzsche’s main works, among which are Daybreak (1881), The Gay Science (1882/1887), Thus Spoke Zarathustra (1883–85), Beyond Good and Evil (1886), and On the Genealogy of Morals (1887). Nietzsche’s final active year, 1888, saw the completion of The Case of Wagner (May-August 1888), Twilight of the Idols (August-September 1888), The Antichrist (September 1888), Ecce Homo (October-November 1888) and Nietzsche Contra Wagner (December 1888).

On the morning of January 3, 1889, while in Turin, Nietzsche experienced a mental breakdown which left him an invalid for the rest of his life. Coincidentally, on virtually the same date, viz., January 4, his little brother, Joseph, had died many years before. Nietzsche, upon witnessing a horse being whipped by a coachman at the Piazza Carlo Alberto—although this episode with the horse could be anecdotal—threw his arms around the horse’s neck and collapsed in the plaza, never to return to full sanity.

Some argue that Nietzsche was afflicted with a syphilitic infection (this was the original diagnosis of the doctors in Basel and Jena) contracted either while he was a student or while he was serving as a hospital attendant during the Franco-Prussian War; some claim that his use of chloral hydrate, a drug which he had been using as a sedative, undermined his already-weakened nervous system; some speculate that Nietzsche’s collapse was due to a brain disease he inherited from his father; some maintain that a mental illness gradually drove him insane; some maintain that he suffered from a slow-growing, frontal cranial base tumor; some maintain that he suffered from CADASIL syndrome, a hereditary stroke disorder; some maintain that Nietzsche suffered from a tumor on the surface of the brain growing behind his right eye. The exact cause of Nietzsche’s incapacitation remains unclear. That he had an extraordinarily sensitive nervous constitution and took an assortment of medications is well-documented as a more general fact. To complicate matters of interpretation, Nietzsche states in a letter from April 1888 that he never had any symptoms of a mental disorder.

During his creative years, Nietzsche struggled to bring his writings into print and never doubted that his books would have a lasting cultural effect. He did not live long enough to experience his world-historical influence, but he had a brief glimpse of his growing intellectual importance in discovering that he was the subject of 1888 lectures given by Georg Brandes (Georg Morris Cohen) at the University of Copenhagen, to whom he directed the above April 1888 correspondence, and from whom he received a recommendation to read Kierkegaard’s works. Nietzsche’s collapse, however, followed soon thereafter.

After a brief hospitalization in Basel, he spent 1889 in a sanatorium in Jena at the Binswanger Clinic, and in March 1890 his mother took him back home to Naumburg, where he lived under her care for the next seven years in the house he knew as a youngster. After his mother’s death in 1897, his sister Elisabeth—having returned home from Paraguay in 1893, where she had been working since 1886 with her husband Bernhard Förster to establish an Aryan, anti-Semitic German colony called “New Germany” (“Nueva Germania”)—assumed responsibility for Nietzsche’s welfare. In an effort to promote her brother’s philosophy, she rented the “Villa Silberblick,” a large house in Weimar, and moved both Nietzsche and his collected manuscripts to the residence. This became the new home of the Nietzsche Archives (which had been located at the family home for the three years preceding), where Elisabeth received visitors who wanted to observe the now-incapacitated philosopher.

On August 25, 1900, Nietzsche died in the villa as he approached his 56th year, apparently of pneumonia in combination with a stroke. His body was then transported to the family gravesite directly beside the church in Röcken bei Lützen, where his mother and sister now also rest. The Villa Silberblick was eventually turned into a museum, and since 1950, Nietzsche’s manuscripts have been located in Weimar at the Goethe- und Schiller-Archiv

2. Early Writings: 1872–1876

Nietzsche’s first book was published in 1872 and was entitled The Birth of Tragedy, Out of the Spirit of Music (Die Geburt der Tragödie aus dem Geiste der Musik). Overall, it sets forth a more visceral and existential alternative to the late 18th/early 19th century understanding of Greek culture—an understanding largely inspired by Johann Winckelmann’s History of Ancient Art (1764)—which, grounded on the aesthetics of classical sculpture, hailed ancient Greece as the epitome of noble simplicity, calm grandeur, clear blue skies, and rational serenity. In 1886, Nietzsche’s book was reissued with a revised title, The Birth of Tragedy, Or: Hellenism and Pessimism (Die Geburt der Tragödie, Oder: Griechentum und Pessimismus), along with a lucid and revealing prefatory essay—“An Attempt at Self-Criticism”—which expresses Nietzsche’s own critical reflections on the book, looking back fourteen years. Although he remained proud of the work, Nietzsche also describes it as questionable, strange and almost inaccessible, filled with Kantian and Schopenhauerian formulas that were inherently at odds with the new valuations he was trying to express.

Having by this time absorbed the Schopenhauerian view that non-rational forces reside at the foundation of all creativity and of reality itself, and that these forces are artistically best conveyed in music, Nietzsche identifies a strongly instinctual, wild, amoral, “Dionysian” energy within pre-Socratic Greek culture as an essentially creative and healthy force, locating its prime expression in the tragic chorus, and constituting the very life of the tragedy. Surveying the history of Western culture since the time of the Greeks, Nietzsche laments over how this Dionysian, creative energy had been submerged and weakened as it became overshadowed by the “Apollonian” forces of logical order and stiff sobriety. He concludes that European culture since the time of Socrates has remained one-sidedly Apollonian, repressed, scientific, and relatively unhealthy. Wagner expressed similar sentiments in his 1849 essay “Art and Revolution,” as he described Western society as having been on the decline since the times of the ancient Greeks.

As a means towards a cultural rebirth, Nietzsche advocates in contemporary life, the resurrection and fuller release of Dionysian artistic energies—those which he associates with primordial creativity, joy in existence and ultimate truth. The seeds of this liberating rebirth Nietzsche perceives in the German music of his time (viz., Bach, Beethoven and especially Wagner), and the concluding part of The Birth of Tragedy, in effect, adulates the emerging German artistic, tragic spirit as the potential savior of European culture. As one of his early books, The Birth of Tragedy has a strong Wagnerian and Schopenhauerian flavor, and scholars disagree about the extent to which Nietzsche departs from Schopenhauer in this work and in later works.

Some regard Nietzsche’s 1873 unpublished essay, “On Truth and Lies in a Nonmoral Sense” (“Über Wahrheit und Lüge im außermoralischen Sinn”) as a keystone in his thought; some believe that it is a peripheral, conflicted and non-representative fragment in his writings. In this essay, Nietzsche rejects the idea of universal constants, and claims, presumably as a truth, that what we call “truth” is only “a mobile army of metaphors, metonyms, and anthropomorphisms.” His view at this time is that arbitrariness prevails within human experience: concepts originate via the transformation of nerve stimuli into images, and “truth” is nothing more than the invention of fixed conventions for practical purposes, especially those of repose, security and consistency. Nietzsche regards our “knowledge” as human, all-too-human, mostly a matter of self-deception that issues from a deep-seated exercise of metaphorical thought. Viewing our existence from a vast and sobering distance, Nietzsche further notes that there was an eternity before human beings came into existence, and believes that after humanity dies out, nothing significant will have changed in the great scheme of things.

Between 1873 and 1876, Nietzsche wrote the Unfashionable Observations (Unzeitgemässe Betrachtungen, also translated as Untimely Meditations or Thoughts Out of Season). These are four (of a projected, but never completed, thirteen) studies concerned with the quality of European, and especially German, culture during Nietzsche’s time. They are unfashionable and nonconformist (or “untimely,” or “unmodern,” or “out of place”) insofar as Nietzsche regarded his standpoint as culture-critic to be in tension with the self-congratulatory spirit of the times. The four studies were: David Strauss, the Confessor and the Writer (David Strauss, der Bekenner und der Schriftsteller, 1873); On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (Vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben, 1874); Schopenhauer as Educator (Schopenhauer als Erzieher, 1874); Richard Wagner in Bayreuth (1876).

The first of these attacks David Strauss, whose popular six-edition book, The Old and the New Faith: A Confession (1871) encapsulated for Nietzsche the general cultural atmosphere in Germany. Responding to Strauss’s advocacy of a “new faith” grounded upon a scientifically-determined universal mechanism—one, however, lubricated by the optimistic, “soothing oil” of historical progress—Nietzsche criticizes Strauss’s view as a vulgar and dismal sign of cultural degeneracy. Nietzsche’s friend, Overbeck, in his contemporaneous writings, also adopted a critical attitude towards Strauss. The second “untimely meditation” surveys alternative ways to write history, and discusses how these ways could contribute to a society’s health. Here Nietzsche claims that the principle of “life” is a more pressing and higher concern than that of “knowledge,” and that the quest for knowledge should serve the interests of life. This parallels how, in The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche had looked at art through the perspective of life and foreshadows Nietzsche’s hallmark theme of “life-affirmation” in his later works.

The third and fourth studies—on Schopenhauer and Wagner, respectively—address how these two thinkers, as paradigms of philosophic and artistic genius, hold the potential to inspire a stronger, healthier and livelier German culture. Nietzsche states here that we all have a duty to help nature complete its goal of producing the highest examples of the human being—these will be the “new redeemers”—which he recognizes in superb instances of the philosopher, the artist and the saint (“Schopenhauer as Educator,” Section 5). These celebratory studies on Schopenhauer and Wagner reveal how, as a recurring feature of Nietzsche’s thought, he presents us with some higher type of character—he offers different models of heroic characters as the years go by—as an ideal towards which he would have his best readers aspire.

3. Middle-Period Writings: 1878–1882

Nietzsche completed Human, All-Too-Human in 1878, supplementing this with a second part in 1879, Mixed Opinions and Maxims (Vermischte Meinungen und Sprüche), and a third part in 1880, The Wanderer and his Shadow (Der Wanderer und sein Schatten). The three parts were published together in 1886 as Human All-Too-Human, A Book for Free Spirits (Menschliches, Allzumenschliches, Ein Buch für freie Geister). Reluctant to construct a philosophical “system,” and sensitive to the importance of style in philosophic writing, Nietzsche composed these works as a series of several hundred short passages and aphorisms—concise condensations of his assorted insights—whose typical length ranges from a line or two to a page or two. Here, he often reflects upon cultural and psychological phenomena by connecting them to individuals’ organic and physiological constitutions. The idea of power (for which he would later become known) sporadically appears as an explanatory principle, but he tends at this time to invoke hedonistic considerations of pleasure and pain in his explanations of cultural and psychological phenomena. Given his harsh criticisms of hedonism and utilitarianism in later works (e.g., Thus Spoke Zarathustra, re: “the Last Man”), Human All-Too-Human appears to many readers as an uncharacteristic work, more science- than art-inspired in its approach to health, where Nietzsche was struggling to break free of Wagner’s spell, and which, presupposing a fundamentally hedonistic moral psychology, does not fully embody the pain-and-power-centered approach that he later developed.

In Daybreak: Reflections on Moral Prejudices (Morgenröte. Gedanken über die moralischen Vorurteile, 1881), Nietzsche continues writing in his aphoristic style, but he marks a new beginning by accentuating as opposed to pleasure, the importance of the “feeling of power” in his understanding of human, and especially of so-called “moral” behavior. Always having been interested in the nature of health, his emerging references to power stem from his earlier efforts to discover the secret of the ancient Greeks’ outstanding health, which he had regarded as the effects of how “agon” (i.e., competition, one-upmanship, or contest, as conceived in his 1872 essay, “Homer’s Contest”) permeated their cultural attitudes. In this respect, Daybreak contains the seeds of Nietzsche’s doctrine of the “will to power”—a doctrine that appears explicitly for the first time two years later in Thus Spoke Zarathustra (1883–85). Daybreak is also one of Nietzsche’s clearest, intellectually calmest, and most intimate, volumes, providing many social-psychological insights in conjunction with some of his first sustained critical reflections on the cultural relativity at the basis of Christian moral evaluations. In this book—as he remarks retrospectively in Ecce Homo (1888)—Nietzsche begins his “crusade [Feldzug] against morality.”

In a more well-known aphoristic work, The Gay Science (Die fröhliche Wissenschaft, 1882)—whose title was inspired by the troubadour songs of southern-French Provence (1100–1300)—Nietzsche sets forth some of the existential ideas for which he became famous, namely, the proclamation that “God is dead” and the doctrine of eternal recurrence—a doctrine that attends to how people of different levels of health are likely to react to the prospect of being reborn, over and over again, to replay life’s experience exactly as before in every pleasurable and painful sequence of detail. Nietzsche’s atheism—his account of “God’s murder” (section 125)—expresses in a literary manner, his philosophical condemnation of all absolute perspectives and values. His atheism also aims to redirect people’s attention to their inherent freedom, the presently-existing world, and away from escapist, pain-relieving, heavenly otherworlds.

To a similar end, Nietzsche’s doctrine of eternal recurrence (sections 285 and 341) serves to draw attention away from all worlds other than the one in which we presently live, since eternal recurrence precludes the possibility of any final escape from the present world. The doctrine also functions as a measure for judging someone’s overall psychological strength and mental health, since Nietzsche believed that the doctrine of eternal recurrence was the hardest world-view to affirm. There are some differences of scholarly opinion concerning whether Nietzsche primarily intends this doctrine to describe a serious metaphysical theory, or whether he is offering merely one way to interpret the world among many others, which if adopted therapeutically as a psychologically healthy myth, can help us become stronger.

In 1887, The Gay Science was reissued with an important preface, an additional fifth Book, and an appendix of songs, reminiscent of the troubadours.

4. Later-Period Writings: 1883–1887

Thus Spoke Zarathustra, A Book for All and None (Also Sprach Zarathustra, Ein Buch für Alle und Keinen, 1883–85), is one of Nietzsche’s most famous works, and Nietzsche regarded it as among his most significant. It is a manifesto of personal self-overcoming, and a guidebook for others towards the same revitalizing end. Thirty years after its initial publication, 150,000 copies of the work were printed by the German government and issued during WWI as inspirational reading to the young soldiers, along with the Bible. Though Thus Spoke Zarathustra is antagonistic to the Judeo-Christian world-view, its poetic and prophetic style relies upon many, often inverted, Old and New Testament allusions. Nietzsche also filled the work with nature metaphors, almost in the spirit of pre-Socratic naturalist philosophy, which invoke animals, earth, air, fire, water, celestial bodies, plants, all in the service of describing the spiritual development of Zarathustra, a solitary, reflective, exceedingly strong-willed, sage-like, laughing and dancing voice of heroic self-mastery who, accompanied by a proud, sharp-eyed eagle and a wise snake, envisions a mode of psychologically healthier being beyond the common human condition. Nietzsche refers to this higher mode of being as “superhuman” (übermenschlich), and associates the doctrine of eternal recurrence—a doctrine for only the healthiest who can love life in its entirety—with this spiritual standpoint, in relation to which all-too-often downhearted, all-too-commonly-human attitudes stand as a mere bridge to be crossed and overcome.

Within Nietzsche’s corpus, Thus Spoke Zarathustra has a controversial place, owing mainly to its peculiar literary style. Nietzsche speaks in parables and short narratives populated by fictional characters—“the hunchback,” “the ugliest man,” “the soothsayer,” “the saint,” “the tightrope walker,” “the jester,” and “the Last Man,” to name a few—leaving their philosophical import open to a variety of interpretations. One of Nietzsche’s most well-known and morally troubling figures—the superhuman—also appears substantially only in this work, rendering it questionable to some interpreters whether this ideal of supreme human health is central to Nietzsche’s thought as a whole. There is also some interpretive uncertainty about whether the work, which was written across the span of three years, properly ends triumphantly at the conclusion of the Third Part, thus situating the psychologically complex Fourth Part as a question-raising supplement, or whether the book’s narrative moves smoothly and progressively across the entire four parts.

Beyond Good and Evil, Prelude to a Philosophy of the Future (Jenseits von Gut und Böse. Vorspiel einer Philosophie der Zukunft, 1886) is arguably a rethinking of Human, All-too-Human, since their respective tables of contents and sequence of themes loosely correspond to one another. In Beyond Good and Evil, Nietzsche identifies imagination, self-assertion, danger, originality and the “creation of values” as qualities of genuine philosophers, as opposed to mere scholars engaged in positive research in the sciences and humanities, or the dusty classification of philosophical outlooks. Nietzsche takes aim at some of the world’s great philosophers, who ground their outlooks wholeheartedly upon concepts such as “self-consciousness,” “free will,” and “either/or” bipolar thinking.

Nietzsche alternatively philosophizes from the perspective of life located beyond good and evil, and challenges the entrenched moral idea that exploitation, domination, injury to the weak, destruction and appropriation are universally objectionable behaviors. Above all, he believes that living things aim to discharge their strength and express their “will to power”—a pouring-out of expansive energy as if one were like a perpetually-shining sun that, quite naturally, can entail danger, pain, lies, deception and masks. Here, “will” is not an inner emptiness, lack, feeling of deficiency, or constant drive for satisfaction, but is a fountain of constantly-swelling energy, life, and power.

As he views things from the perspective of life, Nietzsche further denies that there is a universal morality applicable indiscriminately to all human beings, and instead designates a series of moralities in an order of rank that ascends from the plebeian to the noble: some moralities are more suitable for subordinate roles; some are more appropriate for dominating and leading social roles. What counts as a preferable and legitimate action depends upon the kind of person one is. The deciding factor is whether one is weaker, sicker and on the decline, or whether one is healthier, more powerful and overflowing with life.

On the Genealogy of Morals, A Polemic (Zur Genealogie der Moral, Eine Streitschrift, 1887) is composed of three sustained essays that advance the critique of Christianity expressed in Beyond Good and Evil. The first essay continues the discussion of master morality versus servant morality, and maintains that the traditional ideals set forth as holy and morally good within Christian morality are products of self-deception, since they were forged in the bad air of revenge, resentment, hatred, impotence, and cowardice. In this essay, as well as the next, Nietzsche’s controversial references to the “blond beast” in connection with master morality also appear. In the second essay, Nietzsche continues with an account of how feelings of guilt, or the “bad conscience,” arise merely as a consequence of an unhealthy Christian morality that turns an evil eye towards our natural inclinations. He also discusses how punishment, conceived as the infliction of pain upon someone in proportion to their offense, is likely to have been grounded in the contractual economic relationship between creditor and debtor, i.e., in business relationships. In the third essay, Nietzsche focusses upon the truth-oriented ascetic ideals that underlie and inform prevailing styles of art, religion and philosophy, and he offers a particularly scathing critique of the priesthood: the priests are allegedly a group of weak people who shepherd even weaker people as a way to experience power for themselves. The third essay also contains one of Nietzsche’s clearest expressions of “perspectivism” (section 12)—the idea that there is no absolute, “God’s eye” standpoint from which one can survey everything that is.

On the Genealogy of Morals is Nietzsche’s “polemic,” i.e., attack, against the assumptions and methods (which, incidentally, are still popular) characteristic of works such as Paul Rée’s The Origin of the Moral Sensations (1877). Inspired by utilitarianism and Darwinism, Rée offers a naturalistic account of our moral values, especially altruism, but by Nietzsche’s lights, does not question the value of the moral values themselves. In the Genealogy, Nietzsche offers a competing account of the origin of moral values, aiming to reveal their life-negating foundations and functions.

Nietzsche ultimately advocates valuations that issue from a self-confident, self-reinforcing, self-governing, creative and commanding attitude, as opposed to those that issue from reactive attitudes that determine values more mechanically and subordinatingly to those who are inherently more powerful. For Nietzsche, those who prefer to think in terms of “good vs. bad” exemplify the former, leading and superior mentality, and those who think in terms of “good vs. evil,” exemplify the latter, inferior and subservient mentality. From the standpoint of a leader, in the appropriate circumstances it is good to be able to inflict pain and instil fear among those who are led, and bad not to be able to do so. From the standpoint of those who are led, the infliction of pain and instillation of fear upon subordinates does not appear typically to be good at all, but rather evil.

5. Final Writings of 1888

The Case of Wagner, A Musician’s Problem (Der Fall Wagner, Ein Musikanten-Problem, May-August 1888), contrasts sharply with Nietzsche’s laudatory portrayal of Wagner in The Birth of Tragedy (1872), and compares well with his 1873 meditation on David Strauss in its unbridled attack on a popular cultural figure. In The Case of Wagner, Nietzsche “declares war” upon Richard Wagner, whose music is characterized as the epitome of modern cultural achievement, but also crucially as sick and decadent. The work is a brilliant display of Nietzsche’s talents as a music critic, and includes memorable ridicule of Wagner’s theatrical style, reflections on redemption via art, a “physiology of art,” and discussion of the virtues associated, respectively, with ascending and descending life energies. As the therapeutic inversion and antithesis of Wagner’s debilitatingly serious music, Nietzsche refers us to Georges Bizet (1838–1875) whose music he finds cheerful, revitalizing, redeeming and light-hearted. Wagner himself had some years earlier (1850) condemned Felix Mendelssohn (1809–1847) for having confounded the public’s taste in music. Nietzsche, writing almost thirty years later, here accuses Wagner of having done the same.

The title, Twilight of the Idols, or How One Philosophizes with a Hammer (Götzen-Dämmerung, oder Wie man mit dem Hammer philosophiert, August-September 1888), word-plays upon Wagner’s opera, The Twilight of the Gods (Die Götterdämmerung). Nietzsche reiterates and elaborates some of the criticisms of Socrates, Plato, Kant and Christianity found in earlier works, criticizes the then-contemporary German culture as being unsophisticated and too-full of beer, and shoots some disapproving arrows at key French, British, and Italian cultural figures such as Rousseau, Hugo, Sand, Michelet, Zola, Renan, Carlyle, Mill, Eliot, Darwin, and Dante. In contrast to these alleged representatives of cultural decadence, Nietzsche applauds Caesar, Napoleon, Goethe, Dostoevsky, Thucydides and the Sophists as healthier and stronger types. The phrase “to philosophize with a hammer” primarily signifies a way to test idols by tapping on them lightly; one “sounds them out” to determine whether they are hollow, or intact, etc., as physician would use a percussion hammer upon the abdomen as a diagnostic instrument.

In The Antichrist, Curse on Christianity (Der Antichrist. Fluch auf das Christentum, September 1888 [published 1895]), Nietzsche expresses his disgust over the way noble values in Roman Society were corrupted by the rise of Christianity, and he discusses specific aspects and personages in Christian culture—the Gospels, Paul, the martyrs, priests, the crusades—with a view towards showing that Christianity is a religion for weak and unhealthy people, whose general historical effect has been to undermine the healthy qualities of the more noble cultures. The Antichrist was initially conceived of as the first part of a projected four-part work for which Nietzsche had in mind the title, Revaluation of All Values (the second part was to be entitled, “The Free Spirit”). As in most of his 1888 works, Nietzsche criticizes, either implicitly or explicitly, the anti-Semitic writers of his day. In this particular study, one of his main targets is the French, anti-Semitic, Christian historian, Ernest Renan (1823–1892), who was known for works such as The Life of Jesus (1863) and History of the Origins of Christianity (1866–1881), the fourth book of which was entitled The Antichrist (1873). Some interpret Nietzsche’s title for his book as meaning, “the Antichristian.” It should be noted that in an 1883 letter to his friend, Peter Gast [Johann Heinrich Köselitz], Nietzsche does describe himself self-entertainingly as “the Antichrist,” and also more seriously as “the most terrible opponent of Christianity.”

Nietzsche describes himself as “a follower of the philosopher Dionysus” in Ecce Homo, How One Becomes What One Is (Ecce Homo, Wie man wird, was man ist, October-November 1888)—a book in which he examines retrospectively his entire corpus, work by work, offering critical remarks, details of how the works were inspired, and explanatory observations regarding their philosophical contents. He begins this fateful intellectual autobiography—he was to lose his mind little more than a month later—with three eyebrow-raising sections entitled, “Why I Am So Wise,” “Why I Am So Clever,” and “Why I Write Such Good Books.” Nietzsche claims to be wise as a consequence of his acute aesthetic sensitivity to nuances of health and sickness in people’s attitudes and characters; he claims to be clever because he knows how to choose the right nutrition, climate, residence and recreation for himself; he claims to write such good books because they allegedly adventurously open up, at least for a very select group of readers, a new series of noble and delicate experiences. After examining each of his published works, Nietzsche concludes Ecce Homo with the section, “Why I Am a Destiny.” He claims that he is a destiny because he regards his anti-moral truths as having the annihilating power of intellectual dynamite; he expects them to topple the morality born of sickness which he perceives to have been reigning within Western culture for the last two thousand years. In this way, he expresses his hope that Dionysus, the god of life’s exuberance, would replace Jesus, the god of the heavenly otherworld, as the premier cultural standard for future millennia.

Although Ecce Homo stands historically as Nietzsche’s final autobiographical statement, if we consider that—although the plans were in flux—Nietzsche was embarking on a new work, at one point to be entitled, Revaluation of All Values, his 1888 autobiographical excursion can be appreciated as a kind of house-cleaning and summing-up of where he had intellectually arrived at that point. Rather than being a final self-definition, it can be seen as yet another among Nietzsche’s several efforts over the years to clear the way for a freer intellectual development or metamorphosis. In this respect, it compares to Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Book IV, which appears to be Nietzsche’s squarely facing, almost as a kind of exorcism, the variety of inner characters that constituted his personality. Along the same lines, Ecce Homo recalls the interval between Human-All-too-Human and Daybreak, when Nietzsche plunged to a very low point in his health, coming close to death, and then dramatically recuperated.

Nietzsche Contra Wagner, Out of the Files of a Psychologist (Nietzsche contra Wagner, Aktenstücke eines Psychologen, December 1888) is a short, but classic, selection of passages Nietzsche extracted from his 1878–1887 published works. Many concern Wagner, but the excerpts serve mostly as a foil for Nietzsche to express his own views against Wagner’s. In this self-portrait, completed only a month before his collapse, Nietzsche characterizes his own anti-Christian sentiments, and contemplates how even the greatest people usually undergo significant corruption. In Wagner’s case, Nietzsche claims that the corrupting force was Christianity. One cannot help remembering here how, using the same kind of rationale, Wagner claimed that Felix Mendelssohn’s corrupting force was Judaism. At the same time, Nietzsche describes how he truly admired some of Wagner’s music for its profound expressions of loneliness and suffering—expressions which Nietzsche admitted were psychologically impossible for he himself to articulate.

The writings of Nietzsche’s final active year are peppered with some wild phrasings, but they remain lucid and philosophically penetrating on the whole. Given the utter loss of Nietzsche’s intellectual capacities upon his collapse, this prior lucidity is puzzling. The abruptness of his breakdown in combination with the lucidity of his final writings has fed speculation that rather than suffering from a slowly progressive mental disease, Nietzsche had a physical condition (e.g., a brain tumor) whose silent growth eventually reached a critical mass that caused his mental composure to snap.

6. Nietzsche’s Unpublished Notebooks

Nietzsche’s unpublished writings often reveal his more tentative and speculative ideas. This material is surrounded by controversy, since some of it conflicts with views he expresses in his published works. Disagreement regarding Nietzsche’s notebooks, also known as his Nachlass, centers around the degree of interpretive priority which ought to be given to the unpublished versus the published writings. One popular approach in the tradition of classical scholarly interpretation is to maintain that Nietzsche’s published works express his more considered and polished views, and that these should take precedence over the unpublished manuscripts when conflicts arise; a second attitude, given voice by Martin Heidegger (who lectured on Nietzsche in Nazi Germany, 1936–1940), and broadly consistent with a psychoanalytic approach as well, is to regard what Nietzsche published as representative of what he decided was publicly presentable, and what he kept privately to himself in unpublished form as containing his more authentic views; a third, more comprehensive, interpretive style tries to grasp all of Nietzsche’s texts together in an effort to form the most coherent interpretation of Nietzsche’s thought, judging the priority of published versus unpublished works on a thematic, or case-by-case basis; a fourth position influenced by the French deconstructionist perspective maintains that any rigid prioritizing between published and private works is impossible, since all of the texts embody a comparable multidimensionality of meaning.

In his unpublished manuscripts, Nietzsche sometimes elaborates the topics found in the published works, such as his early 1870s notebooks, where there is important material concerning his theory of knowledge. In the 1880s notebooks—those from which his sister collected together a large selection after his death under the title, The Will to Power: Attempt at a Revaluation of all Values—Nietzsche sometimes adopts a more metaphysical orientation towards the doctrines of Eternal Recurrence and the Will to Power, speculating upon their structure, implications, and intellectual strength as interpretations of reality itself. Side-by-side with these speculations, and complicating efforts towards developing an interpretation which is both comprehensive and coherent, Nietzsche’s 1880s notebooks also repeatedly state that “there are no facts, only interpretations.”

7. Nietzsche’s Influence Upon 20th Century Thought

Nietzsche’s thought extended a deep influence during the 20th century, especially in Continental Europe. In English-speaking countries, his positive reception has been less resonant. During the last decade of Nietzsche’s life and the first decade of the 20th century, his thought was particularly attractive to avant-garde artists who saw themselves on the periphery of established social fashion and practice. Here, Nietzsche’s advocacy of new, healthy beginnings, and of creative artistry in general stood forth. His tendency to seek explanations for commonly-accepted values and outlooks in the less-elevated realms of sheer animal instinct was also crucial to Sigmund Freud’s development of psychoanalysis. Later, during the 1930s, aspects of Nietzsche’s thought were espoused by the Nazis and Italian Fascists, partly due to the encouragement of Elisabeth Förster-Nietzsche through her associations with Adolf Hitler and Benito Mussolini. It was possible for the Nazi interpreters to assemble, quite selectively, various passages from Nietzsche’s writings whose juxtaposition appeared to justify war, aggression and domination for the sake of nationalistic and racial self-glorification.

Until the 1960s in France, Nietzsche appealed mainly to writers and artists, since the academic philosophical climate was dominated by G.W.F. Hegel’s, Edmund Husserl’s and Martin Heidegger’s thought, along with the structuralist movement of the 1950s. Nietzsche became especially influential in French philosophical circles during the 1960s–1980s, when his “God is dead” declaration, his perspectivism, and his emphasis upon power as the real motivator and explanation for people’s actions revealed new ways to challenge established authority and launch effective social critique. In the English-speaking world, Nietzsche’s unfortunate association with the Nazis kept him from serious philosophical consideration until the 1950s and 60s, when landmark works such as Walter Kaufmann’s, Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist (1950) and Arthur C. Danto’s, Nietzsche as Philosopher (1965), paved the way for a more open-minded discussion.

Specific 20th century figures who were influenced, either quite substantially, or in a significant part, by Nietzsche include painters, dancers, musicians, playwrights, poets, novelists, psychologists, sociologists, literary theorists, historians, and philosophers: Alfred Adler, Georges Bataille, Martin Buber, Albert Camus, E.M. Cioran, Jacques Derrida, Gilles Deleuze, Isadora Duncan, Michel Foucault, Sigmund Freud, Stefan George, André Gide, Hermann Hesse, Carl Jung, Martin Heidegger, Gustav Mahler, André Malraux, Thomas Mann, H.L. Mencken, Rainer Maria Rilke, Jean-Paul Sartre, Max Scheler, Giovanni Segantini, George Bernard Shaw, Lev Shestov, Georg Simmel, Oswald Spengler, Richard Strauss, Paul Tillich, Ferdinand Tönnies, Mary Wigman, William Butler Yeats and Stefan Zweig.

That Nietzsche was able to write so prolifically and profoundly for years, while remaining in a condition of ill-health and often intense physical pain, is a testament to his spectacular mental capacities and will power. Lesser people under the same physical pressures might not have had the inclination to pick up a pen, let alone think and record thoughts which—created in the midst of striving for healthy self-overcoming—would have the power to influence an entire century.


A. Nietzsche’s Writings

  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe Briefwechsel, G. Colli and M. Montinari (ed.), 24 volumes in 4 parts, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1975.
  • The Antichrist, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), in The Portable Nietzsche, Walter Kaufmann (ed.), New York: Viking Press, 1968.
  • Beyond Good and Evil, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Random House, 1966.
  • The Birth of Tragedy, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), in The Birth of Tragedy and The Case of Wagner, New York: Random House, 1967.
  • The Case of Wagner, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), inThe Birth of Tragedy and The Case of Wagner, New York: Random House, 1967.
  • Daybreak: Thoughts on the Prejudices of Morality, R. J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
  • Ecce Homo: How One Becomes What One Is, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), in On the Genealogy of Morals and Ecce Homo, New York: Random House, 1967.
  • The Gay Science, with a Prelude of Rhymes and an Appendix of Songs, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Random House, 1974.
  • Human, All Too Human: A Book for Free Spirits, R. J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Nietzsche Contra Wagner, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), in The Portable Nietzsche, New York: Viking Press, 1968.
  • On the Genealogy of Morals, Walter Kaufmann and R.J. Hollingdale (trans.), in On the Genealogy of Morals and Ecce Homo, New York: Random House, 1967.
  • Philosophy and Truth: Selections from Nietzsche’s Notebooks of the Early 1870s, Daniel Breazeale (trans. and ed.), Atlantic Highlands, N.J.: Humanities Press, 1979.
  • Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, Marianne Cowan (trans.), Chicago: Henry Regnery Company, 1962.
  • Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), in The Portable Nietzsche, New York: Viking Press, 1968.
  • Twilight of the Idols, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), in The Portable Nietzsche, New York: Viking Press, 1968.
  • Untimely Meditations, R. J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • The Will to Power, Walter Kaufmann (trans.), New York: Random House, 1967.

B. Books About Nietzsche

  • Acampora, Christa Davis, 2013, Contesting Nietzsche, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Alfano, Mark, 2019, Nietzsche’s Moral Psychology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Allison, David, 2000, Reading the New Nietzsche, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield Publishing.
  • Ansell-Pearson, Keith, and Rebecca Bamford, 2021, Nietzsche’s Dawn: Philosophy, Ethics, and the Passion of Knowledge, Hoboken, NJ: John Wiley & Sons Ltd.
  • Aschheim, Steven E, 1992, The Nietzsche Legacy in Germany, 1890–1990, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Babich, Babette E, 1994, Nietzsche’s Philosophy of Science, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Bamford, Rebecca, 2014, Nietzsche’s Method of Experimentalism in Science and Mind, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Bataille, Georges, 1945, On Nietzsche, Bruce Boone (trans.), London: Athlone Press, 1992.
  • Berry, Jessica, 2010, Nietzsche and the Ancient Skeptical Tradition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bertram, Ernst, 1918, Nietzsche: An Attempt at a Mythology, Robert E. Norton (trans.), Champaign IL: University of Illinois Press, 2009.
  • Bishop, Paul, and R. H. Stephenson, 2005, Friedrich Nietzsche and Weimar Classicism, Rochester, NY: Camden House.
  • Blond, Lewis, 2011, Heidegger and Nietzsche: Overcoming Metaphysics, London: Continuum.
  • Blue, Daniel, 2016, The Making of Friedrich Nietzsche – The Quest for Identity, 1844–1869, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brobjer, Thomas, 1995, Nietzsche’s Ethics of Character: A Study of Nietzsche’s Ethics and its Place in the History of Moral Thinking, Department of the History of Ideas: University of Uppsala.
  • –––, 2008, Nietzsche’s Philosophical Context: An Intellectual Biography, Chicago: University of Illinois Press.
  • Chamberlain, Lesley, 1998, Nietzsche in Turin: An Intimate Biography, New York: Picador.
  • Clark, Maudemarie, 1990, Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, Jonathan R, 2010, Science, Culture, and Free Spirit: A Study of Nietzsche’s “Human, All-Too Human”, Amherst, NY: Humanity Books/Prometheus Books.
  • Conrad, Mark T., 2017, Nietzsche and the Philosophers, New York: Routledge, Taylor & Francis Group.
  • Danto, Arthur C., 1965, Nietzsche as Philosopher: An Original Study, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Deleuze, Gilles, 1962, Nietzsche and Philosophy, Hugh Tomlinson (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
  • Derrida, Jacques, 1979, Spurs: Nietzsche’s Styles, Barbara Harlow (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Emden, Christian J., 2008, Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of History, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Nietzsche’s Naturalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fink, Eugen, 2003 [1960], Goetz Richter (trans.), Nietzsche’s Philosophy, Aldershot: Avebury.
  • Franco, Paul, 2011, Nietzsche’s Enlightenment: The Free-Spirit Trilogy of the Middle Period, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Geuss, Raymond, 1999, Morality, Culture and History: Essays on German Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gillespie, Michael, 1996, Nihilism Before Nietzsche, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Gilman, Sander L, 1987, ed., Conversations with Nietzsche: A Life in the Words of his Contemporaries, David J. Parent (trans.), New York: Oxford University Press, Inc..
  • Green, Michael, 2002, Nietzsche and the Transcendental Tradition, Champaign, IL: University of Illinois Press.
  • Hales, Steven D. and Rex Welshon, 2000, Nietzsche’s Perspectivism, Champaign, IL: University of Illinois Press.
  • Hatab, Lawrence J., 2005, Nietzsche’s Life Sentence: Coming to Terms with Eternal Recurrence, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2008, Nietzsche’s “On the Genealogy of Morality”, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hayman, Ronald, 1980, Nietzsche, a Critical Life, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Heidegger, Martin, 1936–7a, Nietzsche, Vol. I: The Will to Power as Art, David F. Krell (trans.), New York: Harper & Row, 1979.
  • –––, 1936–7b, Nietzsche, Vol. II: The Eternal Recurrence of the Same, David F. Krell (trans.), San Francisco: Harper & Row, 1984.
  • –––, 1939, Nietzsche, Vol. III: Will to Power as Knowledge and as Metaphysics, Joan Stambaugh and Frank Capuzzi (trans.), San Francisco: Harper & Row, 1986.
  • –––, 1939, Nietzsche, Vol. IV: Nihilism, David F Krell (trans.), New York: Harper & Row, 1982.
  • Higgins, Kathleen Marie, 1999, Comic Relief: Nietzsche’s Gay Science, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1987, Nietzsche’s “Zarathustra” Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • Hollingdale, R.J., 1973, Nietzsche, London and New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Hunt, Lester H, 1991, Nietzsche and the Origin of Virtue, London: Routledge.
  • Irigaray, Luce, 1980, Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche, Gillian C. Gill (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
  • Janaway, Christopher, 2007, Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche’s Genealogy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Janz, Curt Paul, 1978–79, Friedrich Nietzsche. Biographie in drei Bänden, Munich: Carl Hanser.
  • Jaspers, Karl, 1936, Nietzsche: An Introduction to the Understanding of His Philosophical Activity, Charles F. Wallraff and Frederick J. Schmitz (trans.), South Bend, Indiana: Regentry/Gateway, Inc., 1979.
  • Jensen, Anthony K., 2013, Nietzsche’s Philosophy of History, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Johnson, Dirk R., 2010, Nietzsche’s Anti-Darwinism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jung, Carl G., 1934–9, Nietzsche’s “Zarathustra”, ed. James L. Jarrett. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • Kain, Philip J., 2009, Nietzsche and the Horror of Existence, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Katsafanas, Paul., 2013, Agency and the Foundations of Ethics: Nietzschean Constitutivism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016, The Nietzschean Self: Moral Psychology, Agency, and the Unconscious, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kaufmann, Walter, 1950, Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Klossowski, Pierre, 1969, Nietzsche and the Vicious Circle, London: Athlone, 1993.
  • Kofman, Sarah, 1972, Nietzsche and Metaphor, Duncan Large (ed. and trans.), London: Athlone Press; Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1993.
  • Krell, David Farrell, 1986, Postponements: Women, Sensuality, and Death in Nietzsche, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Krell, David Farrell, and Donald L. Bates, 1997, The Good European: Nietzsche’s Work Sites in Word and Image, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Lampert, Laurence, 1987, Nietzsche’s Teaching: An Interpretation of “Thus Spoke Zarathustra”, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 2001, Nietzsche’s Task: An Interpretation of “Beyond Good and Evil”, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Leiter, Brian, 2002, Routledge Guidebook to Nietzsche on Morality, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2019, Moral Psychology with Nietzsche, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lemm, Vanessa, 2009, Nietzsche’s Animal Philosophy: Culture, Politics and the Animality of the Human Being, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Nietzsche and the Becoming of Life, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Liebert, Georges, 2004, Nietzsche and Music, David Pellauer and Graham Parkes (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Loeb, Paul, 2010, The Death of Nietzsche’s Zarathustra, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Löwith, Karl, 1956, Nietzsche’s Philosophy of the Eternal Recurrence of the Same, J. Harvey Lomax (trans.), Bernd Magnus (foreward), Berkeley: University of California Press, 1997.
  • Losurdo, Dominico, 2002 [2020], Nietzsche, The Aristocratic Rebel, Leiden: Brill, 2020; translated by Gregor Benton from the Italian, Nietzsche, il ribelle aristocratico: Biografia intellettuale e bilancio critico, Turin, 2002.
  • Mabille, Louise, 2009, Nietzsche and the Anglo-Saxon Tradition, London: Continuum International Publishing Group.
  • Macintyre, Ben, 1992, Forgotten Fatherland: The Search for Elisabeth Nietzsche, London: Macmillan.
  • Magnus, Bernd, Stanley Stewart, and Jean-Pierre Mileur, 1993, Nietzsche’s Case: Philosophy as/and Literature, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Magnus, Bernd, 1978, Nietzsche’s Existential Imperative, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Mandel, Siegfried, 1998, Nietzsche & the Jews, New York: Prometheus Books.
  • May, Simon, 2000, Nietzsche’s Ethics and his War on “Morality”, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, Nietzsche’s “On the Genealogy of Morality”: A Critical Guide, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mencken, H.L., 1908, Friedrich Nietzsche, New Brunswick (USA) and London (UK): Transaction Publishers, 1993.
  • Meyer, Matthew, 2014, Reading Nietzsche Through the Ancients, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Moore, Gregory, 2002, Nietzsche, Biology and Metaphor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • More, Nicholas D., 2014, Nietzsche’s Last Laugh – “Ecce Homo” as Satire, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nabais, Nuno, 1997 Nietzsche and the Metaphysics of the Tragic, Martin Earl (trans.), London: Continuum International Publishing Group, 2007.
  • Nehamas, Alexander, 1985, Nietzsche: Life as Literature, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Oliver, Kelly, 1995, Womanizing Nietzsche: Philosophy’s Relation to the “Feminine”, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Parkes, Graham, 1994, Composing the Soul: Reaches of Nietzsche’s Psychology, Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press.
  • Pippin, Robert B., 2011, Nietzsche, Psychology and First Philosophy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Pletsch, Carl, 1991, Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius, New York: Free Press.
  • Poellner, Peter, 2000, Nietzsche and Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Prange, Martine, 2013, Nietzsche, Wagner, Europe, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Prideaux, Sue, 2018, I am Dynamite! — A Life of Nietzsche, New York: Tim Duggan Books.
  • Rampley, Matthew, 2007, Nietzsche, Aesthetics and Modernity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ratner-Rosenhagen, 2011, American Nietzsche: A History of and Icon and His Ideas, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Reginster, Bernard, 2006, The Affirmation of Life: Nietzsche on Overcoming Nihilism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Remhof, Justin, 2020, Nietzsche’s Constructivism — A Metaphysics of Material Objects, New York: Routledge, Taylor & Francis Group.
  • Richardson, John, 1996, Nietzsche’s System, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2004, Nietzsche’s New Darwinism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2020, Nietzsche’s Values, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ridley, Aaron, 1998, Nietzsche’s Conscience: Six Character Studies from the “Genealogy”, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2007, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Nietzsche on Art, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Rosen, Stanley, 1995, The Mask of Enlightenment: Nietzsche’s Zarathustra, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Safranski, Ruediger, 2002, Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography, Shelley Frisch (trans.), New York: W.W. Norton.
  • Salomé, Lou, 1894, Nietzsche, Siegfried Mandel (ed. and trans.), Redding Ridge, CT: Black Swan Books, Ltd., 1988.
  • Schaberg, William H., 1996, The Nietzsche Canon: A Publication History and Bibliography, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Schacht, Richard, 1983, Nietzsche, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • –––, 1995, Making Sense of Nietzsche: Reflections Timely and Untimely, Champaign, IL: University of Illinois Press.
  • Schrift, Alan D, 1990, Nietzsche and the Question of Interpretation: Between Hermeneutics and Deconstruction, New York: Routledge.
  • Schain, Richard, 2001, The Legend of Nietzsche’s Syphilis, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
  • Shapiro, Gary, 1989, Nietzschean Narratives, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Shaw, Tamsin, 2007, Nietzsche’s Political Skepticism, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Simmel, Georg, 1907, Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, Helmut Loiskandle, Deena Weinstein, and Michael Weinstein (trans.), Urbana and Chicago: University of Illinois Press, 1991.
  • Small, Robin, 2001, Nietzsche in Context, London: Ashgate Publishing.
  • –––, 2005, Nietzsche and Rée: A Star Friendship, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2010, Time and Becoming in Nietzsche’s Thought, London: Continuum.
  • Solomon, Robert C., 2003, Living With Nietzsche: What the Great “Immoralist” Has to Teach Us, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stambaugh, Joan, 1987, The Problem of Time in Nietzsche, John F. Humphrey (trans.), Philadelphia: Bucknell University Press.
  • Steinbuch, Thomas, 1994, A Commentary on Nietzsche’s Ecce Homo, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Welshon, Rex, 2004, The Philosophy of Nietzsche, Montreal and Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
  • White, Alan, 1990, Within Nietzsche’s Labyrinth, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Wilcox, John T., 1974, Truth and Value in Nietzsche, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Young, Julian, 2010, Friedrich Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Nietzsche’s Philosophy of Art, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2006, Nietzsche’s Philosophy of Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

C. Collected Essays on Nietzsche

  • Acampora, Christa Davis (ed.), 2006, Nietzsche’s “On the Genealogy of Morals”: Critical Essays, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Allison, David B. (ed.), 1985, The New Nietzsche: Contemporary Styles of Interpretation, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Ansell-Pearson, Keith (ed.), 2006, A Companion to Nietzsche, Malden, USA/Oxford, UK/Carlton, Australia: Blackwell.
  • Bishop, Paul (ed.), 2004, Nietzsche and Antiquity: His Reaction and Response to the Classical Tradition, Rochester, New York: Camden House.
  • –––, 2012, A Companion to Friedrich Nietzsche: Life and Works, Rochester, New York: Camden House.
  • Bloom, Harold (ed.), 1987, Modern Critical Views: Friedrich Nietzsche, New York, New Haven, Philadelphia: Chelsea House Publishers.
  • Boublil, Élodie, and Christine Daigle, 2013, Nietzsche and Phenomenology: Power, Life, Subjectivity, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Burgard, Peter J. (ed.), 1994, Nietzsche and the Feminine, Charlottesville, VA: University of Virginia Press.
  • Came, Daniel (ed.), 2014, Nietzsche on Art and Life, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Constancio, Joäo and Maria Joäo Mayer Branco (eds.), 2011, Nietzsche on Instinct and Language, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Gemes, Ken, and Simon May (eds.), 2009, Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gemes, Ken, and John Richardson (eds.), 2013, The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Golomb, Jacob (ed.), 1997, Nietzsche and Jewish Culture, London: Routledge.
  • Golomb, Jacob and Robert S. Wistrich (eds.), 2002, Nietzsche, Godfather of Fascism?: On the Uses and Abuses of a Philosophy, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Hemming, Laurence Paul, Bogdan Costea, and Kostas Amiridis (eds.), 2011, The Movement of Nihilism: Heidegger’s Thinking after Nietzsche, London: Continuum.
  • Janaway, Christopher (ed.), 1998, Willing and Nothingness: Schopenhauer as Nietzsche’s Educator, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Janaway, Christopher and Simon Robertson (eds.), 2012, Nietzsche, Naturalism, and Normativity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Katsafanas, Paul (ed.), 2020, The Nietzschean Mind, New York: Routledge, Taylor & Francis Group.
  • Kemal, Salim, Ivan Gaskell and Daniel W. Conway (eds.), 1998, Nietzsche, Philosophy and the Arts, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Knoll, Manuel and Barry Stocker (eds.), 2014, Nietzsche as Political Thinker, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Koelb, Clayton (ed.), 1990, Nietzsche as Postmodernist: Essays Pro and Contra, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Leiter, Brian, and Neil Sinhababu (eds.), 2009, Nietzsche and Morality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Magnus, Bernd, and Kathleen M. Higgins (eds.), 1996, The Cambridge Companion to Nietzsche, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Metzger, Jeffrey (ed.), 2009, Nietzsche, Nihilism and the Philosophy of the Future, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Oliver, Kelly, and Marilyn Pearsall (eds.), 1998, Feminist Interpretations of Friedrich Nietzsche (Re-reading the Canon), University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Parkes, Graham (ed.), 1991, Nietzsche and Asian Thought, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Richardson, John, and Brian Leiter (eds.), 2001, Nietzsche, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rosenthal, Bernice Glatzer (ed.), 1994, Nietzsche and Soviet Culture: Ally and Adversary, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schacht, Richard (ed.), 1994, Nietzsche, Genealogy, Morality: Essays on Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morals, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Scott, Jacqueline, and A. Todd Franklin (eds.), 2007, Critical Affinities: Nietzsche and African American Thought, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sedgwick, Peter R. (ed.), 1995, Nietzsche: A Critical Reader, Oxford, UK and Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
  • Solomon, Robert C, and Kathleen M. Higgins (eds.), 1988, Reading Nietzsche, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Solomon, Robert (ed.), 1973, Nietzsche: A Collection of Critical Essays, Garden City, NY: Anchor Books.
  • Stauffer, Jill, and Bettina Bergo (eds.), 2008, Nietzsche and Levinas: After the Death of a Certain God, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Young, Julian (ed.), 2014, Individual and Community in Nietzsche’s Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Yovel, Yirmiyahu (ed.), 1986, Nietzsche as Affirmative Thinker, Dordrecht: Martinus Nihoff Publishers.

D. Nietzsche’s Music

  • Piano Music of Friedrich Nietzsche, Newport Classics, CD #85513 (1992), John Bell Young (piano)
  • The Music of Friedrich Nietzsche, Newport Classics, CD #85535 (1993), John Bell Young (piano), Thomas Coote (piano), John Aler (voice), Nicholas Eanet (violin)
  • Friedrich Nietzsche, Volume I: Compositions of his Youth (1857–63). Albany Music, CD #178 (1996), Lauretta Altman, Wolfgang Bottenberg, Valerie Kinslow, Eric Oland, The Orpheus Singers
  • Friedrich Nietzsche, Volume II: Compositions of his Mature Years (1864–82). Albany Music, CD #181 (1997), Lauretta Altman, Wolfgang Bottenberg, Sven Meier, Valerie Kinslow, Eric Oland, The Orpheus Singers
  • Friedrich Nietzsche: Piano Works and Fantasy for Violin and Piano, Talent, CD #291031 (1996), Elena Letnanova (piano), Kuniko Nagata (violin)
  • The Music of Friedrich Nietzsche, The Nietzsche Music Project and Media Arts International (2003), Manolis Papasifakis (piano), Thomas Coote (piano), Christian Hebet (violin), David Blackburn (tenor)
  • Friedrich Nietzsche: Selected Works for Piano, Nicholas Hopkins (ed.), New York: Carl Fischer Music, 2017.

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