Supplement to Possible Worlds

Further Problems for Concretism

The Charge of Circularity

Lycan (1988, 1991) and others have disputed the claim that Lewis's account is free of any modalities and hence have questioned whether it really provides an analysis of our modal intuitive notions. The usual charge is that 'world' for Lewis can only mean 'possible world', lest, e.g., there be Lewisian worlds containing impossible objects. It is not clear that this charge has any merit. If an astrophysicist were to conjecture for theoretical reasons the existence of a distant galaxy beyond the reach of any telescope, we would not say that by 'galaxy' the astrophysicist can only mean 'possible galaxy'. We would say simply that the astrophysicist is conjecturing that there is yet another thing of an already familiar sort, viz., galaxies. Modality need not enter the picture at all. It seems that an analogous response is open to Lewis. He is simply conjecturing for theoretical reasons that there is yet another thing — indeed many other things — of an already familiar sort, viz., worlds and, on the face of it anyway, those entities are themselves analyzed in non-modal terms, viz., spatiotemporal relations and mereology. Granted, the picture is a bit muddier in Lewis's case insofar as he wants to claim that the intuitive possibilities include universes in which the laws of nature are quite a lot different from those in our universe and, hence, that there are worlds in which these possibilities are realized. But it is not clear how Lewis's commitment even to such remote worlds requires him to acknowledge a primitive modality. Likewise, we may have strong intuitions that, say, it is impossible that there be stones capable of thought or that 5 plus 7 be something other than 12, and hence that there are no worlds in which those propositions are true. But there is no obvious point at which Lewis is forced to say that there cannot be any such worlds. Rather, all he needs to say is that there is no reason to think that the existence of such worlds is in any way suggested by the recombination principles R1 and R2. (For more in defense of Lewis on this point, see Divers and Melia 2002.)

The Charge of Irrelevance

A frequent objection raised against Lewis — presented forcefully by, e.g., Salmon (1988) — is that, in general, the truth value of a de re modal statement is obviously not determined in any way by how things stand among entities that bear absolutely no spatial or temporal connection to the actual world, among entities that bear no intrinsic connection to us. In a word, what goes on in Lewis's worlds is largely irrelevant to the modal facts of our world. Intuitively, that Socrates could have been a politician has something intrinsically to do with Socrates himself. On Lewis's telling, however, whether Socrates could have been a politician is determined by what happens to someone else, somewhere else. Intuitively, however, what happens to someone other than Socrates in some other world — even a spitting image of him in a world that is a spitting image of ours — has no more to do with what could have happened to him than does what happens to someone who resembles him in, say, New York City.

For all its intuitive force, the objection is arguably question-begging: Lewis's claim is precisely that the allegedly irrelevant connections are what determine modal truth values. The objection, at root, is simply that our semantical intuitions tell us otherwise. Other things being equal, dissonance with strong intuitions can be decisive in a philosophical dispute. However, while consanance with intuitions is desirable, semantical intuitions can be trumped by a theory's explanatory breadth. Thus, as he does in response to the incredulous stare, Lewis would likely argue that we are entirely warranted in ignoring the intuitions in question so long as there is no theory that accommodates them whose explanatory power is at least roughly equivalent to his theory.

Coarse-grained Intensions

Lewis inherits a general problem for the possible world analysis of intensional entities, namely, that they are too "coarse-grained". A proposition p is necessary just in case it is true in all possible worlds. On Lewis's analysis, p is true in w just in case wp. It follows that p is necessary just in case, for all worlds w, wp, i.e., just in case p is the set of all possible worlds. As sets with the same members are identical, it follows that, on the concretist analysis, there is only one necessary truth. This is intuitively problematic. The propositions that all red things have a color and that there are infinitely many prime numbers are, intuitively, quite distinct; one is about a color, the other about a certain type of natural number. Both, however, are necessary and are identical according to the analysis above, intuitions to the contrary notwithstanding. Similar problems arise for properties and relations.

Lewis (1986, 55–59) is of course well-aware of this objection and mounts a sophisticated response. His basic line is that there are numerous conceptions of propositions, properties, and relations, only one of which, admittedly coarse-grained, is captured by the definitions in §2.1.4. More complex set theoretic constructions however can be defined that play the roles of finer-grained intensions as needed. (See §2.2.2 for further discussion.)

Challenges to the Completeness of Lewis's Program

Island Universes

A surprisingly simple challenge to completeness is the problem of island universes. Intuitively, one way things could be is that there are multiple physical universes each of which is spatio-temporally unrelated to all of the others. Why could it not be the case, for example, that the actual world consists of exactly two, symmetrical, physical universes, each the mirror image of the other, as described in Adams 1981, albeit, in addition, spatio-temporally unconnected from each other? For the concretist, such purported possibilities appear to be logically incoherent. For a physical universe is a maximal object in the concretist sense — an object such that anything spatio-temporally related to it is part of it. Hence, the translation of "Possibly, there are multiple spatio-temporally unrelated physical universes" into the concretist framework is "There is a world in which there are multiple worlds". Since all of the objects within a single world are spatio-temporally related, the translation entails that there is an object — a world — all of whose parts are spatio-temporally related such that some of those parts are not spatio-temporally related.

Lewis (1986, 66ff) rejects the possibility of island universes and attempts to explain away the initial intuition. Bricker (2001) argues that Lewis's response does not adequately explain away the intuition and, indeed, argues that they follow from the Humean denial of necessary connections that underlies Lewis's recombination principle R2. He then argues (§3.2) that concretism can accommodate island universes simply by amending the standard analysis of possibility such that a proposition is possible if and only if it is true at some nonempty class of worlds. This allows island universes to be possible (as they will just comprise multiple concrete worlds) without there being a world at which any island universes exist. However, even still, Bricker (ibid., §3.3) points out, this move leaves the concretist unable to countenance the intuitive possibility that the actual world comprises multiple island universes without abandoning the indexical account of ‘actual’ and its cognates and invoking instead an absolute metaphysical distinction between those worlds that are actual and those that are merely possible, a move that Lewis would in no wise accept.

Alien Properties

Another challenge to the concretist concerns so-called “alien properties” (Lewis 1986, 91–92). Intuitively, there could have been things of a very different kind from very different from anything in the actual world, so different, in fact that they are not reasonably thought of as the result of reorganizing duplicates of parts of the actual world — a very different sort of fundamental particle, say. But if so, the challenge goes, recombination does not suffice to account for the existence of the worlds needed to provide truth conditions for this intuitive possibility and, hence, needs supplementation. Divers and Melia (2002) propose a strong principle OAN that entails the existence of infinitely many alien properties but go on to show that, even given the principle, Lewis's translation scheme is still incomplete: Given OAN, there will still be intuitive possibilities that do not translate into truths of concretism (ibid., 31–35).

However, the challenge of alien properties itself is arguably the product of the same misconception noted in §2.1.5. Lewis agrees that recombinations of this-world duplicates do not suffice to “generate” alien possibilities. But this it is a confusion to think that this is the purpose of the principle of Recombination. Recombination is a principle designed, vividly if perhaps only partially, to express the plenitude of worlds; it is not meant as a sort of axiom from which the existence of arbitrary worlds can in some sense be derived. Rather, given any intuitive possibility, it simply follows from the stipulated completeness of Lewis's account that the concrete worlds required for its truth condition exist; Recombination, in turn, expresses the richness of the worlds whose existence follows from those concrete worlds in virtue of the plenitude of logical space.

The Threat of Paradox

Lewis's liberal use of sets in his theory raises the specter of paradox, one concerning the principle of Recombination and another that stems from his adoption of the possible worlds conception of propositions.

Paradox and Recombination

As it stands, the principle R of recombination leads directly to paradox. Forrest and Armstrong 1984 suggest a particularly simple one: The worlds themselves are objects. Moreover, according to Lewis, the worlds form a set W and, hence, there is some number of them. Hence, by R, there is a distinct world w* that itself contains duplicates of all the worlds. Now, let E be the set of electrons in w* and suppose the cardinality of E is κ, which we can safely assume to be infinite. By R again, for every subset E′ of E there is a distinct world wE containing duplicates of exactly those electrons and no others. Hence, there are exactly 2κ such worlds. By hypothesis, there are distinct duplicates of each of those worlds in w* and, hence, w* must contain more electrons than, by assumption, it contains.

A way out of this paradox is to deny that worlds and, hence, objects generally, form sets. Indeed, that they do not seems to follow from R. For R entails that, for any cardinal number κ, there is a world containing at least κ objects. It follows that, for any cardinal κ, there are more than κ objects. Hence, by some basic set theory, there is no set containing all the objects. Assuming furthermore that there is a definite cardinal number of objects in any world, it follows that there is no set of all worlds. But this appears to lead to theoretical disaster as well. For, given Lewis's definitions of intensional entities in §2.1.3, it follows that certain intuitive propositions, properties, and relations do not exist. Notably, there are no necessary propositions. For, on Lewis's account, a proposition p is true in w just in case wp and p is necessary just in case it is true in all worlds, that is, just in case p is exactly the set of all worlds. Likewise, if there is no cardinal limit on the number of counterparts any object can have (and it is difficult to see why there should be), then there is no such thing as the counterpart relation, as the number of pairs ⟨x,y⟩ such that y is a counterpart of x is simply too large to be a set. Lewis, therefore, finds himself forced to place restrictions on R that are arguably ad hoc — notably, that there is a cardinal upper bound on the number of objects that can fit into any possible physical spacetime (1986, 89–90, 101–4). Moreover, these restrictions threaten the completeness of Lewis's program, as certain intuitive modal truths are false under translation into Lewis's metaphysics, notably, the proposition that, for any number n, it is possible that there are n things. (For further discussion, see Forrest and Amstrong 1984, Lewis 1986, 89–92 and 101–104, Nolan 1986, Pruss 2001, and Sider 2009.)

Paradox and Propositions

A second paradox deriving from Kaplan (1995) threatens any account — Lewis's in particular — that follows possible world semantics in defining propositions to be arbitrary sets of worlds (see Davies 1981, 262; Lewis 1986, 104–108; Bueno et al. 2014). Let t be a given time and consider the following thesis:

E For every proposition p, it is possible that p is the only proposition entertained (by anyone) at t.

It follows from E that, for every proposition p, there is at least one possible world unique to p, a world in which that proposition alone is entertained at t. Hence, there have to be at least as many worlds as propositions. But if every set of worlds is a proposition, then, by Cantor's Theorem, there are more propositions than worlds. Contradiction.

Lewis's response is, not implausibly, to deny the thesis E that every proposition — every arbitrary subset of an infinite plenitude of worlds — is possibly the content of some agent's thought (ibid., 105). A consequence of this move is that it raises doubts about the identification of propositions with arbitrary sets of worlds. As noted already in §2.2.2, however, Lewis adopts a very flexible, pragmatic attitude toward the nature of propositions, and, hence, would not find this consequence particularly worrisome.

Copyright © 2016 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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