Supplement to Possible Worlds

The Extensionality of Possible World Semantics

As noted, possible world semantics does not make modal logic itself extensional; the substitutivity principles all remain invalid for modal languages under (basic) possible worlds semantics. Rather, it is the semantic theory itself — more exactly, the logic in which the theory is expressed — that is extensional. Specifically, basic possible world semantics for a given modal language ℒ, when formalized, is expressed in a (non-modal) first-order language ℒPWS that contains the set membership predicate ‘∈’ supplemented with dedicated predicates, function symbols, and constants, as well as mechanisms for talking about the expressions of ℒ and their possible world interpretations, notably:

World(w):    w is a world
T(φ,w):    (formula) φ is true at (world) w
dom(w):    the domain of world w
ext(π,w):    the extension of (n-place predicate) π at world w
den(τ):    the denotation of (constant or variable) τ
@:    the actual world

Thus, for example, by formalizing the definition of truth simpliciter as truth in the actual world:

  • True(φ) =def T(φ,@)

the complete statement of the truth conditions for (6), expressed more formally in ℒPWS, take on the following form:

  • True(‘◻∀x(PxMx)’) ↔ ∀wx((World(w) ∧ xdom(w)) → (xext(‘ P’,w) ∨ xext(‘M’,w))).

The semantic theory for this language ℒPWS, of course, is just our Tarskian semantics above. Thus, the logic of possible world semantics is simply an extensional first-order logic in a dedicated language. It is in this clear sense that basic possible world semantics is an extensional semantic theory for modal languages. It can therefore be said that modal logic with a basic possible world semantics is itself extensional in a derivative sense: the logic that gives full expression to the meanings of modal sentences is extensional in the primary sense that, in that logic, all substitutivity principles are valid.

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Copyright © 2016 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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