Notes to Process Philosophy

1. Among the main theoretical alternatives for an ontological interpretation of the temporal existence of things, contemporary analytical ontology discusses so-called “four-dimensionalism,” “eternalism,” and the “stage theory,” which, interestingly, are all static varieties of Leibniz’ analysis.

2. On the first three topics see Fortescue 2001, Brown 2005, and Herstein 2005, respectively, on the fourth see note 19 below. Process philosophy in the letter or spirit of Whitehead has been the most visible strand of contemporary process philosophy, carried by a larger group of philosophers (see section 7. on institutionalization). Without wanting to diminish the significance of Whiteheadian process philosophy, either in itself nor for process philosophy, this entry is written with the aim to convey that process philosophy is a longstanding and highly diversified enterprise that should not be too closely associated with any particular school or movement.

3. After Whitehead’s Process and Reality, which surely offers a plethora of observations, arguments, and analyses in support of all three of these claims, proposals for process ontology or metaphysics are rarely presented together with an explicit reflection of the conditions of theory revision in philosophy. More recent contributions to process-geared philosophy typically are prefaced by metaphilosophical commentary where some revision targets are highlighted (see e.g., the introduction to Stout 2018 and Nicholson and Dupré 2018); more detailed descriptions of revision targets are given in Seibt 1990, where the substance paradigm (“myth of substance”) is characterized in terms of over 20 ontological presuppositions, but the systematic role of these for other philosophical disciplines beyond ontology is not worked out.

4. The history of process philosophy contains various vague pointers to the link between cognitive habituation and language structure (see e.g., Whitehead 1929: 49). Nowadays the claim can be properly supported, however, by drawing on recent research cognitive linguistics and cognitive science, in particular, on recent studies of linguistic relativity; moreover, research in linguistic typology, especially on the semantics of noun-phrases across languages, can be used to motivate the switch to a process ontology on purely methodological grounds, see Seibt 2015b.

5. The following reconstruction and discussion of Strawson’s argument is based on Rescher 1962 and 1996, ch. 3.

6. See for instance Auxier and Herstein (2017), who offer a new approach to our understanding of explanation in philosophical and cosmological inquiries by way of presenting a comprehensive and novel interpretation of Whitehead’s philosophical and mathematical writings. Given the affinities to Whitehead, Manuel DeLanda’s (2012) elaboration of Deleuze’s process metaphysics may also be understood as a transpositional explication in a wider sense.

7. To be sure, linguistic theories of verb semantics and aspectuality not only offer important data for process ontology: while interpretations of “event structures” in formal semantics predominantly have used the traditional ‘static’ categories (objects, events conceived of as states or extended regions) Bridget Copley and Heidi Harley recently presented a distinctly processual “force-theoretic” semantics, taking “dynamic predicates” to denote forces rather than extended events (see e.g., Copley and Harley 2015)

8. A noteworthy forerunner of these efforts to clarify the logical features of processes vis-à-vis other categories can be found in Zemach 1970. Aristotle’s observation that sentences in the progressive govern different inferences depending on whether they denote activities (seeing) or developments (building a house), respectively, figures central in most ontological and linguistic classifications of occurrence types, from Mourelatos 1978 and Roberts 1979 to the various recent categorizations of Aktionsarten in linguistic aspectology. By contrast, Stout (1997, 2015) and Steward (1997, 2013) disregard this inferential difference and take every sentence with progressive aspect to denote a “process”, contrasting these with “events”, which are denoted by sentences with perfective aspect. This has the effect that as long as ‘processes’ (thusly conceived) are going on, one cannot distinguish between—what intuitively appear to be—‘non-directed’ goings-on (e.g., a dry leaf’s swirling in the wind) and ‘directed’ goings-on (e.g. the metamorphosis of a frog); only retrospectively we can classify ‘events’ (thusly conceived) into non-directed activity-like events and directed developmental events (Stout 2018). Galton and Mizoguchi (2009) explore in greater detail the logical differences between processes and events, with Galton later (2012, 2018) settling on a conception of processes as abstract patterns of “states”. In parallel, the Vendler/Kenny classification also launched and reinforced research on actions per se, i.e., on the logic of action discourse for different types of actions, see e.g. Stout 1996, 2018; Kühl 2008. Based on Kenny’s classification, Fink (1973) argues that only certain types of occurrences can be the subject of value judgments — an important result for the ontology of values. These approaches follow by and large the methodological tradition of P.F. Strawson’s “descriptive metaphysics” and take the conceptual analysis of our common-sense reasoning about occurrence types already to amount to an ontology of occurences. By contrast, Seibt argues that our common-sensical distinctions among occurrence types merely provide (some of) the data for a process ontology. She suggests (2004, 2015b) a classification of basic occurrence types in terms of inferential networks of sentences with different aspects (“aspectual inference networks”). This has two advantages. First, the above-mentioned distinction between activity-like goings-on and developmental goings-on can be drawn—whether the sentence ‘Max is mending his shirt’ denotes an activity-like going-on (Max is doing some shirt-mending) or a developmental going-on (Max is working towards the goal of his shirt being mended), follows from the inferences licensed by the sentence. Second, if occurrence types are not distinguished with reference to a particular verbal aspect (the “progressive”) but with respect to aspectual inference networks, the classification corrects for language-specific systematic differences of aspect semantics; in this ways the classification is more likely to hold across languages.

9. See Seibt (2009, 2015, 2018a). More recently the non-particularist conception has gained more supporters: T. Crowther (2012, 2017) defends the conception of processes as stuffs against recent particularist views: M. Soteriou (2013) argues that such a conception proves advantageous for the task of making sense of the unity of human experience (2013); and J. Hornsby (2012) has suggested that human activities are best understood as non-particular individuals.

10. See Steward (2012) and Stout (2018), which collects contributions from main protagonists of this recent process turn in the ontology of mind. See also below section 4, (iii).

11. See Rescher (1996 ch. 3), and Rubenstein (1997). To be sure, the idea that general or determinable entities are concrete has been around since Aristotle; the novel twist is to allow for determinable entities to be “subjectless” processes (C.D. Broad); see also Sellars (1981). Deacon (2012) argues that “constrained processing” represents generality, since a (e.g., causal) constraint on what can happen amounts to a removal of specific features in what is happening.

12. For a refurbishment of Whitehead’s account of persistence see Simons (2008) and, in spirit if not in letter, Galton (2006); Seibt (1997, 2008, 2017) deconstructs the dichotomy of endurance (persistent entities are identical in time but not extended in time) versus perdurance (persistent entities exist in time by having a temporal part that exists at that time) and argues for a “recurrence account” of persistence: persisting entities are identical (i.e., the same concrete non-particular individual) in time and may be temporally extended. Since Seibt’s “dynamics” or “general processes” are functionally individuated like stuffs, some of them exist in time like stuffs exist in space; that is, they are not only, as Aristotle observed, “homeomerous” (like-parted) in time or space, but “automerous” (sameparted) in the sense that they literally, as the same individual, recur throughout the parts of the spatial or temporal region in which they occur: they permeate a region of space, time, or spacetime. For criticism of this account see Oakes 2017.

13. The idea that a process philosophy can put (rudimentary forms of) normativity into nature is argued in Bickhard (2004, 2022), where selfmaintenance of far-from-equilibrium systems is explained in terms of functional presuppositions among processes, and further developed in Campbell’s (2011) study on truth as a property of actions (see also below, section 4 (iii). Similarly, Deacon (2012) explains the emergence of information and normativity as in terms of an increasingly complex architecture of constraints within natural systems, channeling and redirecting the natural tendency towards entropy increase. — As pointed out above in section 1, in view of recent research on embodied cognition, emergence, and non-linear mechanistic explanations, it also can be argued that Wilfrid Sellars’ naturalism prefigures a process-based naturalization of normativity, especially since Sellars distinguishes between different kinds or degrees of normativity (Seibt 2016).

14. For a process view of God as sketched in (v) see Rescher 1996, ch. 9. In connection with this issue it might be useful to restate the caveat from section 2, drawing attention to the fact that this entry does not detail the contributions of process thought to process theism. While many American process philosophers, especially Whiteheadians, have been inclined to address general theological questions within the exposition of a process metaphysics, it should be noted that in the current international research landscape that this article is trying to do justice to, theism is not an integral element of a process philosophy. Many researchers currently working on process-philosophical themes do not consider the nature of God an inevitable or even legitimate subject for their research. This need not be taken as an indication of the increasing atheism among process philosophers, but merely as an effect of the increasing specialization of academic research. Guided by the philosophy of Charles Hartshorne and, more recently, stimulated and promoted by the work of J. L. Cobb and D.R. Griffin, the area of “process theology” by now has become a diversified field of inquiry of its own, combining philosophy of religion and theology (often Christian theology but more recently also the theology of religions).

15. It is not quite clear whether Salmon’s analysis of causation (as well as Dowe’s (1992) modification, the “conserved quantity view”) is indeed committed to processes in the relevant sense that distinguishes them from sequences of states; for a process view of causation where this commitment is explicit see Ingthorsson (2002).

16. In Whiteheadian process metaphysics such mutual dynamic dependencies are introduced by way of informal definitional characterizations—they are included in the description of how prehensions, subjective aim and subjective form of an actual entity relate to each other. In a non-Whiteheadian process ontology one might need to resort to non-standard mereologies in order to state such dependencies more precisely, see below section 5.

17. For the use of (non-Whiteheadian) process ontology for an interpretation of certain concepts of chemistry see Needham (1999, 2003) and Guttinger (2017); Stein (2004) has offered a Whiteheadian process metaphysics for chemistry.

18. See the introduction in Nicholson and Dupré 2018, as well earlier arguments in Dupré (2012, ch. 10 and 11, partly co-authored with Maureen O’Malley). Surveying results from the biology of microbes and metagenomics, Dupré argues that phenomena of horizontal or lateral gene transfer as well as fundamental symbiotic dependencies between microbes and their embedding multicellular communities present a severe challenge to the traditional notion of the monogenomic biological individual (organism) as the focal unit of inheritance and selection. “Life is in fact a hierarchy of processes (e.g., metabolic, developmental, ecological, evolutionary) and...any abstraction of an ontology of fixed entities must do some violence to this dynamic reality” (p. 188f), which displays more the form of a net than single lineages within a ‘tree of life.’

19. Hättich (2004) has adapted the Whiteheadian framework for an interpretation of axiomatic quantum field theory. For more general expositions of a Whiteheadian approach to the interpretation of quantum physics see, e.g., Eppersen (2004) and Stapp (2007). The collected volume by Eastman, Epperson, and Griffin (2016) offers new perspectives on cross-fertilizations between (quantum) physics and speculative philosophy, with focus on the role, and the metaphysical interpretation of, of potentiality. Some contributors set out a framework of “relational realism” that includes a modal realism; e.g., operating with category theory instead of set theory, Michael Epperson (2016) and Elias Zafiris (2016) explore new approaches to the decoherence interpretation of measurement, treating the difference between actuality and potentiality as a feature of reality. Other contributors promote “process physics” outright as an “information-theoretic modeling of reality”) (Klinger 2016, Cahill 2016). Since the tension between relativity theory and quantum physics notoriously has forced physics currently into a mode of theory formation that is in the vicinity of speculative thought, it is here where philosophical explorations may have particular heuristic value for science. Moreover, given that here an space of inquiry has opened up that can benefit from fresh ideas, the philosophical mainstream may do well to pay attention to proposals that explore new explanatory models (see for example C. Carlson’s (2004, 2009) suggestion to ground space-time and energy in causal networks of basic chunks of becoming (“time”); J. Brenner’s suggestion to refurbish dialectics in connection with information-theoretic modelling (Brenner 2008, 2010); or T. Eastman’s (2021) proposal to combine Boolean and non-Boolean logics to arrive at a systematic interpretation of reality including the quantum-physical domain).

20. See e.g., Rovelli 2014, 2020. As highlighted recently by Martin Calamari (2021), Rovelli’s conception of becoming presents a profound challenge to mainstream analytical ontology and metaphysics, given the latter’s vestiges of substance metaphysics.

21. See e.g., Bickhard (2000, 2022) and Campbell/Bickhard (2011), as well as Wimsatt (1997), where emergence and reducibility are defined in terms of types of interactions with a physical system. Within the context of (partly speculative) molecular biology, Deacon (2012) offers a detailed description of the process structures that realize the emergences of two distinctive dynamics, “morphodynamics” (in other parlance “self-maintenance” or “autopoiesis”) and “teleodynamics” (akin to Bickhard’s “recursive selfmaintenance”), which each are (partly ‘self’-referential) constraint structures on thermodynamic processes of energy dissipation (“homeodynamics”).

22. For the first articulation of a process view of cognition see especially the work of Mark Bickhard, a longstanding protagonist of the “interactivist” outlook on cognition as cross-disciplinary intersection for research in cognitive science, psychology, and philosophy; Bickhard’s many papers center on embodied cognition but in effect lay out a comprehensive naturalist process metaphysics, which he recently has been able to summarize in one comprehensive exposition (Bickhard 2022). – Proponents of process-based or interaction-based approaches to cognition, information, and representation do not always agree on the description of the decisive process architectures. On Bickhard’s view low-grade forms of cognition can be attributed to systems with certain process architectures independently of the causal evolutionary history of these systems; in contrast, Terrence Deacon (2010, 2011) has argued that the evolutionary embedding of a certain dynamics is definitionally constitutive for the occurrence of information. While Bickhard and Deacon aim to describe in some detail the process architectures that accomplish various aspects of 4E cognition, the most recent work on enacted predictive processing has only begun to explore in greater detail the ontological significance of mathematical descriptions of the mind as process (see e.g. Ramstead et al. 2021).

23. In Zemach 1970 and Roberts 1979 we find early suggestions that processes endure in time; Stout (2015) even speaks of “occurrent continuants.” See also footnote 8.

24. Galton (2017a, 2017b, 2023) suggests that what appear to be different types of continuants (e.g., chunks of matter, objects, assemblies, organisms, or collectives) are different sorts of processual complexes, which can be distinguished by way of determining which processes perform a taxonomic set of roles (such as formation, persistence, impingement, resilience, destruction). Similarly, “General Process Theory” maintains as a research hypothesis that a five-dimensional classificatory matrix suffices to define processes that are the ontological counterparts for all basic types of concrete entities that common-sense and scientific reasoning is committed to; the first of these dimensions distinguishes ten ways in which a dynamics is distributed in space and time (Seibt 2015, 2018).

25. “Levelled mereology” (Seibt 2009, 2015a) is a non-transitive mereology that allows for formal representations of process structures with feedback loops and certain forms of self-referentiality, including representations of dynamic wholes whose functioning both conditions and is conditioned by their parts. Such process structures with whole-part interdependencies constitute a distinctive explanatory advantage, as illustrated by the process-philosophical account of personhood in section 3 above.

26. The editors’ introduction to Duprè and Nicholson 2018 offers an instructive overview over main figures in the “organicist” school in philosophy of biology during the first decades of the twentieth century and its relationship to Whitehead.

27. For an extensive and in-depth treatment of questions of complexity see Rescher’s 1998; for the axiological question addressed here see in particular his 2012.

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