Supplement to Challenges to Metaphysical Realism

The Model-Theoretic Argument and the Completeness Theorem

It will be useful to first state the logical theorems on which the argument is based. Let us start with the Completeness Theorem. In 1930 Kurt Gödel proved that a certain type of predicate logic, first-order logic without identity (which we shall sometimes denote as FOL), is complete in the sense that all sentences of that logic that are true under every interpretation can be derived within that logic. This means that every set of FOL sentences S that is ‘syntactically’ consistent (i.e. consistent in the sense that no contradiction can be derived from S within this logic), also has a model [See the entry on Kurt Gödel for further details and a proof of the theorem].

The other theorem we shall need for the Model-Theoretic Argument below goes by the name of the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem. To understand this theorem, one needs to first know something of the work of the nineteenth century mathematician Georg Cantor in set theory—specifically, his discovery of the different sizes of infinity. Cantor showed that infinite sets could be subdivided into those whose elements could be counted in the sense that their elements could be put into one to one correspondence with the natural numbers and those whose elements could not in this sense be counted. The set of integers is countable, as, surprising as it may seem, is the set of rational numbers. The set of real numbers, however, along with the set of complex numbers and the set of all subsets of the natural numbers are all uncountably infinite. Cantor called the size of an infinite set its cardinality [See the entry on the early development of set theory].

The Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem states that if a a set of FOL sentences has an infinite model, it has a model whose domain is countably infinite. The Upward Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem states that if a countable set of FOL sentences has an infinite model of some cardinality \(\kappa\) then it has a model of every infinite cardinality [See the entry Skolem’s paradox for the history of the theorems and the philosophical issues concerning them]. The Model-Theoretic Argument now proceeds thus:

Suppose we had an ideal theory which passed every observational and theoretical test we could conceive of. Assume this theory could be formalized in first-order logic. Assume also that the world is infinite in size and that our formalized ideal theory \(T\) says it is. Assume, finally, \(T\) is consistent. Then given these assumptions, Putnam argues, we can show that \(T\) is also true:

Firstly, as \(T\) is syntactically consistent, by the Completeness Theorem for first-order logic, \(T\) will have a model. Then by the Upward Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem, there exists a model elementarily equivalent to the model generated by the Completeness Theorem that is of the same size as the world (since by the Upward Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem \(T\) will have models of every infinite size). Call this model \(M\).

Nothing in the construction of \(M\) guarantees that the objects in its domain are objects in the real world. To the contrary, the domain of \(M\) may be comprised wholly of real numbers for example. So to obtain, as required, a model whose domain consists of objects in the world, use Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem once more to project the model \(M\) onto the world by generating from \(M\) a new model \(W\) whose domain consists of the objects in the world and which assigns to all the predicates of \(T\) subclasses of its domain and relations defined on that domain.

We now have a correspondence between the expressions of the language \(L\) in which \(T\) is expressed and (sets of) objects in the world just as the realist requires. \(T\) will then be true if ‘true’ just means ‘true-in-\(W\)’.

If \(T\) is not guaranteed true by this procedure it can only be because \(W\) is not the intended model. Yet all our observation sentences come out true according to \(W\) and the theoretical constraints must be satisfied because T’s theses all come out true in \(W\) also. So the realist owes us an explanation of what constraints a model has to satisfy for it to be ‘intended’ over and above its satisfying every observational and theoretical constraint we can conceive of.

Copyright © 2021 by
Drew Khlentzos <>

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