## Notes to Boltzmann’s Work in Statistical Physics

1. Cf. the following words of
E.G.D. Cohen, (a student of Uhlenbeck, who was a student of Ehrenfest
who studied with Boltzmann): “The depth of ill-feelings … and
the resistance to [Boltzmann's] ideas … still resonated for me
when Uhlenbeck said to me one day in some mixture of anger and
indignation ‘that damned Zermelo, a student of Planck's *nota
bene*’ an echo after two generations of past injustice and pain
inflicted on Boltzmann by his hostile environment.” (Cohen 1996,
5).

2. The remarkable degree of consent between Mach and Boltzmann has led one commentator (Blackmore 1982) into thinking that Boltzmann abandoned realism altogether.

3. Note that the recent thoughtful biography by Cercignani (1998) carries the subtitle: “the man who trusted atoms”, not “the man who believed in atoms”.

4. Sommerfeld writes: “The battle between Boltzmann and Ostwald resembled the battle of the bull with the supple fighter. However, this time the bull was victorious … . The arguments of Boltzmann carried the day. We, the young mathematicians of that time, were all on the side of Boltzmann …” (Höflechner 1994, I, 167). A similar opinion was voiced by Arrhenius.

5. For example, the well-known passage in Boltzmann (1896b) in which he heaps praise on Zermelo, for providing the first evidence that Boltzmann's papers were actually being read at all in Germany, cannot be taken seriously, coming 8 years after he had been offered Kirchhoff's chair in Berlin and membership of the Prussian Academy. Another example of Boltzmann's love of provocation is his article on Schopenhauer which he entitled “Proof that Schopenhauer is an empty-minded, ignorant, nonsense-spreading philosophaster who thoroughly degenerates heads by selling hollow talk”, but was published, after editorial intervention, as ‘On a thesis by Schopenhauer’ (Boltzmann 1905, 240).

6. It has even been suggested
that “Maxwell apparently never read any of the papers that Boltzmann
wrote after about 1870” (Klein 1973). But this is not true. There are
several occasions where Maxwell refers to the Boltzmann equation and
*H*-theorem from 1872 and to other Boltzmann papers from 1874
and 1876.

7. This is not to say that he always conflated these two interpretations of probability. Some papers employ a clear and consistent choice for one interpretation only. But then that choice differs between papers, or even in different sections of a single paper. In fact, in (1871c) he even multiplied probabilities with different interpretations into one equation to obtain a joint probability. But then in (1872) he conflates them again. Even in his last paper (Boltzmann and Nabl 1904) we see that Boltzmann identifies the two kinds of probability with a simple minded argument.

8. The literature contains
some surprising confusion about how the hypothesis got its name. The
Ehrenfests borrowed the name from Boltzmann's concept of an
*Ergode*, which he introduced in
(Boltzmann 1884) and also discussed in his *Lectures on Gas
Theory* (Boltzmann 1898). But what did Boltzmann actually
understood by an *Ergode*? Brush points out in his translation of
(Boltzmann 1898, 297) and similarly in
(Brush 1976, 364), that Boltzmann used the
phrase to denote a stationary ensemble, characterized by the
microcanonical distribution in phase space. In other words, in
Boltzmann's (1898) usage an *Ergode* is just an
micro-canonical ensemble, and has very little to do with the so-called
ergodic hypothesis. Brush criticized the Ehrenfests for causing
confusion by their terminology.

However, in his original (1884) introduction of the phrase, an
*Ergode* is a stationary ensemble with only a single integral
of motion. As a consequence, its distribution is indeed
micro-canonical, but, what is more, every member of the ensemble
satisfies the hypothesis of traversing every phase point with the
given total energy. Indeed, in that text, being an element of an
Ergode and satisfaction of this hypothesis are equivalent. The
Ehrenfests were thus completely justified in baptizing the hypothesis
“ergodic”.

Another dispute has emerged concerning the etymology of the term. The
common opinion, going back at least to the Ehrenfests has always been
that the word derived from *ergos* (work) and *hodos*
(path). Gallavotti (1994) has argued however that “undoubtedly” it
derives from *ergos* and *eidos* (similar). Now one must
grant Gallavotti that one would expect the etymology of the suffix
“ode” of ergode to be identical to that for Boltzmann's “holode”,
“monode”, “orthode” and “planode”, and that a reference to path would
be somewhat unnatural in these last four cases. However, I don't
believe a reference to *eidos* would be more natural. Moreover,
it seems to me that if Boltzmann intended this etymology, he would
have written “ergoide” in analogy to “planetoide”, “ellipsoide”,
etc. That he was familiar with this common usage is substantiated by
him coining the term “momentoide” for momentum-like degrees of freedom
(i.e., those that contribute a quadratic term to the Hamiltonian) in
(Boltzmann 1892). The argument mentioned by Cercignani (that
Gallavotti's father is a classicist) fails to convince me in this
matter.

9. Indeed, in the rare occasion in which he later did mention external disturbances, it was only to say that they are “not necessary” (Boltzmann 1895b). See also (Boltzmann 1896, §91).

10. Or some hypothesis compatible with the quasi-ergodic hypothesis. As it happens, Boltzmann's example is also compatible with the measure-theoretical hypothesis of ‘metric transitivity’.

11. Actually Boltzmann formulated the discussion in terms of a distribution function over kinetic energy rather than velocity. We have here transposed this into the latter, nowadays more common formulation.

12. The term “cyclic” is missing in Brush's translation.

13. Actually, as the
Ehrenfests showed more clearly, there is also a third possible case,
namely (c): *H*_{0} lies on a local minimum of the
curve. But that case is even more improbable than case (b) above.