Supplement to Value Theory

Atomism/Holism about Value

G.E. Moore is famously among those who have believed that intrinsic value must be an intrinsic property or supervene on intrinsic properties. If intrinsic value is an intrinsic property, however, how intrinsically good something is shouldn’t be able to change, simply on the basis of its environment or surroundings. What makes it good, after all, isn’t the surroundings, but its intrinsic properties, which it can retain in different environments.

But this idea is challenged by a class of examples, in which environment seems to make a difference. One common such example is pleasure, which is often said to be intrinsically good. It is often argued that pleasure in someone else’s pain is not, itself, good. Since Moore held that whether pleasure was non-instrumentally good could not change as a matter of what caused the pleasure, but took such cases seriously, he conjectured that cases like this one have to be explained by the hypothesis that while pleasure is always intrinsically good, pleasure whose object is suffering forms part of a complex whole, pleasure-at-suffering, which is intrinsically bad (exactly bad enough to outbalance how good the pleasure it involves is). Moore’s word for such wholes was “organic unity”.

So Moore’s doctrine of organic unities was driven by his idea that non-instrumental value was an intrinsic property, or at least supervened on intrinsic properties. It preserves the atomistic idea that something that is genuinely non-instrumentally good must be equally good, no matter what environment it is in, and hence the idea that non-instrumental value is an intrinsic property, from apparent counterexamples like this one. Moore’s explanation competes with the holistic idea that such cases can be taken at face value, as cases in which pleasure, though usually non-instrumentally good, turns out not to be good after all. Holism about value has been recently defended by Jonathan Dancy [2004].

Holism about value, so understood, may be closer to the surface phenomena than Moore’s Atomism about value and his doctrine of organic unities, but it creates questions that by itself, it leaves unanswered. For example, when someone takes pleasure in someone else’s pain, why is it that the pleasure is bad because of its object, rather than that the pain is even worse, because someone took pleasure in it? (Brown [2007]) Since Moore identifies the badness with the unity involving both the pleasure and the pain, there is no question here for him to answer, except perhaps to explain why we (incorrectly) treat them asymmetrically. But since Dancy’s holism treats the pleasure and the pain asymmetrically, there is a real question here for his view to answer.

Moore’s atomism also has the advantage of underwriting his evaluative epistemology. To know what is intrinsically good, Moore says, consider how good it would be in isolation. If holism is true, this is not a reliable test for intrinsic value, because what is good in isolation may not be even intrinsically good under other conditions. As a corollary, the holist’s evaluative epistemology must allow that we have direct insight into what is intrinsically good, whereas Moore’s evaluative epistemology is built on ordinary judgments of goodness, which are not differentiated between intrinsic and instrumental goodness.

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Copyright © 2021 by
Mark Schroeder <>

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