Wilhelm Maximilian Wundt

First published Fri Jun 16, 2006; substantive revision Fri Oct 21, 2022

Wilhelm Maximilian Wundt (1832–1920) is known to posterity as the “father of experimental psychology” and the founder of the first psychology laboratory (Boring 1950: 317, 322, 344–5),[1] whence he exerted enormous influence on the development of psychology as a discipline, especially in the United States. Reserved and shy in public (cf. Kusch 1995: 249, f.), Wundt aggressively dominated his chosen arenas, the lecture hall and the pages of books, with a witty and sardonic persona (cf., e.g., Wundt 1911a: 61; Boring 1950: 317). His scope was vast, his output incredible. His writings, totaling an estimated 53,000 pages, include: articles on animal and human physiology, poisons, vision, spiritualism, hypnotism, history, and politics; text- and handbooks of “medical physics” and human physiology; encyclopedic tomes on linguistics, logic, ethics, religion, a “system of philosophy;” not to mention his magna opera, the Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie and the Völkerpsychologie (in ten volumes).[2] Although his work spans several disciplines—physiology, psychology, and philosophy—Wundt would not have considered himself an “interdisciplinary” or “pluralistic” thinker: he was to the core a foundationalist, whose great ambition was establishing a philosophico-scientific system of knowledge, practice, and politics (see Section 7, below) (Boring 1950: 327). Despite his intentions, however, the sheer length of his career (some 65 years) and the volume of his output make it hard to speak of a coherent Wundtian doctrine.[3] His corpus is riven by tensions and ambiguities, and though his work has undergone periodic scholarly reconsiderations, Wundt’s lasting importance for the field of psychology remains the topic of lively debate among psychologists.[4]

For philosophers, Wundt is worth studying for two reasons. First, the arguments he made more than a century ago for the legitimacy of a non-reductionist account of consciousness offer both challenges and resources to contemporary psychology and philosophy of mind alike. Should those arguments be found lacking, there remains a second, perhaps more important reason to read him: not understanding Wundt is to tolerate a lacuna at a crucial nexus of the recent history of philosophy. Not only was he a powerful influence (albeit mostly by repulsion) upon the founders of Pragmatism, Phenomenology, and neo-Kantianism, it was also Wundt and his pioneering students who developed the empirical methodologies that first granted psychology a disciplinary identity distinct from philosophy. It is these philosophically germane aspects of his thought that this article describes.

1. Biographical Timeline

born at Neckarau/Mannheim, August 16
enters Bruchsal Gymnasium
study of medicine at Tübingen
study of medicine at Heidelberg
first publication “on the sodium chloride content of urine”
medical assistant at a Heidelberg clinic
semester of study with J. Müller and DuBois-Reymond at Berlin;
doctorate in medicine at Heidelberg; habilitation as Dozent in physiology;
nearly fatal illness
Privatdozent at the Physiological Institute, Heidelberg
Beiträge zur Theorie der Sinneswahrnehmung; Helmholtz becomes director of the Heidelberg Physiological Institute
first lectures in psychology
Vorlesungen über die Menschen- und Tier-Seele
made ausserordentlicher Professor; lectures on physiological psychology (published as Wundt 1873–4)
fails to be named Helmholtz’s successor at Heidelberg; army doctor in Franco-Prussian War
publishes Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie[5]
called to Zürich to the professorship in “inductive philosophy”;
called to Leipzig as professor
founds the Institut für Experimentelle Psychologie, Leipzig; birth of son, Max
Philosophische Studien founded
Logik, 2 vols.
Ethik, 3 vols.
System der Philosophie, 2 vols.
Rector of Leipzig University
Völkerpsychologie, 2 vols.
retires from teaching; replaced by his student, Felix Krueger (Sluga 1993: 95)
dies at Grossbothen, near Leipzig, at the age of 88, August 31

2. Life & Times

Wilhelm Maximilian Wundt was born on August 16, 1832, in the German town of Neckarau, outside of Mannheim, the son of a Lutheran minister (Titchener 1921b: 161). The family moved when Wilhelm was six to the town of Heidenheim, in central Baden (Boring 1950: 316). By all accounts, he was a precocious, peculiar boy, schooled mainly by his father’s assistant, the vicar, Friedrich Müller; young Wilhelm was so attached to Müller that he moved in with him when the latter got a post in a neighboring village (Boring 1950: 316). Wundt studied at the Gymnasien at Bruchsal and Heidelberg and entered the University of Tübingen at 19, in 1851 (Boring 1950: 317). After one year he transferred to the University of Heidelberg, where he majored in medicine. By his third year, his intense work ethic yielded his first publication (Boring 1950: 318). Nevertheless, doctoring was not Wundt’s vocation and he turned instead to physiology, which he studied for a semester under Johannes Müller (the “father of experimental physiology”) at Berlin (Boring 1950: 318). In 1856, at the age of 24, Wundt took his doctorate in medicine at Heidelberg, and habilitated as a Dozent in physiology. Two years later, the physicist, physiologist, and psychologist, Hermann von Helmholtz,[6] received the call to Heidelberg as a professor of physiology, a decisive moment for Wundt’s career, with Wundt working as Helmholtz’s assistant from 1858 until 1865 (Boring 1950: 300, 319; Araujo 2014: 55).

When Helmholtz moved to Berlin in 1871, Wundt was passed over as Helmholtz’s replacement; three years later he took the chair in “inductive philosophy” at the University of Zürich. He remained at Zürich for only one year before receiving an appointment to “a first-class chair of philosophy at Leipzig in 1875” (Ben-David and Collins 1966: 462). Leipzig’s philosophy department, dominated by Herbartians, provided the ideal environment for his intellectual flowering, the soil having been prepared by Fechner, Weber, and Lotze (Littman 1979: 74; cf. Kim 2009). Wundt became famous at Leipzig. It was here, in 1879, that the university formally recognized his little room of equipment as a bona fide laboratory, the world’s first devoted to psychology.[7] Students flocked to Wundt,[8] and while he set the tone and direction of research, it was largely they who constructed apparatus, performed experiments, and published results.

Enrollment in his courses doubled about every 15 years, reaching a peak of 620 students in the summer of 1912. Wundt ended up sponsoring 186 Ph.D. dissertations, about a third of which apparently involved purely philosophical topics (Tinker, 1932). (Quote—including reference to Tinker–from Hearst 1979b: 22)

Though Wundt participated actively in labor politics in his early years at Heidelberg, even being elected to the Baden parliament, he steadily drifted rightwards, eventually being persuaded by his “virulently anti-Semitic”[9] son, Max, a historian of philosophy, to join the ultranationalist Deutsche Philosophische Gesellschaft, after 1917.[10] It is hard to ignore Wundt’s unattractive “application” of his late social and cultural psychology to the tendentious critique of Germany’s enemies (Kusch 1995: 220–1). Nevertheless, his drive and unflagging intellectual advocacy will arouse admiration in some: even at age 80, he remained involved in academic controversy.[11] But let us consider the man through his work.

To understand Wundt’s philosophical importance one must know something of his intellectual context. Early nineteenth-century German psychology labored under the looming shadow of Kant and his arguments that a science of psychology is in principle impossible. This fact by itself illustrates the oddity of the situation, from our point of view: why would a psychologist care what a philosopher thought about his practice? The answer is that since ancient times, psychology had been a basic part of philosophical speculation, though after Kant’s criticisms many considered it a dying branch, dangerously close to breaking off. Psychologists were philosophers on the defensive (cf. L III: 163).

Psychology, as a part of philosophy, had already several times changed the way it defined its object: as “soul”, “mental substance”, “mind”, etc. By the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries, many regarded psychology to be the account of consciousness or “inner experience”, distinct from the natural scientific accounts of external, sensible reality. After having dealt the coup de grâce to the speculative, rational, a priori psychology of the soul epitomized by Christian Wolff, however, Kant tried to cut off any retreat into the empirical study of consciousness, as well. In the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, he argued that empirical psychology cannot be an exact science because the phenomena it seeks to explain are not mathematically expressible (Kitcher 1990: 11). Moreover, it can never become an experimental science “because it is not possible to isolate different thoughts” (Kitcher 1990: 11). Finally, and most fatally, the only access to the phenomena of inner experience, introspection, ipso facto alters those phenomena: if I try, by introspection, to study what it’s like to be tristful, the phenomena of my sadness are now something different, namely, phenomena of my sadness-being-studied-by-me (Kitcher 1990: 11). Thus psychologists found their object declared beyond the limit of possible investigation and their methods vain. While such arguments did not persuade all of Kant’s successors of the hopelessness of their enterprise, their attempts were unpromising. On the one hand, the German Idealists’ fanciful speculation about Geist collapsed upon itself. On the other hand, the efforts of J.F. Herbart to devise a mathematical mental mechanics suggested a possible way forward although in the end it proved equally fruitless. Thus, for those mid-nineteenth-century enthusiasts of mental phenomena, the future of a genuine psychology seemed blocked.

At the same time, however, progress was being made in human physiology, especially of the sensory systems. In 1834, the physiologist, E.H. Weber, published a startling discovery in his De tactu. His experiments on the sensation of weight had led him to find that there obtains a constant ratio between, on the one hand, a given stimulus and, on the other hand, a second stimulus sufficiently larger for the difference between the two stimuli to be just noticeable, no matter the magnitude of the first stimulus.[12] In other words, if the first stimulus is of intensity \(I\), then \(\Delta I\) is the amount by which it must be increased for the difference to be just noticeable; the ratio of \(I\) and \(\Delta I\) is constant (\(k\)): \(\Delta I / I = k\) (cf. L III: 186). This equation, which later came to be known as Weber’s Law,[13] was crucial to the development of psychology because it apparently demonstrated that where Herbart had failed in his aprioristic construction of mathematical regularities of mind, experimentation could succeed. The situation nevertheless remained murky as interpretations of Weber’s Law multiplied. Fechner, for example, elaborated Weber’s experiments but took his results as the basis for an arcane panpsychic monism (Wundt’s own “psychological” interpretation is treated in Section 4) (cf., e.g., Boring 1950: 286).

In founding the experimental science of psychology, Wundt in effect “triangulated” a media via between the available options: he rejected Fechner’s mysticism while maintaining his experimental approach; at the same time, Wundt went beyond the purely physical interpretation of physiological experiments à la Helmholtz, arguing that at least in humans experimentation could reveal law-like regularities of inner (psychological) reality. Thus, to use the phrase of Ben-David and Collins, he established the “hybrid science” whose dual provenance is expressed in Wundt’s name for it, “physiological psychology” (Ben-David and Collins 1966: 459; Kusch 1995: 122, ff.).[14] Wundt’s interest, both to scholars of the history of philosophy and to contemporary philosophers of mind, flows ultimately from the definition, methodology, and “metaphysics” of this physiological psychology. Sections 3 and 4 are devoted to a description of its definition, method, and doctrine, while Section 5 is concerned with its theoretical underpinnings. The practical and theoretical limits of experimental psychology will be treated in Section 6, on Völkerpsychologie.

3. Experimental psychology: object and method

3.1 Object

“The exact description of consciousness [Bewusstsein] is the sole aim of experimental psychology” (cited by Titchener 1921b: 164). Wundt identifies “physiological” with “experimental” psychology.[15] Thus, for Wundt, experimental psychology is the unmediated study of consciousness, aided by the experimental protocols of the natural sciences. Yet this definition involves two contestable assumptions: first, that “consciousness” is susceptible to experiment (rejected by Kant); second, that psychology, even if conceived as experimental, has for its object consciousness or “the mental” (later rejected by the Behaviorists) (cf. Hearst 1979b: 10). Let us focus on the first assumption, since it is one Wundt addresses.

Wundt defines consciousness as “inner experience;” it is only the “immediately real”[16] phenomena constituting this experience, and nothing behind or beyond it, that is the object of psychological, as opposed to physiological or psychophysical investigation (PP II: 636). Wundt’s project is not only a “psychology without a soul”, in F.A. Lange’s phrase, but also a science without a substrate tout court.[17] Wundt therefore presents himself as a radical empiricist. The subject of psychology “is itself determined wholly and exclusively by its predicates”, and these predicates derive solely from direct, internal observation (on which below). The basic domain of inquiry, accordingly, is that of “individual psychology” (cf. e.g. L III: 160, ff), i.e. of the concrete mental contents appearing to particular human beings, and not some mental substance or bundle of faculties.[18] In Wundt’s declaration that individual psychology must become a science via the experimental manipulation of inner phenomena, we see a pragmatic attitude perhaps peculiar to the working scientist: the future science as doctrine takes shape in and through the present practice of experimentation, its essays, assays, trials, and errors. Instead of simply submitting to Kant’s injunctions against the very possibility of a scientific psychology, Wundt finds that certain aspects of our inner experience can be, and in fact have been, made susceptible to experiment and mathematical representation: Weber and Fechner did this.

3.2 Method

Nevertheless, Wundt repeatedly addresses the objections raised against the very possibility of psychological, as opposed to physiological or psychophysical, experimentation. How are we to subject the mind-body complex to physiological stimulation such that the reactions may be given a purely psychological interpretation? From the physiological point of view, experimentation with stimulus and response are not experiments of sensation, but of externally observable excitations and reactions of nerve and muscle tissue. For example, a nerve fiber or a skin surface may be given an electric shock or brought into contact with acid, and twitches of muscle fiber are observed to follow. It is obvious, especially when the nerve-tissue in question belongs to a dead frog (Wundt describes such an experiment in PP), that these experiments say nothing about the “inner” experience or consciousness of sensation. Wundt’s innovation is the attempt to project the experimental rigor of physiology into the domain of inner experience by supplementing these experiments with a purely psychological set of procedures. These procedures constitute Wundt’s well-known yet misunderstood method of Selbstbeobachtung, i.e. “introspection” or, better, “self-observation”.

Because “inner” distinguishes itself from “external” experience by virtue of its immediacy, all psychology must begin with self-observation, so that physiological experiment is given an ancillary function (Boring 1950: 320–21). Now Wundt is well aware of the common criticism that self-observation seems inescapably to involve the paradoxical identity (described in the previous section) of the observing subject and observed object. Indeed, he takes pains to distinguish his notion of self-observation from that of “most advocates of the so-called empirical psychology”, which he calls “a fount of self-delusions [Selbsttäuschungen]”:

Since in this case the observing subject coincides with the observed object, it is obvious that the direction of attention upon these phenomena alters them. Now since our consciousness has less room for many simultaneous activities the more intense these activities are, the alteration in question as a rule consists in this: the phenomena that one wishes to observe are altogether suppressed [i.e., by the activity of focused attention upon them]. (L III: 162)

Wundt believes that one can experimentally correct for this problem by

using, as much as possible, unexpected processes, processes not intentionally adduced, but rather such as involuntarily present themselves [sich darbieten]. (L III: 162)[19]

In other words, it is in the controlled conditions of a laboratory that one can, by means of experimenter, experimental subject, and various apparatus, arbitrarily and repeatedly call forth precisely predetermined phenomena of consciousness. The psychologist is not then interested in the psychophysical connections between the somatic or nervous sense-mechanisms and the elicited “inner” phenomena, but solely in describing, “and where possible measuring”, the psychological regularities that such experiments can reveal, viz., regular causal links within the domain of the psychic alone (L III: 165). According to Wundt, psychological experiments thus conceived accomplish in the realm of consciousness precisely what natural-scientific experiments do in nature: they do not leave consciousness to itself, but force it to answer the experimenter’s questions, by placing it under regulated conditions. Only in this way is

a [psychological] observation [as opposed to a mere perception {Wahrnehmung}] at all possible in the scientific sense, i.e., the attentive, regulated pursuit of the phenomena. (L III: 165)[20]

A detailed account of these experiments themselves, however, lies far beyond the scope of this article.[21]

4. Wundt’s “individual psychology”

4.1 Sensation

Wundt, like most early experimental psychologists,[22] concentrated his investigations upon sensation and perception; of all psychic phenomena, sensation is the most obviously connected to the body and the physical world (Hearst 1979b: 33). For Wundt, sensations and our somatic sensory apparatus are especially important for the project of physiological psychology for the simple reason that sensations are the “contact points” between the physical and the psychological (PP I: 1). Sensations (Empfindungen), as the medium between the physical and psychic, are uniquely susceptible to a double-sided inquiry,[23] viz. from the “external” physical side of stimulus, and the “internal” psychological side of corresponding mental representation (Vorstellung).[24] The Wundtian psychologist therefore controls the external, physiological side experimentally, in order to generate diverse internal representations that can only “appear” to the introspective observer. According to Wundt, the representations (Vorstellungen) that constitute the contents (Inhalt) of consciousness all have their elemental basis in sensations (Empfindungen) (PP I: 281).[25] Sensations are never given to us as elemental, however; we never apperceive them “purely”, but always already “combined” (verbunden) in the representation of a synthesized perception (PP I: 281). Yet, the manifestly composite nature of our representations forces us to abstract such elementary components (PP I: 281) (cf. PP II: 256). Pure sensations, according to Wundt, display three differentiae: quality, intensity, and “feeling-tone” (Gefühlston) (PP I: 282–3).[26]

His treatment of quality and intensity are especially important for getting a clearer notion of his notion of psychological experimentation. It is a “fact of inner experience” that “every sensation possesses a certain intensity with respect to which it may be compared to other sensations, especially those of similar quality” (PP I: 332). The outer sensory stimuli may be measured by physical methods, whereas psychology is given the corresponding

task of determining to what degree our immediate estimation [Schätzung] [of the strength of sensory stimuli] that we make aided by our sensations—to what degree this estimation corresponds to or deviates from the stimuli’s real strength. (PP I: 332–3)

There are two possible tasks for psychophysical measurement of sense-stimuli: the “determination of limit-values between which stimulus-changes are accompanied by changes in sensation”; and “the investigation of the lawful relations between stimulus-change and change in sensation” (PP I: 333). Sensation can thus be measured with respect to changes in intensity corresponding to changes in strength of stimuli (PP I: 335–6).

Weber’s Law (WL) is the most striking example of such a relation, and Wundt’s interpretation of WL sheds much light on what he means by “physiological psychology”. Wundt writes:

We can formulate [this law] as follows: A difference between any two stimuli is estimated [geschätzt] to be equal if the relationship between the stimuli is equal. Or: If in our apprehension [Auffassung] the intensity of the sensation is to increase by equal amounts, then the relative stimulus-increase must remain constant. This latter statement may also be expressed as follows: The strength of a stimulus must increase geometrically if the strength of the apperceived sensation is to increase arithmetically. (PP I: 359)

Now these various formulations[27] of WL admit, as Wundt says, of three different, and indeed incompatible interpretations; that is, there are three different conceptions of what WL is a law of. First, the physiological interpretation takes it as a manifestation of the “peculiar laws of excitation of the neural matter;”[28] second, the psychophysical (Fechnerian) interpretation takes WL as governing the interrelation between somatic and psychic activity (PP I: 392). Wundt rejects both of these in favor of a third, the psychological interpretation; his arguments are instructive. Against the physiological interpretation Wundt raises the following main point, viz. that

the estimation of the intensity of sensation (Empfindungsintensität) is a complicated process, upon which—in addition to the central sensory excitation—the effectiveness of the center of apperception will exert considerable influence. We can obviously say nothing immediate about how the central sense-excitations would be sensed independently of the latter; thus Weber’s Law, too, concerns only apperceived sensations, and therefore can just as well have its basis in the processes of the apperceptive comparison of sensation as in the original constitution of the central sensory excitations. (PP I: 391–2)

Now apperception (see below) is a purely psychological act in consciousness—and it is solely as a law of the psychological processes involved in the “measuring comparison of sensations” that Wundt understands WL (PP I: 393). In other words, WL

does not apply to sensations in and for themselves, but to processes of apperception, without which a quantitative estimation of sensations could never take place. (PP I: 393; cf. PP II: 269)

Wundt sees WL as simply a mathematical description of the more general experience that

we possess in our consciousness no absolute, but merely a relative measure of the intensity of the conditions [Zustände] obtaining in it, and that we therefore measure in each case one condition against another, with which we are obliged in the first place to compare it. (PP I: 393)

For this reason Wundt’s “psychological interpretation” makes WL into a special case of a more general law of consciousness, viz. “of the relation or relativity of our inner conditions [Zustände]” (PP I: 393). WL is therefore not a law of sensation so much as of apperception.

This solution typifies Wundt’s general view that the domains of psychic and physical phenomena do not stand in conflict, but rather constitute separate spheres of (causal) explanation. His interpretation of WL nicely illustrates how, on his view, physiological experiments can yield mathematically expressible results, not about the physical, somatic processes involved in sensation, but about the relationships among these sensations as apperceived, i.e., as psychological elements and objects of consciousness. He writes that “the psychological interpretation offers the advantage of not excluding a simultaneous [i.e. parallel] physiological explanation” (presumably once the neurophysiological facts of the matter have been better elucidated — cf. PP I: 391); by contrast, the two competing interpretations “only permit a one-sided explanation” of WL (PP I: 393).

4.2 Consciousness

Psychology finds consciousness to be constituted of three major act-categories: representation, willing, and feeling; our discussion is limited to the first two. Now while Wundt is forced to speak of representations and representational acts as distinct, he is nevertheless clear that they are merely different aspects of a single flowing process. This is his so-called theory of actuality (Aktualitätstheorie) (1911a: 145). Representations are representational acts, never the “objects with constant properties” propounded by adherents of a so-called theory of substantiality (Substantialitätstheorie) (1911a: 145). This identity of representation and representational act typifies what we may call Wundt’s “monistic perspectivism”.[29] Everywhere he insists that the “psychic processes form a unitary flow of events [einheitliches Geschehen[30] ]”, the constituents of which—“representing, feeling, willing, etc.”—are “only differentiated through psychological analysis and abstraction” (1911a: 145). Keeping in mind the underlying active unity of the psychic, let us examine some of Wundt’s “analyses and abstractions”.

As discussed in the previous section, all consciousness originates in sensations. These, however, are never given to consciousness in a “pure” state as individual sensory atoms, but are always perceived as already compounded[31] into representations (Vorstellungen), that is, into “images of an object or of a process in the external world” (PP II: 3; 1). Representations may be either perceptions (Wahrnehmungen) or intuitions (Anschauungen): the same representation is called a “perception” if considered as the presentation of objective reality, and an “intuition” if considered in terms of the accompanying conscious, subjective activity (PP II: 1). If the representation’s object is not real (cf. PP II: 479) but merely thought, then it is a so-called reproduced representation.[32]

Now the formative process, by which sensations are connected into representations either through temporal sequencing or spatial ordering (PP II: 3), constitutes a main aspect of the activity we call consciousness; the other is the “coming and going of [these] representations” (PP II: 256). On the evidence of “innumerable psychological facts”,[33] Wundt claims that all representations are formed through “psychological synthesis of sensations”, and that this synthesis accompanies every representational act (PP II: 256). We are therefore entitled to take the act of representational synthesis as a “characteristic feature of consciousness itself” (PP II: 256). Although consciousness consists in the formation of representations, on the one hand, and of the coming and going of such representations, on the other hand—i.e., although its contents are a continuous streaming of fusing and diffusing representations—yet it is not merely this (PP II: 256). We are also aware within our consciousness of another activity operating upon our representations, namely of paying them attention (PP II: 266).

Attention may be understood in terms of the differing degrees to which representations are present (gegenwärtig) in consciousness. These varying degrees of presence correspond to the varying degrees to which consciousness is “turned towards [zugewandt]” them (PP II: 267). Wundt appeals to an analogy:

This feature of consciousness can be clarified by that common image we use in calling consciousness an inner vision. If we say that the representations present [gegenwärtig] at a particular moment are in consciousness’s field of vision [Blickfeld], then that part of the field upon which our attention is turned may be called the inner focal point of vision [Blickpunkt]. The entry of a representation into the field of inner vision we call “perception”, and its entry into the focal point of vision we call “apperception”. (PP II: 267)

Thus consciousness is a function of the scope of attention, which may be broader (as perception) or narrower (as apperception[34] ). Apperception, in turn, may either actively select and focus upon a perceived representation, or it may passively find certain representations suddenly thrusting themselves into the center of attention (PP II: 267; 562). There is no distinct boundary between the perceived and the apperceived, and Wundt’s analogy may be misleading (cf. esp. PP II: 268) to the extent that it gives the impression of two separable forms of attention able in principle to subsist together simultaneously (that is, apperception focusing upon a point in the perceptual field while that field continues to be perceived). No: perceptive attention becomes apperceptive attention just as it focuses more strenuously, constricting the perceptive field. The more it contracts, the “brighter” the representation appears, now becoming the focal point of apperception as the fringes of the perceptual field retreat into “darkness” (PP II: 268). For Wundt, the distinguishing feature of the apperceptive focus is that it “always forms a unitary representation”, so that a narrower focal point (or rather, the focal “field” [PP II: 268; 477]) results in a correspondingly higher intensity of attention (PP II: 269). Hence

the degree of apperception is not to be measured according to the strength of the external impression [i.e. physically or physiologically], but solely according to the subjective activity through which consciousness turns to a particular sense-stimulus. (PP II: 269)

Thus, apperception[35] is closely akin to the will, indeed is a primordial expression of will: “the act of apperception in every case consists in an inner act of will [Willenshandlung]” (L I: 34). By contrast, Wundt argues that the processes by which the representations are themselves formed, fused, synthesized, and “delivered” into the perceptual field, are associative processes “independent of apperception” (PP II: 278–9; 437, ff). Passive apperception may be characterized simply by saying that here the associative form of representational connection is predominant (cf. L I: 34), whereas when “the active apperception successively raises representations into the focal field of consciousness”, this active passage of representations obeys the special laws of what Wundt calls “apperceptive connection” (PP II: 279). He does not consider the types of association to be genuine psychological laws, i.e. laws governing the “succession of representations”, because they merely generate the possible kinds of representational compounds. It is apperception, in accordance with its own laws, that “decides” which of these possible connections are realized in consciousness (L I: 34). We see here the important role played by his so-called voluntarism:[36] associationist psychologists, according to Wundt, cannot give an account of the (subjective) activity that immediately characterizes consciousness (cf. Wundt 1911b: 721, ff.; Lipps 1903: 202, ff.; cf. esp. L I: 33). Yet this is not to deny association of sensations altogether. Rather, it is to conceive of association as merely a subliminal process, the products of which, representations, then become the actual objects of consciousness. Thus the “apperceptive connections of representations presuppose the various types of association”, especially the associative fusion[37] of sensations into representations.[38]

Apperception operates according to its own peculiar laws (PP II: 470). These laws, like those of association, govern acts of combination (Verbindung) and separation (Zerlegung). How do apperceptive laws differ from those of association? Wundt writes:

Association everywhere gives the first impetus to [apperceptive] combinations. Through association we combine, e.g., the representations of a tower and of a church.[39] But no matter how familiar the coexistence of these representations may be, mere association does not help us form the representation of a church-tower. For this latter representation does not contain the two constitutive representations in a merely external coexistence; rather, in the [representation of the church-tower], the representation of the church has come to adhere [anhaften] to the representation of the tower, more closely determining the latter. In this way, the agglutination of representations forms the first level of apperceptive combination. (PP II: 476; on “agglutination of representations”, see also L I: 38, f.)

It is on the basis of such “agglutinative” representations, exhibiting characteristics essentially different from their constituents, that apperception continues to synthesize ever more representations, a process resulting in their compression (Verdichtung) or displacement (Verschiebung) (PP II: 476–7; cf. L I: 43). The more the original associative or agglutinated representations are compressed or displaced, the more they disappear altogether from consciousness, leaving in their stead a single representation whose original composite structure has disappeared. This process, which Wundt calls “representational synthesis” proper, is reiterated at ever higher levels until even the sensory foundation vanishes, as in the case of abstract and symbolic concepts (L I: 39).

Apperception is not only a synthetic process; it is also governed by rules of separation. Apperceptive separation operates only upon the representations already synthesized out of the “associative stock [Assoziationsvorrath]”, but does not necessarily decompose them into their original parts (PP II: 478). Wundt’s notion of apperceptive separation is one of the most philosophically original, consequential, and ambiguous of his theories. He argues that it is usually the case that

the original representational totality [ursprüngliche Gesammtvorstellung] is present to our consciousness at first as an indistinct complex of individual representations. These individual parts and the manner of their connection become distinct only through the separative activity of apperception. (PP II: 478)

Thus, conscious thought and judgment (on judgment, see SP I: 34, ff., esp. 37, ff.) (separating and combining subject and predicate) is not, as may seem at first blush, an act of

gathering together [representational] components and then fitting them together in the successive articulation of the total representation [Gesammtvorstellung]. (PP II: 478)

Rather, “the whole, albeit in an indistinct form, must have been apperceived prior to its parts” (PP II: 478). Only in this way can one explain the

well-known fact that we can easily and without trouble finish [composing] a complicated sentence-structure. This would be impossible if the whole had not been represented at the outset. The accomplishment of the judgment-function therefore consists, from the psychological point of view, only in our successively making clearer the obscure outlines of the total picture [Gesammtbild], so that at the end of the composite thought-act the whole, too, stands more clearly before our consciousness. (PP II: 478)

Because according to Wundt’s principle of “actuality [Aktualität]” consciousness is purely an activity, it is impossible to render his theory in terms of “structures”. It consists in constantly interacting processes: on the one hand, there are associative processes that fuse sensations into elemental representations. These stream into and thereby constitute a fluctuating field of attention: flowing and broad, it is called “perception;” ebbing and concentrate, “apperception”. As an activity, attention is an expression of will; since consciousness just is attention in its shifting forms, it is the activity of will manifested in the selection, combination, and separation of disposable representations (PP II: 564). These representations are constantly “worked over” by apperception, which through its synthetic and diaeretic activity constructs them into ever “higher developmental forms of consciousness”, such that in the end their origins in sensation and perception might be completely erased. In other words, as the apperceptive activity becomes increasingly intense it seems as it were to rise above the field of perception, above the field of its own constructs, becoming aware of itself as pure activity, as pure self-consciousness:

rooted in the constant activity [Wirksamkeit] of apperception, [self-consciousness] … retreats completely into apperception alone, so that, after the completion of the development of consciousness, the will appears as the only content of self-consciousness…. (PP II: 564)[40]

Thus the self as will appears to itself as independent from and opposed to an external world of both sensation and culture, though Wundt hastens to add that this is but an illusion; in reality, “the abstract self-consciousness maintains constantly the full sensible background of the empirical self-consciousness” (PP II: 564).[41]

5. The theoretical framework of experimental psychology

As we have seen (Section 3.2), for Wundt the possibility of a physiological psychology (as opposed to a purely physiological inquiry into sensation, behavior, learning, etc.) depends on the possibility of self-observation. Self-observation, in turn, is of scientific use only if the sequence of “inner” phenomena of consciousness is assumed to fall under an independent principle of psychic causality. For if it does not, then these phenomena could never be more than a chaotic muddle, of which there could be no science. Alternatively, if the “inner” phenomena could be shown to fall under the physical causality of the natural sciences, then there would be no need for a special psychological method, such as self-observation (cf. Natorp 1912). In fact, however, a system of psychic causality can be determined, Wundt argues, one that at no point is reducible to physical causality: “no connection of physical processes can ever teach us anything about the manner of connection between psychological elements” (Wundt 1894: 43, quoted in Kusch 1995: 134). This “fact”, which Wundt thinks is given in the psycho-physiological experiments described above, leads him to his so-called principle of psychophysical parallelism (PPP).

The PPP has caused a great deal of confusion in the secondary literature, which persists in characterizing it as a metaphysical[42] doctrine somehow derived from Leibniz (e.g., Wellek 1967: 350; Thompson and Robinson 1979: 412) or Spinoza (cf. L I: 77). Wundt however is crystal-clear that the PPP is not a metaphysical “hypothesis”. It is merely an admittedly misleading name for an “empirical postulate” necessary to explain the phenomenal “fact” of consciousness of which we are immediately aware (Wundt 1911a: 22; cf. esp. 28). By denying any metaphysical interpretation of his principle, Wundt insists that the “physical” and the “psychic” do not name two ontologically distinct realms whose events unfold on separate yet parallel causal tracks. He is therefore not an epiphenomenalist, as some commentators have claimed. Rather, the “physical” and “psychic” name two mutually irreducible perspectives from which one and the same world or Being (Sein) may be observed: “nothing occurs in our consciousness that does not find its sensible foundation in certain physical processes”, he writes, and all psychological acts (association, apperception, willing) “are accompanied by physiological nerve-actions” (PP II: 644). In distinguishing the empirical from the metaphysical PPP, Wundt contrasts his own view against Spinoza’s, which, according to Wundt, makes the realm of material substance exist separately from, though parallel to that of mental substance (Wundt 1911a: 22, 44–5; cf. esp. Wundt 1911a: 143, ff.).

The investigator of psychological phenomena, therefore, must assume, solely for heuristic reasons, two “parallel” and irreducible causal chains by which two distinct types of phenomena may be accounted for (Wundt 1911a: 143; cf. Van Rappard 1979: 109). Wundt compares the distinction between psychological and physiological explanation to the different viewpoints taken by chemistry and physics of the same object, a crystal. The chemical and physical accounts are not of two different entities; rather, they describe and explain the same entity from two distinct points of view, and in this sense the two accounts are “parallel”. Similarly, (neuro-) physiology and psychology do not describe different processes, one neural and one mental, but the same process seen from the outside and the inside, respectively. As Wundt writes,

“inner” and “outer” experience merely designate distinct perspectives that we can apply in our grasp and scientific investigation of what is, in itself, a unitary experience. (Wundt 1896a; quoted at Natorp 1912: 264).

6. Völkerpsychologie

Whereas experimental psychology focuses in the first place on the effects of the physical (outer) upon the psychic (inner), the willing consciousness is characterized by intervening in the external world, that is, by expressing the internal (PP I: 2). This latter feature of consciousness lies beyond the scope of experiment, because the origins of conscious expression cannot be controlled. Moreover, psychological development is obviously not determined merely by sensation, but also by the meaningful influences of the individual’s “spiritual [geistig] environment”—his culture—influences again not obviously susceptible to experimentation.[43] Hence, just as Wundt reserved for physiology an ancillary role in experimental psychology, so too he now argues for the utility of a distinct methodological approach to analyze and explain the

psychic processes that are bound, in virtue of their genetic and developmental conditions, to spiritual communities [geistige Gemeinschaften]. (L III: 224)

It is the inquiry into “cultural products [Erzeugnisse]” of the “totality of spiritual life [geistiges Gesammtleben] in which certain psychological laws have embodied themselves”, specifically, language, art, myth, and customs (Sitten) (PP I: 5; L III: 230). These objects cannot be investigated in the same way as those of individual “inner” experience, but require a mode of explanation appropriate to their external, yet non-physical phenomenology. This inquiry, which complements and together with experimental psychology completes the discipline of psychology, Wundt calls “Völkerpsychologie” (hereafter abbreviated: VP) (L III: 225).[44]

While Wundt had already discussed the role of a VP necessary for the completion of psychology in his early writings, it was not until old age that he committed himself to its realization. The result was his ten-volume work, entitled Völkerpsychologie. While an examination of the contents of these tomes lies beyond the scope of this article, his justification and clarification of the völkerpsychologisch project as such are of interest for those interested in truth and method in the social and human sciences. Wundt stresses that although VP shares object-domains with such sciences as history, philology, linguistics,[45] ethnology,[46] or anthropology (L III: 226), yet it is only interested in these domains insofar as they “are determined by general psychological laws, and not just by historical conditions” (PP I: 5). In other words, VP is not interested in the unique and specific facts of this nation’s history or that tribe’s language as such, but only insofar as these reveal “the general psychological developments that arise from the connection of individual [developments]” (L III: 226). This quotation is important. While VP does not concern itself with historical or linguistic facts as such, this does not mean that it is not concerned with individuality. Indeed, it is through the study of the psychological motives only apparent in history or language—i.e., in communal existence—that our understanding of the individual is completed (cf. L III: 224, 228). This view is typical of Wundt’s perspectivism. Just as psychology is an alternative perspective to that of physiology, so too (within psychology) VP provides an alternative perspective to that of experimental psychology. Wundt considers none of these various perspectives dispensable, since each one is a complement necessary for total science. But while each of these perspectives reveals a (phenomenologically) irreducible (“parallel”) network of causal chains, the process so explained, Wundt holds, is in every case one and the same. There is just one empirical world and reality, but many irreducible varieties of experience. Thus, in the case of VP, too, he claims that there is no “general law of spiritual events [geistiges Geschehen] that is not already completely contained in the laws of the individual consciousness” (L III: 225).

7. The order of knowledge

7.1 Psychology in its relation to the sciences

As we have seen, Wundt was concerned not only with expanding the set of known psychological facts, but also with interpreting them within an appropriate explanatory framework. Of course, the necessity of establishing such a closed framework distinct from physiology amounted to distinguishing psychological causality from physical causality in general, and hence psychology from the natural sciences altogether. But psychology has to be defined against two other areas of “scientific” (wissenschaftlich) inquiry; first, in its völkerpsychologisch dimension, against the Geisteswissenschaften or “human sciences”, and second, against the non-psychological domains of philosophy. As these relationships are laid out below, it must always be remembered that although these four areas—psychology, philosophy, natural science, human science—are irreducible, this irreducibility is not a metaphysical or ontological one, but merely one of explanatory function (and commensurate methodology). They do not have distinct objects, but again merely represent ways of describing irreducible perspectives upon the same object, namely experience. Wundt writes:

Objects of science do not in and of themselves yield starting points for a classification of the sciences. Rather, it is only regarding the concepts that these objects call for that we can undertake this classification. Therefore, the same object [Gegenstand] can become the object [Objekt] of several sciences: geometry, epistemology, and psychology each deals with space, but space is approached in each discipline from a different angle. … The tasks of the sciences are therefore never determined by the objects in themselves, but are predominantly dependent upon the logical points of view from which they are considered. (SP I: 12–3; cf. L III: 228)

Wundt’s monism has serious consequences for the sort of claim philosophy (and thus psychology) can make to be scientific. The most obvious is that neither can lay claim to synthetic knowledge that is not founded in or (also) describable in terms of the natural or human sciences.

For Wundt, it is only the sciences that have methodologies by which to synthesize our representations, sensible as well as “processed”, into “facts” or “pieces of” knowledge (Erkenntnisse). Hence, while strictly speaking he is committed to considering psychology (i.e., physiological psychology and VP) a part of philosophy, he usually speaks of them as distinct enterprises. This is because psychology is hybrid, adapting scientific methodologies to its particular aims; in this sense psychology, although part of philosophy, synthesizes facts, just like the sciences.[47] By contrast, philosophy’s pure task is universal, operating over all scientific domains; it is, he writes, “the general science whose task it is to unify the general pieces of knowledge yielded by the particular sciences into a system free of contradiction” (SP I: 9). Philosophy’s positive role, therefore, is not to provide the foundations of science, nor can it ever “step into the role of a particular science” (cf. Kusch 1995: 129); rather it is “to take in every case the already secured results of those sciences as its foundation”, and organize them into a single, overarching system by determining their points of connection (PP I: 8; 6). Wundt calls this side of philosophy Prinzipienlehre or “doctrine of principles”. By contrast, its negative or critical role is to regulate the sciences in accord with the imperative of consistent systematicity. In short, it has no constitutive but merely a regulative role vis-à-vis the sciences. Thus, when we return to the philosophical as opposed to the scientific aspect of psychology’s hybrid structure, we see that this aspect consists in its aim (as opposed to its method) of explaining rules of genesis, connection, and separation of those mental representations with an epistemic character. Wundt calls this psychological contribution to philosophy Erkenntnislehre or “doctrine of knowledge” (i.e., the theory of the coming-to-be of knowledge). This explanation then provides to philosophy the scientific foundation for its pure task.[48]

Wundt divides up the sciences into two large families, the “formal” sciences and the “real” sciences. The former include mathematics; the latter study the natural and spiritual aspects of reality,[49] and correspondingly are divided into the natural and the human sciences. The human sciences in turn are divided into two genera, one of which deals with spiritual processes (geistige Vorgänge), the other with spiritual products (geistige Erzeugnisse). The former just is the science of psychology; the latter includes the general study of these products as such (e.g., philology, political science, law, religion, etc.), as well as the parallel historical study of these products as they have in fact been created (This taxonomy is given in SP I: 19–20). Since the process precedes the product (cf. Kusch 1995: 132), psychology as “the doctrine of spiritual [geistig] processes as such” is the foundation of all the other human sciences (SP I: 20).[50] Philosophy, in turn, takes psychology’s results and again abstracts from them the normative rules governing the organization of the human and natural sciences, something the latter cannot do themselves. In this way psychology as a science mediates between the sciences and philosophy.

7.2 Psychology and logic

One aspect of Wundt’s hierarchy of method and knowledge deserves special attention, namely the place of logic in the sciences. Like almost all the similarly titled tomes produced by the German mandarins, Wundt’s Logik (in two, later three 600-page volumes in four editions) molders away in research libraries. Its contents are for the most part unrecognizable as “logic” in any contemporary sense. What most philosophers meant by “Logik” in Wundt’s day was the rules and procedure of inference governing the sciences, where this often included lengthy treatments of the actual scientific application of these rules. What we would expect to find in a book called “Logik” today, viz., symbolic or mathematical logic, was called at that time “Logistik”, and was considered by some a mathematical (that is, merely formal) game unworthy of philosophy’s scientific (that is, substantive) role (cf., e.g., Natorp 1910: 4–10). Thus we should not be surprised to read Wundt, too, declare logic’s task to be the justifying and accounting for “those laws of thinking active in scientific knowledge” (L I: 1).

For Wundt, however, this task involves psychology, and indeed much of his Logik is devoted to this topic. As he reasonably points out, logic comprises the rules of correct thinking, and the principles of logic are known to us as conscious representations (L I: 76; 13; cf. Wundt 1920: 267); thinking and consciousness are objects of psychological inquiry; therefore any account of logic must include a psychological description of the genesis of logical principles (L I: 13). Even the normative character of logic had, in his view, to be given a psychological interpretation (cf. L I: 76). Inevitably Wundt was accused of logical psychologism—the all-purpose term of abuse flung about in fin-de-siècle German philosophical debate. Husserl, for example, condemned him for expounding an “extreme” form of psychologism (Husserl 1901: 124–5; cf. Farber 1943: 123, 208, ff.; cf. Wundt 1910b: 511, ff.), viz. “species-relativism”, the notion that “truth varies with different species” of animal (Kusch 1995: 49). Yet Wundt himself calls his Logik the “most rigorous rejection of the psychologism that reigned at the time [i.e., 1880]” (Wundt 1920: 264), and held that “logical thinking is universally binding for every thinker” (Wundt 1920: 266). How can we reconcile these statements?

Wundt’s view of logic is unusual, but fully in line with his rigorously anti-metaphysical monistic perspectivism. That is, there is no logical “third realm”, but merely a single process called “thinking [Denken]” (L I: 6); it is an immediately given fact of thinking that there are logical laws that stand over against all our other thoughts and representations as norms (L I: 76). Their psychological immediacy does not, Wundt thinks, compromise their normativity, since what is given in consciousness precisely is their normative character.[51] Once this character is taken for granted, the science of logic develops its systems of correct deductions (Schliessen) without further worry about the source of that normativity. All that remains is “develop[ing] the foundations and methods of scientific knowledge” (L I: 8).

According to Wundt, the three features of logical thinking that set it apart from all other types of representational connection are its “spontaneity, evidence, and universal validity [Spontaneität, Evidenz, Allgemeingültigkeit]” (L I: 76). Let us briefly describe these. Wundt’s notion of the spontaneity of logical thinking is perhaps the most psychologistic-sounding of the three. Because, as was described above, thinking is

experienced immediately as an inner activity, … we must regard it as an act of will [Willenshandlung], and accordingly regard the logical laws of thought [Denkgesetze] as laws of the will. (L I: 76–7)

In other words, logical thinking is accompanied essentially by a feeling of the thinking subject’s freedom in thinking. But while logical thinking may be accompanied by an especially strong self-awareness of the mind’s own activity, this feeling is not unique to logical thinking, since active apperception more generally is also accompanied by the sense of subjective activity. By contrast, logical evidence and universal validity are characteristics possessed by logical thinking “to a higher degree than by any other psychic function” (L I: 78). By “evidence”, Wundt means the character of compelling necessity accompanying a logical judgment, what we might call self-evidence (L I: 78, 79). A thought (Gedanke) may exhibit immediate certainty, obvious without any mediating thought-acts; or a thought may be mediately certain, grounded in prior thought-acts. Immediate and mediate evidence have their source and foundation in intuition (Anschauung): immediate evidence immediately, mediate evidence mediately (L I: 82–3). Intuition is not identical with evidence, for evidence only

comes to be at the moment when logical thinking relates the contents of intuition and presupposes the relations of such intuitive contents as objectively given. (L I: 83)

Wundt thus charts a middle course between, on the one hand, making logical evidence a “transcendent or transcendental” function of thinking (as Kant and “recent speculative philosophy” are alleged to do), and, on the other hand, considering it an “empirical trait of sensible objects” (as do empiricists and positivists) (L I: 83).

By the standards of such philosophers as Husserl, Natorp, and Frege, Wundt appears committed to a logical psychologism. But it is worth considering his response to this charge, for it again illustrates his monistic perspectivism. While he rejects any interpretation of the origin of logical principles that would impugn their normative character of necessity, he also rejects the opposite extreme, what he calls “Logizismus”—the complete divorce of logical thinking from thinking as it actually occurs in minds. For Wundt, the logicist makes a metaphysical leap as suspect as it is unnecessary in conjuring up a “pure”, “absolute”, “transcendental”, but in any case separate source of logical normativity (cf. Wundt 1910b: 515). Instead of solving the puzzle of logical normativity, he exacerbates it by adding the puzzles of the ontological status of a third realm, or of a transcendental ego, or of “pure thinking”, and the influence of all of these on your thinking as you read this. Wundt finds a simpler solution in his perspectivism. The logical may be considered “purely” from a logical point of view, i.e., in terms of its normative character, or “genetically” from a psychological point of view. But there are no logical laws that are not also describable psychologically, just as there is no psychological phenomenon not also describable physiologically. But being “describable” in this sense is not the same as being explicable, and it is this separate task of explanation that falls to logic and psychology, respectively. The logical description saves the phenomenon of normativity, just as the psychological description saves the phenomenon of the interiority of consciousness.

8. Conclusion

Wundt’s conception of psychology was always controversial. At least in Germany, the struggle over the status and philosophical meaning of “consciousness” resulted, on the one hand, in the exclusion of Wundtian empiricism from philosophy departments, striving to maintain their speculative purity, and, on the other, the institutional establishment of experimental psychology as an independent discipline. This was not the outcome Wundt had desired. He had wished to reform philosophy, not as a synthetic science, but with a direct, indispensable, juridical relation vis-à-vis both the natural and human sciences. He never saw his psychological scientism as a threat to philosophy—on the contrary, he considered his psychology to be a part of philosophy (cf. Boring 1950: 325), one necessary for philosophy to take its proper place in the totality of the sciences. Indeed, philosophy could only assume that position through the mediating position of psychology (PP I: 3). Yet academic philosophers, denied the possibility of any legislative or executive functions in the sciences, rejected the juridical ones as well, bitterly resisting contamination of their pure pursuit by the empiricism of the new psychology. In Germany, resistance was especially stiff among neo-Kantians, and later the Phenomenologists. In the end, the quarreling parties ineluctably assumed positions similar to their opponents’—though of course in a “purified” way.[52]

Let us return to James’s mean remark[53] about Wundt: he has no noeud vital, no central idea, and so this would-be Napoleon-planarian can never be “killed all at once”. Setting aside Wundt’s need to be killed at once or in bits, a fair and attentive reader will respectfully reject such scintillating criticisms. For although Wundt has many ideas—“the theory of actuality”, the “principle of psychophysical parallelism”, “voluntarism”, “creative resultants”, etc., etc.—yet they all do have a single unifying node, namely what I have here called “monistic perspectivism”. If Wundt has a big idea, it is that Being is a single flow of Becoming with many sides and many ways of being described. Consequently we, as part of this Being, have many ways of describing and explaining it. Few have as unblinkingly accepted the consequences of their starting points, or more doggedly pursued them to their various ends as Wundt.


Boring 1950 has an excellent annotated bibliography (344, ff.). Wundt’s entire oeuvre was compiled by his daughter, Eleonore Wundt (1927; cf. esp. Wong 2009: 230–3). An excellent select bibliography organized by theme has been compiled by S. Araujo for Oxford Bibliographies (subscription required). It includes volumes on Wundt’s correspondence, his estate, international library collections and archives, and his global influence.

Wundt: Selected Publications

Beiträge zur Theorie der Sinneswahrnehmung, Leipzig: Winter.
Vorlesungen über die Menschen- und Thier-Seele, 2 volumes, Leipzig: Voss.
Lehrbuch der Physiologie des Menschen, Erlangen: Enke. 2nd edition, 1868; 3rd edition, 1873.
Handbuch der medicinischen Physik, Erlangen: Enke.
Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie, 2 volumes. 4th edition, 1893, 5th edition, 1903 (vol. 3); 6th edition, 1908 (vol. 1), 1910 (vol. 2), 1911 (vol. 3), Leipzig: Engelmann.
Über den Einfluss der Philosophie auf die Erfahrungswissenschaft, Leipzig: Engelmann.
Logik: Eine Untersuchung der Prinzipien der Erkenntnis und der Methoden wissenschaftlicher Forschung, (2 volumes), Stuttgart: Enke. 2nd edition, 1893; 3rd edition, 1906; 4th edition, 1921; 5th edition, 1924 (3 volumes): Stuttgart: Enke.
Logik (Volume 1), Stuttgart: Enke; abbreviated as [L I]
Logik (Volume 3), Page numbers from this the 4th edition, 1921, Stuttgart: Enke; abbreviated as [L III].
“Logische Streitfragen”, Vierteljahrschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie, 6: 340–55.
Essays, Leipzig: Engelmann. 2nd edition, 1906.
Ethik. Eine Untersuchung der Thatsachen und Gesetze des sittlichen Lebens, Stuttgart: Enke. 3rd edition, 1903; 4th edition, 1923–24.
“Selbstbeobachtung und innere Wahrnehmung”, Philosophische Studien, 1: 615–17.
“Über Ziele und Wege der Völkerpsychologie”, Philosophische Studien, 4: 1–27.
System der Philosophie, 2 volumes, Leipzig: Wilhelm Engelmann; 2nd (revised) edition, Leipzig: Engelmann, 1897; 4th (revised) edition, Leipzig: A. Kroner, 1919. Page reference is to the 1919 edition, with volumes abbreviated in this entry as “SP I” or “SP II”.
“Über die Einteilung der Wissenschaften”, Philosophische Studien, 5: 1–55.
Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie, 2 vols. 4th edition. Leipzig: Engelmann. Abbreviated in this article as “PP”, “PP I”, or “PP II”.
“Über psychische Kausalität und das Prinzip des psychophysischen Parallelismus”, Philosophische Studien, 10: 1–124.
Grundriss der Psychologie, Leipzig: Engelmann. Revised editions in 1897, 1898, 1901, 1902, 1904, 1905, 1907, 1909, 1911, followed by five unaltered editions. See Boring 1950: 345.
“Über die Definition der Psychologie”, Philosophische Studien, 12: 1–66.
Völkerpsychologie. Eine Untersuchung der Entwicklungsgesetze von Sprache, Mythus und Sitte, 10 volumes, Leipzig: Kröner. 3rd edition, 1904; 3rd edition, 1911–1920.
Sprachgeschichte und Sprachpsychologie. Mit Rücksicht auf B. Delbrücks “Grundfragen der Sprachforschung”, Leipzig: Engelmann.
“Über empirische und metaphysische Psychologie: Eine kritische Betrachtung”, Archiv für die gesamte Psychologie, 2: 333–61.
“Psychologie”, in W. Windelband (ed.), Die Philosophie im Beginn des zwanzigsten Jahrhunderts, Heidelberg: Carl Winter’s Universitätsbuchhandlung, pp. 1–57.
“Über Ausfrageexperimente und über die Methoden zur Psychologie des Denkens”, Psychologische Studien; Psychologische Studien is the renamed new series of the Philosophische Studien, founded by Wundt in 1883.
Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie, vol. 1, 6th ed. Leipzig: Engelmann.
“Kritische Nachlese zur Ausfragemethode”, Archiv für die gesamte Psychologie, 9: 445–59.
Kleine Schriften, vol. 1, Leipzig: Engelmann.
“Psychologismus und Logizismus”, in Wundt 1910a: 511–634.
Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie, vol. 2, 6th ed. Leipzig: Engelmann.
“Das Institut für experimentelle Psychologie zu Leipzig”, Psychologische Studien, 5: 279–93.
“Über reine und angewandte Psychologie”, Psychologische Studien, 10: 571–2.
Kleine Schriften, vol. 2. Leipzig: Engelmann.
Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie, vol. 3, 6th ed. Leipzig: Engelmann.
Probleme der Völkerpsychologie, Leipzig, E. Wiegandt. 2nd edition, 1921, Stuttgart: Kröner.
Elemente der Völkerpsychologie. Grundlinien einer psychologischen Entwicklungsgeschichte der Menschheit, Leipzig: Barth.
Die Nationen und ihre Philosophie: Ein Kapitel zum Weltkrieg, Leipzig: Kröner. [1916, 1918, 1941]
Leibniz: zu seinem zweihundertjährigen Todestag 14. November 1916, Leipzig: Kröner.
Erlebtes und Erkanntes, Stuttgart: Kröner.
Kleine Schriften, 3 vols. Stuttgart: Kröner.

Wundt’s works in English

Lectures on human and animal psychology, J.G. Creighton and E.B. Titchener (trans.), London: Allen. Translation of Vorlesungen über die Menschen- und Thier-Seele, 1863 (2nd edition). [Lectures available online]
Outlines of Psychology, C.H. Judd (trans.), Leipzig: Wilhelm Engelmann, translation of Grundriss der Psychologie, 1896. [Outlines available online]
The Principles of Morality and the Departments of the Moral Life, M.F. Washburn (trans.), London: Swan Sonnenschein; New York: Macmillan. Translation of part of Ethik 1886. [Principles 1901 available online]
Principles of physiological psychology, E.B. Titchener (trans.), London: Allen. Translation of Grundzüge der physiologischen Psychologie, 1873–4 but based mostly on the 5th edition. [Principles 1904 available online]
An Introduction to Psychology, Rudolf Pintner (trans.), New York: MacMillan, translated from the 2nd edition of Einleitung in die Psychologie. Leipzig: Engelmann. [Introduction to Psychology available online]
Elements of folk-psychology: Outlines of a Psychological History of the Development of Mankind, E.L. Schaub (trans.), London: Allen, translation of Elemente der Völkerpsychologie, 1912. [Elements available online]
The Language of Gestures, Approaches to Semiotics/Paperback Series, G.H. Mead et al. (ed.), T. Sebeok (series ed.), The Hague: Mouton.

Secondary sources concerning Wundt

  • Araujo, S.F., 2003, “A obra inicial de Wundt: Um capitulo esquecido nahistoriografia da psicologia”, Revista do Departamento de Psicologia da UFF, 15(2): 63–76.
  • –––, 2012, “Why Did Wundt Abandon His Early Theory of the Unconscious?”, History of Psychology, 15(1): 33–49.
  • –––, 2014a, “Bringing New Archival Sources to Wundt Scholarship: The case of Wundt’s assistantship with Helmholtz”, History of Psychology, 17(1): 50–9.
  • –––, 2014b, “The emergence and development of Bekhterev’s psychoreflexology in relation to Wundt`s experimental psychology”, Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences, 50(2): 189–210.
  • –––, 2016, Wundt and the Philosophical Foundations of Psychology: A Reappraisal, Cham: Springer.
  • –––, 2019, “Völkerpsychologie as cultural psychology: The place of culture in Wundt’s psychological program”, in Jovanović, et al.: 75–84.
  • –––, 2021, “A useful and reliable guide to Wundt’s entire work”, History of Psychology, 24(2): 188–9.
  • Ash, M.G., 1980, “Academic politics in the history of science: experimental psychology in Germany, 1879–1941”, Central European History, 13(3): 255–86.
  • Binder, N., 2016, Subjekte im Experiment: Zu Wilhelm Wundts Programm einer objektiven Psychologie, Frankfurt: Peter Lang.
  • Blumenthal, A.L., 1975, “A Reappraisal of Wilhelm Wundt”, American Psychologist, 30(11): 1081–8. doi:10.1037/0003–066X.30.11.1081
  • –––, 1977, “Wilhelm Wundt and Early American Psychology: A Clash of Two Cultures”, Annals of the New York Academy of Sciences, 291: 13–20. doi:10.1111/j.1749–6632.1977.tb53055.x
  • –––, 1979, “The Founding Father We Never Knew”, Contemporary Psychology, 24(7): 547–550. doi:10.1037/018836
  • Boring, E.G., 1950 [1942], A History of Experimental Psychology, 2nd ed., New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
  • –––, 1965, “On the Subjectivity of Important Historical Dates: Leipzig 1879”, Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences, 1(1): 5–9.
  • Bringmann, W.G., W.D.G. Balance, and R.B. Evans, 1975, “Wilhelm Wundt 1832–1920: A brief biographical sketch”, Journal of the History of the Behavioral Sciences, 11(3): 287–97.
  • Bringmann, W.G., G. Bringmann, and D. Cottrell, 1976, “Helmholtz und Wundt an der Heidelberger Universität 1858–1971”, Heidelberger Jahrbücher, 20: 79–88.
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  • Diamond, Solomon, 1980, “Wundt before Leipzig”, in Rieber 1980: 3–70.
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  • Emmans, D. and A. Laihinen (eds.), 2015, Comparative Neuropsychology and Brain Imaging: Festschrift in Honour of Prof. Dr. Ulrike Halsband, Vienna: LIT Verlag.
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Related or cited works

  • Ash, M.G. and W.R. Woodward (eds.), 1987, Psychology in Twentieth-Century Thought and Society, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ben-David, J. and R. Collins, 1966, “Social factors in the origins of a new science: the case of psychology”, American Sociological Review, 31(4): 451–65.
  • Brett, G.S., 1953, History of psychology, R.S. Peters (ed.), New York: Macmillan.
  • Herbart, J.F., 1850, Psychologie als Wissenschaft, neu gegründet auf Erfahrung, Metaphysik und Mathematik, 2 volumes, reprinted by E.J. Bonset, Amsterdam, 1968.
  • Ladd, G.T., 1887, Psychology, descriptive and explanatory, New York: Macmillan.
  • James, W., 1890, Principles of Psychology, (vol. 1), London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1920, The Letters of William James, Vol. I, Henry James (ed.), Boston: The Atlantic Monthly Press.
  • Kant, I., 1786, Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, J. Ellington (trans.), Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1970.
  • Kitcher, P., 1990, Kant’s Transcendental Psychology, New York: Oxford.
  • Kockelmans, J.J. (ed.), 1967, Phenomenology: The Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Its Interpretation, New York: Doubleday (Anchor).
  • Lipps, T., 1903, Leitfaden der Psychologie, Leipzig: Engelmann.
  • Marbe, K., 1901, Experimentell-psychologische Untersuchungen über das Urteil: Eine Einleitung in die Logik, Leipzig: Engelmann.
  • Maudsley, H., 1876, Physiology of mind, New York: Macmillan.
  • Merleau-Ponty, M., 1967, “The Interconnections of Psychology and Phenomenology”, in Kockelmans 1967: 485–502.
  • Rosett, J., 1939, The mechanism of thought, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Sartre, J.-P., 1967, “Psychology, Phenomenology, and Phenomenological Psychology”, in Kockelmans 1967: 473–84.
  • Titchener, E.B., 1899, “Structural and Functional Psychology”, Philosophical Review, 8(3): 290–9. doi:10.2307/2176244
  • –––, 1909, Lectures on the experimental psychology of the thought processes, New York: Macmillan.
  • Wolman, B.B., 1968, Historical roots of contemporary psychology, New York: Harper & Row.

Other Internet Resources

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