Notes to Action

1. Our focus will be on individual human action. Readers interested in joint action should consult Roth (2017) and Schweikard and Schmid (2021). We similarly defer on the topic of free will to O’Connor and Franklin (2022).

2. In providing an analysis of acting for “no reason” in terms of acting for no further reason, Davidson does say that this analysis is of interest because “it defends the possibility of defining an intentional action as one done for a reason” (Davidson 1963, 683), insofar as it shows that even in such cases there is a primary reason the explains the action.

3. For more on these different approaches to intention, see Setiya 2022.

4. Bratman is here following ideas developed by Harry Frankfurt in, for instance, Frankfurt 1971, 1987, and 1992. For more on Frankfurt’s views on these issues, see O’Connor and Franklin 2022.

5. One difficulty is that, as Anscombe herself notes, it seems very difficult to perform certain tasks without perception. Her suggestion, however, is that perception plays the role of a mere “aid” (Anscombe 1957, §29). However, understanding this aiding role has proven difficult; and some authors would object that it doesn’t do justice to the role of perception in intentional action (O’Shaughnessy 1980; Pickard 2004; Grünbaum 2008, 2011, 2013; Wu 2016; but see Schwenkler 2011; 2012 for an Anscombean reply). Another difficulty is how to integrate proprioceptive knowledge (which Anscombe appears to class as a distinct form of non-observational knowledge) with intentional action. There appears to be a tight connection (McDowell 2011)—indeed, one that O’Shaughnessy (1980) takes as conceptual. However, appealing to cases of action by agents with proprioceptive disabilities, Yu (2018) suggests that, at most, proprioception is needed for the fluidity characterizing normal agency.

6. We render the sentences in the prevailing neo-Davidsonian form (Parsons 1990), which uses thematic roles and conjunction to represent different components of the sentence. By contrast, Davidson would have rendered (2) as:

\[ \exists x( \textrm{Buttering}(x, \textrm{Donald}, \textrm{toast}, \textrm{bathroom})) \]

with the unwelcome result that the buttering relation in each sentence is different in type (since it has different adicity).

Copyright © 2023 by
Juan S. Piñeros Glasscock <>
Sergio Tenenbaum <>

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