The Concept of the Aesthetic

First published Fri Sep 11, 2009; substantive revision Mon Feb 28, 2022

Introduced into the philosophical lexicon during the Eighteenth Century, the term ‘aesthetic’ has come to designate, among other things, a kind of object, a kind of judgment, a kind of attitude, a kind of experience, and a kind of value. For the most part, aesthetic theories have divided over questions particular to one or another of these designations: whether artworks are necessarily aesthetic objects; how to square the allegedly perceptual basis of aesthetic judgments with the fact that we give reasons in support of them; how best to capture the elusive contrast between an aesthetic attitude and a practical one; whether to define aesthetic experience according to its phenomenological or representational content; how best to understand the relation between aesthetic value and aesthetic experience. But questions of more general nature have lately arisen, and these have tended to have a skeptical cast: whether any use of ‘aesthetic’ may be explicated without appeal to some other; whether agreement respecting any use is sufficient to ground meaningful theoretical agreement or disagreement; whether the term ultimately answers to any legitimate philosophical purpose that justifies its inclusion in the lexicon. The skepticism expressed by such general questions did not begin to take hold until the later part of the 20th century, and this fact prompts the question whether (a) the concept of the aesthetic is inherently problematic and it is only recently that we have managed to see that it is, or (b) the concept is fine and it is only recently that we have become muddled enough to imagine otherwise. Adjudicating between these possibilities requires a vantage from which to take in both early and late theorizing on aesthetic matters.

1. The Concept of Taste

The concept of the aesthetic descends from the concept of taste. Why the concept of taste commanded so much philosophical attention during the 18th century is a complicated matter, but this much is clear: the eighteenth-century theory of taste emerged, in part, as a corrective to the rise of rationalism, particularly as applied to beauty, and to the rise of egoism, particularly as applied to virtue. Against rationalism about beauty, the eighteenth-century theory of taste held the judgment of beauty to be immediate; against egoism about virtue, it held the pleasure of beauty to be disinterested.

1.1 Immediacy

Rationalism about beauty is the view that judgments of beauty are judgments of reason, i.e., that we judge things to be beautiful by reasoning it out, where reasoning it out typically involves inferring from principles or applying concepts. At the beginning of the 18th century, rationalism about beauty had achieved dominance on the continent, and was being pushed to new extremes by “les géomètres,” a group of literary theorists who aimed to bring to literary criticism the mathematical rigor that Descartes had brought to physics. As one such theorist put it:

The way to think about a literary problem is that pointed out by Descartes for problems of physical science. A critic who tries any other way is not worthy to be living in the present century. There is nothing better than mathematics as propaedeutic for literary criticism. (Terrasson 1715, Preface, 65; quoted in Wimsatt and Brooks 1957, 258)

It was against this, and against more moderate forms of rationalism about beauty, that mainly British philosophers working mainly within an empiricist framework began to develop theories of taste. The fundamental idea behind any such theory—which we may call the immediacy thesis—is that judgments of beauty are not (or at least not canonically) mediated by inferences from principles or applications of concepts, but rather have all the immediacy of straightforwardly sensory judgments. It is the idea, in other words, that we do not reason to the conclusion that things are beautiful, but rather “sense” that they are. Here is an early expression of the thesis, from Jean-Baptiste Dubos’s Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting, and Music, which first appeared in 1719:

Do we ever reason, in order to know whether a ragoo be good or bad; and has it ever entered into any body’s head, after having settled the geometrical principles of taste, and defined the qualities of each ingredient that enters into the composition of those messes, to examine into the proportion observed in their mixture, in order to decide whether it be good or bad? No, this is never practiced. We have a sense given us by nature to distinguish whether the cook acted according to the rules of his art. People taste the ragoo, and tho’ unacquainted with those rules, they are able to tell whether it be good or no. The same may be said in some respect of the productions of the mind, and of pictures made to please and move us. (Dubos 1748, vol. II, 238–239)

And here is a late expression, from Kant’s 1790 Critique of the Power of Judgment:

If someone reads me his poem or takes me to a play that in the end fails to please my taste, then he can adduce Batteux or Lessing, or even older and more famous critics of taste, and adduce all the rules they established as proofs that his poem is beautiful… . I will stop my ears, listen to no reasons and arguments, and would rather believe that those rules of the critics are false … than allow that my judgment should be determined by means of a priori grounds of proof, since it is supposed to be a judgment of taste and not of the understanding of reason. (Kant 1790, 165)

But the theory of taste would not have enjoyed its eighteenth-century run, nor would it continue now to exert its influence, had it been without resources to counter an obvious rationalist objection. There is a wide difference—so goes the objection—between judging the excellence of a ragout and judging the excellence of a poem or a play. More often than not, poems and plays are objects of great complication. But taking in all that complication requires a lot of cognitive work, including the application of concepts and the drawing of inferences. Judging the beauty of poems and plays, then, is evidently not immediate and so evidently not a matter of taste.

The chief way of meeting this objection was first to distinguish between the act of grasping the object preparatory to judging it and the act of judging the object once grasped, and then to allow the former, but not the latter, to be as concept- and inference-mediated as any rationalist might wish. Here is Hume, with characteristic clarity:

[I]n order to pave the way for [a judgment of taste], and give a proper discernment of its object, it is often necessary, we find, that much reasoning should precede, that nice distinctions be made, just conclusions drawn, distant comparisons formed, complicated relations examined, and general facts fixed and ascertained. Some species of beauty, especially the natural kinds, on their first appearance command our affection and approbation; and where they fail of this effect, it is impossible for any reasoning to redress their influence, or adapt them better to our taste and sentiment. But in many orders of beauty, particularly those of the fine arts, it is requisite to employ much reasoning, in order to feel the proper sentiment. (Hume, 1751, Section I)

Hume—like Shaftesbury and Hutcheson before him, and Reid after him (Cooper 1711, 17, 231; Hutcheson 1725, 16–24; Reid 1785, 760–761)—regarded the faculty of taste as a kind of “internal sense.” Unlike the five “external” or “direct” senses, an “internal” (or “reflex” or “secondary”) sense is one that depends for its objects on the antecedent operation of some other mental faculty or faculties. Reid characterizes internal sense as follows:

Beauty or deformity in an object, results from its nature or structure. To perceive the beauty therefore, we must perceive the nature or structure from which it results. In this the internal sense differs from the external. Our external senses may discover qualities which do not depend upon any antecedent perception… . But it is impossible to perceive the beauty of an object, without perceiving the object, or at least conceiving it. (Reid 1785, 760–761)

Because of the highly complex natures or structures of many beautiful objects, there will have to be a role for reason in their perception. But perceiving the nature or structure of an object is one thing. Perceiving its beauty is another.

1.2 Disinterest

Egoism about virtue is the view that to judge an action or trait virtuous is to take pleasure in it because you believe it to serve some interest of yours. Its central instance is the Hobbesian view—still very much on early eighteenth-century minds—that to judge an action or trait virtuous is to take pleasure in it because you believe it to promote your safety. Against Hobbesian egoism a number of British moralists—preeminently Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Hume—argued that, while a judgment of virtue is a matter of taking pleasure in response to an action or trait, the pleasure is disinterested, by which they meant that it is not self-interested (Cooper 1711, 220–223; Hutcheson 1725, 9, 25–26; Hume 1751, 218–232, 295–302). One argument went roughly as follows. That we judge virtue by means of an immediate sensation of pleasure means that judgments of virtue are judgments of taste, no less than judgments of beauty. But pleasure in the beautiful is not self-interested: we judge objects to be beautiful whether or not we believe them to serve our interests. But if pleasure in the beautiful is disinterested, there is no reason to think that pleasure in the virtuous cannot also be (Hutcheson 1725, 9–10).

The eighteenth-century view that judgments of virtue are judgments of taste highlights a difference between the eighteenth-century concept of taste and our concept of the aesthetic, since for us the concepts aesthetic and moral tend oppose one another such that a judgment’s falling under one typically precludes its falling under the other. Kant is chiefly responsible for introducing this difference. He brought the moral and the aesthetic into opposition by re-interpreting what we might call the disinterest thesis—the thesis that pleasure in the beautiful is disinterested (though see Cooper 1711, 222 and Home 2005, 36–38 for anticipations of Kant’s re-interpretation).

According to Kant, to say that a pleasure is interested is not to say that it is self-interested in the Hobbesian sense, but rather that it stands in a certain relation to the faculty of desire. The pleasure involved in judging an action to be morally good is interested because such a judgment issues in a desire to bring the action into existence, i.e., to perform it. To judge an action to be morally good is to become aware that one has a duty to perform the action, and to become so aware is to gain a desire to perform it. By contrast, the pleasure involved in judging an object to be beautiful is disinterested because such a judgment issues in no desire to do anything in particular. If we can be said to have a duty with regard to beautiful things, it appears to be exhausted in our judging them aesthetically to be beautiful. That is what Kant means when he says that the judgment of taste is not practical but rather “merely contemplative” (Kant 1790, 95).

By thus re-orienting the notion of disinterest, Kant brought the concept of taste into opposition with the concept of morality, and so into line, more or less, with the present concept of the aesthetic. But if the Kantian concept of taste is continuous, more or less, with the present-day concept of the aesthetic, why the terminological discontinuity? Why have we come to prefer the term ‘aesthetic’ to the term ‘taste’? The not very interesting answer appears to be that we have preferred an adjective to a noun. The term ‘aesthetic’ derives from the Greek term for sensory perception, and so preserves the implication of immediacy carried by the term ‘taste.’ Kant employed both terms, though not equivalently: according to his usage, ‘aesthetic’ is broader, picking out a class of judgments that includes both the normative judgment of taste and the non-normative, though equally immediate, judgment of the agreeable. Though Kant was not the first modern to use ‘aesthetic’ (Baumgarten had used it as early as 1735), the term became widespread only, though quickly, after his employment of it in the third Critique. Yet the employment that became widespread was not exactly Kant’s, but a narrower one according to which ‘aesthetic’ simply functions as an adjective corresponding to the noun “taste.” So for example we find Coleridge, in 1821, expressing the wish that he “could find a more familiar word than aesthetic for works of taste and criticism,” before going on to argue:

As our language … contains no other useable adjective, to express coincidence of form, feeling, and intellect, that something, which, confirming the inner and the outward senses, becomes a new sense in itself … there is reason to hope, that the term aesthetic, will be brought into common use. (Coleridge 1821, 254)

The availability of an adjective corresponding to “taste” has allowed for the retiring of a series of awkward expressions: the expressions “judgment of taste,” “emotion of taste” and “quality of taste” have given way to the arguably less offensive ‘aesthetic judgment,’ ‘aesthetic emotion,’ and ‘aesthetic quality.’ However, as the noun ‘taste’ phased out, we became saddled with other perhaps equally awkward expressions, including the one that names this entry.

2. The Concept of the Aesthetic

Much of the history of more recent thinking about the concept of the aesthetic can be seen as the history of the development of the immediacy and disinterest theses.

2.1 Aesthetic Objects

Artistic formalism is the view that the artistically relevant properties of an artwork—the properties in virtue of which it is an artwork and in virtue of which it is a good or bad one—are formal merely, where formal properties are typically regarded as properties graspable by sight or by hearing merely. Artistic formalism has been taken to follow from both the immediacy and the disinterest theses (Binkley 1970, 266–267; Carroll 2001, 20–40). If you take the immediacy thesis to imply the artistic irrelevance of all properties whose grasping requires the use of reason, and you include representational properties in that class, then you are apt to think that the immediacy thesis implies artistic formalism. If you take the disinterest thesis to imply the artistic irrelevance of all properties capable of practical import, and you include representational properties in that class, then you are apt to think that the disinterest thesis implies artistic formalism.

This is not to suggest that the popularity enjoyed by artistic formalism during the late 19th and early 20th centuries owed mainly to its inference from the immediacy or disinterest theses. The most influential advocates of formalism during this period were professional critics, and their formalism derived, at least in part, from the artistic developments with which they were concerned. As a critic Eduard Hanslick advocated for the pure music of Mozart, Beethoven, Schumann, and later Brahms, and against the dramatically impure music of Wagner; as a theorist he urged that music has no content but “tonally moving forms” (Hanslick 1986, 29). As a critic Clive Bell was an early champion of the post-Impressionists, especially Cezanne; as a theorist he maintained that the formal properties of painting—“relations and combinations of lines and colours”—alone have artistic relevance (Bell 1958, 17–18). As a critic Clement Greenberg was abstract expressionism’s ablest defender; as a theorist he held painting’s “proper area of competence” to be exhausted by flatness, pigment, and shape (Greenberg 1986, 86–87).

Not every influential defender of formalism has also been a professional critic. Monroe Beardsley, who arguably gave formalism its most sophisticated articulation, was not (Beardsley 1958). Nor is Nick Zangwill, who recently has mounted a spirited and resourceful defense of a moderate version of formalism (Zangwill 2001). But formalism has always been sufficiently motivated by art-critical data that once Arthur Danto made the case that the data no longer supported it, and perhaps never really had, formalism’s heyday came to an end. Inspired in particular by Warhol’s Brillo Boxes, which are (more or less) perceptually indistinguishable from the brand-printed cartons in which boxes of Brillo were delivered to supermarkets, Danto observed that for most any artwork it is possible to imagine both (a) another object that is perceptually indiscernible from it but which is not an artwork, and (b) another artwork that is perceptually indiscernible from it but which differs in artistic value. From these observations he concluded that form alone neither makes an artwork nor gives it whatever value it has (Danto 1981, 94–95; Danto 1986, 30–31; Danto 1997, 91).

But Danto has taken the possibility of such perceptual indiscernibles to show the limitations not merely of form but also of aesthetics, and he has done so on the grounds, apparently, that the formal and the aesthetic are co-extensive. Regarding a urinal Duchamp once exhibited and a perceptual indiscernible ordinary urinal, Danto maintains that

aesthetics could not explain why one was a work of fine art and the other not, since for all practical purposes they were aesthetically indiscernible: if one was beautiful, the other one had to be beautiful, since they looked just alike. (Danto 2003, 7)

But the inference from the limits of the artistically formal to the limits of the artistically aesthetic is presumably only as strong as the inferences from the immediacy and disinterest theses to artistic formalism, and these are not beyond question. The inference from the disinterest thesis appears to go through only if you employ a stronger notion of disinterest than the one Kant understands himself to be employing: Kant, it is worth recalling, regards poetry as the highest of the fine arts precisely because of its capacity to employ representational content in the expression of what he calls ‘aesthetic ideas’ (Kant 1790, 191–194; see Costello 2008 and 2013 for extended treatment of the capacity of Kantian aesthetics to accommodate conceptual art). The inference from the immediacy thesis appears to go through only if you employ a notion of immediacy stronger than the one Hume, for example, takes himself to be defending when he claims (in a passage quoted in section1.1) that “in many orders of beauty, particularly those of the fine arts, it is requisite to employ much reasoning, in order to feel the proper sentiment” (Hume 1751, 173). It may be that artistic formalism results if you push either of the tendencies embodied in the immediacy and disinterest theses to extremes. It may be that the history of aesthetics from the 18th century to the mid-Twentieth is largely the history of pushing those two tendencies to extremes. It does not follow that those tendencies must be so pushed.

Consider Warhol’s Brillo Boxes. Danto is right to maintain that the eighteenth-century theorist of taste would not know how to regard it as an artwork. But this is because the eighteenth-century theorist of taste lives in the 18th century, and so would be unable to situate that work in its twentieth-century art-historical context, and not because the kind of theory she holds forbids her from situating a work in its art-historical context. When Hume, for instance, observes that artists address their works to particular, historically-situated audiences, and that a critic therefore “must place herself in the same situation as the audience” to whom a work is addressed (Hume 1757, 239), he is allowing that artworks are cultural products, and that the properties that works have as the cultural products they are are among the “ingredients of the composition” that a critic must grasp if she is to feel the proper sentiment. Nor does there seem to be anything in the celebrated conceptuality of Brillo Boxes, nor of any other conceptual work, that ought to give the eighteenth-century theorist pause. Francis Hutcheson asserts that mathematical and scientific theorems are objects of taste (Hutcheson 1725, 36–41). Alexander Gerard asserts that scientific discoveries and philosophical theories are objects of taste (Gerard 1757, 6). Neither argues for his assertion. Both regard it as commonplace that objects of intellect may be objects of taste as readily as objects of sight and hearing may be. Why should the present-day aesthetic theorist think otherwise? If an object is conceptual in nature, grasping its nature will require intellectual work. If grasping an object’s conceptual nature requires situating it art-historically, then the intellectual work required to grasp its nature will include situating it art-historically. But—as Hume and Reid held (see section 1.1)—grasping the nature of an object preparatory to aesthetically judging it is one thing; aesthetically judging the object once grasped is another.

Though Danto has been the most influential and persistent critic of formalism, his criticisms are no more decisive than those advanced by Kendall Walton in his essay “Categories of Art.” Walton’s anti-formalist argument hinges on two main theses, one psychological and one philosophical. According to the psychological thesis, which aesthetic properties we perceive a work as having depends on which category we perceive the work as belonging to. Perceived as belonging to the category of painting, Picasso’s Guernica will be perceived as “violent, dynamic, vital, disturbing” (Walton 1970, 347). But perceived as belonging to the category of “guernicas”—where guernicas are works with “surfaces with the colors and shapes of Picasso’s Guernica, but the surfaces are molded to protrude from the wall like relief maps of different kinds of terrain”—Picasso’s Guernica will be perceived not as violent and dynamic, but as “cold, stark, lifeless, or serene and restful, or perhaps bland, dull, boring” (Walton 1970, 347). That Picasso’s Guernica can be perceived both as violent and dynamic and as not violent and not dynamic might be thought to imply that there is no fact of the matter whether it is violent and dynamic. But this implication holds only on the assumption that there is no fact of the matter which category Picasso’s Guernica actually belongs to, and this assumption appears to be false given that Picasso intended that Guernica be a painting and did not intend that it be a guernica, and that the category of paintings was well-established in the society in which Picasso painted it while the category of guernicas was not. Hence the philosophical thesis, according to which the aesthetic properties a work actually has are those it is perceived as having when perceived as belonging to the category (or categories) it actually belongs to. Since the properties of having been intended to be a painting and having been created in a society in which painting is well-established category are artistically relevant though not graspable merely by seeing (or hearing) the work, it seems that artistic formalism cannot be true. “I do not deny,” Walton concludes, “that paintings and sonatas are to be judged solely on what can be seen or heard in them—when they are perceived correctly. But examining a work with the senses can by itself reveal neither how it is correct to perceive it, nor how to perceive it that way” (Walton 1970, 367).

But if we cannot judge which aesthetic properties paintings and sonatas have without consulting the intentions and the societies of the artists who created them, what of the aesthetic properties of natural items? With respect to them it may appear as if there is nothing to consult except the way they look and sound, so that an aesthetic formalism about nature must be true. Allen Carlson, a central figure in the burgeoning field of the aesthetics of nature, argues against this appearance. Carlson observes that Walton’s psychological thesis readily transfers from works of art to natural items: that we perceive Shetland ponies as cute and charming and Clydesdales as lumbering surely owes to our perceiving them as belonging to the category of horses (Carlson 1981, 19). He also maintains that the philosophical thesis transfers: whales actually have the aesthetic properties we perceive them as having when we perceive them as mammals, and do not actually have any contrasting aesthetic properties we might perceive them to have when we perceive them as fish. If we ask what determines which category or categories natural items actually belong to, the answer, according to Carlson, is their natural histories as discovered by natural science (Carlson 1981, 21–22). Inasmuch as a natural item’s natural history will tend not to be graspable by merely seeing or hearing it, formalism is no truer of natural items than it is of works of art.

The claim that Walton’s psychological thesis transfers to natural items has been widely accepted (and was in fact anticipated, as Carlson acknowledges, by Ronald Hepburn (Hepburn 1966 and 1968)). The claim that Walton’s philosophical thesis transfers to natural items has proven more controversial. Carlson is surely right that aesthetic judgments about natural items are prone to be mistaken insofar as they result from perceptions of those items as belonging to categories to which they do not belong, and, insofar as determining which categories natural items actually belong to requires scientific investigation, this point seems sufficient to undercut the plausibility of any very strong formalism about nature (see Carlson 1979 for independent objections against such formalism). Carlson, however, also wishes to establish that aesthetic judgments about natural items have whatever objectivity aesthetic judgments about works of art do, and it is controversial whether Walton’s philosophical claim transfers sufficiently to support such a claim. One difficulty, raised by Malcolm Budd (Budd 2002 and 2003) and Robert Stecker (Stecker1997c), is that since there are many categories in which a given natural item may correctly be perceived, it is unclear which correct category is the one in which the item is perceived as having the aesthetic properties it actually has. Perceived as belonging to the category of Shetland ponies, a large Shetland pony may be perceived as lumbering; perceived as belonging to the category of horses, the same pony may be perceived as cute and charming but certainly not lumbering. If the Shetland pony were a work of art, we might appeal to the intentions (or society) of its creator to determine which correct category is the one that fixes its aesthetic character. But as natural items are not human creations they can give us no basis for deciding between equally correct but aesthetically contrasting categorizations. It follows, according to Budd, “the aesthetic appreciation of nature is endowed with a freedom denied to the appreciation of art” (Budd 2003, 34), though this is perhaps merely another way of saying that the aesthetic appreciation of art is endowed with an objectivity denied to the appreciation of nature.

2.2 Aesthetic Judgment

The eighteenth-century debate between rationalists and theorists of taste (or sentimentalists) was primarily a debate over the immediacy thesis, i.e., over whether we judge objects to be beautiful by applying principles of beauty to them. It was not primarily a debate over the existence of principles of beauty, a matter over which theorists of taste might disagree. Kant denied that there are any such principles (Kant 1790, 101), but both Hutcheson and Hume affirmed their existence: they maintained that although judgments of beauty are judgments of taste and not of reason, taste nevertheless operates according to general principles, which might be discovered through empirical investigation (Hutcheson 1725, 28–35; Hume 1757, 231–233).

It is tempting to think of recent debate in aesthetics between particularists and generalists as a revival of the eighteenth-century debate between rationalists and theorists of taste. But the accuracy of this thought is difficult to gauge. One reason is that it is often unclear whether particularists and generalists take themselves merely to be debating the existence of aesthetic principles or to be debating their employment in aesthetic judgment. Another is that, to the degree particularists and generalists take themselves to be debating the employment of aesthetic principles in aesthetic judgment, it is hard to know what they can be meaning by ‘aesthetic judgment.’ If ‘aesthetic’ still carries its eighteenth-century implication of immediacy, then the question under debate is whether judgment that is immediate is immediate. If ‘aesthetic’ no longer carries that implication, then it is hard to know what question is under debate because it is hard to know what aesthetic judgment could be. It may be tempting to think that we can simply re-define ‘aesthetic judgment’ such that it refers to any judgment in which an aesthetic property is predicated of an object. But this requires being able to say what an aesthetic property is without reference to its being immediately graspable, something no one seems to have done. It may seem that we can simply re-define ‘aesthetic judgment’ such that it refers to any judgment in which any property of the class exemplified by beauty is predicated of an object. But which class is this? The classes exemplified by beauty are presumably endless, and the difficulty is to specify the relevant class without reference to the immediate graspability of its members, and that is what no one seems to have done.

However we are to sort out the particularist/generalist debate, important contributions to it include, on the side of particularism, Arnold Isenberg’s “Critical Communication” (1949) Frank Sibley’s “Aesthetic Concepts” (in Sibley 2001) and Mary Mothersill’s Beauty Restored (1984) and, on the side of generalism, Monroe Beardsley’s Aesthetics (1958) and “On the Generality of Critical Reasons” (1962), Sibley’s “General Reasons and Criteria in Aesthetics” (in Sibley 2001), George Dickie’s Evaluating Art (1987), Stephen Davies’s “Replies to Arguments Suggesting that Critics’ Strong Evaluations Could not be Soundly Deduced” (1995), and John Bender’s “General but Defeasible Reasons in Aesthetic Evaluation: The Generalist/Particularist Dispute” (1995). Of these, the papers by Isenberg and Sibley have arguably enjoyed the greatest influence.

Isenberg concedes that we often appeal to descriptive features of works in support of our judgments of their value, and he allows that this may make it seem as if we must be appealing to principles in making those judgments. If in support of a favorable judgment of some painting a critic appeals to the wavelike contour formed by the figures clustered in its foreground, it may seem as if his judgment must involve tacit appeal to the principle that any painting having such a contour is so much the better. But Isenberg argues that this cannot be, since no one agrees to any such principle:

There is not in all the world’s criticism a single purely descriptive statement concerning which one is prepared to say beforehand, ‘If it is true, I shall like that work so much the better’ (Isenberg 1949, 338).

But if in appealing to the descriptive features of a work we are not acknowledging tacit appeals to principles linking those features to aesthetic value, what are we doing? Isenberg believes we are offering “directions for perceiving” the work, i.e., by singling out certain its features, we are “narrow[ing] down the field of possible visual orientations” and thereby guiding others in “the discrimination of details, the organization of parts, the grouping of discrete objects into patterns” (Isenberg 1949, 336). In this way we get others to see what we have seen, rather than getting them to infer what we have inferred.

That Sibley advances a variety of particularism in one paper and a variety of generalism in another will give the appearance of inconsistency where there is none: Sibley is a particularist of one sort, and with respect to one distinction, and a generalist of another sort with respect to another distinction. Isenberg, as noted, is a particularist with respect to the distinction between descriptions and verdicts, i.e., he maintains that there are no principles by which we may infer from value-neutral descriptions of works to judgments of their overall value. Sibley’s particularism and generalism, by contrast, both have to do with judgments falling in between descriptions and verdicts. With respect to a distinction between descriptions and a set of judgments intermediate between descriptions and verdicts, Sibley is straightforwardly particularist. With respect to a distinction between a set of judgments intermediate between descriptions and verdicts and verdicts, Sibley is a kind of generalist and describes himself as such.

Sibley’s generalism, as set forth in “General Reasons and Criteria in Aesthetics,” begins with the observation that the properties to which we appeal in justification of favorable verdicts are not all descriptive or value-neutral. We also appeal to properties that are inherently positive, such as grace, balance, dramatic intensity, or comicality. To say that a property is inherently positive is not to say that any work having it is so much the better, but rather that its tout court attribution implies value. So although a work may be made worse on account of its comical elements, the simple claim that a work is good because comical is intelligible in a way that the simple claims that a work is good because yellow, or because it lasts twelve minutes, or because it contains many puns, are not. But if the simple claim that a work is good because comical is thus intelligible, comicality is a general criterion for aesthetic value, and the principle that articulates that generality is true. But none of this casts any doubt on the immediacy thesis, as Sibley himself observes:

I have argued elsewhere that there are no sure-fire rules by which, referring to the neutral and non-aesthetic qualities of things, one can infer that something is balanced, tragic, comic, joyous, and so on. One has to look and see. Here, equally, at a different level, I am saying that there are no sure-fire mechanical rules or procedures for deciding which qualities are actual defects in the work; one has to judge for oneself. (Sibley 2001, 107–108)

The “elsewhere” referred to in the first sentence is Sibley’s earlier paper, “Aesthetic Concepts,” which argues that the application of concepts such as ‘balanced,’ ‘tragic,’ ‘comic,’ or ‘joyous’ is not a matter of determining whether the descriptive (i.e., non-aesthetic) conditions for their application are met, but is rather a matter of taste. Hence aesthetic judgments are immediate in something like the way that judgments of color, or of flavor, are:

We see that a book is red by looking, just as we tell that the tea is sweet by tasting it. So too, it might be said, we just see (or fail to see) that things are delicate, balanced, and the like. This kind of comparison between the exercise of taste and the use of the five senses is indeed familiar; our use of the word ‘taste’ itself shows that the comparison is age-old and very natural (Sibley 2001, 13–14).

But Sibley recognizes—as his eighteenth-century forebears did and his formalist contemporaries did not—that important differences remain between the exercise of taste and the use of the five senses. Central among these is that we offer reasons, or something like them, in support of our aesthetic judgments: by talking—in particular, by appealing to the descriptive properties on which the aesthetic properties depend—we justify aesthetic judgments by bringing others to see what we have seen (Sibley 2001, 14–19).

It is unclear to what degree Sibley, beyond seeking to establish that the application of aesthetic concepts is not condition-governed, seeks also to define the term ‘aesthetic’ in terms of their not being so. It is clearer, perhaps, that he does not succeed in defining the term this way, whatever his intentions. Aesthetic concepts are not alone in being non-condition-governed, as Sibley himself recognizes in comparing them with color concepts. But there is also no reason to think them alone in being non-condition-governed while also being reason-supportable, since moral concepts, to give one example, at least arguably also have both these features. Isolating the aesthetic requires something more than immediacy, as Kant saw. It requires something like the Kantian notion of disinterest, or at least something to play the role played by that notion in Kant’s theory.

Given the degree to which Kant and Hume continue to influence thinking about aesthetic judgment (or critical judgment, more broadly), given the degree to which Sibley and Isenberg continue to abet that influence, it is not surprising that the immediacy thesis is now very widely received. The thesis, however, has come under attack, notably by Davies (1990) and Bender (1995). (See also Carroll (2009), who follows closely after Davies (1990), and Dorsch (2013) for further discussion.)

Isenberg, it will be recalled, maintains that if the critic is arguing for her verdict, her argumentation must go something as follows:

  1. Artworks having p are better for having p.
  2. W is an artwork having p.
  3. Therefore, W is so much the better for having p.

Since the critical principle expressed in premise 1 is open to counter-example, no matter what property we substitute for p, Isenberg concludes that we cannot plausibly interpret the critic as arguing for her verdict. Rather than defend the principle expressed in premise 1, Davies and Bender both posit alternative principles, consistent with the fact that no property is good-making in all artworks, which they ascribe to the critic. Davies proposes that we interpret the critic as arguing deductively from principles relativized to artistic type, that is, from principles holding that artworks of a specific types or categories—Italian Renaissance paintings, romantic symphonies, Hollywood Westerns, etc.—having p are better for having it (Davies 1990, 174). Bender proposes that we interpret the critic as arguing inductively from principles expressing mere tendencies that hold between certain properties and artworks—principles, in other words, holding that artworks having p tend to be better for having it (Bender 1995, 386).

Each proposal has its own weaknesses and strengths. A problem with Bender’s approach is that critics do not seem to couch their verdicts in probabilistic terms. Were a critic to say that a work is likely to be good, or almost certainly good, or even that she has the highest confidence that it must be good, her language would suggest that she had not herself experienced the work, perhaps that she had judged the work on the basis of someone else’s testimony, hence that she is no critic at all. We would therefore have good reason to prefer Davies’s deductive approach if only we had good reason for thinking that relativizing critical principles to artistic type removed the original threat of counterexample. Though it is clear that such relativizing reduces the relative number of counterexamples, we need good reason for thinking that it reduces that number to zero, and Davies provides no such reason. Bender’s inductive approach, by contrast, cannot be refuted by counterexample, but only by counter-tendency.

If the critic argues from the truth of a principle to the truth of a verdict—as Davies and Bender both contend—it must be possible for her to establish the truth of the principle before establishing the truth of the verdict. How might she do this? It seems unlikely that mere reflection on the nature of art, or on the natures of types of art, could yield up the relevant lists of good- and bad-making properties. At least the literature has yet to produce a promising account as to how this might be done. Observation therefore seems the most promising answer. To say that the critic establishes the truth of critical principles on the basis of observation, however, is to say that she establishes a correlation between certain artworks she has already established to be good and certain properties she has already established those works to have. But then any capacity to establish that works are good by inference from principles evidently depends on some capacity to establish that works are good without any such inference, and the question arises why the critic should prefer to do by inference what she can do perfectly well without. The answer cannot be that judging by inference from principle yields epistemically better results, since a principle based on observations can be no more epistemically sound than the observations on which it is based.

None of this shows that aesthetic or critical judgment could never be inferred from principles. It does however suggest that such judgment is first and foremost non-inferential, which is what the immediacy thesis holds.

2.3 The Aesthetic Attitude

The Kantian notion of disinterest has its most direct recent descendents in the aesthetic-attitude theories that flourished from the early to mid 20th century. Though Kant followed the British in applying the term ‘disinterested’ strictly to pleasures, its migration to attitudes is not difficult to explain. For Kant the pleasure involved in a judgment of taste is disinterested because such a judgment does not issue in a motive to do anything in particular. For this reason Kant refers to the judgment of taste as contemplative rather than practical (Kant 1790, 95). But if the judgment of taste is not practical, then the attitude we bear toward its object is presumably also not practical: when we judge an object aesthetically we are unconcerned with whether and how it may further our practical aims. Hence it is natural to speak of our attitude toward the object as disinterested.

To say, however, that the migration of disinterest from pleasures to attitudes is natural is not to say that it is inconsequential. Consider the difference between Kant’s aesthetic theory, the last great theory of taste, and Schopenhauer’s aesthetic theory, the first great aesthetic-attitude theory. Whereas for Kant disinterested pleasure is the means by which we discover things to bear aesthetic value, for Schopenhauer disinterested attention (or “will-less contemplation”) is itself the locus of aesthetic value. According to Schopenhauer, we lead our ordinary, practical lives in a kind of bondage to our own desires (Schopenhauer 1819, 196). This bondage is a source not merely of pain but also of cognitive distortion in that it restricts our attention to those aspects of things relevant to the fulfilling or thwarting of our desires. Aesthetic contemplation, being will-less, is therefore both epistemically and hedonically valuable, allowing us a desire-free glimpse into the essences of things as well as a respite from desire-induced pain:

When, however, an external cause or inward disposition suddenly raises us out of the endless stream of willing, and snatches knowledge from the thralldom of the will, the attention is now no longer directed to the motives of willing, but comprehends things free from their relation to the will … Then all at once the peace, always sought but always escaping us … comes to us of its own accord, and all is well with us. (Schopenhauer 1819, 196)

The two most influential aesthetic-attitude theories of the 20th century are those of Edward Bullough and Jerome Stolnitz. According to Stolnitz’s theory, which is the more straightforward of the two, bearing an aesthetic attitude toward an object is a matter of attending to it disinterestedly and sympathetically, where to attend to it disinterestedly is to attend to it with no purpose beyond that of attending to it, and to attend to it sympathetically is to “accept it on its own terms,” allowing it, and not one’s own preconceptions, to guide one’s attention of it (Stolnitz 1960, 32–36). The result of such attention is a comparatively richer experience of the object, i.e., an experience taking in comparatively many of the object’s features. Whereas a practical attitude limits and fragments the object of our experience, allowing us to “see only those of its features which are relevant to our purposes,…. By contrast, the aesthetic attitude ‘isolates’ the object and focuses upon it—the ‘look’ of the rocks, the sound of the ocean, the colors in the painting.” (Stolnitz 1960, 33, 35).

Bullough, who prefers to speak of “psychical distance” rather than disinterest, characterizes aesthetic appreciation as something achieved

by putting the phenomenon, so to speak, out of gear with our actual practical self; by allowing it to stand outside the context of our personal needs and ends—in short, by looking at it ‘objectively’ … by permitting only such reactions on our part as emphasise the ‘objective features of the experience, and by interpreting even our ‘subjective’ affections not as modes of our being but rather as characteristics of the phenomenon. (Bullough 1995, 298–299; emphasis in original).

Bullough has been criticized for claiming that aesthetic appreciation requires dispassionate detachment:

Bullough’s characterization of the aesthetic attitude is the easiest to attack. When we cry at a tragedy, jump in fear at a horror movie, or lose ourselves in the plot of a complex novel, we cannot be said to be detached, although we may be appreciating the aesthetic qualities of these works to the fullest… . And we can appreciate the aesthetic properties of the fog or storm while fearing the dangers they present. (Goldman 2005, 264)

But such a criticism seems to overlook a subtlety of Bullough’s view. While Bullough does hold that aesthetic appreciation requires distance “between our own self and its affections” (Bullough 1995, 298), he does not take this to require that we not undergo affections but quite the opposite: only if we undergo affections have we affections from which to be distanced. So, for example, the properly distanced spectator of a well-constructed tragedy is not the “over-distanced” spectator who feels no pity or fear, nor the “under-distanced” spectator who feels pity and fear as she would to an actual, present catastrophe, but the spectator who interprets the pity and fear she feels “not as modes of [her] being but rather as characteristics of the phenomenon” (Bullough 1995, 299). The properly distanced spectator of a tragedy, we might say, understands her fear and pity to be part of what tragedy is about.

The notion of the aesthetic attitude has been attacked from all corners and has very few remaining sympathizers. George Dickie is widely regarded as having delivered the decisive blow in his essay “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude” (Dickie 1964) by arguing that all purported examples of interested attention are really just examples of inattention. So consider the case of the spectator at a performance of Othello who becomes increasingly suspicious of his own wife as the action proceeds, or the case of the impresario who sits gauging the size of the audience, or the case of the father who sits taking pride in his daughter’s performance, or the case of the moralist who sits gauging the moral effects the play is apt to produce in its audience. These and all such cases will be regarded by the attitude theorist as cases of interested attention to the performance, when they are actually nothing but cases of inattention to the performance: the jealous husband is attending to his wife, the impresario to the till, the father to his daughter, the moralist to the effects of the play. But if none of them is attending to the performance, then none of them is attending to it interestedly (Dickie 1964, 57–59).

The attitude theorist, however, can plausibly resist Dickie’s interpretation of such examples. Clearly the impresario is not attending to the performance, but there is no reason to regard the attitude theorist as committed to thinking otherwise. As for the others, it might be argued that they are all attending. The jealous husband must be attending to the performance, since it is the action of the play, as presented by the performance, that is making him suspicious. The proud father must be attending to the performance, since he is attending to his daughter’s performance, which is an element of it. The moralist must be attending to the performance, since he otherwise would have no basis by which to gauge its moral effects on the audience. It may be that none of these spectators is giving the performance the attention it demands, but that is precisely the attitude theorist’s point.

But perhaps another of Dickie’s criticisms, one lesser known, ultimately poses a greater threat to the ambitions of the attitude theorist. Stolnitz, it will be recalled, distinguishes between disinterested and interested attention according to the purpose governing the attention: to attend disinterestedly is to attend with no purpose beyond that of attending; to attend interestedly is to attend with some purpose beyond that of attending. But Dickie objects that a difference in purpose does not imply a difference in attention:

Suppose Jones listens to a piece of music for the purpose of being able to analyze and describe it on an examination the next day and Smith listens to the same music with no such ulterior purpose. There is certainly a difference in the motives and intentions of the two men: Jones has an ulterior purpose and Smith does not, but this does not mean Jones’s listening differs from Smith’s … . There is only one way to listen to (to attend to) music, although there may be a variety of motives, intentions, and reasons for doing so and a variety of ways of being distracted from the music. (Dickie 1964, 58).

There is again much here that the attitude theorist can resist. The idea that listening is a species of attending can be resisted: the question at hand, strictly speaking, is not whether Jones and Smith listen to the music in the same way, but whether they attend in the same way to the music they are listening to. The contention that Jones and Smith are attending in the same way appears to be question-begging, as it evidently depends on a principle of individuation that the attitude theorist rejects: if Jones’s attention is governed by some ulterior purpose and Smith’s is not, and we individuate attention according to the purpose that governs it, their attention is not the same. Finally, even if we reject the attitude theorist’s principle of individuation, the claim that there is but one way to attend to music is doubtful: one can seemingly attend to music in myriad ways—as historical document, as cultural artifact, as aural wallpaper, as sonic disturbance—depending on which of the music’s features one attends to in listening to it. But Dickie is nevertheless onto something crucial to the degree he urges that a difference in purpose need not imply a relevant difference in attention. Disinterest plausibly figures in the definition of the aesthetic attitude only to the degree that it, and it alone, focuses attention on the features of the object that matter aesthetically. The possibility that there are interests that focus attention on just those same features implies that disinterest has no place in such a definition, which in turn implies that neither it nor the notion of the aesthetic attitude is likely to be of any use in fixing the meaning of the term ‘aesthetic.’ If to take the aesthetic attitude toward an object simply is to attend to its aesthetically relevant properties, whether the attention is interested or disinterested, then determining whether an attitude is aesthetic apparently requires first determining which properties are the aesthetically relevant ones. And this task seems always to result either in claims about the immediate graspability of aesthetic properties, which are arguably insufficient to the task, or in claims about the essentially formal nature of aesthetic properties, which are arguably groundless.

But that the notions of disinterest and psychical distance prove unhelpful in fixing the meaning of the term ‘aesthetic’ does not imply that they are mythic. At times we seem unable to get by without them. Consider the case of The Fall of Miletus—a tragedy written by the Greek dramatist Phrynicus and staged in Athens barely two years after the violent Persian capture of the Greek city of Miletus in 494 BC. Herodotus records that

[the Athenians] found many ways to express their sorrow at the fall of Miletus, and in particular, when Phrynicus composed and produced a play called The Fall of Miletus, the audience burst into tears and fined him a thousand drachmas for reminding them of a disaster that was so close to home; future productions of the play were also banned. (Herodotus, The Histories, 359)

How are we to explain the Athenian reaction to this play without recourse to something like interest or lack of distance? How, in particular, are we to explain the difference between the sorrow elicited by a successful tragedy and the sorrow elicited in this case? The distinction between attention and inattention is of no use here. The difference is not that the Athenians could not attend to The Fall whereas they could attend to other plays. The difference is that they could not attend to The Fall as they could attend to other plays, and this because of their too intimate connection to what attending to The Fall required their attending to.

2.4 Aesthetic Experience

Theories of aesthetic experience may be divided into two kinds according to the kind of feature appealed to in explanation of what makes experience aesthetic: internalist theories appeal to features internal to experience, typically to phenomenological features, whereas externalist theories appeal to features external to the experience, typically to features of the object experienced. (The distinction between internalist and externalist theories of aesthetic experience is similar, though not identical, to the distinction between phenomenal and epistemic conceptions of aesthetic experience drawn by Gary Iseminger (Iseminger 2003, 100, and Iseminger 2004, 27, 36)). Though internalist theories—particularly John Dewey’s (1934) and Monroe Beardsley’s (1958)—predominated during the early and middle parts of the 20th century, externalist theories—including Beardsley’s (1982) and George Dickie’s (1988)—have been in the ascendance since. Beardsley’s views on aesthetic experience make a strong claim on our attention, given that Beardsley might be said to have authored the culminating internalist theory as well as the founding externalist one. Dickie’s criticisms of Beardsley’s internalism make an equally strong claim, since they moved Beardsley—and with him most everyone else—from internalism toward externalism.

According to the version of internalism Beardsley advances in his Aesthetics (1958), all aesthetic experiences have in common three or four (depending on how you count) features, which “some writers have [discovered] through acute introspection, and which each of us can test in his own experience” (Beardsley 1958, 527). These are focus (“an aesthetic experience is one in which attention is firmly fixed upon [its object]”), intensity, and unity, where unity is a matter of coherence and of completeness (Beardsley 1958, 527). Coherence, in turn, is a matter of having elements that are properly connected one to another such that

[o]ne thing leads to another; continuity of development, without gaps or dead spaces, a sense of overall providential pattern of guidance, an orderly cumulation of energy toward a climax, are present to an unusual degree. (Beardsley 1958, 528)

Completeness, by contrast, is a matter having elements that “counterbalance” or “resolve” one another such that the whole stands apart from elements without it:

The impulses and expectations aroused by elements within the experience are felt to be counterbalanced or resolved by other elements within the experience, so that some degree of equilibrium or finality is achieved and enjoyed. The experience detaches itself, and even insulates itself, from the intrusion of alien elements. (Beardsley 1958, 528)

Dickie’s most consequential criticism of Beardsley’s theory is that Beardsley, in describing the phenomenology of aesthetic experience, has failed to distinguish between the features we experience aesthetic objects as having and the features aesthetic experiences themselves have. So while every feature mentioned in Beardsley’s description of the coherence of aesthetic experience—continuity of development, the absence of gaps, the mounting of energy toward a climax—surely is a feature we experience aesthetic objects as having, there is no reason to think of aesthetic experience itself as having any such features:

Note that everything referred to [in Beardsley’s description of coherence] is a perceptual characteristic … and not an effect of perceptual characteristics. Thus, no ground is furnished for concluding that experience can be unified in the sense of being coherent. What is actually argued for is that aesthetic objects are coherent, a conclusion which must be granted, but not the one which is relevant. (Dickie 1965, 131)

Dickie raises a similar worry about Beardsley’s description of the completeness of aesthetic experience:

One can speak of elements being counterbalanced in the painting and say that the painting is stable, balanced and so on, but what does it mean to say the experience of the spectator of the painting is stable or balanced? … Looking at a painting in some cases might aid some persons in coming to feel stable because it might distract them from whatever is unsettling them, but such cases are atypical of aesthetic appreciation and not relevant to aesthetic theory. Aren’t characteristics attributable to the painting simply being mistakenly shifted to the spectator? (Dickie 1965, 132)

Though these objections turned out to be only the beginning of the debate between Dickie and Beardsley on the nature of aesthetic experience (See Beardsley 1969, Dickie 1974, Beardsley 1970, and Dickie 1987; see also Iseminger 2003 for a helpful overview of the Beardsley-Dickie debate), they nevertheless went a long way toward shaping that debate, which taken as whole might be seen as the working out of an answer to the question “What can a theory of aesthetic experience be that takes seriously the distinction between the experience of features and the features of experience?” The answer turned out to be an externalist theory of the sort that Beardsley advances in the 1970 essay “The Aesthetic Point of View” and that many others have advanced since: a theory according to which an aesthetic experience just is an experience having aesthetic content, i.e., an experience of an object as having the aesthetic features that it has.

The shift from internalism to externalism has meant that one central ambition of internalism—that of tying the meaning of ‘aesthetic’ to features internal to aesthetic experience—has had to be given up. But a second, equally central, ambition—that of accounting for aesthetic value by grounding it in the value of aesthetic experience—has been retained. The following section takes up the development and prospects of such accounts.

2.5 Aesthetic Value

To count as complete a theory of aesthetic value must answer two questions:

  • What makes aesthetic value aesthetic?
  • What makes aesthetic value value?

The literature refers to the first question sometimes as the aesthetic question (Lopes 2018, 41–43; Shelley 2019, 1) and sometimes as the demarcation question (van der Berg 2020, 2; Matherne 2020, 315; Peacocke 2021, 165). It refers to the second as the normative question (Lopes 2018, 41–43; Shelley 2019, 1; Matherne 2020, 315).

2.5.1 The Aesthetic Question

The prevailing answer to the aesthetic question is aesthetic formalism, the view that aesthetic value is aesthetic because objects bear it in virtue of their perceptual properties, where these encompass visual, auditory, gustatory, olfactory, and tactile properties. Aesthetic formalism rose to prominence when and because artistic formalism did, during the late 19th and early 20th centuries (see Section 5.1). Because everyone then took artistic value to be a species of aesthetic value, artistic formalism could gain prominence only by dragging aesthetic formalism in its train. But whereas artistic formalism has since fallen from favor, aesthetic formalism has held its ground. The explanation, arguably, has to do with the way aesthetic formalism honors the conceptual link between the aesthetic and the perceptual. Any adequate answer to the aesthetic question must meet what we may call the perceptual constraint, that is, it must plausibly articulate the sense in which aesthetic value is perceptual. Aesthetic formalism does this in the clearest possible terms.

Versions of aesthetic formalism come in varying strengths. Its strongest versions hold objects to have aesthetic value strictly in virtue of their perceptual properties (Bell 1958/1914; Danto 2003, 92). Weaker versions either allow objects to have aesthetic value in virtue of their non-perceptual content so long as that content expresses itself perpetually (Zangwill 1998, 71–72) or require merely that objects paradigmatically have aesthetic value in virtue of their perceptual properties (Levinson 1996, 6). All versions of aesthetic formalism struggle, one way or another, to accommodate our long-standing practice of ascribing aesthetic value to objects that do not address themselves primarily to the five bodily senses. Consider works of literature. We have been ascribing aesthetic value to them for as long as we have been ascribing aesthetic value to artworks of any kind. How might the aesthetic theorist square her theory with this practice? A first approach is simply to dismiss that practice, regarding its participants as linguistically confused, as applying terms of aesthetic praise to objects constitutionally incapable of meriting it (Danto 2003, 92). But given how extremely revisionist this approach is, we ought to wait on an argument of proportionately extreme strength before adopting it. A second approach allows that literary works bear aesthetic value, but only in virtue of their sensory properties, such as properties associated with assonance, consonance, rhythm, and imagery (Urmson 1957, 85–86, 88; Zangwill 2001, 135–140). But this approach accounts for a mere fraction of the aesthetic value we routinely ascribe to works of literature. Suppose you praise a short story for the eloquence of its prose and the beauty of its plot-structure. It seems arbitrary to count only the eloquence as a genuine instance of aesthetic value. A third approach treats literary works as exceptional, allowing them, alone among works of art, to bear aesthetic value in virtue of their non-perceptual properties (Binkley 1970, 269; Levinson 1996, 6 n.9). The difficulty here is to explain literature’s exceptionality. If literary works somehow bear aesthetic value in virtue of non-perceptual properties, what prevents non-literary works from doing the same? Moreover, to whatever degree we allow things to have aesthetic value in virtue of their non-perceptual properties, to that degree we sever the connection the formalist asserts between the aesthetic and the perceptual and so undermine our reason for adopting aesthetic formalism in the first place.

We might be forced to choose from among these three formalist approaches to literature if aesthetic formalism constituted the only plausible articulation of the sense in which aesthetic value is perceptual, but it doesn’t. Instead of holding that aesthetic value is perceptual because things have it in virtue of their perpetual properties, one might hold that aesthetic value is perceptual because we perceive things as having it. This would be a corollary of the immediacy thesis as defined in Section 1.1. If, as that thesis holds, aesthetic judgment is perceptual, having all the immediacy of any standard perceptual judgment, then aesthetic properties are perceptual, grasped with all the immediacy of standard perceptual properties. That aesthetic properties are thus perceptual is Sibley’s point in the following:

It is of importance to note first that, broadly speaking, aesthetics deals with a kind of perception. People have to see the grace or unity of a work, hear the plaintiveness or frenzy in the music, notice the gaudiness of a colour scheme, feel the power of a novel, its mood, or its uncertainty of tone. (Sibley 2001, 34, emphasis in original)

Sibley says that people have to see the grace or unity of a work and they have to feel the power of a novel. He doesn’t say that they have to see the properties in virtue of which a work has grace or unity or feel the properties in virtue of which a novel has power: the properties in virtue of which a work has grace or unity need not be perceptual and the properties in virtue of which a novel has power presumably will not be. Thus the literature problem, over which formalism stumbles, does not arise for Sibley, nor for anyone else committed to the immediacy thesis, including Shaftesbury (Cooper 1711, 17, 231), Hutcheson (1725, 16–24), Hume (1751, Section I), and Reid (1785, 760–761), among others. For the immediacy theorist, the aesthetic value we ascribe to literary works is aesthetic because we perceive literary works as bearing it.

2.5.2 The Normative Question

The prevailing answer to the normative question is aesthetic hedonism, the view that aesthetic value is value because things having it give pleasure when experienced. Aesthetic hedonism achieved prominence in the 19th century, roughly when aesthetic formalism did. Schopenhauer played a pivotal role in bringing it to prominence by reassigning disinterested pleasure from the role it had been playing in aesthetic judgment to the role of grounding aesthetic value (Schopenhauer 1818 [1969], 195–200). Bentham (1789, ch. 4) and Mill (1863 [2001]; ch. 2) arguably played larger roles by popularizing value hedonism, that is, the view that pleasure is the ground of all value. But whereas value hedonism no longer holds much sway in ethics, and Schopenhauer no longer exerts much influence in aesthetics, aesthetic hedonism has held its ground. The explanation presumably has to do with the apparent ease with which aesthetic hedonism explains why we seek out objects of aesthetic value. Any adequate answer to the normative question must meet what we may call the normative constraint, that is, it must plausibly identify what a thing’s having aesthetic value gives us reason to do. Aesthetic hedonism, locating that reason in the pleasure taken in experiencing aesthetically valuable objects, does this in the clearest possible terms.

Advocates of aesthetic hedonism include Schopenhauer 1818 [1969], Clive Bell 1914 [1958], C. I. Lewis 1946, Monroe Beardsley 1982, George Dickie 1988, Alan Goldman 1990, Kendall Walton 1993, Malcolm Budd 1995, Jerrold Levinson 1996, 2002, Gary Iseminger 2004, Robert Stecker 2006, 2019, Nick Stang 2010 and Mohan Matthen 2017. It is only quite recently that any sustained opposition to hedonism has arisen, a fact that may go some way toward explaining why hedonists, as a rule, see no need to argue for their view, opting instead to develop it in light of objections an imagined opposition might make.

Beardsley, for instance, leads with this simple formulation of hedonism:

The aesthetic value of an object is the value it possesses in virtue of its capacity to provide aesthetic gratification. (Beardsley 1982, 21).

But he then anticipates a fatal objection. Sometimes we undervalue aesthetic objects, finding them to have less value than they actually have; other times we overvalue aesthetic objects, finding them to have greater value than they actually have. The simple formulation above is consistent with undervaluation, since it is possible to take less aesthetic pleasure from an object than it has the capacity to provide, but inconsistent with overvaluation, since it is impossible to take greater aesthetic pleasure from an object than it has the capacity to provide (Beardsley 1982, 26–27). To remedy this problem, Beardsley appends a rider:

The aesthetic value of [an object] is the value [it] possesses in virtue of its capacity to provide aesthetic gratification when correctly and completely experienced (Beardsley 1982, 27, italics in original).

Suppose we refer to the italicized portion of this formulation as the epistemic qualification and the non-italicized portion as the hedonic thesis. The epistemic qualification renders the hedonic thesis consistent with overvaluation, given that you can misapprehend an object such that you take greater aesthetic pleasure from it than it has the capacity to provide when apprehended correctly and completely.

Beardsley’s version of aesthetic hedonism has served as a model for subsequent versions (Levinson 2002, n. 23); at least all subsequent versions consist of an epistemically qualified hedonic thesis in some form. Beardsley’s version, however, seems open to counter-example. Consider Tony Morrison’s Beloved, for instance, or Cormac McCarthy’s Blood Meridian. Taking pleasure from works designed to cause shock, horror, despair, or moral revulsion may seem perverse; surely, it may seem, such works do not have whatever aesthetic value they have in virtue of any pleasure they give. One way to accommodate such cases is to cast aesthetic pleasure as a higher-order response, that is, a response that depends on lower-order responses, which in some cases might include shock, horror, despair, and moral revulsion (Walton 1993, 508; Levinson 1992, 18). Another way is to broaden the field of experiences that may ground aesthetic value. Though pleasure as a rule grounds aesthetic value, in exceptional cases certain non-hedonic yet intrinsically valuable experiences—which may include horror, shock, despair, and revulsion—may also do so (Levinson 1992, 12; Stecker 2005, 12). The literature refers to this latter, broadened variety of hedonism as aesthetic empiricism; it hasn’t settled on a name for the former variety, but we may call it tiered hedonism, given the varying levels of response it takes aesthetic experience to comprise.

Yet another objection, anticipated by hedonists, holds hedonism to imply the heresy of the separable experience (Budd 1985, 125). It is a commonplace that for any object bearing aesthetic value nothing other than it can have just the particular value it has, excepting the improbable case in which something other than it has just its particular aesthetic character. The worry is that hedonism, given that it regards aesthetic value as instrumental to the value of experience, implies that for any object bearing aesthetic value something wholly other from it, such as a drug, might induce the same experience and so serve up the same value. The hedonist’s usual reply is to assert that aesthetic experience is inseparable from its object, such that for any aesthetic experience, that experience is just the particular experience it is because it has just the particular aesthetic object it has (Levinson 1996, 22–23; Budd 1985, 123–124; S. Davies 1994: 315–16; Stang 2012, 271–272).

Actual opposition to hedonism did not materialize until the present century (Sharpe 2000, Davies 2004), and most all of that during the past decade or so (Shelley 2010, 2011, 2019; Wolf 2011; Lopes 2015, 2018; Gorodeisky 2021a, 2021b). Why the opposition took so long to show up is a good question. It is tempting to think its answer resides in the obvious truth of the hedonist’s central premise, namely, that aesthetically valuable objects please us, at least in general. Anti-hedonists, however, have taken no interest in denying this premise. One useful way to think of the dialectic between hedonists and their opponents is to regard each as grasping one horn of an aesthetic version of the Euthyphro dilemma, where hedonists hold things to have aesthetic value because they please and anti-hedonists hold things to please because they have aesthetic value (Augustine 2005/389–391, De vera religione §59; Gorodeisky 2012a, 201 and 2021b, 262). Seen this way, the fact that aesthetically valuable things please tells not at all in favor of the hedonist; indeed, it is precisely this fact that the anti-hedonist thinks the hedonist cannot explain.

For instance, Wolf, in the context of an extended, nuanced case against value welfarism, argues that aesthetic hedonism cannot account for the fact that Middlemarch is a better novel than the Da Vinci Code,given that most people apparently like the latter better, presumably because it gives them greater pleasure (Wolf 2011, 54–55; see also Sharpe 2000, 326). The hedonist has a ready reply in the claim that all standard versions of hedonism are now epistemically qualified, that while most people may derive greater pleasure from the Da Vinci Code, a fully informed reader—that is, a reader who gives both texts a correct and complete reading—will not, assuming Middlemarch to be the better novel. But it’s not clear how much appeal to the epistemic qualification ultimately helps the hedonist. The anti-hedonist will want to know what best explains the fact that a fully informed reader will derive greater pleasure from Middlemarch (Wolf 2011, 55; D. Davies 2004, 258–259; Sharpe 2000, 325). Suppose we say that it owes to the fully informed reader’s grasping the superiority of Middlemarch’s structure, the higher quality of its prose, the greater subtlety and depth of its character development, and the greater penetration of the insights it affords (Wolf 2011, 55). Wouldn’t we then be saying that it owes to her grasping the greater aesthetic value of Middlemarch? Wouldn’t that be part of what a fully informed reader is fully informed about?

Of course, the hedonist may allow Middlemarch to be aesthetically better because of its superior structure, prose, character development, and insight; to allow this, from her point of view, is simply to allow that these are the elements in virtue of which a fully informed reader will derive greater pleasure. But here it would be good if the hedonist had an argument. Otherwise, the anti-hedonist will rightly wonder how it is that a correct and complete experience of Middlemarch will be an experience of every value-conferring feature of Middlemarch yet not an experience of the value conferred by those features. She will rightly wonder whether the hedonist fails to honor her own commitment to externalism about aesthetic value; she will rightly wonder, in other words, whether the hedonist fails to distinguish between a valuable experience and an experience of value, just as the internalist about aesthetic value fails to distinguish between a coherent and complete experience and an experience of coherence and completeness.

Earlier we attributed the appeal of hedonism to the apparent ease with which it explains our seeking out objects of aesthetic value. Anti-hedonists take that ease to be apparent merely. Some anti-hedonists, for instance, argue that at least some aesthetically valuable objects offer up pleasure only on condition that we do not seek it (Lopes 2018, 84–86; Ven der Berg 2020, 5–6; see also Elster 1983, 77–85). Lopes puts the point this way:

Sometimes an agent has an aesthetic reason to act and yet they could not be motivated to act out of a hedonic desire that would be satisfied by their so acting. To get any pleasure, they must act out of non-hedonic motives. Strolling through the Louvre, they happen upon the Chardins, and they look at them. So long as they do not look seeking pleasure, they get the pleasure that the paintings afford (Lopes 2018, 85–86).

Lopes’s choice of example is not arbitrary. There are particular art-critical reasons for thinking that Chardins will frustrate the hedonically motivated viewer (Fried 1980, 92; cited in Lopes 2018, 85), and Lopes is careful to claim that only “some aesthetic pleasures are essential by-products of acts motivated by other considerations” (Lopes 2018, 85). But it’s not as if Lopes’s claim is specific to Chardins. Consider again Wolf’s assertation that most readers take greater pleasure from The Da Vinci Code than from Middlemarch. If that assertion is correct, as it plausibly is, perhaps this is because (a) most readers read for pleasure, and (b) The Da Vinci Code affords pleasure to readers who read for it, whereas (c) Middlemarch withholds pleasure from such readers, affording pleasure instead on readers who read in pursuit of some non-hedonic good.

There is an apparent tension, moreover, between the hedonist’s reliance on the epistemic qualification and her claim that pleasure rationalizes our aesthetic pursuits. Consider the less-than-fully-informed reader who overvalues The Da Vinci Code and undervalues Middlemarch. The epistemic qualification is designed to allow the hedonist to explain how this might occur: such a reader takes greater pleasure from The Da Vinci Code, and less (or lesser) pleasure from Middlemarch, than she would were she fully informed. The epistemic qualification, moreover, allows the hedonist to explain why the uninformed reader has aesthetic reason not to undervalue Middlemarch: she is missing out on pleasure that would be hers if only she gave Middlemarch a fully informed reading. But the hedonist struggles to explain why the uninformed reader has reason not to overvalue the Da Vinci Code. If The Da Vinci Code gives the reader greater pleasure when she overvalues it, not only has she no aesthetic reason to be fully informed, she has aesthetic reason not to be. It therefore seems that if pleasure rationalized our hedonic pursuits, we would take ourselves to have reason to experience aesthetic objects in whatever way maximizes our pleasure. To the degree that we instead take ourselves to have reason to experience aesthetic objects completely and correctly—to the degree that we instead take ourselves to have reason to experience aesthetic objects as having the aesthetic values they in fact have—suggests that pleasure is not the aesthetic good we’re after (Shelley 2011).

But if pleasure is not the aesthetic good we’re after, what is? Part of hedonism’s perceived inevitability over the past century or so has owed to our inability even to imagine alternatives to it. If opposition to hedonism has been slow to materialize, alternatives have been slower still. To date, the only fully realized alternative to hedonism is Lopes’s network theory of aesthetic normativity, articulated and defended in his ground-breaking Being for Beauty: Aesthetic Agency and Value (2018).

Earlier we noted how Lopes challenges the hedonist on her own terms, objecting that she cannot adequately explain why we seek out objects of aesthetic value, given that aesthetic pleasure is at least sometimes an essential by-product of our seeking after something else (2018, 84–86). Lopes’s deeper challenge, however, targets the hedonist’s very terms. Aesthetic considerations rationalize a very great variety of aesthetic acts, according to Lopes: appreciating objects of aesthetic value is one such act, but so too is hanging a poster one way rather than another, selecting this book rather than that one for a book club, building out a garden this way rather than that, conserving one video game rather than another, pairing this dish with this wine rather than that one, and so on ad infinitum (2018, 32–36). If a theory of aesthetic value is to accommodate such a vast range of aesthetic acts, without singling out any one as more central than the others, it will have to conceive of aesthetic normativity as a species of some very general kind of normativity. Lopes, accordingly, conceives of aesthetic normativity as a species of the most generic form of practical normativity; that aesthetic acts ought to be performed well follows from the premise that all acts ought to be performed well for the simple reason that they are acts (2018, 135–137). As Lopes puts it: “Aesthetic values inherit their practical normativity from a basic condition of all agency—agents must use what they have to perform successfully” (2018, 135). Just which competencies an aesthetic agent may call upon to perform successfully on any given occasion depends on the particular role they happen to be playing in the particular social practice in which they happen to be performing (2018, 135). It is from the fact that all aesthetic activity necessarily takes place within the domain of some particular social practice that the network theory of aesthetic value takes its name (2018, 119).

In holding aesthetic agents to be performing the greatest variety of aesthetic acts on the greatest variety of items in coordination with one another, the network theory departs radically from hedonism. But, as Lopes himself observes, the network theory follows after hedonism in one fundamental way: inasmuch as both theories “answer the normative question but offer nothing in answer to the aesthetic question,” both “are consistent with any stand-alone answer to the aesthetic question” (2018, 48). The claim that the normative and aesthetic questions admit of stand-alone answers implies that aesthetic value is a species of the genus value in a standard species-genus relation, such that what makes aesthetic value value has no bearing on what makes it aesthetic and vice-versa. It therefore also implies that aesthetic value is not a determinate of the determinable value, such that what makes aesthetic value aesthetic is very thing that makes it value.

Do answers to the normative and aesthetic questions stand alone or stand together? If we have not yet registered the urgency of this question, perhaps that is because no one has yet fully articulated, let alone defended, a theory of aesthetic value according to which aesthetic value is a determinate form of value. Such a theory appears to be implicit, however, in Shelley 2011, Watkins and Shelley 2012, Gorodeisky and Marcus 2018, Gorodeisky 2021a, and Shelley 2022. The position common to these authors has been dubbed the Auburn view (Van der Berg 2020, 11). It answers the aesthetic question, and therein the value question, by holding an item’s having aesthetic value to rationalize its appreciation in a distinctively self-reflexive way, such that part of what you perceive when you appreciate an aesthetically valuable item is that it ought to be appreciated as you appreciating it (Shelley 2011, 220–222; Watkins and Shelley 2012, 348–350; Gorodeisky and Marcus 2018, 117–119; Gorodeisky 2021a, 200, 207; Shelley 2022, 12). The network theorist may object that the Auburn view privileges acts of appreciation as surely as hedonism does, but such an objection, from the Auburn perspective, begs the question. It is in assuming that the normative and aesthetic questions admit of stand-alone answers that the network theorist grants herself the freedom of passing on the aesthetic question, and it is in passing on the aesthetic question that she grants herself the freedom of treating each of a very great variety of aesthetic acts as equally central. It is in assuming that aesthetic value is a determinate of the determinable value, meanwhile, that the Auburnite places herself under the necessity of answering the aesthetic question, and it is in seeking an answer to the aesthetic question that she places herself under the necessity of singling out appreciation as aesthetically central. The network theorist and the Auburnite agree that the aesthetic question deserves an answer sooner or later (Lopes 2018, 46). They disagree, crucially, about whether it deserves an answer sooner rather than later.

The network theory and the Auburn view hardly exhaust the options for non-hedonic theories of aesthetic normativity: Nguyen 2019, Matherne 2020, Peacocke 2021, Kubala 2021, and Riggle 2022 all represent promising new directions. Yet every new theory of aesthetic value, hedonic or not, must follow after the network theory or the Auburn view in regarding answers to the normative and aesthetic questions as stand-alone or stand-together. A lot hangs on the decision to follow one path rather than the other. Perhaps it’s time we attend to it.


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