Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Explanatory Epiphenomenalism

Recognition of an irreducible explanatory role for reasons, and mental properties generally, as expressed in the dual explananda strategy, does not by itself fully do away with epiphenomenalist concerns. In light of mental anomalism, why think that reason explanations are causal explanations, rather than a sui generis form of noncausal explanation? The need for a causal relation between mental events cited in reason explanations (see discussion of the ‘because’ problem in 2.2) doesn’t settle this issue once we have distinguished between causal relations and explanations (see section 6). Neil Campbell (1998 and 2005) argues for an interpretation of Anomalous Monism on which while mental events stand in causal relations with each other, reason explanations are not causal explanations. He calls this ‘explanatory epiphenomenalism’. Causal explanations explain because they fit singular causal occurrences into true causal generalizations (2005, 442–43). However, reason explanations, according to Campbell, are more plausibly thought of as functioning along different lines: reasons explain actions by revealing the agent’s rationality in so acting in light of those reasons (2005, 445). The point of this explanatory epiphenomenalism is not to criticize reason explanations as illusory—as wrongly claiming to explain—but rather to point up limitations of the domain of causal explanation. On this view, not all genuine explanations are causal—reason explanations are sui generis and capture a distinctive pattern in nature that would otherwise be missed. This is an interesting twist on the noncausal theories of actions (2.2), acknowledging both Davidson’s criticism of them (the ‘because’ problem) in insisting on causal efficacy (reasons cause (extensional) actions) yet also acknowledging their disavowal of causal explanation as a model for reason explanation and refusal to accept that only causal explanations capture real patterns in nature. It also explicitly connects the distinctive feature of reason explanation—rationality—to the reality of reasons and mental properties generally (see 4.3). Campbell is influenced in this line of thinking by McDowell’s reading of mental anomalism (4.2.2), though he goes beyond McDowell in denying that reason explanations are causal.

Campbell acknowledges that reasons which explain actions are backed by generalizations (ceteris paribus ones), but claims that this fact “takes a back seat” to the normative dimension of rationalizing explanation, because generalizations record mere tendencies while rational explanations observe what agents should do—the fact that the generalizations hold is explicable by rationality, something that is not true of other forms of explanation (2005, 445). (Though Campbell doesn’t argue this explicitly, in this vein one might also point to the fact that the truth of the generalizations does not—indeed, cannot—explain the fact that the relations covered are rational. This is a key point in Kim’s reconstruction of the argument for mental anomalism—see 4.2.1.) The epistemic satisfaction that reason explanations provide is achieved differently than that of causal explanations—not by being an instance of a generalization, but rather by being a realization of rationality.

By itself, this point does not appear to rule out the idea that reasons explanations are causal explanations. Indeed, it seems to be a non sequitur. First, in other cases where explanations covered by generalizations are not thereby causal explanations—for instance, logic—the obstacle has to do with not meeting basic conditions for causal explanations, such as temporal succession. But such conditions are met in reason explanations. Second, as we have seen (4.2.1), Davidson emphasizes that a normative component also underlies the physical realm in constitutive a priori principles. On Campbell’s reasoning, this would prevent physical explanations from being causal, which is clearly wrong. We see once again a problematic consequence of interpretations of the argument for mental anomalism (Kim’s and now Campbell’s) that highlight a strong distinction between normative and descriptive principles. Third, and related to this point, reason explanations might be different than other causal explanations in their subject matter without this preventing them from being causal. After all, there are other causal explanations that are also backed only by ceteris paribus generalizations, and a point analogous to the one Campbell emphasizes—that their constitutive feature explains why such generalizations hold rather than vice-versa—has also been made concerning biological explanations in particular and functional explanations generally (Macdonalds 1995; for related discussion, see below).

If rational explanations could be satisfying despite failing to be instances of generalizations, then there might be an asymmetry sufficiently strong to block the assimilation of reasons explanations to causal explanations. But Campbell does not argue for this, either in itself or as an interpretation of Davidson, and it has no clear independent plausibility—the failure of a reason explanation to generalize would in fact prevent it from being a satisfying explanation (see also 4.2.3). Reason explanations are satisfying both because they show that an action is a realization of rationality and also because such explanations are instances of generalizations. Both conditions are necessary for reasons explanations, and cannot be pulled apart. None of this appears to be inconsistent with reasons explanations being causal explanations, and seems merely to individuate reason explanations from those that are made relative to different explanatory interests.

However, Campbell provides an additional and conceptually distinct point in favor of an asymmetry between the two that would block assimilating reason explanations to causal explanations. Even though, for example, hurricanes and catastrophes don’t stand in strict lawlike relations, the explanation of the latter by the former is causal because we have at least a rough understanding of how hurricanes function in terms of underlying mechanisms—the physical properties co-instantiated by meteorological events. But the point of mental anomalism is to deny that there can be any such understanding in the case of reasons. Therefore, “without a means of connecting reason explanations to their underlying causal processes in an intelligible fashion there is nothing to account for their explanatory force if such explanations are taken to be a species of causal explanations” (Campbell 1998, 29). Campbell’s point seems to be that without an explanatory relationship between reason explanations and the physical causal explanations underlying them, not only is there no justification for holding reason explanations to be causal; moreover, the problem of causal explanatory competition and exclusion pressed by Kim (6.2) rears its head. Campbell’s explanatory epiphenomenalism is thus a form of the dual explananda solution to Kim’s problem, but one that further eschews explanatory competition between reason and physical explanations by distinguishing not only their distinct explanans and explananda but also the form of explanation (causal or not) that relates them.

The Macdonalds (1995) hold, as Campbell does, that (1) mental events are causally efficacious by virtue of being identical with physical events, and that (2) despite the anomalous nature of reason explanations, they capture distinctive patterns that account for their explanatory usefulness. But the Macdonalds don’t see this as incompatible with reason explanations being causal. They cite biological events and explanations as meeting (1) and (2)—the pattern consisting in appearance of design resulting from natural selection—but emphasize that these are nonetheless causal explanations. It thus appears that the difference between their attitudes is due to the second point raised by Campbell—whether there exists an account of how such explanations explain. For the Macdonalds, there is an underlying account of design and natural selection in terms of underlying “physico-chemical changes”. That suggests that for the Macdonalds there needs to be an account of reason explanations in terms of the nomological properties that mental events instance in order for reasons explanations to be causal explanations—precisely what Campbell claims is ruled out by Davidson’s mental anomalism. And the Macdonalds, who accept mental anomalism, indeed hold that the patterns in both cases—rational and biological—must be “reliably produced” by co-instanced nomological properties. However, and crucially, such reliability does not depend upon or entail exceptionless relations (see further below).

Campbell’s explanatory epiphenomenalism is in effect calling into question the Macdonalds’ underlying assumption that patterns genuinely occurring “in nature”—and thus real—must bear an explanatory relation to nomological properties. On Campbell’s view, that assumption is unwarranted, particularly given the already established causal efficacy of mental events. Reason explanations can pick out genuine patterns “in nature” without being either causal explanations or explainable in terms of underlying nomological properties. The relevance of this for the current discussion is whether the Macdonalds’ “reliable production” requirement is consistent with Anomalous Monism, which Campbell in effect denies. We have already seen (5.3) that the Macdonalds endorse a supervenience relationship between mental and physical properties, and claim that their conception of supervenience is consistent with both the strict nature of supervenience laws and also mental anomalism because we can’t currently state such laws and so are not in a position to predict or explain mental events on their basis. As we have also seen, this is consistent with—indeed, seems ultimately to require—a strict explanatory/predictive relationship between physical and mental properties, making mental anomalism into a merely epistemic and not metaphysical thesis.

If one rejects this particular attempt to square supervenience with mental anomalism, then the quagmire of 5.3 arises—how to articulate a conception that provides for dependency without exceptionless prediction or explanation. Interestingly, the Macdonalds’ later requirement of “reliable” (as opposed to exceptionless) relations is suggestive of a ceteris paribus conception of supervenience, which we earlier saw as an unexplored and potentially fruitful direction to take in trying to square Anomalous Monism with an explanatory priority of the physical through the supervenience relation. (Campbell valiantly but implausibly tries to fit Davidson’s appeals to supervenience into Campbell’s explanatory epiphenomenalist framework by claiming that while reason explanations depend upon physical causal explanations, this is a semantic and not a metaphysical thesis (Campbell 1998, 37–38), and so presumably does not entail an explanatory relationship between the mental and the physical of the kind pressed by the Macdonalds. Much of what we have seen Davidson saying about supervenience is inconsistent with this interpretation.)

Since Campbell allows that reason explanations make actions intelligible without falling under exceptionless generalizations (mental anomalism), he can’t object that physical properties cannot make reasons intelligible simply because of an anomalous relation between them. It might be responded that physical properties cannot make reasons intelligible because “making intelligible” means making rationally intelligible, and this is not something that physical properties are in the business of providing (as emphasized by the dual explananda approach). While this is true, it is both question-begging and misses the point. Explanations always make phenomena intelligible within the terms of the particular explanatory framework. This is the point of the idea that explanation is interest-relative. Within the framework of understanding the relationship between physical and mental properties, ceteris paribus relations can make it intelligible why some mental event is occurring—because some physical event is occurring, and there is a ceteris paribus relationship between them—even while not providing an exceptionless explanation for its occurrence. Rational intelligibility is not the only kind of intelligibility. As Campbell himself notes, the sort of explanation that physical properties can provide for hurricanes is neither exceptionless nor rational, but it nonetheless makes it intelligible why a hurricane is occurring or how it is behaving within its own particular explanatory framework.

The debate about asymmetries between reason and other explanations does not end here, and though we cannot explore it any further, it is worth briefly noting one direction in which it inevitably goes that is close to the heart of Anomalous Monism. A plausible question to ask at this point is why the generalizations—whether strict or ceteris paribus—hold at the most basic level between physical properties, between mental properties, and between the two. In other words, why are the fundamental laws of our world as they are? Now, an initial answer to this question might be that it is in the nature of the properties related that the laws are what they are. However, this answer masks an important asymmetry between the different kinds of generalizations, emphasized by both Kim and McDowell (4.2.1–4.2.2) and reflected in Campbell’s discussion. In the case of both purely physical and psychophysical generalizations, we can conceive of the possibility of different relations holding. (Though this point is powerfully intuitive, it is no simple task to make precise. For relevant discussion, see Chalmers 1996, Mumford 2009 and Latham 2011). This is the case whether the generalizations are strict or ceteris paribus. In the case of psychophysical generalizations in particular, there is no convincing answer forthcoming to the question of why these mental properties supervene on these rather than other physical properties. However, to the question “Why are these actions explained by these reasons?”, there is a deeper level of explanation available. And the answer isn’t simply “Because of a rational relation between the two”. Rather, it is because that rational relation has no conceivable alternative. It is not intelligible to us that those reasons might explain very different kinds of actions. As we have seen, it isn’t at all obvious that this asymmetry entails that reason explanations are not causal explanations, as Campbell insists. But there is no question that this asymmetry is important to our understanding of Anomalous Monism and the nature and status of reason explanations.

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

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