Aristotle’s Aesthetics

First published Fri Dec 3, 2021

The term “aesthetics”, though deriving from the Greek (aisthetikos meaning “related to sense experience”), is a modern one, forged by Baumgarten as the title of his main book (Aesthetica, 1750). Only later did it come to name an entire field of philosophical research. Aristotle does not use that term. But after Plato, he does use the word mimêtikê (that is, literally, the art of producing a mimesis), and since he considers mimesis to be the most general term (or the genus) of all instances (or species) that we consider “art”, like painting, sculpture, music, poetry, or dance, such a word would probably have been well suited to such an inquiry into (what we call) “works of art”. But the fact is that he did not write any such book as a “Treatise on mimêtikê”. Instead, the main treatise he wrote bears the name of Poêtikê, that is, literally, “the art of composing poetry” which mainly focuses on tragedy in its first “book” which we can still read, and on comedy, in its second, which is now lost.[1] Nowadays known as the Poetics, this treatise was never published or properly edited by Aristotle himself (and may have mainly consisted of “teaching notes”); like the other treatises that have come down to us, it remained inside his philosophical school, the Lyceum (among, that is, his so-called “esoteric” works). But Aristotle also published, as “exoteric works” (that is, writings that were circulating outside of the Lyceum), various books on poetry, notably a book entitled “On Poets”, and another “Homeric Problems” (both of which we can still read a few fragments of) and even a (now entirely lost) catalogue of the tragedies and comedies that were put on stage in Athenian festivals, recording those which won which prize. Thus, poetry, and especially dramatic poetry and theater, rather than art in general, were apparently Aristotle’s chief concern.

It is probably the case that Aristotle considered tragedy and comedy to be paradigmatic works of art, which constituted the most attractive and exciting parts of the civic and religious festivals that were such important events in the lives of most Athenians and, more generally, of the people of Greek cities. But he also dedicated almost an entire book to music (book VIII of the Politics), and it is to be noted that his followers did likewise: in addition to his own books on poetry and comedy, Theophrastus wrote a work on music in three books (all lost, except for a few fragments), and Aristoxenus is the author of important treatises on music that we still (partly) have. On the other hand, before Aristotle Plato had expressed quite strong views on art generally speaking, and not only on poetry or music; in book X of the Republic, Socrates embarks on a critical review of mimesis as a whole, where mimetic art quite generally is at stake. Since it is difficult not to take Aristotle as responding to Plato’s critique of the arts in one way or another, it is quite natural to suppose that he also had some views on art in general, and not only on poetry or music.

But perhaps the main reason why one should seriously consider Aristotle as having general aesthetic views comes from an extraordinary passage which is too rarely quoted in Aristotelian scholarship. In one passage of the Eudemian Ethics (EE), Aristotle insists that the pleasurable experience (paschein) of contemplating a statue or listening to music has nothing to do with the pleasure that is at stake in the lack of self-control (akrasia, or what we usually call “weakness of will”):

no one would be considered to be unself-controlled for gazing at a beautiful statue or a beautiful horse or human, or listening to someone singing, without any desire to eat or drink or have sex, but just to gaze at beautiful objects or listen to the singing—any more than those who were spellbound by the Sirens would. (EE III 2.1230b25–35)

When people look at beautiful statues or persons, or listen to music without any other desire than the desire for such gazing or listening, they enjoy all these things “for their intrinsic qualities” and not “for their incidental associations” (or “accidentally”, kata symbebêkos). Only humans can enjoy such experiences, not animals; a lion can enjoy seeing a gazelle only as a potential meal and never for its beauty (Nicomachean Ethics (NE) III 13.1118a22–23). And the same goes for the sense of smell, Aristotle adds, quoting a witty saying by the musician Stratonicos: while a meal “smells delicious”, a flagrant flower “smells beautiful” (EE III 2.1231a11–12).

It can hardly be denied that this passage points to what we nowadays call an “aesthetic disinterestedness”, which implies the idea of a pleasurable experience that is typically human, one which pays attention to the object itself and its intrinsic qualities. And, one may add, it also points to the idea of judging the quality of the thing that is gazed at or listened to. And indeed, in another passage from the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle clearly implies this:

A virtuous person, as a virtuous person, takes pleasure in [others’] actions that express moral virtues, and is upset by actions caused by moral vices, just as a musician enjoys beautiful songs but finds bad ones painful. (NE IX 9.1170a8–11)

The virtuous person rejoices in someone else’s performing a morally good act thanks to her knowledge of what virtue consists in. The pleasurable experience a musician gets from music is primarily a sensory one linked to her faculty of hearing, to be sure, but also derives, as in the case of morality, from her musical knowledge. In other words, having experience and knowledge of music, or any kind of art, allows one to be a good judge of music, or any kind of art —that is to say what we would call a person of “aesthetic” taste. The goal of building and transmitting such knowledge in order to help his readers to become good judges could be considered the main reason why Aristotle wrote about art.

The following presentation reviews some of the most central topics we find in the works Aristotle dedicated to (what we call) art. The Poetics is of course our main entry into this, but his published works were actually the only works that were available outside his school throughout antiquity; most probably, non-Aristotelian philosophers from Philodemus to the late neo-Platonists only had access to those works, and not to the Poetics. In modern scholarship, those works are usually marginalized if not dismissed, on the grounds that they do not seem to reflect any deep philosophical insight. And, indeed, they were addressed to a general public. But (as we shall see), nothing indicates that the philosophically less elaborated views of On Poets would have been totally different from those in the Poetics, and in the latter work Aristotle does not hesitate to refer to the former. And the same goes for the Homeric Problems: chapter 25 of the Poetics seems to reformulate in a more abstract way the principles from which Aristotle discussed numerous examples of interpretive problems in that work. It is therefore a plausible hypothesis that Aristotle wanted to provide a broader public an echo of what he was teaching his philosophy students. Aristotle often recommends that we begin with more evident, concrete views before aiming at more sophisticated, deeper insights. Let us follow this methodological recommendation, and begin with the two published works.

Caveat lector. Before we get into the heart of our topic, a warning. The Poetics is one of the works from the ancient world that has elicited the most controversies, and it still does. As everybody knows, the word katharsis has more than any other made the greatest quantity of ink flow from the Renaissance onwards (when the treatise was rediscovered). But it is no exaggeration to say that almost every page, if not every sentence, of the Poetics has been interpreted in different ways, and so have many more general themes as well, such as the problem of who the treatise is addressed to, its general aim or, quite simply, its overall significance. The Greek text has not only been rather poorly transmitted (and it is still subject to many philological disputes among specialists), but it is also extremely dense and convoluted, and many terms are actually rather vague or ambiguous, and therefore subject to various possible interpretations (and translations). The reader of this general presentation should thus be warned that, like any other presentation of the Poetics, it is based on a (hopefully coherent) series of interpretive choices; some of the other main interpretive choices will be briefly described, or flagged in the notes.[2]

1. On Poets: How to Judge Poetry?

This work, a dialogue in three books, was apparently quite widely read in the ancient world. While the Poetics seems to have received no echo in antiquity, On Poets seems to have acquired the status of a reference work on Aristotle’s aesthetics; the fragments that we have come from a wide array of sources, including Philodemus, Ps-Plutarch, Athenaeus, Diogenes Laertius, Macrobius, and Proclus. Many fragments deal with entertaining stories such as the birth and death of Homer, or the presentation of the rivalries between the poets. However, it would be a mistake to draw the conclusion that the whole work would have consisted of such stories without any theoretical background. Actually, two topics that are crucial in the Poetics seem to have been central in On Poets as well: mimesis and the shortcomings of poets.

When opening the Poetics, the reader is struck by the repetition of the word mimêsis (and the verb mimeisthai), to the point that it defines what is (what we call) a work of art. Very roughly, one might say that the word mimêsis has both a static, or “pictorial” aspect, and a “dynamic”, or “theatrical” aspect. According to its “pictorial” aspect, mimêsis designates the fact that in such and such mimetic work, the receiver recognizes a resemblance. In the Poetics, Aristotle gives us a very telling example in evoking a painting or a sculpture in front of which the beholder recognizes, about a character represented, that “such and such a character is so-and-so” (4, 1448b17). According to its “dynamic” aspect, it is rather the behavior of the one who makes a mimêsis, which may range from the mimicking of noises or gestures to theater enactment. In Latin, mimêsis was rendered as imitatio, which indeed could include both meanings; but the English “imitation” hardly works, and perhaps the best solution after all is to keep the Greek term, transliterated as “mimesis” (“representation”, or “depiction”, works for the first connotation, but hardly for the second). Of course, often the use of the word, especially in poetry, includes both connotations: a play is a mimesis both in the sense of an enactment of some actions that are made by the characters of the play, and we can also recognize them as being the actions of such-and-such characters. Traditionally, a poetic work was defined in its opposition to prose, by versification (see, e.g., Gorgias’ definition of poetry: “I consider and call poetry every speech that possesses meter”, Helen 8). Aristotle opposes that idea, on the grounds that it does not allow us to understand the specificity of a poetic work, by giving the example of Empedocles “who has nothing in common with Homer except for the metric form” (Poetics 1, 1447b17–18): we do not infer from the fact that Empedocles writes in the same kind of verses as Homer that his work is epic poetry! What distinguishes Homer from Empedocles is that the former wrote a mimetic work, whereas Empedocles is a “philosopher of nature” (phusiologos, b19), who did not compose a mimesis. This concern is also to be found in On Poets, where Aristotle asks this question:

Are we not going to say that even though not in verse, the so-called mimes of Sophron are works in prose and works of representation, and that the same goes for the dialogues of Alexameneus of Teos, which were written before the Socratic dialogues? (Janko 2011, F44a)

Since such written dialogues are meant to be a mimesis of dialogues that did, or rather might have taken place, they too must be considered as a kind of poetry (or what we would call literature). Athenaeus, who quotes that question, interprets this as an attack against Plato:

While in the Republic Plato expelled Homer and mimetic poetry, he himself wrote his dialogues in mimetic form, and he is not even the inventor of that genre: before him, Alexamenus of Teos and Sotion invented that type of work in prose. (Janko 2011, F44a)

We cannot say whether Aristotle also intended this to be an attack against Plato; and it is important to note that we do not find anything like an explicit rebuttal of Plato’s views in the fragments we have, but it is difficult not to see in the quoted question at least a certain irony against Plato’s critique of mimesis.

The first century BC Epicurean philosopher Philodemus wrote a treatise also called On Poetry in which he seems to offer quotations or perhaps summaries of some passages of On Poets. What Aristotle seemed to have focused on is the nature of poetry, and the importance of mimesis (Janko 2011, F4: “mimêsis has been posited as essential to the art of poetry”). And he seems to have clearly stated that mimesis, at least in the case of poetry, involves people in action (Janko 2011, F6a: Poets “depict the actions of people acting…”), and that this action must be complete (Janko 2011, F45: “The poet is a representer of a complete action”), all of which will be elaborated upon in the Poetics.

The second theme that seems to have been central to this dialogue is that of the shortcomings of poets. It is on this theme that Aristotle refers to his dialogue in the Poetics, where he analyzed, Aristotle puts it, the “many mistakes” that poets can make

with regard to what affects the reactions of the public which are necessarily connected to the art of poetic composition. (15, 1454b15–18)

This sentence has often seemed cryptic. But we find an example of such a mistake in one of our fragments. It is a passage from the later Roman author Macrobius, who quotes an excerpt in Greek assuming that he is quoting Aristotle’s words (ipsa Aristotelis verba), and where we see Aristotle denouncing an error of Euripides, who in one of his plays states that Aetolian warriors fought without sandals on their left foot. It is an error because those warriors habitually fought without sandals on their right foot. As benign as it may seem from a historical point of view, it is a deep flaw if one considers the impact on spectators. Imagine that spectators realize the error in a theater setting: the scene would no longer be tragic, and the error would become comical and provoke laughter.

This topic is not at all marginal. On the contrary, pointing out the mistakes that poets, even the best ones, commit should help us readers tell the difference between good and bad poetry (or at least good and bad passages or scenes in a poem or play), that is, to make us “critical” readers of poetry, or watchers of theater plays. It is the first century AD rhetorician Dio Chrysostom who reports a tradition according to which Aristotle was “at the origin of literary criticism (kritikê)” (Janko 2011, T4). By that, he surely meant primarily the work of scholars such as Aristarchus of Samothrace, which consisted in commenting on Homer’s epics, or of those who commented on Aristophanes; but such kinds of works made sense only if one supposes that discriminating or judging (which is the core meaning of the verb krinein) the qualities and defects of such and such a literary work is what is at stake. And that activity, as we can see from On Poets, was not a domain reserved to the academic happy few. Rather, every educated person could be expected to engage in such critical assessment. In his Protagoras, Plato makes the famous sophist state:

In my opinion, the most important part of a man’s education consists in being proficient in poetry, that is, in being able to understand, in the productions of poets, those that are correctly made and those that are not, in knowing how to distinguish between them, and in knowing how to give an account of these judgments, if asked. (338e–339a)

Plato certainly mocks such a claim, just as, in the Ion, he mocks the rhapsode who believes he possesses a “science of poetry” or a “technique of poetic composition” (in 532c, Plato equivalently uses the words technê and epistêmê poiêtikê, or simply poiêtikê). In writing a “Treatise on poetic composition” (Peri poiêtikês), we can hypothesize that, unlike Plato, Aristotle followed the path indicated by Protagoras. And in publishing a more accessible work such as On Poets, Aristotle seems to take it for granted that every person should be offered the opportunity to become a good judge of poetry so that she can better appreciate the value of the poetry she reads or the plays she regularly goes to see in the theater. [3] (Note that in Aristotle’s time, many tragic and comic authors were still writing numerous plays, and that several of the plays of Aeschylus, Sophocles, or Euripides were available in book form, and were also regularly staged in Athens and elsewhere in the Greek world).

2. Homeric Problems: How to Defend Poetry?

Literary criticism is at the very core of the other major published work dealing with poetry, the so-called Homeric Problems. One cannot overestimate the role and importance of Homer in ancient Greek culture: he is commonly called “the poet”, and every educated Greek person knows many passages by heart. And yet, Homer had also been harshly criticized from very early on, notably by Xenophanes and Heraclitus, who reproached Homer for giving wrong images of the gods. This is in part because both read Homer literally, as if Homer were describing the real world of the gods. Plato famously follows suit: he too addresses the way people usually read Homeric epics as a sort of moral description and prescription of right and wrong behaviors; and since gods and heroes are to be taken as our moral paradigms, we must condemn (and withdraw or perhaps rewrite) the numerous passages where those gods and heroes commit wrongdoings. In turn, those critiques provoked equally strong reactions aimed at defending the poet. Some simply defended the Iliad and the Odyssey as offering right ethical models: after all, according to Homer, Achilles is the paradigmatic example of courage, and Odysseus of practical intelligence and resilience. This seems to be why the Socratic philosopher Antisthenes took Odysseus as one of his philosophical heroes, as a man whose endurance may be seen as paradigmatic of the endurance required for a virtuous life. A rather different way of defending Homer was to read his poems in an allegorical manner, as, notably, did the philosopher Metrodorus of Lampsacus (a contemporary of Socrates), who interpreted many Homeric passages in the light of the cosmology of Anaxagoras.

Aristotle’s Homeric Problems offers yet another manner of defense. As one can see from the fragments that we have, Aristotle never tries to exonerate Homer’s apparent shortcomings by arguing from an ethical or allegorical perspective. What he instead proposes is to respond to criticisms made against Homer from an art-centered perspective. He sought to determine, that is, how such and such a passage or verse should be judged by reference to the aim or function of the art of poetry, considered as art and in no other way. As he clearly states in the Poetics, which seems to recap how he presented his material in the Homeric Problems:

It is not the same criterion of correctness that applies in poetry and in politics, nor in poetry and in any other art. (25, 1460b13–15)

Judging poetry from the perspective of another domain, such as politics, biology or psychology, would be a methodological mistake, since their respective aim or function is not the same. In response to ethical condemnations faulting Homer for depicting the gods in a morally bad fashion, Aristotle calmly answers:

It is quite possible that the poets speak about them neither by idealizing them nor in a true way, and that things are as indeed as Xenophanes states: but in any case, it is how people speak of them. (1460b36–61a1)

Aristotle seems to agree with Xenophanes that it is wrong to believe that the gods look like human beings and share our bad behaviors; but the poets must take into account how people generally imagine them to be if they want to have them intervening in their plots. For representing the gods as morally good beings would actually make Homer’s epics rather odd to the people they were addressed to, which would have disturbed their involvement in the plot, and spoilt their pleasure. Another example comes from the scene in which Achilles pursues Hector: the way Achilles prevents the army from taking up arms against him and lets him go by a simple nod of the head is, from a psychological point of view, totally implausible (1460a14–16; Iliad 22, 205–206). But this is not an error we have to blame Homer for, Aristotle replies, since this adds to the effect of wonder, which is part of our pleasure: even if it is a mistake from a psychological perspective,

it is right if it achieves poetry’s aim […], if that way an even more striking effect is produced in that part of the poem or at a later stage. (1460b24–26)

In Homeric Problems, Aristotle presumably only dealt with Homer. But in Poetics 25, he wants to extend his approach to tragedy. One example concerns Menelaus in Euripides’ Orestes. There Aristotle agrees (presumably with other critics) that Euripides made a mistake in representing him as a coward (15, 1454a28–29; 25, 1461b19–21)—but not for ethical reasons. The offense is purely “poetical” or “artistic”: since pity and fear require that we admire the heroes on stage, having a base character must jeopardize the audience’s emotional reaction; if, on the other hand, the plot requires having such a hero (which is not the case in that play), that would not be a fault. One will also notice that Aristotle takes for granted that we can extend such views to the other domains of art. Another example is that of the painting of a horse “with two right legs stretched out towards the front” (1460b18–18). Aristotle believes (wrongly, as it happens) that this is physically impossible. Still, he avers that we must not judge the quality of the painting from a biological point of view. On the contrary, if the horse’s galloping in such a way effects a stronger emotional reaction in the viewer, that is the right way to represent it!

3. The Poetics: How to Understand Poetry ?

In these two published works, Aristotle’s primary goal was to offer instruction for becoming a sophisticated reader or spectator of poetic works. There is no reason why this general aim might have been different in the Poetics. This text has often been held, since its rediscovery in the Renaissance, as a manual for a would-be poet. And indeed, Aristotle’s tone is often very prescriptive: this “Treatise on the art of composing poetry” seems to lay down the rules that one must follow if one wants to write a successful play. But Aristotle also says, emphatically, that “the art of poetic composition belongs to a naturally gifted man” (17, 1455a32–33), and that making good metaphors, which is the prerogative of a good poet, is “something that cannot be learnt from someone else, but is the sign of natural talent” (22, 1459a4–6). It is thus unlikely that Aristotle had the ambition of training poets. Surely, what Aristotle proposes is to reconstruct what he takes the best set of composition rules, which in his view had helped, or would help, poets write good tragedies. But the exposition of these rules (which the poets may or may not be aware of: 8, 1451a23–24) is meant to show what good poetry should be like, such that his readers could appreciate the quality of a piece. And indeed, this is what the conclusion of the Poetics states:

This is all there is to say about tragedy versus epic … about the reasons why some are good and others not so good…. (26, 1462b16–18)

What the readers of the Poetics are offered are the reasons or causes why such and such feature of a play is to be considered good or poor. Armed with such knowledge, they should be better able to judge the quality of the tragedies they read or see in the theater.

As Aristotle posits, notably in the first book of the Metaphysics, searching for causes defines philosophical inquiry; knowing the cause of x allows you to understand what x consists in. And, crucially in Aristotle’s eyes, the final cause is what matters the most: when one knows the final cause of x, one can truly understand not only what x consists in, but should consist in if it is to be the x it is supposed to be. More precisely, the end of x amounts to the ergon, literally, the “work” or the “activity”, or what we more usually call the “function” that x performs; thus, for an eye, its aim or end amounts to its function, or “functioning” (or “working”, energeia) which is, of course, its seeing. Similarly, in the case of a hand: its function is grasping things, and when we talk of the hand of a dead body, we use the name “hand” only homonymously —a dead, non-functioning hand is no longer what it is to be a hand, or a “real” hand. And when an eye is seeing well, this is what Aristotle calls its entelecheia, that is when it performs its telos in a perfect (entelês) way. It is true that in the Poetics, we don’t find the typically Aristotelian technical words energeia and entelecheia. But presumably one may take the phrase “the best tragedy” (kallistê tragôgia) which is emphatically used in Poetics 13 as the equivalent, in common parlance, to a tragedy in entelecheia, that is a tragedy that performs its function, or its telos, in the best possible way. This phrase does not refer to any particular outstanding tragedy (say, Sophocles’ Oedipus-Rex, which Aristotle seems to like very much), or to an ideal tragedy that a poet should try to emulate, but rather to any tragedy that would or does indeed fulfill its function properly.

This very rough characterization of what the aim and the method of the Poetics consist in is in fact announced from its very first sentence:

This treatise is about how to compose poetry: what is poetry as such? What are the poetic genres? What power (dunamis) does each of them have? How should plots be constructed so as to end up with a successful work of poetry? How many components should there be, and what should these components be like? (1, 1447a8–11)

This gives us a clear plan of the Poetics, which divides into two parts: a first part is devoted to poetry “as such” (ch. 1–5), which can be considered as a kind of general introduction to what poetry is; and a second part, actually the bulk of it, is dedicated to its genres, that is, mainly tragedy and comedy, where the plot is treated as the main “component”. But perhaps most crucially, it also introduces the question of the “power” of each of the poetic genres. The word used is dunamis, which is here to be taken in the sense of “the ability to put something into movement”, that is, in our case, the power it exercises on the poetry’s recipient, or the “effect” it has on its consumer. It is, one may say, the “subjective” counterpart to the more “objective” side of the same thing, that is the function or work(ing) (the ergon or energeia) itself. So, the function of each genre of poetry, or its power or effect, is really what is of central importance in this inquiry. And (for reasons we are going to see), plot is seen by Aristotle as the best tool for implementing that effect. Now, it is not to be denied that a successful poet is the one who concentrates on plot when writing his plays. But this is not Aristotle’s main point of focus. His dominant agenda is to warn his readers right at the beginning of his treatise that they must focus on how the plot is constructed if they want to judge the extent to which such and such work of poetry succeeds, i.e., how well it performs its function.

Now, what concretely is the aim or the function of poetry? Homer has already told us very explicitly, notably in the famous episode of the Sirens (Odyssey 12. 39–54; 154–200), that the aim of his poetry is pleasure. Listening to the Sirens who are singing poetry, presumably Homer’s own Iliad (as they sing everything that took place under the walls of Troy), is something Odysseus, and actually every man, strongly desires, so strongly, as this episode amply illustrates, that he might even forget the very goal of his journey, namely the goal of returning home and being reunited with his family. Aristotle does not hesitate in mentioning that episode when, in the passage from the Eudemian Ethics already quoted, he describes what gazing at beautiful statues or listening to beautiful songs, or poetry, should amount to. In the Poetics, this is what he takes for granted: he assumes, as Homer does, that providing pleasure is the aim a poet must seek. A piece of poetry is successful when it provides pleasure to its consumers. But what precisely is this pleasure that poetry is meant to provide? How shall poetry accomplish that function? These are the questions that underlie the Poetics.

3.1 What is poetry as such?

Two major themes run through the first part of the Poetics on “poetry as such”: the naturalness of poetry and the division of poetry into serious and comic poetry.

The first sentence of Poetics 4 is famous for stating that two causes presided over the birth of poetry, and that those two causes are natural: the instinct that all men have for mimesis and the pleasure they take in the objects of mimesis (1448b4–5). A few lines further down, Aristotle adds to the instinct for mimesis, the instinct for melody and rhythm (1448b20–21). What he means exactly by these two causes is disputed. It might seem more natural to opt for mimetic instinct and pleasure, taking the musical instinct as part of the mimetic instinct (music also being a mimesis for Aristotle). But it should be noted on the one hand that this instinct for rhythm explains the versification (which in Greek is based on the rhythmic alternation of long and short syllables), which can hardly be qualified as mimesis. And on the other hand, that the pleasure is not only the one we take in the works resulting from the mimesis, but also in the mimesis itself. It seems that Aristotle apparently wants to speak not only about the two causes which preside over the poetic creation, but also about the causes which make for our attraction to poetic works, the two perspectives being intimately linked. Both poetic creation and our attraction to poetic works have as their causes our mimetic instinct and our musical instinct, as well as the pleasure that accompanies the expression of these two instincts. Here again, Aristotle has a totally different vision from Plato’s. Poets are not divinely inspired people: they are people who are naturally more gifted than most other humans (1448b22). And unlike Socrates who in the Republic seems to advocate a “natural city” which would not contain the mimetic arts, Aristotle takes them as part of human nature which a “natural” city must take into account. (One will remember the vivid response of Glaucon against Socrates’ proposal: “But this is a city for pigs!” [Rep. II 372d], meaning that such a city would be deprived of everything that makes for a properly human city. Aristotle would have applauded)

It is from this insistence on the naturalness of poetry and the centrality of pleasure that one should understand the division that Aristotle operates within poetry, between “laudative” and “serious” poetry, and “denigrating” and “funny” poetry, whose points of arrival are the genres of comedy and tragedy. At first sight, when Aristotle introduces the history of this division, he seems to rely on an ethical or social distinction:

Poetry branched into two, according to each poet’s character: the more serious-minded poets represented admirable actions, that is to say the actions carried out by that kind of person, whereas the more trivial poets depicted the actions of base people. (Poetics 4, 1448b24–26)

Presumably, Aristotle takes it that the first poems to date must have been what we call “lyric poetry”, with on the one hand the poetry of praise (such as those that Pindar would later write) and on the other hand satirical poems (predating those of Archilochus), and which are the latest ancestors of the tragic and comic plays. However, Aristotle himself qualifies such a presentation, adding that between those first lyrical poems and these two much later genres, stands Homer, who is the author of poems depicting admirable actions in his Iliad and Odyssey, and ridiculous ones in the Margites (a comic epic poem Aristotle takes to be Homeric). Insofar as Homer cannot be both below and above average, we must conclude that this distinction refers rather to what we would call “fictional” possibilities. A good poet is the one who, like a good actor, knows how to put himself in the shoes of his characters, whoever they may be (17, 1455a32–33), and Homer was particularly good at that (24, 1460a5–11). Moreover, there is no evidence that Aristotle held comedy as inferior to tragedy, nor is there any reason to believe that he held the spectators or readers of satires, the Margites or theater comedies to be “inferior” people. To say that “superior” or “inferior” people invented serious and comic poetry is in fact to say that they were particularly good at impersonating those types of characters. And the reason why the characters themselves must be represented either as “superior” or “inferior” is due to the aims of these poetic genres. In the case of tragedy, only “superior” characters can elicit our fear and pity: the more we admire someone, the more we pity him or her when they don’t merit their fate. Conversely, in comedy characters must be represented as “inferior” to elicit our mockery and laughter.

Aristotle supposes a temporal and essential filiation between these poetic genres: lyric poetry, both laudative and satiric (which, Aristotle oddly supposes, must have begun before Homer); serious and comic epic; and the genres of tragedy and comedy. The key moment is Homer. It is in Homer that “tragedy and comedy loomed out” (4, 1449a2–3), that is to say that poets saw in Homer’s poems the promises of comedy and tragedy; it is from there that they gave birth to these new genres and developed them (Aeschylus and Sophocles are named for being such developers). But above all, Aristotle adds that once these genres were discovered from Homer, all the poets abandoned lyric and epic poetry, and wrote in these two genres, “because these new genres had more prestige and value than the older ones” (1449a5–6). That is to say, the poets realized that by writing comedies or tragedies instead of epics, they could gain more prestige, and it is because of their value that people immediately became attached to these new genres. But why? Because these genres were entirely dramatic, and involved a fully enactive mimesis and used music (while epics were recited without music, at least in Aristotle’s time), they fully implement our natural instincts for both mimesis and music, and so they were more pleasant. If pleasure is the aim of poetry, it is only reasonable to focus on the most pleasurable genres, tragedy and comedy. (It is true that Aristotle goes back to epic after his treatment of tragedy, in Poetics 23–26, but it is essentially to help better understand tragedy, and to oppose other critics who took epics to be the most paradigmatic genre of poetry).

It is now time to ask ourselves what this pleasure of poetry might exactly amount to. In Poetics 4, Aristotle notoriously introduces the paradoxical example of an abject animal: while seeing such an animal provokes disgust and pain in the real world, seeing a picture of it produces pleasure. He explains why:

Seeing a likeness is pleasurable, because in contemplating it, people come to understand (manthanein) through inference, what each of its details are: for example, that the man there is so-and-so. (1448b15–17)

This sentence has often been taken as a commitment to what we might roughly label a cognitivist approach to aesthetic pleasure. The pleasure a work of art, be it a picture or a tragedy, affords would come from the understanding, or actually the “learning” (the verb manthanein can mean both), it allows; and the example of the man depicted in the picture would point to the idea that gazing at it, we could learn something new and fresh about that man.[4] (Some interpreters have even gone so far as to read the phrase “the man is so-and-so” as referring to his essence or a certain essential quality that the picture would allow us to grasp [Gallop 1990]). And since this is the pleasure that a mimesis generally speaking seems to afford, it is tempting to conclude that the pleasure that a tragedy or a comedy provides must be one species of such cognitive pleasure. But as others have replied (notably Lear 1988, and Ferrari 1999), such an interpretation is based on an over-reading of the text, especially if one fully takes into account what Aristotle immediately adds:

In case you never saw the man before, you will not derive any pleasure from his likeness qua representation. But you will get pleasure from the brilliant execution or the colours, or for some other such reason. (1448b17–19)

In other words, the “understanding” here barely amounts to the recognition of the man you already knew as so and so, like Socrates in the portrait of him in front of you.

To be sure, there may be cases where a more complex cognitive process takes place, such as in the case of a god which you recognize as being such and such, because you infer from, e.g., the statue having a thunderbolt in his hand, that it is intended to be Zeus. But in all such cases, there is no new learning involved. This reading of the text, however natural, may seem rather unappealing. But one should remember that here Aristotle is only giving a description of the general cause of our being attracted to mimesis: and indeed, were you not able to recognize what the object of the mimesis is, be it the voice of such and such a person, or the identity of the person depicted in this portrait, you wouldn’t be able to enjoy it qua mimesis. In tragedy and comedy, we do enjoy such pleasures as well; it is certainly pleasant to recognize the characters and their features when they intervene in the play, and that recognition is indeed a sine qua non of your following a plot, and enjoying the whole play; and the same goes, more basically, in cases where someone, in the real world or on stage, mimics the voice or the accent of a certain person: this affords you with the pleasure of recognizing who is meant. But all these pleasures are common to all sorts of mimesis. This is perhaps the most important point. As we have seen from the very first sentence of the Poetics, what Aristotle is interested in is inquiring into each of the poetic genres, and the power each has. And indeed, what Aristotle repeatedly emphasizes throughout the Poetics is that the poet must seek to produce the pleasure that is proper to such or such poetic genre: “one should not seek any kind of pleasure from tragedy but only the appropriate kind” (14, 1453b10–11). As for tragedy, Aristotle leaves no doubt: “What the tragic poet must produce is the pleasure derived from pity and fear through mimesis” (1453b11–13). Since book 2 is lost, we no longer have the formulation that Aristotle must have made in the case of comedy, but it is fairly obvious that he would have mentioned the pleasure associated with the amusement provoked by the comic plot’s jokes and gags. We do have something of an echo of such a statement in Poetics 13, which mentions the “pleasure proper to comedy”, and gives the example of a comedy where Orestes would make friends with Aegisthes instead of killing him: this parodic treatment of the tragic end of Sophocles’ or Euripides’ corresponding play, Electra, is what creates our amusement, that is our comic pleasure (1453a35–39).

Thus, the pleasure that is the aim of tragedy is an emotional pleasure, and the same goes for comedy. In the latter case, amusement (of which laughter is the physical expression) is certainly not an emotion strictly speaking, but is rather the experience of a state of mind, which, like an emotion, is an affect or what early modern philosophers will call a “passion”. (Here we may note that in the quoted passage from the Eudemian Ethics, Aristotle does not shy away from using the word paschein, i.e., undergoing a pathos, to describe the experience of gazing at a beautiful thing or listening to a fine tune.) As Plato had said, when we watch tragic heroes suffering on stage,

we take pleasure and, surrendering ourselves, we follow and share the hero’s sufferings and earnestly praise as a good poet whoever most affects us in this way; (Rep. X 605d)

and the same goes for comedy, which offers the opportunity of “taking great pleasure” (606c) in letting us “give in violent laughter”, and even “be overcome by laughter” (III 388e-89a). To be sure, for Plato, this is a surrender to the irrational part of our soul, which may have some deleterious consequences. Aristotle does not seem to be worried by that, at least not in the case of adults. In one passage of the Politics, he warns that letting children go to the theater and watch comedies where people insult one another or make obscene jokes can be damaging, and he does not hesitate to prohibit them from going to the theater. But once “their education has rendered them immune to the harm such things can do” (VII 17.1336b22–23), there is no reason why adults should be prohibited, or even discouraged, from enjoying comic theater. In fact, a similar point can be made in the case of tragic poetry as well: if in the theater (or in an epic recital), we do take pleasure when, as Plato vividly depicts it,

we hear Homer or any other tragic poet representing one of the heroes in a state of grief and making a long speech of lamentation or even chanting and beating his breast, (Rep. X 605c-d)

it would be a shameful thing to do so in the real world (where men at least were not allowed to express their grief aloud). Aristotle seems to take it as evident that the world of the theater is a fictive world that obeys other rules than the real world, and provided we have received a good ethical education, certain “politically incorrect” features, such as laughing at incongruous insults or “sharing the hero’s sufferings” and his “state of grief” in a boisterous manner should not cause any harm. Quite to the contrary, Aristotle seems to take tragic emotions and amusement as typical human propensities, which give us lots of pleasures when they are experienced in the theater.

3.2. Tragedy

The best tragedy, as we have seen, is the one that can best produce the power typical of a tragedy, i.e., producing pity and fear, and therefore can best achieve its function or aim, which is the pleasure that comes from the experience of these emotions. What Aristotle proposes in his analysis of tragedy is highlighting the means by which the poet can implement this function, which in turn should provide theater goers with the right understanding they need to have in order to be able to judge the quality of such and such a play they may attend, or read. As Aristotle announced right at the beginning, the plot is to be considered the most important means and indeed it is given the most expansive treatment, while the other “elements” of the tragedy, such as the depiction of the characters and their expression (or what we more commonly call the style, in which their dialogues are written), come next. This focus imposes itself from the perspective of the aim or function of poetry. A tragedy typically depicts the change of fortune which includes reversal of circumstances and sufferings, and rightly so: this is of course how fear and pity for the main heroes can be produced. Thus, the actions of the heroes that lead to such an outcome must be what a tragedy should mainly depict, or represent, as well as other features that are part and parcel of that outcome. The way plots are constructed or assembled from the various deeds and words of the characters (or what Aristotle calls the “events”, pragmata) should be what constitutes “the aim” of the poet (Poetics 6, 1450a22–23). This is the aim a poet must seek if he wants to end up with a tragedy that can fulfill its aim or function properly.

If a poet were to string together tirades describing characters, however perfectly composed in terms of expression and reasoning they might be, he will not be able to achieve what we have said is the function of tragedy: (1450a29–31)

presumably he might well provide a certain pleasure to his public (if only for the beauty of his style), but he would not obtain the proper aim or function of tragedy.

There are two series of requirements for a plot to be a good plot. One series involves the qualities of the plots, which includes totality, unity and generality (or: universality); the second one involves the turning points of the plot, which include the reversal of circumstances, the recognition, and the sufferings. But both series are based on what a proper consumption of tragedy requires: the first series is about our being involved in a plot; the second series, about what creates the emotions of pity and fear. Producing the pleasure that comes from the emotions of pity and fear is the aim of tragedy, but in order to achieve this, the poet must create a plot the hearers can immerse themselves in; as we would say, a theater audience must “believe” in the story that is unfolding and in the characters who make up the story. Otherwise, they would just lose attention and interest, which would prevent any strong emotional involvement. One such requirement is that of “the fitting size”. In the case of gazing at a beautiful animal, whether in reality or in a picture, our admirative enjoyment cannot hold if the animal or the picture is so big that it cannot be grasped in one glimpse, or if it is too minute to be seen at our ease. The case of a tragic plot is similar: a proper size is needed to make the whole play “easy to remember” (6, 1450b34–51a6). One must be able to remember the important features and events the full time we watch it, which is a sine qua non condition for our being unflaggingly attentive and attracted to the plot.

Another such sine qua non requirement is what one may call the “law of likelihood”, or “plausibility”. Aristotle strongly insists on this: all events must offer the appearance of causality, and follow not one after the other, but from each other (10, 1452a20–21). Faced with an event that is totally unexpected in being disconnected from any normal causal sequence would just be incredible, and, in worst cases, hearers would laugh instead of feeling pity or fear. Of course, unexpectedness can be an efficient tool for evoking strong reactions. For example,

when the statue of Mitys in Argos killed the person responsible for the death of Mitys himself by falling on him as he was staring at it, (9, 1452a7–9)

it must have created a big surprise, and putting such an event into a plot might be very powerful. But even if the event happened by pure coincidence, the poet must suppose that his audience will, even if subconsciously, admit a certain divine vengeful intention behind the event, so it appears to them as having a certain plausible cause. The poet has full license for inventing whatever events he wants, but they must appear “plausible” in one way or another. Or as Aristotle summarizes,

the function of the poet is not to speak of what has happened but of things such as they might happen, that is to say, to tell us of possible outcomes in all likelihood or out of necessity. (1451a36–38)

The weight is not so much on the fictionality of events, since the poet can also draw his material from events that actually occurred, but in the way he presents them: whether they actually happened or not, and whether they are physically possible, he must describe them in the way we would think they might happen. It is to be noted that “in all likelihood or out of necessity” is a rephrasing of the well-known “for the most part or out of necessity” motto in the Physics, where “for the most part” describes what actually happens to physical things which obey causal necessity, barring a few exceptions. In the case of poetry, or any other mimetic genre, the only causality we need is “subjective” causality, or plausibility. Aristotle even goes so far as to say: “What is impossible but plausible must be preferred to what is possible but not credible” (24, 1460a27): an event that has taken place, and so is physically possible, but which would not be presented in a plausible way would not succeed in gripping hearers.

It is in this context that Aristotle makes a comparison with history: while history must report hard facts as they actually happened, poetry must tell them as they might happen according to the law of plausibility. It is in this context where we find one of the most famous, and famously contentious, sentences of the Poetics:

This is the very reason why writing poetry is more philosophical and more worthy than writing history. For poetry tends towards a general picture (katholou), whereas history tells us of particular case studies. (9, 1451b5–7)

It is very tempting to interpret this as if Aristotle were proposing that poetry dealt with “universals” in the usual sense of the term, and thus conveyed “universal truths”. Many philosopher readers have assigned Aristotle a grandiose view of poetry, while historians have blamed him for undermining the importance of history. Both are probably overreactions. Aristotle does not say that history is not philosophical, but that poetry is “more philosophical” than history. Since philosophy is the search for causal understanding, we may suppose that “philosophical” means, in effect: “that which sees things under the perspective of causality”. Of course, history, as Herodotus claims in the very first sentence of his Histories, is also a search for the causes of the events he reports; but his main focus must be to report and explain those events as they actually happened, for example “what Alcibiades did or what happened to him” (1451b11). What the poet does is to take whatever event he may want to introduce into his plot and turn it into a plausible one—even the most factually impossible events!

For nothing prevents what really happened to be turned into things such as they might happen in all likelihood or be possible—it is this which makes him the poet of these. (1451b30–32)

This makes poetry, in the active sense of the term “making poetry” (the word poiêsis allows for both meanings), a “more philosophical” craft. And this involves “universals” in a non-technical sense, as Aristotle explains:

A general picture is this: the kind of thing a certain type of person would say or do in all likelihood or out of necessity. (1451b8–9)

“General”, or “universal”, does not describe here a specific item, but the way how one may expect someone will say or do things given the person she is. And that goes not only for tragedy, but also for comedy where (contrary to most tragedies which draw their plot from well known myths) particular names of the characters are up to the poet’s choice and added after the plot is written (1451b11–14): thus, here too, the crucial thing is to create a plausible plot where all the deeds and words done or uttered by the play’s characters seem to be causally related; this is what makes them plausible to an audience.

The second type of requirement involves the content of the plot. Generally speaking, a plot is constituted by all the events making up, as we say, the “dramatic action”. But what counts primarily among such events are three features. First, the reversal of circumstances which “is a volte-face change in the sequence of events” (11, 1452a22–23). This must happen “in all likelihood or out of necessity” as Aristotle insists, otherwise they would not achieve their aim, which is to provoke strong emotional reactions in the public. Emotional reaction is also created by recognitions: after, or just before, something important happens to a character, he or she is recognized as having such and such relation towards his or her protagonist (1452a36–b3). And, last but not least: audience members respond to sufferings (pathê), or rather what Aristotle determines as “an action conducive either to death or great pain” (1452b11–12), thus an act of violence that causes great suffering. This action is best conducted when it involves kin: it is much more powerful, emotionally speaking, to watch a scene in which, e.g., a mother is going to kill her son, or a daughter her father (14, 1453b19–22). In such tragic scenes, involving unexpected yet plausible changes of fortune, startling recognitions, and acts of violence, managing them in the right way is absolutely key if one wants to elicit the tragic emotions. These are pity and fear, which are the two moments, or aspects, of the same emotional experience, where fear concerns primarily the moment when a character is about to commit the irreparable towards his kin, while pity comes about at the sufferings and deep misfortunes of the involved parties.

If plot is at tragedy’s core, that is not to say that the play’s other features are of no importance. That is especially the case for how the characters are depicted, and how they speak. Both are a significant factor in rendering a plot successful. In a word, characters must be credible: when we see a character doing or saying such and such, we must believe in them. Characters must be normally virtuous, for otherwise we couldn’t admire them, and pity requires that we think that their misfortune is unmerited. Conversely, a woman shouldn’t be presented as talking like a philosopher (such as Menalippe in one of Euripides’ play), because no ancient Greek spectator would ever expect to see a woman speaking like a male philosopher (15, 1454a16–32). Building characters that correspond to an audience’s expectations is key if one wants to immerse them in a tragic play. As to the “expression”, or the style, characters must speak in a relatively clear and common way, so the spectators can easily follow the plot. But figures of style such as rare words or metaphors must be added at the right times, especially when what a character says may add to the scene’s emotional impact. Aristotle compares two ways of saying the same thing:

In his Philoctetes, Aeschylus had written: “The ulcer which eats the sole of my foot”, whereas Euripides replaced “eats” by “feasts on” (thoinaô). (22, 1458b19–24)

The rare, poetic verb that Euripides used produces an unusual impression, and for that very fact strikes the spectators, which is of course a means of still further increasing the pity they feel for this character whose foot is affected by a painful gangrene.

By reconstructing how tragedies can best implement their function, Aristotle intended to help his readers to become better judges and appreciators of the tragedies they could read or attend in the theater. But for any modern reader, there remain two perplexing questions. Whereas pity and fear are normally painful emotions, how are we to conceive of them as pleasurable? And what about the most enigmatic word of the Poetics, katharsis, which also seems to be presented as the aim of tragedy?

Since the Renaissance, the theme of katharsis, which appears in the definition of tragedy (tragedy is “a mimesis of a momentous action”, which “by stirring up pity and fear, brings about a katharsis of such emotions”—6,1449b25–28), has been the subject of endless debates, as Aristotle himself never explains himself about it. The interpretive conundrum is basically this. Normally, the word itself refers to the action of rendering something “pure” (katharos), with all the possible senses or connotations of “pure”: purification in a religious context (such as Orestes who undergoes a katharsis when digging in the sea to be “purified” of the murder of his mother, which Aristotle refers to at Poetics 17, 1455b15), purgation in a medical context, or cleaning in the case of an object that is dirty. It might mean either in principle, but we might expect the word to get its meaning from its context of use. But what is the context supposed to be in the case of tragedy? Aristotle does not tell us. In Politics VIII, he briefly mentions a kind of music, the so-called “enthusiastic music”, which provides a medical cure that consists in a katharsis for those who are especially prone to “enthusiasm” (or what we would call “frenzy”, or “agitation”). And then he adds:

The same thing, then, must be experienced by those who are especially prone to pity and fear and in general by those who are suffering from their emotions (pathetikoi) on the one hand, and by any other person to the extant as she shares in those emotions on the other hand: they all undergo a certain katharsis and get a pleasant feeling of relief. (Pol. VIII 7, 1342a11–15)

At least for the pathetikoi, the context seems to be medical. But is it the case for “each other person to the extent that she shares in those emotions”, i.e., notably the spectators of tragedy? When Aristotle refers to “a certain katharsis” (tina katharsin), he may mean either that all these people, the pathetikoi as well as anyone else, undergo the same sort of medical katharsis, or that they each undergo a different sort of katharsis.

The best known scholar forcefully endorsing the first interpretation remains Jakob Bernays (whose nephew by marriage, Freud, adapted the views to psychoanalysis): Aristotle, a doctor’s son, would have defended tragedy against Plato’s rejection by conceiving of it as sort of beneficial cure for all theater spectators (Bernays 1858). That interpretation (which has known several refinements, especially in German scholarship; collected in Luserke 1991) has been fiercely criticised for reducing tragedy to being a medical cure. Whereas Bernays was actually reacting against the strong ethical views of the German writer and philosopher Lessing, many contemporary scholars have proposed coming back to such views. According to one reading, defended by Richard Janko, the tragic katharsis should be conceived of as the purgation of the excessive emotions so as to obtain the right measure of pity and fear, which nicely matches Aristotle’s conception of virtue (see especially Janko 1992). But Aristotle seems adamant in the text of Politics VIII that music for katharsis is to be differentiated from music for moral education (7, 1341a21–24; 1341b38). And in the Poetics, Aristotle takes it as evident that emotions must be strongly experienced; aiming at the right, moderated measure of pity would actually spoil the typical pleasure that a good tragedy provides! Others, notably Martha Nussbaum, have suggested that in the case of people who go to the theater to enjoy the emotions of fear and pity, katharsis might mean “clarification” (i.e., the removal of obscurities; in his logical works, Aristotle does use the adverb katharôs in the sense of “clearly”); the tragic theater would then aim at providing spectators with a clarification of the pitiful, indeed tragic, human condition.[5] As philosophically engaging as that reading may be, there is no textual proof that Aristotle would have adopted such a grandiose view; and contrary to Nussbaum’s own views on ethics, where pity is considered a central ethical emotion, pity only plays a very marginal role in Aristotle’s ethics. Yet another kind of reading, relying on the idea that pity presupposes that the object must primarily be the spectator him- or herself, has insisted on the relief that such an emotional releasing might offer, consisting in a “consolation”: as Jonathan Lear states,

In tragedy, we are able to put ourselves imaginatively in a position in which there is nothing further to fear. There is consolation in realizing that one has experienced the worst, there is nothing further to fear, and yet the world remains a rational, meaningful place in which a person can conduct himself with dignity. (1988: 326; A reading of a similar kind has been offered by Munteanu 2012: 131–136)

Again, this is a fascinating approach of the ultimate meaning of tragedy, but it does not seem that Aristotle himself ever expressed such an idea of “consolation”.

It seems, therefore, that a much more minimalist reading might better suit Aristotle’s texts. One such reading, advocated by John Ferrari, is to take the word katharsis as a way to describe the process of relieving the tension created by the stimulation of the tragic emotions (Ferrari 1999, 2019). The great advantage of this interpretation is that it does not presuppose anything beyond the context of the Poetics, and it does not seem to contradict any other explicit statement of Aristotle’s; but one may wonder if it really explains the phrase, the “katharsis of such emotions”, where the idea of “tension”, or “suspense”, does not seem to be present. Another such reading might look like the following. In his biological works, Aristotle regularly uses the word katharsis to refer to the menstrual blood or bleeding as well as to the male ejaculation: in those cases, katharsis means the flowing itself (or by metonymy, the blood); and the fluid is nothing deleterious (interestingly enough, against Hippocratic views, Aristotle does not take menstrual blood to be “impure”). He holds rather only that keeping such fluid inside the body without discharge can be unhealthy, and so a discharge is needed from time to time. As Aristotle knew very well, ancient theater audiences showed their emotional reactions in a very physical way by screaming and weeping loudly. So, the katharsis of the emotions of pity and fear could be meant to name that sort of physical expression or outlet of such emotions. This last reading might perhaps not appear worthy of Aristotle’s philosophical genius. But it would fit the aim Aristotle has himself proposed: to explain how a tragedy accomplishes its function, which is to produce the emotions of pity and fear, and the pleasure accompanying them. Saying that a tragedy is a mimesis which “by stirring up pity and fear, brings about a katharsis of such emotions” might simply mean that tragedy should indeed aim to allowing spectators to express and unleash their emotions in the theater.[6]

The second perplexing question involves what modern aestheticians call the “paradoxical pleasure of negative emotions”. How is it that we can enjoy emotions such as pity and fear that are normally painful? It is quite often assumed that katharsis can do just that, transform the pain of those emotions into pleasure, through the feeling of relief that accompanies it. But it would be very counter-intuitive to reduce the pleasure any audience gets from a play to just that pleasure, which follows or is the consequence of a katharsis. For one would then have to suppose that a theater audience would suffer all through the play to finally undergo a katharsis, and get their pleasure at the play’s end, on leaving the theater! As Aristotle surely noticed himself, an audience that has felt great fear for heroes on the verge of grave suffering and has wept and cried during a two hour show, will normally leave the theater with a physical sense of relief. But when he says that the poet must “produce the pleasure from pity and fear through mimesis (dia mimêseôs)”, Aristotle probably wanted to allude to the fact that mimesis is what makes those emotions a source of pleasure. How are we understand this more precisely? Relying on Kendall Walton’s theory of “make-believe”, one might be tempted to take mimesis here as what would allow spectators to pretend to have those emotions. But nothing indicates that Aristotle would have shared such a conception; on the contrary, describing what even the simple reading of such a powerful plot as Sophocles’ Oedipus-Rex would produce, he speaks of shuddering or getting goosebumps (phrittein), which seems to indicate that we actually experience strong emotional reaction (14, 1453b3–6). (And the same would hold for pity which produces tears). Thus, insofar as we immerse ourselves in a tragic plot and “believe” in its characters, it is probably in some way a painful emotional experience. But we also know that a story experienced in this way takes place in an imaginative world, where there is no real object to be feared. Thus mimesis, one might say, allows us to experience fear for itself (and as Aristotle says in a passage from De Anima, imagining fearful objects is “up to us”, while seeing them in the real world is not: 427b14–21), which is pleasurable. This is not to say, though, that this would annihilate the painfulness of the experience. As Plato explicitly said (and there is no reason to think Aristotle would have disapproved), this is precisely what makes tragic pleasures so paradoxically attractive: they are a kind of mixture of pain and pleasure (Philebus 48a).[7]

3.3 Comedy

Many if not most scholars seem to consider tragedy to be the best possible kind of poetry in Aristotle’s eyes. But Aristotle never suggests that; on the contrary, he insists that tragedy and comedy, each constituting a fully enactive mimesis, are the most perfect genres of poetry, each one corresponding to our natural inclinations for tears and laughter. Whereas the tragic poet must produce strong emotions in order to enjoy a tragic play, the comic poet must produce amusement, which finds its physical expression in laughter. (Also, as a few lines from the neo-platonists Iamblichus and Proclus forcefully suggest, it might well be the case that Aristotle thought there was a katharsis in comedy as well, which would perfectly fit the last proposed interpretation: a comic katharsis would just amount to the expression or the outlet of laughter.)[8]

In chapter 5 of our Poetics, Aristotle presents comedy with these terse words:

Comedy, as we have already said, is the representation of men of lesser value, but not in a sense that would imply all defects: ridicule is only a part of what is shameful. What makes people laugh is indeed a form of error or physical ugliness which does not cause suffering or death, as is immediately seen from a comedy mask: it is something ugly and deformed, but which does not express any suffering. (1449a32–37)

Scholars have often drawn on the idea that aggressiveness or, as Bergson would say, “malice”, would be at the heart of comedy as Aristotle sees it. And indeed, this is already what Plato defends in a famous passage of the Philebus (47d-50b): it would be phthonos (an emotion that is often translated as “malice” or “ill will”, but that designates above all “envy”) that would be the hidden cause of our laughter (Imagine your neighbor, whose new Ferrari you envy, inadvertently crashing it into his garage door: the strength of your laughter would be proportional to your envy!).[9]

But let us return to the example of the comedy he mentions in Poetics 13, where spectators see Orestes ending up being reconciled with Aegisthes. What makes them laugh at that ending? Undoubtedly, the ancient spectators must have felt a sense of indignation: not avenging one’s father by killing his murderer is a moral fault. But it cannot be indignation that causes them to laugh (if anything, indignation provokes anger, not amusement). What makes them laugh, rather, is the complete oddity of such a reconciliation, its sheer incongruity. So more generally, one may suppose, what makes one laugh is the incongruity of the blunders of the characters on stage, perhaps coupled with their ugliness (which is moreover accentuated by the mask the actors wear). That these characters must be “inferior” is a psychological requirement that is the opposite of that of tragedy: if we can only feel fear and pity towards a hero who does not deserve his fate, we readily laugh at a man full of himself who slips on a banana peel. Similarly, Aristotle’s insists that a character’s blunders must not cause him to suffer, and that therefore a comedy cannot end with the characters’ misfortune or death. That would not be funny: a comedy in which the arrogant character killed himself on a banana peel would end our amusement (provided we are average, morally good people). And this also implies that our negative feelings towards such characters, made up of a certain contempt and perhaps a feeling of superiority (as Hobbes would say), is really just a kind of game: we do not feel any real animosity or condescension towards comedy characters. If we really felt indignation when attending that comedy of Orestes, we would not be able to laugh.

In the third book of the Rhetoric, dedicated to the figures of speech, Aristotle recalls that in his Poetics, presumably in its second book on comedy, he spoke of different “types of jokes” (III 18, 1419b6–7). There is perhaps a difference of emphasis on this point between comedy and tragedy. If a comedy must also have a good plot, having good jokes is essential:

It is especially in regard to these [funny comparisons] that poets fail with the public if they do not make them well, and if they do make them well, that they are popular. (11, 1413a10–11)

It is impossible to reconstruct what exactly those “types of jokes” would have been. But in his treatment there of the figures of speech, Aristotle evokes those that the comic poet uses. The central idea that emerges is that of incongruity. Aristotle argues that a serious speech that wants to persuade its listeners must use a “suitable”, or “appropriate” style, where the words chosen are “in proportion” (to analogon) to the things they signify. If there is disproportion, or what we call “incongruity”, that speech’s style will be “like that of comedy”. And to exemplify what he seriously states, Aristotle makes a joke at the expenses of a tragedy writer, a certain Cleophon, whose style was (at least in Aristotle’s eyes) rather like a comedy writer’s: “Some of his expressions were like saying: august fig tree” (III 7, 1408a10–16). This expression is funny (and not at all appropriate to the tragic style), because there is a total incongruity between this adjective which is normally reserved for a goddess or a queen, and that tree which, in ancient Greece, was considered of little value.

In the case of tragedy, Aristotle’s aim is to reconstruct for his readers what the art of poetic composition should be, in order to enable them to distinguish a good tragedy from a bad one and to explain why. There is no reason to think that this should not also have been his goal in writing on comedy. We have no direct echo of this in our Poetics, but a passage from the Nicomachean Ethics provides a clue worth following. It comes from the chapter devoted to the virtue of “sense of humor” (eutrapelia), which consists in being able to make good jokes among friends as well as in being able to take mockery against oneself with good grace. It is in this context that we read this statement:

The amusement of the free man is very different from that of the slave, that of the educated man from that of an uneducated man. This can be seen also in the ancient and recent comedies: in the former, what makes one laugh is obscene language, in the latter, it is rather the innuendos (huponoia), and this difference is not small in view of elegance (euschêmosunê). (IV 8, 1128a20–25)

To be sure, this is an analogy that is intended to make clear what kind of jokes decent citizens should make or hear in the real world. But this analogy also reveals the normative judgment that Aristotle suggests when it comes to theater: good comedy, that which is intended for educated audiences, should use innuendo and allusion, not obscene language. This is not an ethical normativity, but a normativity intrinsic to the art of making people laugh. Jokes that use crude and obscene language are what might be called “easy jokes”, which require no originality and inventiveness on the part of the jokester. On the contrary, good jokes must be “refined”, or “elegant”, which show a good, truly incongruous and sophisticated use of the figures of speech.[10]

4. Music and the Value of Art

What is the value of poetry, or art more generally? Neither in the Poetics nor in the published works on poetry does Aristotle seem to be bothered by that question. But since this is yet another perplexing question for us, many scholars have been tempted to supply an ethical answer. Interpreting the katharsis clause in this way has been one major way of satisfying the urge to answer this question. But even without relying on that admittedly controversial phrase, other ethically tinged answers have been offered. For example, why can’t we read tragedies as providing us an attractive way to develop a typically “emotional understanding” of important ethical features, such as the importance of being moved by other people’s misfortunes (Halliwell 1986, 2002)? Or, more specifically, shouldn’t tragedies allow for imagining ethical situations that would help spectators illuminate issues linked to their use of practical wisdom (Frede 1992; Belfiore 1992; Donini 2004)?[11] There is certainly much to say in favor of such readings, especially if one focuses on, say, Antigone or Philoctetes. But when Aristotle mentions these plays, he does not at all give the impression that he takes them to be paradigmatic of the genre (In the Poetics, he mentions the former in the framework of a critique of the quite untragic way Sophocles has depicted Haemon, who did not dare to kill his father Creon: 14, 1454a1–2; as to the latter, one verse of Euripides’ lost play is quoted for the appropriate use of a rare verb: Poetics 22, 1458b22–24). Instead, the two plays that he seems to take as paradigmatic (and to which he refers the most) are Sophocles’ Oedipus-Rex and Euripides’ Iphigenia in Tauris. Certainly, Oedipus-Rex can easily be read as providing a kind of insight into the deep miseries a human being can be subjected to; but one may fairly doubt that it might really help people in their use of practical wisdom. As to Iphigenia in Tauris, it would require a tremendous battery of arguments to persuade modern readers that they should read it in a either such way—and it is no surprise that no scholar has attempted to do so!

More generally, there are at least two main rebuttals to be made against such ethical readings of the Poetics (and presumably Aristotle’s aesthetics in general).[12] First, what then about comedy? When he mentions a possible positive use of comedy, Plato proposes that virtuous citizens watch them for a better grasp of what vices look like: “We must learn to recognizes buffoonery in order to avoid doing or saying anything ridiculous out of ignorance” (Laws VII 816e). It is telling that Aristotle never mentions such an odd suggestion: how can we possibly learn about vice while we are enjoying the jokes and gaffes that pepper comedic plots? A second reply comes from what Aristotle says about music in Politics VIII. There, he begins by repeating faithfully what Plato had proposed: since music can represent virtues like courage, children must learn to play it and it is through enjoying singing and playing such music that they will subconsciously come to enjoy those virtues. But then, in a second instance, Aristotle vigorously, if implicitly, opposes Plato. In the Laws, Plato very much insists that adult citizens of Magnesia must continue singing and dancing in order to bolster their virtues (II 664d). Aristotle is no less insistent that once adults, the citizens of his ideal city stop singing and playing music and instead hire professional musicians and enjoy listening to them during their “free time” (VIII 6, 1340b35–39).

“Free time” or “leisure” (scholê) is a key concept (on this, see Too 1998; Heath 2014; and Ferrari 2019). It does not mean the pause or the rest one takes from work; it is a time, or a mode of life, where activities are enjoyed for themselves. In the Nicomachean Ethics, it is at the core of the argument for the primacy of theoretical activity: while contemplation is typically a leisured activity, political activities constitute the non-leisured life, one which is meant to achieve practical goals (X 8, 1177b4–24). And in Politics VII-VIII, when defending his own proposal as how organize a perfect city, Aristotle goes as far as saying: “To be able to enjoy leisure rightly is the principle of everything” (VIII 3, 1337b31–32). In the case of music, Aristotle makes it clear that if music can be listened to for the practical purpose of relaxation (a little bit like our ambient music), or fostering virtue (as children must do), music can also be listened to for its own sake, just for the sake of enjoying it. Here Aristotle seems to be repeating what he says in the passage of the Eudemian Ethics already quoted, but he adds something we do not find there: music “for the sake of leisure” is characterized as a music “for the sake of intelligence (phronêsis)” (VIII 5, 1339a14–26).

Unfortunately, Aristotle does not spell out what exactly he means by that, and the phrase has been variously interpreted. Again, some scholars have proposed an ethical reading: the intelligence involved would amount to the practical intelligence, or wisdom (which is typically called phronêsis), that is required in any moral action. Thus, by listening to music that depicts, or “represents”, say, courage, one may better understand what courage is. Despite its seeming natural, this reading contradicts what Aristotle repeats in those same pages: moral, or political, action is fundamentally a non-leisured activity (ascholia). It would be odd then if Aristotle were recommending such a leisured use of music while aiming to describe how to manage non-leisured moral life! Another theme that is also repeated in those pages should give us a better clue: the final aim of learning how to sing and play an instrument is to help these future citizens become “good judges” of music (VIII 6, 1340b35–39). In the Laws, Plato also used that phrase, and meant by it that adult citizens should be able to recognize morally good from morally bad songs, and thus enable them to decide which songs must be sung in Magnesia (II 669a-670c). There is no reason to believe Aristotle would have endorsed such a strong ethical-cum-political agenda. Instead, it is very likely that by “judging”, Aristotle just means that by having the first-hand experience of playing music, citizens will be able to judge and appreciate the good quality of music. And, as all musical connoisseurs know, such an appreciation is both perceptual (as we do enjoy listening to sounds and rhythm) and also somehow intellectual: a connoisseur, that is, equally enjoys how well or inventively a piece of music is constructed.[13]

Admittedly, all of this is absent from the Poetics, where the word “leisure” does not even appear. But when in the Politics, he presents his conception of a music that should be listened to and appreciated for its own sake, it is surprising that Aristotle gives as justification the example of Homer, and cites several verses from the Odyssey: besides music for relaxation and moral education, there is

music for a life spent in leisure, which is the very reason why people bring it in. They give it a place among the leisure time that they think befits free people. That is why Homer wrote these verses: […] “They invite the bard who charms them all”. And elsewhere, Odysseus says that the best way to spend one’s life is in view when men are rejoicing: “the guests sit in a row in the room to listen to the bard”. (VIII 3, 1338a21–30)

Of course, Aristotle must have been aware that the bard is the one who sings poetry, whether lyric or epic, with the accompaniment of the lyre. This argument therefore implies that it is actually the listening and appreciation of performed poetry that must constitute such a leisured activity. And since in the Poetics, tragedy and comedy are presented as poetic forms that are more valuable than epic or lyric poetry, Aristotle must also have considered attending tragic and comic plays as part of these leisured activities, or more generally of what he calls in that passage of the Politics, a “free life”, that is a life of free citizens (not of slaves), but also a life that in which time is spent enjoying music or poetry for their own sake.

In the case of music, Aristotle strongly recommends that children learn how to play an instrument (actually, the lyre) so that once adults they will be able to fully enjoy beautiful songs since they will have become able to “judge the beautiful songs” and therefore “enjoy them for themselves” (Pol. VIII 6, 1340b38–39). This is also the case for visual arts: children, Aristotle proposes, should learn how to draw images in order to be able “to contemplate the beauty of bodies” (1338a40–b2). In both cases, their pleasure can be taken along the lines in which Aristotle defines pleasure in his Nicomachean Ethics: it is the unimpeded activity, or “activation”, of their natural capacity, or faculty, of hearing and seeing respectively. But Aristotle importantly adds: “when it comes to the best possible object” to be heard or seen (NE 10.4, 1174b14–23). We therefore need to learn how to judge how good the objects of our listening or seeing are. And once we have learned this, we can fully enjoy pieces of music and paintings or sculptures that we know are those that best suit our respective faculties.

Aristotle never makes such a suggestion in the case of poetry; and indeed, if one holds that poetry is a matter of exceptional natural gift, as Aristotle does, it would be odd to propose that every child should practice composing poetry. One might then perhaps take his writings on poetry offered as a sort of late education on such artworks. Through their reading of either the Poetics (if they get the chance of enrolling in the Lyceum) or Aristotle’s published works, people can become such connoisseurs of poetry, and enjoy it fully too.

It is often claimed that the ancients did not value artworks in the ways we moderns do. Ancient Greek theater, which includes poetry, scene painting and music, the argument goes, is only one moment of religious festivals where a whole city came to unite in shared activities and values. And despite all his critiques of the theater, for which he coined the despising word “theatrocracy” (Laws III 701a), Plato nevertheless emphasized that the right sorts of poetry and music should play a crucial role in the moral education of youth. But Aristotle seems very much unconcerned about the religious and political context of theater performances; and it is telling that he doesn’t say anything worth noticing about the role of the gods in the tragedies. (Actually, these elements are even a matter of reproach that classicists often make against him![14]) And he vividly opposes a complete subjection of art to any other useful objective: “To search everywhere for what is useful is totally inappropriate for those who are great in soul and free” (Pol. VIII 3, 1338b2–4). In other words, if indeed it may be useful to listen to some sorts of music for educational or therapeutic purposes, music can, and should, also be enjoyed for itself, and the same goes for painting and poetry. To be sure, by themselves, the objects of mimesis may not be worthy. But even the lowest animals, as Aristotle states in the preface of his Parts of Animals, do offer “extraordinary pleasures to those who are able to know their causes and are naturally gifted for philosophical understanding” (I 5, 645a9–10). In the case of animals and plants, we admire the way “artistic nature” (dêmiourgêsasa phusis) has built them. In the case of artworks,

we enjoy gazing at likenesses of animals because we are at the same time contemplating how artistic craft (dêmiourgêsasa technê), whether painting or sculpture, has produced them; (645a11–12)

that is, when we are connoisseurs of art. True, as Aristotle also says in that preface, divine beings such as celestial bodies and unmoved gods are much more worthy objects to contemplate (mostly because they are eternal). And indeed, as he repeats in his Nicomachean Ethics and Politics, philosophical contemplation, which culminates in exercising our intellect towards such divine objects, is the highest activity one can attain. But such philosophical contemplation, whether it comes to these divine entities or to the causes of the animals and plants, is deemed to remain for the “naturally gifted for philosophical understanding” which are few, as Aristotle seems to admit with regret. By contrast, provided one gets the right artistic education leading to connoisseurship, contemplating art can be part and parcel of everyone’s happiness (or typically human flourishing: eudaimonia).


A. Selected Texts, Translations, Commentaries

  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics (NE), Eudemian Ethics (EE), De Anima, Parts of Animals, Rhetoric, Politics, fragments of On Poets, and fragments of Homeric Problems; any edition. All translations by the author of this entry unless otherwise noted.
  • Bywater, Ingram (ed./trans.), 1909, Aristotle, On the Art of Poetry. A Revised Text, with Critical Introduction, Translation and Commentary, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Carroll, Mitchell, 1895, Aristotle’s Poetics, C. XXV, in the Light of the Homeric Scholia, Baltimore: J. Murphy.
  • Destrée, Pierre, 2021, Aristote. La Poétique, Paris: Flammarion.
  • Donini, Pierluigi, 2008, Aristotele. Poetica, Turin: Einaudi.
  • Dupont-Roc, Roselyne and Jean Lallot, 1980, Aristote. La Poétique, Paris: Le Seuil.
  • Else, Gerald F., 1957, Aristotle’s Poetics: The Argument, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Flashar, Hellmut, Uwe Dubielzig, and Barbara Breitenberger (eds.), 2006, Fragmente zu Philosophie, Rhetorik, Poetik, Dichtung, (Aristoteles Werke, Band 20/I), Berlin: Akademie Verlag. doi:10.1524/9783050048901
  • Goldschmidt, Victor, 1982, Temps physique et temps tragique chez Aristote, Paris: Vrin.
  • Gorgias, Helen (Encomium of Helen), any edition. Translation by the author.
  • Halliwell, Stephen, 1987, The Poetics of Aristotle, London: Duckworth.
  • ––– (ed./trans.), 1995, Aristotle: Poetics (Loeb Classical Library, 199), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Heath, Malcolm (trans.), 1996, Aristotle: Poetics, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Iamblichus, On Mysteries, translated in Janko 1987.
  • Janko, Richard, 1984, Aristotle on Comedy: Towards a Reconstruction of Poetics Ii, London: Duckworth.
  • ––– (trans.), 1987, Aristotle. Poetics I with the Tractatus Coislinianus, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • ––– (trans./ed.), 2011, Philodemus, On Poems, Books 3–4, with the Fragments of Aristotle, On Poets, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kassel, Rudolf (trans.), 1965, Aristotelis de arte poetica liber, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kraut, Richard (trans.), 1997, Aristotle. Politics VII and VIII, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Plato, Republic, Philebus, and Laws, any edition. All translations by the author unless otherwise noted.
  • Proclus, Commentary on Plato’s Republic, translated in Janko 1987.
  • Schmitt, Arbogast, 2008, Aristoteles. Poetik, Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • Sinnott, Eduardo, 2006, Aristóteles. Poetica, Buenos Aires: Colihue.
  • Tarán, Leonardo and Dimitri Gutas, 2012, Aristotle “Poetics”: Editio Maior of the Greek Text with Historical Introductions and Philological Commentaries, Leiden/Boston: Brill.

B. Selected Secondary Literature

  • Armstrong, J. M., 1998, “Aristotle on the Philosophical Nature of Poetry”, The Classical Quarterly, 48(2): 447–455. doi:10.1093/cq/48.2.447
  • Belfiore, Elizabeth S., 1992, Tragic Pleasures: Aristotle on Plot and Emotion, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. doi:10.1515/9781400862573
  • Bernays, Jacob, 1858, Grundzüge der verlorenen Abhandlung des Aristoteles über die Wirkung der Tragödie, Breslau.
  • Bouchard, Elsa, 2012, “Audience, Poetic Justice, and Aesthetic Value in Aristotle’s Poetics”, in Aesthetic Value in Classical Antiquity, Ineke Sluiter and Ralph M. Rosen (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 183–213. doi:10.1163/9789004232822_009
  • –––, 2016, Du Lycée au Musée: théorie poétique et critique littéraire à l’époque hellénistique, Paris: Presses de l’université de Paris-Sorbonne.
  • Curran, Angela, 2016, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Aristotle and the “Poetics”, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315771991
  • Depew, David J., 1991, “Politics, Music, and Contemplation in Aristotle’s Ideal State”, in A Companion to Aristotle’s “Politics”, David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell, 346–80.
  • –––, 2006, “From Hymn to Tragedy: Aristotle’s Biological Genealogy of Poetic Kinds”, in The Origins of Theater in Ancient Greece and Beyond: From Ritual to Drama, Eric Csapo and Margaret C. Miller (eds), New York: Cambridge University Press, 126–149.
  • Destrée, Pierre, 2013, “Aristotle on the Paradox of Tragic Pleasure”, in Suffering Art Gladly: The Paradox of Negative Emotion in Art, Jerrold Levinson (ed.), London: Palgrave Macmillan UK, 3–27. doi:10.1057/9781137313713_1
  • –––, 2016, “Aristotle on the Power of Music in Tragedy”, Greek and Roman Musical Studies, 4(2): 231–252. doi:10.1163/22129758-12341277
  • –––, 2018, “Aristotle on Music for Leisure”, in Music, Text, and Culture in Ancient Greece, Tom Phillips and Armand D’Angour (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 183–202.
  • –––, 2019, “Aristotle on Why We Laugh at Jokes”, in Laughter, Humor, and Comedy in Ancient Philosophy, Pierre Destrée and Franco V. Trivigno (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 35–51. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190460549.003.0003
  • Destrée, Pierre, Malcolm Heath, and Dana L. Munteanu (eds.), 2020, The Poetics in Its Aristotelian Context, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780429347276
  • Donini, Pierluigi, 2004, La tragedia e la vita. Saggi sulla Poetica di Aristotele, Alessandria: Editioni dell’ Orso.
  • Dow, Jamie, 2021, “Beware of Imitations!: Aristotle and the Paradox of Fiction”, Ancient Philosophy, 41(2): 519–549. doi:10.5840/ancientphil202141231
  • Ferrari, G. R. F., 1999, “Aristotle’s Literary Aesthetics”, Phronesis, 44(3): 181–198. doi:10.1163/15685289960500024
  • –––, 2019, “Aristotle on Musical Catharsis and the Pleasure of a Good Story”, Phronesis, 64(2): 117–171. doi:10.1163/15685284-12341956
  • Ford, Andrew Laughlin, 1995, “Katharsis: The Ancient Problem”, in Performativity and Performance, Andrew Parker and Eve Kosofsky Sedgwick (eds),New York: Routledge, 109–132.
  • –––, 2002, The Origins of Criticism: Literary Culture and Poetic Theory in Classical Greece, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2004, “Catharsis: The Power of Music in Aristotle’s Politics”, in Music and the Muses: The Culture of Mousike in the Classical Athenian City, Penelope Murray and Peter Wilson (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 309–336. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199242399.003.0012
  • –––, 2015, “The Purpose of Aristotle’s Poetics”, Classical Philology, 110(1): 1–21. doi:10.1086/678678
  • Frede. Dorothea, 1992, “Necessity, Chance, and ‘What Happens for the Most Part’”, in Rorty 1992: 197–219.
  • Gallop David, 1990, “Animals in the Poetics”, in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 8, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 145–171.
  • Golden, Leon, 1976, “The Clarification Theory of ‘Katharsis’”, Hermes, 104(4): 437–452.
  • –––, 1984, “Aristotle on Comedy”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 42(3): 283–290. doi:10.2307/429709
  • González, José M., 2019, “The Aristotelian Psychology of Tragic Mimesis”, Phronesis, 64(2): 172–245. doi:10.1163/15685284-12341958
  • Hall, Edith, 1996, “Is There a Polis In Aristotle’s Poetics?” in Tragedy and the Tragic: Greek Theatre and Beyond, M.S. Silk (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 295–309.
  • Halliwell, Stephen, 1986, Aristotle’s Poetics, London: Duckworth.
  • –––, 2002, The Aesthetics of Mimesis: Ancient Texts and Modern Problems, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2008, Greek Laughter: A Study of Cultural Psychology from Homer to Early Christianity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511483004
  • –––, 2011, Between Ecstasy and TruthInterpretations of Greek Poetics from Homer to Longinus, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199570560.001.0001
  • Heath, Malcolm, 1989, “Aristotelian Comedy”, The Classical Quarterly, 39(2): 344–354. doi:10.1017/S0009838800037411
  • –––, 1991, “The Universality of Poetry in Aristotle’s Poetics”, The Classical Quarterly, 41(2): 389–402. doi:10.1017/S0009838800004559
  • –––, 2009, “Should There Have Been a Polis in Aristotle’s Poetics?”, The Classical Quarterly, 59(2): 468–485. doi:10.1017/S0009838809990115
  • –––, 2013, Ancient Philosophical Poetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139018258
  • –––, 2014, “Aristotle and the Value of Tragedy”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 54(2): 111–123. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayu006
  • –––, 2017, “Aristotle on the Best Kind of Tragic Plot: Re-Reading Poetics 13–14”, in Reading Aristotle: Exposition and Argument, William Wians and Ron Polansky (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 334–351. doi:10.1163/9789004340084_014
  • Höffe, Otfried (ed.), 2009, Aristoteles. Poetik (Klassiker Auslegen, 38), Berlin: Akademie Verlag. doi:10.1524/9783050050119
  • Janko, Richard, 1992, “From Catharsis to the Aristotelian Mean”, in Rorty 1992: 341–358.
  • Jones, Elizabeth M., 2012, “Allocating Musical Pleasure: Performance, Pleasure, and Value in Aristotle’s Politics”, in Aesthetic Value in Classical Antiquity, Ineke Sluiter and Ralph M. Rosen (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 159–182. doi:10.1163/9789004232822_008
  • Konstan, David, 2006, “Aristotle on the Tragic Emotions”, in The Soul of Tragedy: Essays on Athenian Drama, Victoria Pedrick and Stephen M. Oberhelman (eds), Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 13–25.
  • Lear, Jonathan, 1988 [1992], “Katharsis”, Phronesis 33(3): 297–326. Reprinted in Rorty 1992: 315–340. doi:10.1163/156852888X00216
  • Lockwood, Thornton C., 2017, “Aristotle on the (Alleged) Inferiority of History to Poetry”, in Reading Aristotle: Argument and Exposition, William Wians and Ron Polansky (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 315–333. doi:10.1163/9789004340084_013
  • Lord, Carnes, 1982, Education and Culture in the Political Thought of Aristotle, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1974, “Aristotle’s History of Poetry”, Transactions of the American Philological Association, 104: 195–229. doi:10.2307/2936090
  • Luserke, Matthias (ed.), 1991, Die aristotelische Katharsis: Dokumente ihrer Deutung im 19. und 20. Jahrhundert, Hildesheim: Olms.
  • Mayhew, Robert, 2019, Aristotle’s Lost Homeric Problems: Textual Studies, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198834564.001.0001
  • Munteanu, Dana LaCourse, 2012, Tragic Pathos: Pity and Fear in Greek Philosophy and Tragedy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139028257
  • Narbonne, Jean-Marc, 2017, “Likely and Necessary: The Poetics of Aristotle and the Problem of Literary Leeway”, Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium of Ancient Philosophy, 33: 69–87. doi:10.1163/22134417-00331P08
  • Nehamas, Alexander, 1994, “Pity and Fear in the Rhetoric and the Poetics”, in Aristotle’s Rhetoric: Philosophical Essays, David J. Furley and Alexander Nehamas (eds), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 257–282.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C., 1986, “Luck and the Tragic Emotions”, in her The Fragility of Goodness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 378–394.
  • –––, 1992, “Tragedy and Self-Sufficiency: Plato and Aristotle on Fear and Pity”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 10, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 107–159. Reprinted in Rorty 1992, pp. 261–290.
  • O’Sullivan, Neil, 1995, “Aristotle on Dramatic Probability”, Classical Journal, 91(6): 47–63.
  • Peponi, Anastasia-Erasmia, 2017, “Aristotle’s Definition of Dance”, in Choreutika. Performing and Theorizing Dance in Ancient Greece, Laura Gianvittorio (ed.), Pise/Rome: F. Serra, 215–243.
  • Rapp, Christof, 2006, “Katharsis der Emotionen”, in Katharsis vor Aristoteles. Zum kulturellen Hintergrund des Tragödiensatzes, Martin Vöhler and Bernd Seidensticker (eds), Berlin/New York: de Gruyter, 149–172. doi:10.1515/9783110204285.3.149
  • Rees, B. R., 1972, “Pathos in the Poetics of Aristotle”, Greece and Rome, 19(1): 1–11. doi:10.1017/S0017383500016636
  • Rorty, Amélie Oksenberg (ed.), 1992, Essays on Aristotle’s Poetics, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Schütrumpf, Eckart, 1989, “Traditional Elements in the Concept of Hamartia in Aristotle’s Poetics”, Harvard Studies in Classical Philology, 92: 137–156. doi:10.2307/311356
  • Scott, Gregory, 1999, “The Poetics of Performance: The Necessity of Performance, Spectacle, Music, and Dance in Aristotelian Tragedy”, in Performance and Authenticity in the Arts, Salim Kemal and Ivan Gaskell (eds), New York: Cambridge University Press, 15–48.
  • –––, 2003, “Purging the Poetics”, in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 25, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 233–263.
  • Sifakis, Gregory Michael, 2001, Aristotle on the Function of Tragic Poetry, Herakleion: Crete University Press.
  • Stinton, T. C. W., 1975, “Hamartia in Aristotle And Greek Tragedy”, The Classical Quarterly, 25(2): 221–254. doi:10.1017/S0009838800030068
  • Too, Y. Lee, 1998, “Discriminating Pleasures: Aristotle’s Poetics and the Civic Spectator”, in his The Idea of Ancient Literary Criticism, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 82–114.
  • Trivigno, Franco V., 2020, “Was phthonos a comedic emotion for Aristotle? On the pleasure and moral psychology of laughter”, in Destrée, Heath, and Munteanu 2020: 66–87.
  • Tsitsiridis, Stavros, 2005, “Mimesis and Understanding: An Interpretation of Aristotle’s Poetics 4.1448b4–19”, The Classical Quarterly, 55(2): 435–446. doi:10.1093/cq/bmi041
  • Veloso, Claudio William, 2007, “Aristotle’s Poetics without Katharsis, Fear, or Pity”, in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 33, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 254–84.
  • Yates, Velvet, 1998, “A Sexual Model of Catharsis”, Apeiron, 31(1): 35–58. doi:10.1515/APEIRON.1998.31.1.35

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]


The author is very grateful to E. Belfiore, M. Johnson, M.E. Peláez, and C. Shields for their very helpful remarks, critiques, and suggestions.

Copyright © 2021 by
Pierre Destrée <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free