Supplement to Aristotle’s Rhetoric

The Thesis that Enthymemes are Relaxed Inferences

Burnyeat (1994, 1996) bases his suggestion that enthymemes are relaxed inferences on a peculiar interpretation of the following piece of text:

[…] and since the rhetorical proof is an enthymeme, and this again, to put it simply, is the most important of the means of persuasion and the enthymeme is a sort of sullogismos (sullogismos tis); and since it belongs to dialectic, either to dialectic as whole or one part of it, to consider each (sort of) sullogismos alike, it is obvious that the one who is most capable of considering this, i.e. from which things and how the sullogismos comes about, [that] this one will also be most competent in mastering the enthymeme […] (Rhet. I.1, 1355a6–12)

Burnyeat suggests that the formulation sullogismos tis, which is usually rendered as “a sort of sullogismos”, thus regarding the enthymeme a proper sort or type of sullogismos, should be read as a so-called alienans qualification in the sense that it is only a sullogismos of a sort, i.e. not a full-blooded specimen. As already indicated, this would help to explain (a) that typically Aristotelian enthymemes do not comply with the form of the categorical syllogisms that we know from his Prior Analytics and (b) that according to Aristotle certain sign enthymemes are not deductively valid, but are nevertheless said to be ‘enthymemes’. However, there are many other passages in the Rhetoric that straightforwardly render the enthymeme as a sullogismos (e.g. 1357a16, 1359a9–10, 1394a26–27, 1395b22) or as the rhetorical sullogismos (1356b4, 1357a23, 1358a11) without inserting the tis-qualification. Here it should be noted that the argument in the passage quoted above requires the dialectical expertise of the rhetorician precisely because it is said to be sullogismos, not because it is something like a sullogismos. This is why some authors prefer to abide by the traditional reading (see e.g. Rapp 2002, II 59–72).

Another strategy to establish that the enthymeme is not strictly speaking a sullogismos or deductive argument, but rather a relaxed form of inference, is based on the definition of the enthymeme:

but when, certain things being the case, something different results beside them by virtue of their being the case, either universally or for the most part, it is called deduction here (in dialectic) and enthymeme there (in rhetoric). (Rhet. I.2, 1356ba15–17)

It is remarkable that Aristotle uses the qualification “either universally or for the most part”. Does he want to suggest that in some cases the conclusion follows universally, i.e., by necessity, while in other cases it follows only for the most part? At first glance, this seems to be inconsistent, since a non-necessary inference is no longer a deductive argument. However, several scholars (Grimaldi 1980, 50, Wörner 1990, 352–53, Burnyeat 1994, 19–20, Allen 2001, 32) take this formulation to mean that Aristotle wishes to allow for the possibility that at least some enthymemes are no sullogismoi at all, provided that “for the most part” qualifies the logical consequence as such, implying that at least in some cases (most notably, according to Burnyeat, in the case of probability arguments) the conclusion follows only for the most part, i.e. not necessarily.

By contrast, there are readings of the quoted passage available that are consistent with the claim that enthymemes are sullogismoi and are, hence, not relaxed, but intended to be deductively valid arguments. For example it is possible to refer the qualification “either universally or for the most part” not to the logical inference as such (taken as a qualification of the inference as such it would amount to saying: “If for the most part such and such is the case it follows for the most part that something different is the case”), but to the conclusion in the sense of the deduced proposition (which would boil down to saying “If for the most part such and such is the case it follows by necessity that for the most part something different is the case”, which would leave the logical inference intact). According to the latter reading (which has a parallel in An. post. 87b23–25), an enthymeme whose premises and conclusion are for the most part true would still be a valid deduction (see Rapp 2002, II 165–168). Relaxed inferences can also be avoided by referring the formulation “either universally or for the most part” not to the verb that indicates the consequence (i.e. to result, to follow), but to the immediately preceding words “by virtue of their being the case”; this would yield the deflationary sense that the things that are posited in the premise (or premises) are the case either generally or (only) for the most part and that the conclusion comes about because of their being either generally or for the most part the case (see Rapp 2011).

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Christof Rapp <>

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