Supplement to Aristotle’s Rhetoric

Judgemental and Non-Judgemental Accounts of Aristotelian Emotions

It is generally acknowledged as a major achievement of the Rhetoric’s discussion of emotions that the particular types of emotions are defined by their objects and are thus pictured as having cognitive content. Indeed, Chapters 2-11 of Rhetoric II define several types of emotions (see §2 above) in terms of the focal properties of each particular type of emotion and the typical objects at which each is directed (for an in-depth discussion of the most important types of emotions see Konstan 2006). Anger e.g. is always directed at what someone takes to be an insult, fear at what appears to be an imminent painful or destructive evil, pity at what one regards as undeserved misfortune, etc. This trait of the Rhetoric’s discussion of emotions seems to mark a significant development within the philosophy of emotions in general, but it also seems to be particularly important for the method of rhetorical persuasion, for at least some sort of covariance between a person’s emotional states on the one hand and what she thinks, opines, judges, perceives or imagines on the other seems to be a precondition for the rhetorical method of steering the audience’s emotional state (see §5.2 above). And this required covariance seems to be important at two different stages of the formation of judgements. First, the hearer is likely to change her emotional state in response to the different contents she is currently cognizing. If e.g. someone takes it to be the case or imagines that she is threatened by an imminent painful or destructive evil, she is likely to feel fear, according to Aristotle’s definition. Second, the emotional condition the hearer happens to be in is likely to have an impact on the judgement she is going to pass. Being e.g. in an anxious or fearful condition, the member of an assembly is likely to pass judgements that tend to be less confident and to pay more attention to possible threats and risks. The rhetorician tries to influence or enhance this latter judgement of the hearers by referring them to objects or states of affairs that are likely to alter their emotional conditions in a predictable way, and this condition again is likely to have an impact on the resulting judgement (see Fortenbaugh 1970 and 2002, 94–114 for seminal discussions of the role and nature of emotions in Aristotelian rhetoric).

Given the function of the rhetorical arousal of emotions (namely to influence the formation of a judgement in the audience) and given the only means available to a rhetorician for playing on the audience’s emotions (namely to draw the audience’s attention through the speech to e.g. a possibly terrifying object and thus to make them think, opine or judge that there is, e.g. an imminent painful or destructive evil), it is only natural that the Rhetoric emphasizes the connection between emotions and judgements. Put differently, it is first of all due to the Rhetoric’s peculiar interest in the rhetorical arousal of emotions that it highlights the judgemental aspect of emotions. Does this mean that Aristotle’s Rhetoric defends a judgemental account of emotions? This is less clear and much more controversial. It has led to the controversy between judgemental, belief-based or ‘doxastic’ accounts of emotions on the one hand, and non-doxastic, non-judgemental, phantasia-based accounts on the other (for a survey on this debate see Pearson 2014). Is Aristotle’s theory of emotions not only cognitive, but also belief- or judgement-based or is it cognitive through the peculiar contribution of the capacity of phantasia? One might doubt, in the first place, whether the Rhetoric, due to its peculiar nature and interest, is the right place to look for an elaborated defence of any particular theory of emotion; however, it is legitimate to inquire e.g. whether the recommended method of emotion arousal in the Rhetoric presupposes either a belief- or a phantasia-based account. In a similar vein, it is a non-trivial decision for this kind of debate whether the Rhetoric’s vocabulary for mental or psychological states, such as krisis (judgement) or phantasia (imagination, appearance), should be taken to comply with the technical vocabulary of the De Anima (see Aristotle: psychology) and the ethical writings or not.

The debate about judgemental and non-judgemental accounts of emotions in Aristotle can be framed in various ways. One might e.g. debate whether judgements/beliefs are necessary constituents of each and every emotion or whether they are not necessary while phantasia or the products of phantasia, i.e. phantasmata, are necessary ingredients of emotions. Alternatively, one can zoom in on the question whether the cognizing or the representational state involved in emotions is either judgement/belief or phantasia. On closer examination, the attempt to decide this debate would involve other and, perhaps, deeper questions that can hardly be answered by the evidence provided by the Rhetoric alone, namely whether the various emotions treated in Aristotle make up something like a unified natural class, displaying a unified structure, or whether Aristotle’s examples of emotions are meant to be more like an open list, containing items with varying structures (the latter option could better deal with the fact that e.g. in the chapter on mildness Aristotle rather deals with the calming of an emotion, namely anger, than with an episodic emotion). Similarly, it makes a major difference whether one regards emotions as one unified state or as complex states consisting of different ingredients (e.g. pleasure/pain, sometimes judgement/belief, sometimes appearance/imagination, episodes of desire: sometimes related to particular courses of action, sometimes not, etc.).

In a nutshell, the judgemental or belief-based camp is usually exemplified by the positions of Nussbaum 1996 and Fortenbaugh 2002 (originally published in 1975). Fortenbaugh, in particular, draws on the practice of arousing emotions in the Rhetoric and it is, as already indicated, quite natural that Aristotle in this context emphasizes what people think or believe (see also Rapp 2002, II 556f. and Dow 2009), so it might be the rhetorical context that justifies a preference for belief-based accounts. However, it has been objected that even in the Rhetoric Aristotle defines particular emotions with reference to phantasia, for example when he defines fear as a kind of pain and excitement resulting from the phantasia (appearance, imagination) of an imminent painful or destructive evil. However, since phantasia is mentioned only with regard to some types of emotions (putting the question of technical and non-technical uses of the word aside), this can hardly be meant as a defining characteristic of all kinds of emotions. For this reason, defenders of the phantasia-based account claim that formulations such as phainesthai (to seem, to appear) or phainomenon (seeming, appearing) that Aristotle typically uses when he refers to the objects of emotions (e.g. the seeming insult, or what seems or appears to be an insult), belong to the phantasia-language (see Moss 2012, 75–85) and thus indicate that appearance in the technical sense is involved. It has been objected though (see e.g. Fortenbaugh 2002, epilogue, and Dow 2009) that these formulations are compatible with the belief-based account when they are taken to mean e.g. ‘conspicuous insult’ or ‘what someone takes to be an insult’, thus highlighting that e.g. anger can be triggered by someone’s subjective belief that an insult took place, without it actually being the case that there was such an insult. Another objection against accounts that make judgements/beliefs necessary ingredients of emotions comes from the phenomenon of animal emotions. Aristotle himself is happy in his biological work to ascribe various emotions to non-human animals, which would be inconsistent if we take beliefs/judgements to involve rationality and if animals are thought to lack this rationality (Sihvola 1996 e.g. criticizes Nussbaum’s judgemental account with reference to animal emotions; see Sorabji 1993 on the psychological background of this kind of debate). The same problem as in the case of animal emotions occurs for human beings when their reason is either not yet developed (as in the case of small children) or temporarily obstructed (as in the case of drunken, sleepy or overly emotional adults). One might therefore wonder whether even emotions of the same type, say fear, may come about through different channels, as it were, depending on who undergoes this emotion in what kind of situation — for example, through the phantasia of an approaching enemy in one case and through the well-considered judgement that an enemy is likely to arrive soon in the other. In a similar vein, Pearson 2014, 209, arrives at the conclusion that “Aristotle thinks that a variety of psychological states can grasp the cognitive content invloved in emotions.”

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Christof Rapp <>

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