Supplement to Aristotle’s Rhetoric

The Variety of topoi in the Rhetoric

The several topoi that can be found under the headings ‘specific’ and ‘common’ do not by any means make up two homogeneous classes. Some of them have only a vague affinity with the standard form of topoi that predominates in the book Topics. Some so-called topoi of the Rhetoric belong neither to the specific nor to the common class, but are just instructions or patterns that are somehow useful in public speech. At least the following groups must be distinguished:

  Place Description Examples
(i) I.5–14
(without I.6b—I.7)
specific topoi of the three species of speech “Further, health, beauty, and the like are goods, for being bodily excellences and productive of many other good things.” “It is noble to avenge oneself on one’s enemies and not to come to terms with them; for requital is just, and the just is noble.”
(ii) I.6b topoi on controversial goods “That which most people seek after, and which is obviously an object of contention, is also a good; for, as has been shown, that is good which is sought after by everybody, and ‘most people’ is taken to be equivalent to ‘everybody’.”
(iii) I.7 topoi on the greater good (the better) “Again, where one good is always accompanied by another, but does not always accompany it, it is greater than the other, for the use of the second thing is implied in the use of the first.”
(iv) I.15 topoi of non-technical means of persuasion “We shall argue that justice indeed is true and profitable, but that sham justice is not, and that consequently the written law is not, because it does not fulfill the true purpose of law.”
(v) II.2–11, II.12–17 topoi to arouse emotions “Again we are angry if something is not in line with what we expected, since what is not in line with what we expect provides more pain.”
(vi) II.19 topoi about the possible, the past, the future “If the beginning of a thing can occur, so can the end; for nothing impossible occurs or begins to occur.”
(vii) II.23–24 common topoi
(type 1)
“If a quality does not in fact exist where it is more likely to exist, it clearly does not exist where it is less likely.”
(viii) II.23–24 common topoi
(type 2)
“Another line of argument is common to forensic and deliberative oratory, namely, to consider inducements and deterrents, and the motives people have for doing or avoiding the actions in question.”
(ix) II.23–24 common topoi
(type 3)
“Another line is to apply to the other speaker what he has said against yourself.”
(x) III.15 topoi for slandering “Another method is to denounce calumny, by saying what an enormity it is, and in particular that it raises false issues, and that it means a lack of confidence in the merits of his case.”

Typical examples of group (i) can be found in chapters I.5–6 (first half), 9 and others. Starting from a definition of happiness, good, honorable and just, etc., these topoi instruct the formulation of arguments to the effect that items of a certain type are part of happiness, are good, honorable, just, etc. The groups (ii) und (iii) have been inserted to indicate that the so-called specific topoi include various kinds of instructions: while the topoi of the first group offer determinate premises from which one can deduce that items of a certain type are good, just, etc., the topoi of groups (ii) to (iii) help to construe diverse premises for items of several kinds. The topoi of group (iv) tell the orator what to say if one is using non-technical (i.e., artless) means of persuasion such as contracts, laws, witnesses, etc. Just like the topoi of group (x), which offer the orators formulas for slandering, the underlying concept of topos in this group is essentially the same as in the pre-Aristotelian usage. The items mentioned in group (v), by which the orator should be enabled to arouse certain emotions in different contexts, are also called ‘topoi’, though they do not contribute to argumentation in the strictest sense. The formal character of the topoi of group (vi) is quite similar to that of the topoi of the Topics. The topoi of groups (vii) to (ix) are common insofar as they are not connected with a certain species of rhetoric. But while the topoi of group (vii) are roughly of the same type as the topoi of the Topics, other so-called ‘common’ topoi are exclusively suited for rhetorical purposes; the topoi of group (ix) only offer strategic advice.

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Christof Rapp <>

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