The Capability Approach

First published Thu Apr 14, 2011; substantive revision Thu Dec 10, 2020

The capability approach is a theoretical framework that entails two normative claims: first, the claim that the freedom to achieve well-being is of primary moral importance and, second, that well-being should be understood in terms of people’s capabilities and functionings. Capabilities are the doings and beings that people can achieve if they so choose — their opportunity to do or be such things as being well-nourished, getting married, being educated, and travelling; functionings are capabilities that have been realized. Whether someone can convert a set of means - resources and public goods - into a functioning (i.e., whether she has a particular capability) crucially depends on certain personal, sociopolitical, and environmental conditions, which, in the capability literature, are called ‘conversion factors.’ Capabilities have also been referred to as real or substantive freedoms as they denote the freedoms that have been cleared of any potential obstacles, in contrast to mere formal rights and freedoms.

Within philosophy, the capability approach has been employed to the development of several conceptual and normative theories within, most prominently, development ethics, political philosophy, public health ethics, environmental ethics and climate justice, and philosophy of education. This proliferation of capability literature has led to questions concerning what kind of framework it is (section 1); how its core concepts should be defined (section 2); how it can be further specified for particular purposes (section 3); what is needed to develop the capability approach into an account of social justice (section 4); how it relates to non-Western philosophies (section 5); and how it can be and has been applied in practice (section 6). 

1. Introducing the capability approach

1.1 Background: Critique of other accounts

Although we can trace some aspects of the capability approach back to, among others, Aristotle, Adam Smith, and Karl Marx (see Nussbaum 1988, 1992, 2020; Sen 1993a, 1999: 14, 24; Walsh 2000), it is economist-philosopher Amartya Sen who pioneered the approach and philosopher Martha Nussbaum and a growing number of other scholars across the humanities and the social sciences who have significantly developed it. The capability approach purports that freedom to achieve well-being is a matter of what people are able to do and to be, and thus the kind of life they are effectively able to lead.

The capability approach has its origins in a number of articles in which Sen (1974; 1979a; 1979b) criticizes the limited informational bases of the traditional economic models and evaluative accounts (i.e., utilitarianism and resourcism). What is missing from these traditional models, Sen argues, is a notion of what activities we are able to undertake (‘doings’) and the kinds of persons we are able to be (‘beings’). Sen calls this notion capabilities. Capabilities are the real freedoms that people have to achieve their potential doings and beings. Real freedom in this sense means that one has all the required means necessary to achieve that doing or being if one wishes to. That is, it is not merely the formal freedom to do or be something, but the substantial opportunity to achieve it. 

In this way, the capability approach changes the focus from means (the resources people have and the public goods they can access) to ends (what they are able to do and be with those resources and goods). This shift in focus is justified because resources and goods alone do not ensure that people are able to convert them into actual doings and beings. Two persons with similar sets of goods and resources may nevertheless be able to achieve very different ends depending on their circumstances. 

One of the most prominent illustrations within the capability literature of the need to move beyond a focus on goods and resources is found in Sen’s (1979a) “Equality of What?” Tanner lectures. Here, Sen asks us to consider two persons with the same set of resources. Yet, one person suffers from a disability. This disability makes her unequal to the able-bodied person in two regards, which cannot be captured by a sole focus on resources. First of all, the disabled person is unequal in terms of what she can do or be with her resources compared with the physically able person. She may, for example, be confined to a wheelchair and thus restricted to places that are wheelchair-accessible. Secondly, the disabled person may even be doubly worse off because she only gets the same amount of resources even though she has more expenses in order to correct for her disability. That is, because the disabled person needs to spend a considerable amount of her resources on a wheelchair merely to move around, she has fewer resources available to pursue other goals than the able-bodied person who can spend all her resources on pursuing her valued ends. Thus, in order to evaluate people’s well-being, we need to not only consider the amount of resources they have, but also what they are able to do and be with those resources.   

In “Equality of What?” Sen also objects to utilitarian measures of well-being. According to a utilitarian measure, someone’s well-being should be evaluated in terms of the amount of utility, such as pleasure or happiness, that they derive from the resources and goods that they have. Consequently, a utilitarian may argue that the above example only shows that we ought to distribute more resources, goods, and freedoms to the disabled person to the extent that she experiences the same amount of well-being as the able-bodied person. As Sen (1979a) has shown, however, this response is inadequate. The disabled person may be a pleasure wizard who gains a lot of utility from very little input. Conversely, the able-bodied person may be very hard to please and thus requires a large input of resources and freedoms in order to detect an increase in well-being. In this case, Sen notes, the amended utilitarian position would actually direct more resources and freedoms to the able-bodied person and less to the disabled one. But surely it cannot be right to provide less help to those with greater needs, merely because they are easier to satisfy. As Sen himself has documented, people living in deprivation may actually tend to lower their expectations as a coping mechanism (e.g., Kynch and Sen 1983). But just because they experience a bigger increase in well-being from fewer resources, it does not mean that the situation is justified or justifiable in the first place. 

Philosophical accounts of well-being, freedom, and justice should thus recognize the diversity of human needs and personal and contextual circumstances. This is exactly what the notions of capabilities and functionings do. By focusing on what people are able to do and be, rather than merely on the distribution of goods and resources, the capability approach recognizes the diversity of people’s ability to convert those resources and goods into real opportunities and achievements - the kind of life they are effectively able to lead.

1.2 Capability framework or capability theory?

The capability approach is generally conceived as a flexible and multi-purpose framework, rather than a precise theory of well-being (Qizilbash 2008; Robeyns 2005, 94-96; Sen 1992; 2009). This open-ended and underspecified nature partly explains why the term ‘capability approach’ was chosen and is now used in the philosophical literature rather than, say, ‘capability theory’. The terms ‘capability approach’ and ‘capabilities approach’ are both used in the literature to refer to the same thing, though the latter is often considered to refer more specifically to Nussbaum’s partial theory of justice. Some philosophers have started to use the term ‘capabilitarianism’ (Robeyns 2016; Nielsen and Axelsen 2017). The proliferation of literature on the capability approach has engendered a discussion about how to exactly define and understand it.

Despite some philosophical disagreements about the best description of the capability approach, it is generally understood as a conceptual framework for a range of normative exercises, including most prominently the following: (1) the assessment of individual well-being; (2) the evaluation and assessment of social arrangements; and (3) the design of policies and proposals about social change in society. In all these normative exercises, the capability approach prioritizes certain of peoples’ beings and doings and their opportunities to realize those beings and doings (such as their genuine opportunities to be educated, their ability to move around or to enjoy supportive social relationships). This stands in contrast to other accounts of well-being, which focus exclusively on subjective categories (such as happiness) or on the material means to well-being (such as resources like income or wealth).

Nussbaum (2011a) has described the general capability approach (not her own specific theory) as consisting of two clusters, one focussing on comparative quality of life and the other on theorising about justice. The two clusters would share a focus on what people are able doing and being, and would share a commitment to five principles: treating each person as an end; a focus on choice and freedom rather than achievements; pluralism about values; being deeply concerned with entrenched social injustices; and ascribing an urgent task to government. However, it has been argued that only two of those (namely, treating each person as an end and pluralism about values) are genuinely essential to each and every capability theory, and that in addition there exists work in the capability approach that does not neatly fit into one of the two clusters that Nussbaum proposes (Robeyns 2016). 

In contrast to Nussbaum’s narrow understanding of the capability approach, Robeyns (2017) argues that we can and should distinguish between, on the one hand, the capability approach as an underspecified and open-ended framework and, on the other hand, the capability approach as more specific capability theories. The capability approach should be defined as a normative framework, which can host a wide variety of more specific theories and applications, such as, for example, Nussbaum’s partial capability theory of justice, Crocker’s capability theory of deliberative democracy, and capabilitarian econometrics. Likewise, Qizilbash (2012) argues that the capability approach should be seen as a ‘thin’ framework, which can be filled in by ‘thicker’ theories and applications. While all of these accounts may differ greatly in their specific structure, purpose, and normative commitments, they all adhere to the same normative core, namely a normative commitment to conceptualize well-being in terms of capabilities and functionings.

This core can then be supplemented through certain choices (see sections 2 and 3), such as a particular purpose, methodological and meta-theoretical commitments, and additional normative values to develop more particular theories, such as a capability theory of justice or democracy, or applied to particular tasks, such as empirical studies or the conceptualization of education, health, and so on.  

Confusingly, within the literature the term ‘the capability approach’ has also often been used to refer not to this overall framework, but rather to a more specific capability theory, namely Nussbaum’s (2000; 2011a) partial capability theory of justice, Sen’s (2006; 2008; 2009) theory of transitional justice, or Sen’s (1999) theory of development as freedom. Many capability theorists have long believed that the capability approach has a normative commitment to expand certain doings and beings that people have reason to value, as Sen has proposed. However, it is possible to develop capability theories that differ significantly from Nussbaum’s and Sen’s capability theories. For example, empirical applications of the capability framework do not necessarily have to be committed to the political liberalism of Nussbaum’s approach or the expansion of valuable capabilities, while a theory of educational justice, such as the one developed by Walker and Unterhalter (2007), will differ quite drastically from a theory of health justice, like the ones developed by Venkatapuram (2011) or Prah Ruger (2009; 2010). Moreover, the capability framework can and has been used for non-normative purposes, including the conceptualization of various phenomena, such as sharing of urban space, and the measurement of capabilities through both qualitative and quantitative research. These non-normative applications differ widely in their methodological approaches and are not (necessarily) committed to the expansion of capabilities.

The capability approach often provides one element in the development of an account of justice, social progress, development, or something else. For example, Crocker (2008) has extended the capability approach with accounts of agency and participation into a more detailed account of development ethics, but discusses at length that not all versions of the capability approach are embracing agency so explicitly. Similarly, the capability approach can be developed into an alternative evaluative tool that can replace traditional social cost-benefit analysis (Alkire 2002). Or it can be used as a normative framework within which to evaluate and design policies and social institutions, ranging from welfare-state design in relatively affluent societies (Wolff and de-Shalit 2007), to governmental and nongovernmental development policies in poor countries, to policies that affluent countries and international institutions employ (or are advised to employ) in their efforts to aid poor countries, such as the UNDP’s Human Development Reports. 

2. Core concepts and commitments of the capability approach

2.1 Functionings and capabilities as doings and beings

At the core of the capability approach is a normative commitment to conceptualize well-being in terms of capabilities and functionings. Functionings are ‘doings and beings’, that is, various states of human beings and activities that a person has achieved, such as being well-nourished, getting married, being educated, and travelling, while capabilities are the real, or substantive, opportunity that they have to achieve these doings and beings. (See section 2.2 for a discussion of real/substantive freedom.) A person’s ‘capability-set’ denotes the set of capabilities that he or she can choose from, while the term ‘basic capabilities’ refers either to “the innate equipment of individuals that is necessary for developing the more advanced capabilities”, such as the capability of speech and language, which is present in a newborn but needs to be fostered (Nussbaum 2000, 84), or to the freedom to do some basic things considered necessary for survival and to avoid or escape poverty or other serious deprivation (Sen 1992, 45, fn. 19). The relevance of basic capabilities is “not so much in ranking living standards, but in deciding on a cut-off point for the purpose of assessing poverty and deprivation” (Sen 1987b, 109).

Recently, there has been a discussion within the capability literature about whether capabilities and functionings should be limited to only encompass positively valued doings and beings — such as according to a normative theory, those that we have reason to value, or those which promote some ultimate normative aim, such as human dignity or agency — or whether capabilities and functionings are value-neutral concepts that encompass not only normatively positive but also negative and neutral doings and beings (Byskov 2020; Robeyns 2017).

Why is the value-laden definition of capabilities problematic, according to its critics? First, if what counts as a capability is - by definition - normatively valuable then it risks ignoring that the value of a certain set of capabilities and functionings may also crucially depend on what it does not allow one to do or be or if it allows one to realize morally bad functionings, such as committing murder or polluting (Carter 2014; Dowding and Van Hees 2009). The value-laden conception of capabilities analytically excludes such non-normatively valued doings and beings from consideration, even though they may be just as important for the valuation of a capability-set as positively valued doings and beings.

The second reason why the value-laden definition might be problematic is because it excludes applications of the capability framework that are not concerned with what is valuable or not, and in some cases are concerned with morally bad capabilities. Two such capability applications are the conceptualization of phenomena and empirical purposes. For example, an empirical study that investigates the prevalence of domestic violence in a society would be concerned with whether husbands have capability (and functioning) of exercising such violence - a clear-cut case of a morally bad, yet highly relevant, capability. Thus, if the definition of capabilities and functionings is limited to only encompass normatively valuable or positive doings and beings, it excludes applications of the capability approach that are concerned with morally bad doings and beings and capability applications that are not concerned with whether capabilities are valuable or not.  

In contrast to the value-laden definition, proponents of the value-neutral definition of capabilities and functionings hold that doings and beings can be both positively and negatively valued as well as normatively neutral. A capability, according to this definition, is simply the freedom that people have to do or be certain things. Examples of capabilities that are usually evaluated positively are being well-nourished, sheltered, and educated, while examples of capabilities that are usually negatively valued are the ability to kill (Stewart and Deneulin 2002, 67), the ability to rape, being vulnerable to natural hazards, and being able to pollute (Holland 2008, 418; Nussbaum 2006, 166). Because both positively and negatively valued capabilities determine how well-off we are, it is necessary that capabilities are defined in a way that includes both.

Other capabilities, meanwhile, are morally ambiguous or morally neutral. An example of a morally ambiguous capability is the capability to care or provide care, which can at different times either be rewarding, for example for parents caring for a child, and a burden, especially for women who often face societal pressure to take on the brunt of care activities. An example of a morally neutral capability is the ability to choose between two equally effective and sustainable brands of washing liquid (Williams 1987). On the face of it, whether we can choose between different brands of washing liquid is of little relevance if our purpose is to conceptualize healthcare or if we are interested in measuring a rural community’s access to infrastructure. However, that is not to say that prima facie irrelevant doings and beings cannot become relevant. If, for example, one brand of washing liquid were shown to have a positive or negative effect on health, then it would be relevant for a capabilitarian conceptualization of health to include the capability to choose between different brands of washing liquid. No doings and beings are a priori irrelevant and, according to its proponents, only a value-neutral definition of capabilities can accommodate for this fact.

Lastly, it should be noted that it is only necessary to adopt the value-neutral definition at the level of the capability approach as a general framework. Although the concept of capabilities is value-neutral, for more particular purposes and theories it will be useful and probably necessary to further specify by which criteria we make a selection of capabilities, according to that purpose or theory, and whether it will only focus on valuable doings and beings or also take bad capabilities into account (see section 3.2 for a discussion of the selection of capabilities).   

2.2 Capabilities as real freedoms

It has been mentioned above that capabilities are defined as the real, or substantive, freedoms that people have to achieve certain doings and beings. A frequent misunderstanding in the secondary literature concerns the use of the term ‘freedom’. Especially in his later work, Sen often equates capabilities with freedoms, without always specifying in more detail what kind of freedoms he is referring to. Yet this equation can easily be misunderstood since, as Sen himself acknowledges, there are many kinds of freedom (some valuable, some detrimental, and some trivial) and ‘freedom’ means very different things to different people.

One important misunderstanding to get out of the way is that capabilities as freedoms refer exclusively to the “free market.” Sen (1993b) does argue that people have reason to value the freedom or liberty to produce, buy, and sell in markets. This point, however, is part of his more general work on development, and is a very different matter than the highly disputed question in economics and politics regarding the benefits and limits of the market as a system of economic production and distribution. Functionings and capabilities are conceptualizations of well-being achievements and well-being freedoms, and the question which economic institutions are the best institutional means to foster functionings and capabilities is both analytically but also politically a question that can only be settled after we first agree what economic outcomes we should be aiming at—and this is a question to which the capability approach gives a (partial) answer.

Yet if Sen and other capability scholars label capabilities as freedoms, then what kind of freedoms are capabilities? As Kaufman (2006a) has shown, understanding capability as an opportunity concept of freedom, rather than some other kind of freedom, may undermine mistaken critiques on Sen’s work. A careful reading of Sen’s work clarifies that capabilities are freedoms conceived as real opportunities (Sen 1985a, 3–4; 1985d, 201; 2002, chapter 20). 

Real freedom in this sense means that one has all the required means necessary to achieve that doing and being if one wishes to. That is, it is not merely the formal freedom to do or be something, but the substantial opportunity to achieve it. Someone might, for example, have the formal freedom to vote in elections in the sense that she has the right to do so and that no one will stop her from doing so, but she might lack the substantial possibility to vote because the closest voting station is 200 kilometers away and she does not own a car and does not have access to other means of transportation. Conversely, someone may be living close to the voting station but still may not have the real freedom to vote because females are not permitted to vote in that particular society or they risk bodily harm if exercising their formal voting rights. Capabilities are thus real freedoms in the sense that they are corrected for any potential impediments. Functionings simply denotes those capabilities that have been achieved whether voluntarily or by chance. For example, someone might have the real freedom to vote but chooses not to do so and thus does not have the functioning of voting.

Another question about freedom in the capability approach concerns whether, or the extent to which, it corresponds to other concepts of freedom within the philosophical literature, such as positive and negative freedom. While more research is needed in this regard, some scholars have argued that the concept of freedom in the capability approach most resembles the concept of freedom as non-domination within republicanism, albeit with some notable caveats and disagreement (Alexander 2010; List 2004; Pettit 2001; 2009; Sen 1983; 2001). 

2.3 Conversion factors

Whether someone has the capability to achieve a certain doing or being depends on so-called ‘conversion factors’ (Sen 1992, 19-21, 26-30, 37-38). Resources, such as marketable goods and services, but also goods and services emerging from the non-market economy, including household production, have certain characteristics that make them of interest to people. For example, we may be interested in a bike not because it is an object made from certain materials with a specific shape and color, but because it can take us to places where we want to go, and in a faster way than if we were walking. These characteristics of a good or commodity enable or contribute to a functioning. A bike enables the functioning of mobility, to be able to move oneself freely and more rapidly than walking. The relation between a good and the achievement of certain beings and doings is captured with the term ‘conversion factor’: the degree in which a person can transform a resource into a functioning. For example, an able bodied person who was taught to ride a bicycle when he was a child has a high conversion factor enabling him to turn the bicycle into the ability to move around efficiently, whereas a person with a physical impairment or someone who was never taught to ride a bike has a very low conversion factor. The conversion factors thus represent how much functioning one can get out of a good or service; in our example, how much mobility the person can get out of a bicycle.

Note that on the most plausible reading of Sen (1985a), he is concerned with the conversion of more tangible resources. There is no reason, however, that we should not be equally concerned with the conversion of more intangible resources, such as human capital and public goods. In distinguishing between human capital and human capabilities, for example, Sen (1997) seems to acknowledge that intangible resources (such as human capital) are merely means to capabilities in the relevant sense.

There are several different types of conversion factors, and the conversion factors discussed are often categorized into three groups. All conversion factors influence how a person can be or is free to convert the characteristics of the resources into a functioning, yet the sources of these factors may differ. Personal conversion factors are internal to the person, such as metabolism, physical condition, sex, reading skills, or intelligence. If a person is disabled, is in bad physical condition, or has never learned to cycle, then the bike will be of limited help in enabling the functioning of mobility. Social conversion factors are factors from the society in which one lives, such as public policies, social norms, practices that unfairly discriminate, societal hierarchies, or power relations related to, for example, class, gender, race, or caste. Environmental conversion factors emerge from the physical or built environment in which a person lives. Among aspects of one’s geographical location are climate, pollution, the proneness to earthquakes, and the presence or absence of seas and oceans. Among aspects of the built environment are the stability of buildings, roads, and bridges, and the means of transportation and communication. Take the example of the bicycle. How much a bicycle contributes to a person’s mobility depends on that person’s physical condition (a personal conversion factor), the social mores including whether women are socially allowed to ride a bicycle (a social conversion factor), and the available of decent roads or bike paths (an environmental conversion factor).

The three types of conversion factors all stress that it is not sufficient to know the resources a person owns or can use in order to be able to assess the well-being that he or she has achieved or could achieve; rather, we need to know much more about the person and the circumstances in which he or she is living. Sen uses “capability” not to refer exclusively to a person’s abilities or other internal powers but to refer to an opportunity made feasible, and constrained by, both internal (personal) and external (social and environmental) conversion factors. The real freedom someone has to ride a bicycle is thus dependent on whether these conditions are fulfilled and, in this sense, conversion factors also shape the needs of the individuals in question: in a society in which the capability of riding a bicycle is important (e.g., in order to get to work), it becomes crucial to provide decent roads and an adequate infrastructure (Crocker and Robeyns 2009, 68).

Lastly, whereas the capability approach usually focuses on the conversion of resources into individual capabilities and functionings, some scholars have argued that this is too individualistic (Evans 2002; Gore 1997; Stewart 2005). In fact, it is argued, many capabilities can only be held or achieved through collective action. This has resulted in the notion of ‘collective capabilities’ (Ibrahim 2006; 2020). For example, the capabilities for friendship, assembly, and political speech can only be held or realized in collaboration with other individuals (Ibrahim 2020, 210). Likewise, Binder (2009; 2019) argues that cultural contexts influence individual agency goals and thus the capabilities that we choose to pursue. In these ways, social relations, collectives, and the larger social, cultural, and institutional context function as conversion factors for some capabilities. Robeyns (2017, section 4.6), however, argues that the collectivist critique conflates the capability approach’s commitment to normative, or ethical, individualism (i.e., “that individuals, and only individuals, are the units of ultimate moral concern”) with a commitment to methodological, or ontological, individualism — that “all social phenomena are to be explained wholly or exclusively in terms of their properties” (Bhargava 1992, 19). Although the capability approach, according to Robeyns, is committed to the former, it does not necessarily follow that collectives and social relations have no bearing on how those capabilities are realized. 

2.4 The means-ends distinction

As the notion of conversion factors show, the capability approach explicitly endorses and relies upon a key analytical distinction in practical philosophy, namely the means-ends distinction. The approach stresses that we should always be clear, when valuing something, whether we value it as an end in itself, or as a means to a valuable end. For the capability approach, the ultimate ends of interpersonal comparisons are people’s capabilities. This implies that the capability approach evaluates policies and other changes according to their impact on people’s capabilities as well as their actual functionings. It asks whether people are able to be healthy, and whether the means or resources necessary for this capability, such as clean water, adequate sanitation, access to doctors, protection from infections and diseases, and basic knowledge on health issues, are present. It asks whether people are well-nourished, and whether the means or conditions for the realization of this capability, such as having sufficient food supplies and food entitlements, are being met. It asks whether people have access to a high-quality education system, to real political participation, and to community activities that support them, that enable them to cope with struggles in daily life, and that foster caring and warm friendships.

Much of the critique that capability theorists have advanced against alternative normative frameworks (such as Dworkinian resourcism, or the Rawlsian social primary goods approach), can be traced back to the objection that alternative approaches value particular means to well-being rather than the ends. The main reason why the capability approach holds that it is better to focus on the ends rather than the means, is that people differ in their ability to convert means into valuable opportunities (capabilities) or outcomes (functionings) (Sen 1992: 26–28, 36–38). (See section 1.1.) Since ends are what ultimately matters when thinking about well-being and the quality of life, means can only work as reliable proxies of people’s opportunities to achieve those ends if they all have the same capacities or powers to convert those means into equal capability sets. Capability scholars believe that these inter-individual differences are far-reaching and significant, and that theories that focus on means tend to downplay their normative relevance. In the theoretical framework of the capability approach, these inter-individual differences are captured by the notion of ‘conversion factors’ (see section 2.3).

One could argue, however, that the capability approach does not focus entirely on ends, but rather on the question whether a person is being put in the conditions in which she can pursue her ultimate ends. For example, being able to read could be seen as not an ultimate end in itself, since people’s ultimate ends will be more specific, such as reading street signs, the newspaper, or the Bible or Koran. It is therefore somewhat more precise to say that the capability approach focuses on people’s ends in terms of beings and doings expressed in general terms: being literate, being mobile, being able to hold a decent job. Whether a particular person then decides to translate these general capabilities in the more specific capabilities A, B or C (e.g., reading street signs, reading the newspaper, or reading the Bible), is up to them. Whether that person decides to stay put, travel to the US or rather to China, is not normatively relevant for the capability approach: the question is rather whether a person has these capabilities in more general terms.

Of course, the normative focus on ends does not imply that the capability approach does not at all value means such as material or financial resources. Instead, a capability analysis will typically also focus on resources and other means, such as human capital (Sen 1985a; 1997). For example, in their evaluation of development in India, Jean Drèze and Amartya Sen (2002: 3) have stressed that working within the capability approach in no way excludes the integration of an analysis of resources, such as food, or other resources. In sum, all the means of well-being, like the availability of commodities, legal entitlements to them, other social institutions, and so forth, are important, but the capability approach presses the point that they are not the ends of well-being, only their means. Food may be abundant in the village, but a starving person may have nothing to exchange for it, no legal claim on it, or no way of preventing intestinal parasites from consuming it before he or she does. In all these cases at least some resources will be available, but it will still leave that person hungry and, after a while, undernourished.

Yet one could wonder: would it not be better to focus on means only, rather than making the normative analysis more complicated and more informationally demanding by also focusing on functionings and capabilities? Capability scholars would respond that starting a normative analysis from the ends rather than means has at least two advantages, apart from the earlier mentioned fundamental reason that a focus on ends is needed to appropriately capture inter-individual differences. First, the valuation of means will retain the status of an instrumental valuation rather than take on the nature of an intrinsic valuation. For example, money or economic growth will not be valued for their own sake, but only in so far as they contribute to an expansion of people’s capabilities. Second, by starting from ends, we do not a priori assume that there is only one overridingly important means to that ends (such as income), but rather explicitly ask the question which types of means are important for the fostering and nurturing of a particular capability, or set of capabilities. For some capabilities, the most important means will indeed be financial resources and economic production, but for others it may be particular political practices and institutions, such as effective guarantees and protections of freedom of thought, political participation, social or cultural practices, social structures, social institutions, public goods, social norms, and traditions and habits. As a consequence, an effective capability-enhancing policy may not exist in increasing disposable income, but rather fighting a homophobic, ethnophobic, racist or sexist social climate.

2.5 Acknowledging human diversity and agency

A strong acknowledgment of human diversity is one of the key theoretical driving forces of the capability approach. Its criticism of other normative approaches is often fueled by, and based on, the claim that the full human diversity among people is insufficiently acknowledged in many normative theories, such as theories of distributive justice. This also explains why the capability approach is often favorably regarded by feminist philosophers, or philosophers concerned with care and disability issues (e.g. Khader 2008, Terzi 2008, 2010), since one of their main complaints about mainstream moral and political philosophy has precisely been the relative invisibility of the fate of those people whose lives did not correspond to that of an able-bodied, non-dependent, caregiving-free individual who belongs to the dominant ethnic, racial and religious group. People of color, marginalized people, the disabled and many women do not fit that picture.

The capability approach thus takes account of human diversity in at least three ways. First, by its focus on the plurality of functionings and capabilities as important evaluative spaces. By including a wide range of dimensions in the conceptualization of well-being and well-being outcomes, the approach broadens the so-called ‘informational basis’ of assessments, and thereby includes some dimensions that may be particularly important for some groups but less so for others. For example, in standard outcome assessments, women as a group virtually always end up being worse off than men. But if the selection of outcome dimensions is shifted to also include the quality and quantity of social relations and support, and being able to engage in hands-on care, then the normative assessment of gender inequality becomes less univocal and requires much further argument and normative defense, including being explicit about how to aggregate different dimensions (Robeyns 2003).

Secondly, human diversity is stressed in the capability approach by the explicit focus on personal and socio-environmental conversion factors that make possible the conversion of commodities and other resources into functionings, and on the social, institutional, and environmental context that affects the conversion factors and the capability set directly. Each individual has a unique profile of conversion factors, some of which are body-related, others of which are shared with all people from her community, and still others of which are shared with people with the same social characteristics (e.g., same gender or class or race characteristics).

Third, human diversity within the capability approach is captured by an acknowledgement of human agency and the diversity of goals people have in life. Sen distinguishes between two kinds of freedom, namely what he calls well-being freedom and agency freedom (Sen 1985d). Both of these can also be analyzed in terms of whether they have been achieved. In that case they are called well-being achievement and agency achievement. Well-being freedoms are those freedoms that promote our well-being generally. Being well-nourished, for example, is part of our well-being. But we may also value freedoms that do not promote our well-being, such as giving up a promising career in order to fight for global justice. My fighting global justice may not provide me with anything in terms of well-being as it requires me to travel to some of the most insecure places on earth and does not provide a steady income. I am worse off in terms of well-being compared to the alternative of pursuing a promising career. Yet, I value this freedom because it is an expression of my agency. The recognition of agency freedom, in addition to well-being freedom, allows people to pursue a diversity of doings and beings. 

2.6 A metric for interpersonal comparisons

According to the capability approach, ‘functionings’ and ‘capabilities’ are the best metric for most kinds of interpersonal evaluations. In other words, those interpersonal evaluations should be conceptualized in terms of people’s functioning and their capabilities. These beings and doings together are held to constitute what makes a life valuable. Whereas ‘functionings’ are the proposed conceptualization for interpersonal comparisons of (achieved) well-being, ‘capabilities’ are the conceptualization for interpersonal comparisons of the freedom to pursue well-being, which Sen calls “well-being freedom” (Sen 1992: 40).

The relevant functionings can vary from such elementary things as being adequately nourished, being in good health, avoiding escapable morbidity and premature mortality, to more complex achievements such as having a decent and valuable job, not suffering from lack of self-respect, taking active part in the life of the community, and so on. The claim is that functionings are constitutive of a person’s being, and an evaluation of well-being has to take the form of an assessment of these constituent elements (Sen 1992: 39). To say that functionings are constitutive of a person’s being means that one cannot be a human being without having at least a range of functionings: they make the lives of human beings both lives (in contrast to the existence of innate objects) and also human (in contrast to the lives of trees or tigers). Human functionings are those beings and doings that we take to constitute a human life, and which are central in our understandings of ourselves as human beings. This implies that the range of potentially relevant functionings is very broad, and that the capability approach will in some respects be close to both subjective metrics (for example, by including the capability to be happy), or resources-based metrics (since most functionings require some resources as inputs). Yet not all beings and doings are functionings; for example, being able to fly like a bird or reaching an age of 200 like an oak tree, are not human functionings.

Thus, according to the capability approach, the ends of well-being freedom, justice, and development should be conceptualized in terms of people’s capabilities. Moreover, what is relevant is not only which opportunities are open to me each by themselves, hence in a piecemeal way, but rather which combinations or sets of potential functionings are open to me. For example, suppose I am a low-skilled poor single parent who lives in a society without decent social provisions. Take the following functionings: (1) to hold a job, which will require me to spend many hours on working and commuting, but will generate the income needed to properly feed myself and my family; (2) to care for my children at home and give them all the attention, care and supervision they need. In a piecemeal analysis, both (1) and (2) are opportunities open to me, but they are not both together open to me. The point about the capability approach is precisely that we must take a comprehensive or holistic approach, and ask which sets of capabilities are open to me, that is: can I simultaneously provide for my family and properly care for and supervise my children? Or am I rather forced to make some hard, perhaps even tragic choices between two functionings which both reflect basic needs and basic moral duties?

Note that while most types of capability analysis require interpersonal comparisons, one could also use the capability approach to evaluate the well-being or well-being freedom of one person at one point in time (e.g., evaluate her situation against a capability-yardstick), or to evaluate the changes in her well-being or well-being freedom over time. The capability approach could thus also be used by a single individual in her deliberate decision-making or evaluation processes, but these types of uses of the capability approach are much less prevalent in the philosophical literature, let alone in the social sciences.

3. Specifying the capability approach

Building on its core of central concepts and normative commitments, the capability approach can be developed into more specific capability theories. As Robeyns (2017, chapter 1) argues, some specifications are necessary to make, such as what the purpose of the theory is, what capabilities or functionings are normatively relevant, and whether to focus on capabilities or functionings. Other specifications are optional in the sense that whether we need them depends on the particular capability theory we are developing, including how to weigh different capabilities against each other and what other normative concerns that the theory should take into consideration. In this section, we explain some of the choices that need to or can be made when developing a capability theory.

3.1 Purpose and application

The capability approach can be applied to many different purposes and the choice of purpose, or application, of the theory matters for other specifications that are made.

Some purposes introduce additional normative, descriptive, and/or meta-theoretical commitments. For example, a capability theory of environmental justice that is grounded in the Western philosophical tradition might struggle to account for the protection of non-human entities, such as animals, forests, and rivers, in ways that a commitment to non-Western and holistic ontologies might not (Watene 2016).

The choice of purpose also influences the selection of relevant capabilities and functionings and how this selection should be done. For example, applying the capability approach to developing an account of health justice invariably entails a focus on those capabilities and functionings that are relevant for health (Prah Ruger 2009; Venkatapuram 2011).

Lastly, the choice of purpose affects whether one needs to make some of the optional specifications. For example, capabilitarian accounts of policy-making should explain how the different capability-sets that different policy choices yield can be compared and traded off against each other.

3.2 Functionings or capabilities?

Scholars interested in the capability approach have debated the question of whether the appropriate well-being metric should be capabilities or functionings, hence opportunities or achievements. What considerations have been argued to be relevant for this choice?

The first consideration is normative, and this is the argument Sen and Nussbaum most often offer: by focusing on capabilities rather than functionings, we do not privilege a particular account of good lives but instead aim at a range of possible ways of life from which each person can choose. Thus, it is Nussbaum’s and Sen’s commitment to a liberal version of the capability approach, or an anti-paternalist consideration, that motivates a principled choice for capabilities rather than functionings. Obviously, the strength of this argument depends on how bad one takes paternalism to be. There may be good reasons to believe that some paternalism is unavoidable, or even desired (Nussbaum 2000, 51–56). To some extent, the promotion of functionings (rather than capabilities) may be unavoidable in a capabilitarian political theory, yet this tendency to paternalism can be stronger or weaker, depending on several specific choices made in the theory (Claassen 2014).

A second normative consideration stems from the importance given to personal responsibility in contemporary political philosophy. If one believes that one should strive for equality of capability, then each person should have the same real opportunity (capability), but once that is in place, each individual should be held responsible for his or her own choices. This responsibility-sensitivity principle is widely endorsed not only in political philosophy but also in the mathematical models being developed in normative welfare economics. If one wants to endorse and implement this principle of responsibility-sensitivity, then specifications and applications of the capability approach should focus on capabilities, rather than functionings. Yet even at a highly abstract theoretical level, philosophers disagree on whether we should endorse responsibility-sensitivity in developing the capability approach (e.g., Fleurbaey 2002; Vallentyne 2005; Wolff and de-Shalit 2007). Moreover, for applied work, serious epistemological hurdles may ultimately lead us to drop the responsibility-sensitive principle for practical reasoning about the actual world.

Third, there are cases in which a capability is available to a person but only if other people do not also want to realize that capability (Basu 1987: 74). For example, two spouses may each have the capability of holding demanding jobs which are each on their own incompatible with large caring responsibilities. However, if these spouses also have infants or relatives with extensive care needs, then at best only one of them may effectively realize that capability. Since capability sets may therefore include freedoms that are conditional (because they depend on the choices of other people), it might be better to focus both on the individual’s capability set and also on what people have been able to realize from their own capability sets, that is, their functionings or well-being achievements. The question of who decides or should decide this sort of spousal question highlights the importance of agency and procedural fairness, which are generally taken to be part of the capability approach in its broader use (Crocker 2008).

It should also be mentioned that the concept of functioning has particular relevance for our relations to those human beings who are not yet able to choose (infants), who will never be able to make some particular choices (severely mentally disabled individuals), or who have lost this ability through advanced dementia or serious brain damage. Whether or not these persons can decide to be well nourished and healthy, it is generally held that we (through families, governments, or other institutions) have the moral obligation to promote or protect their nutritional and healthy functioning.

Finally, the choice between functionings and capabilities can also be bridged by a conceptual move. Sen (1987b: 36–7) has proposed the concept of ‘refined functioning’ to designate functioning that takes note of the available alternatives. Sen (1992: 52) notes: “‘fasting’ as a functioning is not just starving; it is choosing to starve when one does have other options.” That is, one could focus on achieved functionings levels but—where appropriate—include the exercise of choice as one of the relevant functionings (Fleurbaey 2002; Stewart 1995).

In addition to these normative and conceptual arguments, there are also concerns related to the application and measurability that influence the choice of capabilities, functionings, or a combination of the two (Robeyns 2006). It is, for example, almost always easier to observe and measure functionings than capabilities (Sen 1992: 52–3).

3.3 Selecting and aggregating of capabilities?

Other major points of debate in the capability literature are the questions of which capabilities should be selected as relevant and who should decide (or how a decision should be made) on the aggregation of the various dimensions into an overall assessment (Claassen 2020). At the level of ideal theories of justice, some have argued that each and every capability is relevant and should count in our moral calculus (Carter 2014; Vallentyne 2005). Others have argued that considerations of justice require that we demarcate morally relevant from morally irrelevant and morally bad capabilities (Nussbaum 2003; Pogge 2002). This demarcation could be done in various ways, and most capability scholars think that different answers are appropriate in different normative exercises. In other words, the selection of relevant capabilities would be different when the question is how to arrange a society’s basic structure, versus when the question is how to spend the donations Oxfam has collected, or when the normative question is how to raise one’s child. Anderson (1999) argues that, for purposes of political justice, the only relevant capabilities are those needed for a person to participate as a citizen. Nussbaum endorses a well-defined list of capabilities, which, she argues, should be enshrined in every country’s constitution (Nussbaum 2000, 2003, 2006). Sen has been somewhat vague in responding to the question of how to select and weight capabilities, yet in the secondary literature it has been argued that he draws on his ideal of agency to argue that each group should itself select, weight, trade off, and sequence or otherwise aggregate capabilities as well as prioritize them in relation to other normative considerations, such as agency, efficiency, and stability (Crocker 2008).

Moving from ideal theory to non-ideal theory and empirical applications makes the selection of relevant capabilities even more complicated, for other concerns such as feasibility, data availability, practical relevance, and even parsimony may play significant roles. Several proposals are on offer, ranging from substantive proposals with elaborate theoretical underpinnings, through several procedural methods, to the atheoretical practice that an investigator should simply conduct a survey in order to collect rich data (or use an existing survey) and let a statistical technique, such as factor analysis, “decide.” At one end of this spectrum is Nussbaum’s well-known list, which contains prescribed capabilities that are grouped together under ten “central human capabilities”: life; bodily health; bodily integrity; senses, imagination and thought; emotions; practical reason; affiliation; other species; play; and control over one’s environment (Nussbaum 2006: 76–78).

Nussbaum (2000: 70–77; 2006: 78–81) justifies this list by arguing that each of these capabilities is needed in order for a human life to be “not so impoverished that it is not worthy of the dignity of a human being” (2000: 72). She defends these capabilities as being the moral entitlements of every human being on earth. She formulates the list at an abstract level and advocates that the translation to implementation and policies should be done at a local level, taking into account local differences. Nussbaum argues that this list can be derived from a Rawlsian overlapping consensus and stresses that her list remains open-ended and always open for revision (Nussbaum 2000: 77), yet other philosophers have taken issue with her claim that this would result in a form of political liberalism (Barclay 2003) or have argued that this leaves insufficient scope for democratic deliberation and respect for agency in her capability approach (e.g., Crocker 2008; Robeyns 2003; Sen 2004a, 2004b). Yet this strand of critique has itself been criticized for not understanding the proper role of philosophy and the normative and political status of Nussbaum’s proposal (Claassen 2011).

Sen consistently and explicitly refuses to defend “one pre-determined canonical list of capabilities, chosen by theorists without any general social discussion or public reasoning” (Sen 2005: 158). Of course, groups and theorists might construct lists for various purposes, and lists need not be “pre-determined” or “canonical,” however we might understand these terms. And Sen’s refusal to endorse Nussbaum’s list has not prevented him from using—for various purposes—particular selections of capabilities in his empirical as well as his normative work. However, beyond stating in general terms that some democratic process and public reasoning should be involved, Sen has never explained in detail how such a selection could and should be done. Sen (2005) has been reluctant to specify a substantive list of capabilities and functionings in order to avoid paternalism - holding that communities should decide for themselves, which capabilities should apply - and the imposition of a particular conception of the good life. Consequently, Sen (1987b; 1992; 2002; 2009) has repeatedly stated that capabilities should be defined as the real freedom to achieve those doings and beings that we ‘have reason to value’. The ‘having reason to value’-formulation of capabilities and functionings is widely regarded within the capability literature as the correct, only, or most popular definition.

On the one hand, the ‘having reason to value’ definition highlights the importance of taking into account what people themselves value doing and being when evaluating their well-being. This is contrary to more objective measures of well-being, such as utilitarianism or resourcism, which hold that people’s well-being can and should be evaluated according to some objective measure, such as the amount of resources that they have or the amount of utility they derive from having these resources. On the other hand, Sen’s definition also breaks with more subjective approaches to well-being and the idea that people’s subjective evaluation of their well-being is all that matters. In response, Sen (1985a; 1985c; 1987a) argues that people may be mistaken about their own well-being. For example, someone might be destitute, yet evaluate their own subjective well-being quite highly or value certain things, such as smoking, that are actually bad for her. In order to avoid such counter-intuitive conclusions, Sen invokes the notion of reasonableness as an objective criterion. We need to submit our values to a process of scrutiny and (public) reasoning and only those valued capabilities that can survive this procedure can be said to be reasonable. 

However, it has often been a matter of interpretation and contention within the capability literature what Sen means exactly with ‘having reason to value.’ Khader and Kosko (2019) argue that there are three interpretations of Sen’s ‘having reason to value’ definition. On the procedural autonomy interpretation, an individual Y has reason to value doing or being X if Y has reasoned that X is valuable; on the process interpretation, what we have reason to value is not necessarily what we do value, but rather what we would value if we had gone through the proper process of individual reflection (Alkire and Deneulin 2009; Bonvin and Farvaque 2005, 282; Ibrahim and Alkire 2007; Nussbaum 2000; Sen 2002, 16) or public deliberation (Alkire 2013, 91; Sen 1999, 152–153; Crocker 2008, 270); and on the perfectionist interpretation, what people have reason to value is what is objectively valuable: Y simply has reason to value X because X is valuable, even if Y does not herself value X (e.g., Arneson 2020).

The disagreement between Nussbaum and Sen on how to select relevant capabilities has led many capability scholars to conclude that there are only two strands of selecting capabilities, namely the philosophical approach favored by Nussbaum or the procedural approach advanced by Sen. However, as Byskov (2018a; 2018b, chapter 6) argues, this is too simple and ignores many possible and already used methods for the selection of capabilities and functionings. Byskov identifies at least 14 different methods for the selection of capabilities within the literature, which he categorizes into ad hoc methods, which base their selection of capabilities on pragmatic considerations; foundational methods, which select capabilities according to some ultimate normative value or principle; procedural methods, which employ open-ended empirical or deliberative exercises to determine relevant capabilities; and mixed (or multi-stage) methods, which combine two or more foundational and/or procedural methods.

The theoretical debate on the selection of dimensions has been complicated by the fact that there are different views on the status of the selection. Is that selection a truth-claim, or should it rather be seen as a contribution to democratic-decision making? Is the scholar proposing a selection of capabilities akin to a philosopher-king, or rather to a philosopher-citizen or a philosopher-mediator? Depending on how one sees these issues, it may affect how justified one believes a certain selection or selection procedure to be (Claassen 2011, Byskov 2017).

What about weighting different capabilities to come to an aggregate evaluation? If we have a list of relevant capabilities, we would still be left with the question of whether the capabilities should be aggregated and, if so, what their relative weights and the formula to aggregate them will or should be. A closely related question is how different capabilities should be traded off against one another when they cannot all be realized fully. Some have argued against trade-offs on the basis that the different capabilities are incommensurable or that each capability is an absolute entitlement that never should be overridden by another entitlement or other normative consideration. For example, Nussbaum argues that the ten capabilities on her list, being incommensurable, cannot be traded off against one another (and, hence, have no relative weights), and also that the state should provide each citizen with a minimum threshold of each capability.

One possible system of weighting or aggregating is to use a democratic or some other social choice procedure (Chakraborty 1996). The basic idea would be to encourage or prescribe that the relevant group of people decide on the weights. In some contexts, such as small-scale projects or evaluations, such capability weighting (and selection) could be done by participatory techniques. It has also been suggested that we may determine the weights of capabilities as a function of how much they contribute to overall life satisfaction or happiness (Schokkaert 2007). Yet this raises the question to what extent functionings are taken to be merely instrumental to another end, such as happiness, or indeed any other ultimate good or ideal.

Much of the existing literature refers to the issue of ‘weighting’, but this is only one particular form of the more general ‘aggregating’, since aggregation may take a different functional form than simply adding up. For example, if you have no food, your other capabilities will be worth very little. Some capabilities may thus be complementary capabilities, implying that their value to a person depends on the presence (or absence) of other capabilities. (Note the similarity with the notion of ‘complementary goods’ in consumer theory in economics, where it is argued that the utility of some goods is dependent on the quantity of some other goods, as in the case of pencils and erasers, or shoe polish and shoes of the same color).

3.4 Additional commitments

When developing a capability theory it is often necessary to specify what additional descriptive, normative, metaphysical, and/or meta-theoretical commitments are made. As mentioned, the purpose of one’s theory might determine some of the commitments that the theory must adhere to, however in other cases this is not necessarily so. For example, while a capability theory of distributive justice - more on which in section 4 - is committed to conceptualizing justice primarily in terms of the fair distribution of capabilities and functionings, it is an open question whether the distribution of other normative concerns, such as utility, happiness, or resources, should play a secondary role. Likewise, the choice of distributive principle is also open and one may develop sufficientarian, strict egalitarian, or prioritarian theories of justice, all of which are committed to the distribution of capabilities and functionings, while the notion of responsibility that is employed may rely on different descriptive theories of human beings as either fully or only partially rational beings. A capability theory of justice may also include metaphysical commitments that extend rights and responsibilities to non-human animals and entities.

4. The possibility of a capability theory of justice

The capability approach is often wrongly taken to be an egalitarian theory or a theory of social or distributive justice. This reading is mistaken, even though it is entirely understandable given the specific debates in which the main philosophers defending the capability approach made their interventions. The capability approach specifies what should count for interpersonal evaluations and thus provides an important aspect of a theory of social or distributive justice, yet more is needed.

Nussbaum’s work comes closest to offering us a capability theory of justice, but her theory too does not amount to a full theory of social justice. Nussbaum’s theory of social justice is comprehensive, in the sense that it is not limited to an account of political justice, or to liberal democracies. Rather, her account holds for all human beings on earth, independently of whether they are living in a liberal democratic regime, or of whether they are severely disabled. The main demarcation of Nussbaum’s account is that it provides only “a partial and minimal account of social justice” (Nussbaum 2006: 71) by specifying thresholds of a list of capabilities that governments in all nations should guarantee to their citizens. Nussbaum’s theory focuses on thresholds, but this does not imply that reaching these thresholds is all that matters for social justice; rather, her theory is partial and simply leaves unaddressed the question what social justice requires once those thresholds are met.

Note, however, that not all capability theorists working on issues of justice believe that aiming for such a fully worked-out theory of justice is what thinking about justice requires. Sen (2006; 2008; 2009) himself has argued at length that we don’t need a theory that describes a utopian ideal, but rather we need theorising to help us with making comparisons of injustice, and to guide us towards a less unjust society. Similarly, Drydyk (2012) has argued that the capability approach to justice should focus on reducing capability shortfalls, for which a utopian account of perfect justice is not needed. Some capability theorists may want to work out a full theory of justice by addressing the various specifications outlined above, while others may want to change the nature of theorising about justice, moving it more to applied, non-ideal or grounded theories (Watene and Drydyk 2016).

Moreover, it would be a mistake to think that there can be only one capability theory of justice; on the contrary, the open nature of the capability approach allows for the development of a family of capability theories of justice, including accounts proposed by Anderson (1999) and Claassen (2018). But this prompts the question: what is needed to develop a full capability theory of justice, and which of these aspects have already been developed by theorists of justice?

First, a theory of justice needs to explain on what basis it justifies its principles or claims of justice. For example, while the early Nussbaum (1992) justifies her list of capabilities through an analysis of what can be considered essential human traits, the later Nussbaum (2011a) holds that her list of capabilities is justified because they promote human dignity. Anderson (1999, 316) argues that people should be entitled “to whatever capabilities are necessary to enable them to avoid or escape entanglement in oppressive social relationships” and “to the capabilities necessary for functioning as an equal citizen in a democratic state.” Claassen (2017, 2018) argues that the capabilities relevant for social justice can be derived from society’s ultimate concern with navigational agency.

Second, as indicated above, in developing a capability theory of justice we must decide whether we want it to be an outcome or an opportunity theory, that is, whether we think that we should assess injustices in terms of functionings, or rather in terms of capabilities, or a mixture. At the level of theory and principles, most theorists of justice endorse the view that justice is done if all have equal genuine opportunities, or if all reach a minimal threshold of capability levels. Translated to the capability language, this would imply that at the level of theory and principles, capabilities are the relevant metric of justice, and not functionings. However, not everyone subscribes to this view. Phillips (2004) has been a prominent voice arguing for equality of outcome, rather than opportunities. In the capability literature, Fleurbaey (2002) has argued against the view to take only capabilities into account and has defended a focus on ‘refined functionings’ (being the combination of functionings and capabilities).

Third, a capability theory of justice will need, just as all other theories that are derived from the general and underspecified capability approach, to address the issue of selecting, quantifying and aggregating of dimensions. For the case of theories of justice, the problem of selecting, quantifying and aggregating turns into the question: ‘in which dimensions should we evaluate justice, how should we construct metrics in these dimensions, and how should we aggregate all the dimensions for overall assessments of justice?’ The general challenge of selecting and aggregating which was discussed above therefore also applies here.

Fourth, a capability theory of justice may need to address other ‘metrics of justice’. Within theories of justice, one strand of debate has been between those defending capabilities and functionings, on the one hand, and those defending Dworkian resources (see Dworkin 2000, 299–303; Kaufman 2006b, 125–128; Pierik and Robeyns 2007; Sen 1985b; 2009, 264–268; Williams 2002). Functionings and capabilities have also been proposed by capability philosophers as an alternative for, and improvement on, the Rawlsian social primary goods metric, which focuses on general purpose goods, such as income and wealth, opportunities and liberties, and the social basis of self-respect (Rawls 1971). Sen argues that a focus on primary goods is inherently inflexible as a metric of justice: “the primary goods approach seems to take little note of the diversity of human beings. … If people were basically very similar, then an index of primary goods might be quite a good way of judging advantage. But, in fact, people seem to have very different needs varying with health, longevity, climatic conditions, location, work conditions, temperament, and even body size. … So what is being involved is not merely ignoring a few hard cases, but overlooking very widespread and real differences” (Sen 1979a: 215–216), such as in the case of the disabled person who would not have a claim to additional resources grounded in his impairment under Rawls’s two principles of justice. Sen argues that Rawls’s difference principle would not justify any redistribution to the disabled on grounds of disability.

Yet while capability scholars initially seemed rather sure of their case against Rawls (Sen 1979a, Nussbaum 2006), a more recent wave of philosophical enquiry has highlighted how complicated the comparisons between Rawls’s theory of justice and the capability view are (Pogge 2002, Robeyns 2009, Brighouse and Robeyns 2010). One reason is that the capability metric is a general metric of well-being and well-being freedom, whereas the social primary goods metric emerges as one element of an integral and complex theory of political justice (rather than social justice more broadly, let alone the even wider category of moral evaluations). As Arneson (2010) rightly notes, the unit of assessment ideally should be the moral theory, and not merely one part of it, such as the metric of interpersonal comparison. Also, Rawls’s theory of justice is an ideal theory of justice, in contrast to the capability approach. This means that it is very hard to compare Rawls’s work on justice with the philosophical work on the capability approach, since their scope and theoretical aims are not the same. Moreover, Rawlsians have criticized the capability approach too, and not all of their critiques have been sufficiently rebutted (Freeman 2006; Kelly 2010; Pogge 2002, Richardson 2006).

Fifth, a capability theory of justice needs to take a position on the ‘distributive rule’ (Anderson 2010: 81) that it will endorse: will it argue for plain equality, or for sufficiency, or for prioritarianism, or for some other (mixed) distributive rule? Both Nussbaum’s (2006) and Andersons’s (1999; 2010) theories are sufficiency accounts, but from this it does not follow, as one sometimes reads in the secondary literature, that the capability approach entails a sufficiency rule. Sen may have given the (wrong) impression of defending straight equality as a distributive rule, by asking the question ‘Equality of what?’ (Sen 1979a), though a careful reading shows that he was merely asking the question ‘If we want to be defending equality of something, then what would that be?’ In fact, Sen has remained uncommitted to one single distributive rule, which probably can be explained by the fact that he is averse of building a well-defined theory of justice but rather prefers to investigate how real-life unjust situations can be turned into more just situations, even if perfect justice is unattainable (Sen 2009). The capability approach clearly plays a role in Sen’s work on justice, since when assessing a situation he will investigate inequalities in people’s capabilities and analyze the processes that led to those inequalities. 

Sixth, a capability theory of justice needs to specify where the line between individual and collective responsibility is drawn, or how it will be decided, and by whom, where this line will be drawn. There is a remarkable absence of any discussion about issues of responsibility in the capability literature. In part this might be explained by the fact that much of the work on capabilities deals with global poverty, where issues of individual responsibility seem to be less relevant since it would seem outrageous to suggest that the world’s most destitute people are personally responsible for the situation they are in. That doesn’t mean that the responsibility question is not important: it is indeed of utmost importance to ask who is responsible for global poverty reduction or the fulfilling of the Millennium Development Goals, on which political philosophers have written a great deal (e.g., Pogge 2008, Singer 2009). The point is rather that philosophical puzzles, such as the issues of expensive tastes (for expensive wine, caviar, fast cars, or you name it), are simply beyond the radar screen of the child laborer or the poor peasant.

This brings us to a related issue: a theory of justice generally specifies not only rights, but also duties. However, capability theorists have remained largely silent on the questions of who should bear the duties for the expansion of the selected capabilities. Nussbaum passionately advocates that all people all over the world should be entitled, as a matter of justice, to threshold levels of all the capabilities on her list; but apart from mentioning that it is the governments’ duties to guarantee these entitlements (2006: 70), she remains silent on the question who precisely should bear the burdens and responsibilities for realizing these capabilities. Yet as Onora O’Neill (1996: chapter 5) has argued, questions of obligations and responsibilities should be central to any account of justice.

This section makes clear that a capability theory of justice is theoretically much more demanding than the basic presupposition of the capability approach that ‘functionings’ and ‘capabilities’ are the best metric for most kinds of interpersonal evaluations. While much has been written on the capability approach in recent years, by an increasing number of scholars, including philosophers, much of the philosophical work needed for turning the open-ended capability approach into a specific theory of justice remains to be done.

5. The capability approach and non-Western philosophies

While most of the philosophical contributions to the literature has tended to take place within the Western philosophical tradition (Nussbaum 2020, section 1.1) — however one defines this tradition — some more recent literature has begun to explore how non-Western philosophies, such as Maori philosophy, Ubuntu, and Buen Vivir, can contribute to the development of the capability approach and vice versa (Bockstael and Watene 2016).

Some of this literature employs the capability approach to conceptualize the rights of Indigenous peoples. Panzironi (2012), for example, introduces the notion of ‘Indigenous capability rights,’ while Murphy (2014) argues that Indigenous self-determination can be conceptualized as a collective capability. Similarly, Binder and Binder (2016) argue that the recognition that the value of capabilities is culture- and context-specific, within (at least Sen’s version of) the capability approach, can help ground Indigenous rights to autonomous self-governance and self-determination.

Another part of this literature aims to show how Indigenous philosophies and concepts can help particular applications of the capability approach, in particular in relation to sustainable human development and environmental justice. Schlosberg and Carruthers (2010) argue that environmental justice for Indigenous peoples must include a concern for developing their capabilities. Watene (2016) argues that the capability approach in its present form is unable to capture the physical and spiritual relation to nature that many Indigenous peoples, in particular the Maori, have. As a possible solution, Watene and Yap (2015) show how Indigenous values and worldviews, such as a holistic relationship to nature, can contribute to develop notions of sustainable development. The notion of interconnectedness — between human individuals and between humans and nature — is also prominent in work that relates the capability approach to the African philosophy of Ubuntu (Hoffmann and Metz 2017; Metz 2016) and that it can even be seen as an ‘architectonic capability,’ which highlights the interdependency of capabilities.

However, given the panoply of non-Western philosophies, more research is needed to explore the capability approach in relation to, for example, Chinese and Buddhist philosophy (see though Nussbaum 2020, section 1.2). Argenton and Rossi (2013), however, questions whether the commitment to scrutiny, reasoning, and deliberation of values within most philosophical applications of the capability approach does not, in fact, run contrary to the ambition of representing the plurality and context-specificity of values that individuals have because this commitment relies on a substantively liberal understanding of what it means to be a reasonable and deliberative agent found in the Western philosophical tradition.

6. Philosophical applications of the capability approach

As mentioned, most of the philosophical capability literature takes place within the practical strand of philosophy with the aim of addressing real-life issues. For readers interested in how the capability approach is applied to particular sub-branches of philosophy, this section provides a short overview of some of the most prominent contributions. This overview does not aim at completeness, but rather wants to give a sense of the wide range of practical concerns to which the capability approach is applied.

One of the most prominent contributions of the capability approach is to the field of development ethics (Drydyk and Keleher 2018). Most importantly, the capability approach has been central to the development of the notion of human development (Fukuda-Parr 2002; 2003; 2011a; 2011b; Fukuda-Parr and Kumar 2003) and the multi-dimensional measures used to evaluate countries’ development levels in the annual Human Development Reports (ul Haq 2003). Scholars who apply the capability approach to development have tended to highlight the necessity of taking into account issues of freedom (Sen 1999), agency (Crocker 2008; Keleher and Kosko 2019), empowerment (Drydyk 2013), and self-determination (Binder and Binder 2016; Byskov 2018b; Murphy 2014).

Another influential application of the capability approach has been within the field of public health ethics and health justice. Both Prah Ruger (2009) and Venkatapuram (2011) have articulated comprehensive theories of health justice, the latter of which has influenced the work of the World Health Organization. Nielsen (2015) provides an argument for why capability theorists should care about health, namely because of its constitutive role in human well-being and agency. Byskov (2019) argues that the capability approach requires a qualitative rather than quantitative interpretation of the principle of the least restrictive means, which is central to public health ethics (Beauchamp and Childress 2001). Applied to healthcare ethics, Entwistle and Watt (2013a; 2013b) argue that a capability approach requires the adoption of person-centred care, while Millar (2013) argues that the capability approach can be used to evaluate the justice of infectious disease control measures within healthcare institutions. The capability approach has also been widely adopted by philosophers as a framework to analyze aspects of the ethics and philosophy of disability (Harnacke 2013; Nussbaum 2006; Riddle 2013; 2014; Terzi 2010; Wynne Bannister and Venkatapuram 2020).

The capability approach has also been applied to a wide variety of aspects of environmental ethics and climate justice. Several edited collections have focused on the concept of sustainable development from a capability perspective, also linking to questions of global and intergenerational justice (Gutwald et al. 2014; Lessmann and Rauschmayer 2014). Holland (2008a; 2008b; 2014a; 2014b) argues that environmental justice entails limits to the kinds of capabilities that people can choose to realize. Schlosberg and Carruthers (2010; Schlosberg 2012) argue that environmental justice must include a concern for developing capabilities, an argument which Kronlid (2014) extends to climate adaptation planning. Voget-Kleschin (2013; 2015) uses the capability approach to investigate reasons for ecologically sustainable consumption patterns and lifestyles while Kramm (2020) shows that the capability approach can be used to conceptualize the well-being of a river, which is needed in order to ground claims to legal personhood for rivers, such as the Whanganui River in New Zealand.

The capability approach has also been influential in developing the right to education and educational justice (Walker and Unterhalter 2007). Most prominently, Walker (2003; 2006) and Unterhalter (2005; 2007; 2013) have been at the forefront of conceptualizing social justice within education, while Terzi (2008) argues that social justice and equality in education require particular attention to special educational needs and disability. A related literature has contributed to the conceptualization of childrens’ rights and development (Brando and Schweiger 2019; Ferracioli and Terlazzo 2014; Hart and Brando 2018).

The potential applications of the capability approach are wide-ranging and possible areas where nascent research has begun, or more research is needed, include the philosophy of technology and the ethical aspects of artificial intelligence and surveillance (Oosterlaken 2011; 2015); business ethics and corporate social responsibility (Bertland 2009; Giovanola 2009; Sferrazzo and Ruffini forthcoming); animal ethics and the rights of of non-human animals (Bendik-Keymer 2014; Cripps 2010; Nussbaum 2011b; Palmer 2010); and professional ethics and the rights of employees.


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