Backward Causation

First published Mon Aug 27, 2001; substantive revision Fri Feb 26, 2021

Sometimes also called retro-causation. A common feature of our world seems to be that in all cases of causation, the cause and the effect are placed in time so that the cause precedes its effect temporally. Our normal understanding of causation assumes this feature to such a degree that we intuitively have great difficulty imagining things differently. The notion of backward causation, however, stands for the idea that the temporal order of cause and effect is a mere contingent feature and that there may be cases where the cause is causally prior to its effect but where the temporal order of the cause and effect is reversed with respect to normal causation, i.e., there may be cases where the effect temporally, but not causally, precedes its cause.

The idea of backward causation should not be confused with that of time travel. These two notions are related to the extent that both agree that it is possible to causally affect the past. The difference, however, is that time travel involves a causal loop whereas backward causation does not. Causal loops for their part can only occur in a universe in which one has closed time-like curves. In contrast, backward causation may take place in a world where there are no such closed time-like curves. In other words, an ordinary system \(S\) taking part in time travel would preserve the temporal order of its proper time during its travel, it would keep the same time sense during its entire flight (a watch measuring \(S\)’s proper time would keep moving clockwise); but if the same system \(S\) were to become involved in a process of backward causation, the order of its proper time would have to reverse in the sense that the time sense of the system would become opposite of what it was before its back-in-time travel (the watch will start to move counter-clockwise). So neither backward causation nor time travel logically entails each other and time travel is distinct from back-in-time travel.

1. History

The philosophical debate about backward causation is relatively new. Only little consideration of the problem can be found in the philosophical literature before Michael Dummett and Anthony Flew initiated their discussion in the mid 1950s. The reason for this is twofold. No empirical phenomena seem to demand a notion of backward causation for our understanding of them. And for a long time it was thought that such a notion involved either a contradiction in terms or a conceptual impossibility. David Hume’s definition of the cause as the one of two events that happens before the other thus rules out that the cause can happen after its effect. Moreover, according to Kant’s idea of synthetic a priori truth the claim that the cause temporally precedes its effect was considered to state such a truth. In 1954 Michael Dummett and Anthony Flew had a discussion about whether an effect can precede its cause. Dummett defended the idea whereas Flew argued that it involved contradictions in terms.

Two years later, Max Black (1956) presented an argument against backward causation, which became known as the bilking argument, and later attempts to meet the argument seemed to generate all kinds of paradoxes. Imagine \(B\) to be earlier than \(A\), and let \(B\) be the alleged effect of \(A\). Thus, we assume that \(A\) causes \(B\), even though \(A\) is later than \(B\). The idea behind the bilking argument is that whenever \(B\) has occurred, it is possible, in principle, to intervene in the course of events and prohibit \(A\) from occurring. But if this is the case, \(A\) cannot be the cause of \(B\); hence, we cannot have backward causation. Since then philosophers have debated the effectiveness of the bilking argument in particular and, in general, the validity and the soundness of the concept of backward causation.

In the 1960s and 1970s, physicists began to discuss the possibilities of particles travelling with a speed greater than light, the so-called tachyons, and as a consequence a similar debate about paradoxes involving backward causation arose among them. In case superluminal particles, like tachyons, exist and could be used to generate signals, it seemed possible to communicate with the past because tachyons going forward in time with respect to one set of reference frames would always be seen as travelling backwards in time from another set of reference frames.

Now and then physicists and philosophers also invoke backward causation in order to explain some experimental and theoretical results within quantum mechanics. For instance, this might be in connection with understanding quantum entanglement after several experiments have proven the violation of Bell’s inequalities.

2. Philosophy

A general notion of backward causation raises two sets of questions: those concerning conceptual problems and those that relate to empirical or physical matters. Among the first sets of questions that require a satisfactory answer are the following:

2.1 Time and Backward Causation

Can metaphysics provide a notion of time that allows that the effect precede its cause? Answering this question, one may argue, on the one hand, as Maudlin (2002, p. 184) does, that in case we allow backward and forward causation to be parts of our description of the world, the “metaphysical picture of the past generating the future must be abandoned, and along with it the mathematical tractability of local theories.” On the other hand, one may argue, as Evans (2015) among others does, that backward causation is not “precluded by the known structure of reality.” Indeed, Evans’s claim presupposes that the future is ontologically on par with the past and that basic physical laws are time symmetric such that the influence of a physical process may under certain special conditions reach backwards in time.

A proper notion of backward causation requires that the future is just as real as the present and the past. It is common among metaphysicians to distinguish between three different views on time. The first is presentism. This view claims that only events that exist now really exist. Past or future events do not exist. Past events have ceased to exist, whereas future events are yet to become real. So only statements about the present or related to the present have a definite truth value. The second view is possibilism according to which both past and present events exist, but future events are still only possible or non-existing. This view is sometimes called the growing block universe. As a consequence, the view holds that only statements about past and present events have a definite truth-value, but statements about the future are either probably true or may completely lack any truth-value. Finally, the third view is called eternalism, also named the block universe. This position maintains that every past, present and future event tenselessly exists at a certain time and that statements about these events therefore have a definite truth-value at every other time.

Usually, presentism and the growing block universe are associated with the dynamic view of becoming. The transient now plays an ontological role as the ever changing time in which things become real or perhaps, if you are a presentist, cease to exist. One reason to prefer the growing block universe from presentism may be the analysis of forward causation. In order for a present event to be caused by a past event, the past event must exist. Nothing, which does not exist in the past, can cause something that presently exists. By the same token, if the backward causation is a conceptual possibility, something must exist in the future in order for it to cause something in the present.

Thus, backward causation demands eternalism or a static account of time in the sense that there is no objective becoming, no coming into being such that future events exist on the par with present and past events. It means that the future is real, the future does not merely consist of unrealised possibilities or even nothing at all. Ordinarily we may think of the past as a nothing that once was a something. But when asked what makes sentences about the past true or false, we would probably also say that it is the facts of the past that make present sentences about the past either true or false. The fact that I went to the cinema yesterday makes it true today when I say that I went to the cinema yesterday. This view is a realist one with respect to the past. If backward causation is to be conceptually possible, it forces us to be realists with respect to the future. The future must contain facts, events with certain properties, and these facts can make sentences about the past/future true or false. Such a realist account is provided by static and tenseless theories of time. Eternalism is such a theory and holds that the participation of time into the past, the present and the future depends on the perspective we human beings put on the world. The attribution of pastness, presentness and futureness to events is determined by what we take to exist at times earlier than and times later than the time of our experience. (For further discussion, see the entry on being and becoming in modern physics.)

2.2 Affecting the Past?

Does backward causation mean that a future cause is changing something in the past? Talking about forward causation we think of the cause as the event that produces its effect or brings it about. It is not part of our notion of forward causation that the cause changes anything in the future. A cause determines what the effect will be. Regardless of whether one is an advocate for presentism, the growing block universe, or eternalism, one never considers the cause as an event that will make the future different from what it will be. Indeed, without the forward-directed cause the future would have been different from what it is going to be.

Even most protagonists consider it an unwarranted consequence that the notion of backward causation, if consistent, involves the idea that the future is able to change the past. Their answer has therefore usually been that if we have the power to bring something about in the past, what came about really already existed when the past was present. We have to make a distinction between changing the past so it becomes different from what it was and influencing the past so it becomes what it was. A coherent notion of backward causation only requires that the future is able to have an influence on what happens in the past. Nonetheless, we can say, quite parallel to forward causation, that the past would have been different if the backward-directed cause had not made the past as it turned out to be.

2.3 Distinguishing Cause from Effect

Can the cause be distinguished from its effect so that the distinction does not depend on a temporal ordering of the events? For a long time the distinction between cause and effect was their temporal order. This view goes at least back to Hume who claimed, “We may define a cause to be an object followed by another, and where all the objects, similar to the first, are followed by objects similar to the second,” which is to say that “[…] if the first object had not been, the second never had existed” (Hume, [1748] 2007, 56). Although Hume did not explicitly say so, the expression “followed by” has always been read as “temporally followed by” and not “causally followed by”. So the adherents of this definition have usually tried to give an account of causation in which the cause and the effect are seen as temporal regularities between types of events. But we can also see that Hume himself added a counterfactual statement about causation which cannot be derived from his temporal definition. Apparently, he noticed that if we have a cause and an effect, there exists a relationship between them that is not given by the temporal order.

What is required for backward causation to be possible is some account of the direction of causation which does not rely on the direction of time. Various alternative proposals refer to counterfactuals, probabilities, agency, manipulation and intervention, common cause or causal forks. Among these it seems that only a Humean notion of causation explicitly makes a temporal identification of the cause and the effect. But there are also problems with some of the other accounts.

For example, it is quite common to follow David Lewis and define causation in terms of counterfactuals (Lewis, 1973). Assume event \(c\) causes event \(e\), then we have a situation in which both \(c\) and \(e\) occur, and in which the counterfactual statement “If \(c\) had not occurred, then \(e\) would not have occurred” is true. Thus, in Lewis’s view, \(e\) is causally dependent on \(c\) if, and only if, \(e\) is counterfactually dependent on \(c\). According to the traditional theory, formulated by Lewis and Stalnaker, any counterfactual statement is true if the consequent is true in the closest possible world to the actual world in which the antecedent is true. Apparently, Lewis’ definition delivers a non-temporal causal asymmetry, since the effect \(e\) is counterfactually dependent on the cause \(c\).

As we saw above, Hume also believed that causal statements entail counterfactuals, but the question is whether causal statements are definable in terms of counterfactuals. Here is an objection against such an attempt: Consider the following example. Because of severe frost during the night, ice covers the lake this morning. So, given the circumstances, if it had not been severe frost, there would not have been any ice on the lake. However, in these circumstances, the frost as the cause of the ice seems to be not only causally necessary for the ice, but the frost also seems to be causally sufficient for the ice cover. In other words, given the actual circumstances, it seems correct to say that the frost is causally sufficient as well as necessary for the ice. If we are going to represent causally sufficiency in terms of a counterfactual statement, we might then say that, given the actual circumstances, if no ice had covered the lake this morning, there would not have been a severe frost during the night. But if one accepts this objection, it shows that causal statements cannot be defined in terms of counterfactuals because such a definition does not give us the wanted asymmetry between cause and effect since each is counterfactually dependent on the other.

Sometimes this problem is called the Problem of Effects. According to this problem, the effect does not distinguish itself other than temporally from the cause because both the cause and the effect are counterfactually dependent on each other. Over the years several attempts have provided solutions to this problem. Lewis himself proposed some criteria consisting of a hierarchy of possible worlds such that a world in which \(c\) occurs but \(e\) does not occur is closer to the actual world than a world in which \(c\) does not occur due to the absence of \(e\). But a number of philosophers have challenged the aptness of these criteria, among others Bennett (1974); Faye (1989); Horwich (1993); Baker (2003); Choi (2007); Wasserman (2015), and Seli (2020).

However, and more importantly in the present context, is that Stalnaker-Lewis’ theory of counterfactuals has difficulties with backtracking counterfactuals and backward causation because if \(c\) occurs later than \(e\), the proposed method of truth evaluation assumes that \(e\) occurs in the relevant possible worlds in which \(c\) does not occur. In general, the assessment of a counterfactual conditional is carried out by assuming that the possible world must be identical with the actual world up to \(c\). Therefore, it is stipulated that the closest possible world is one in which everything happens just as in the actual world up to the time of \(c\)’s occurrence, which means, given \(e\) occurs before \(c\), that the possible world will include the occurrence of \(e\). But then it is necessarily true that there is never a possible world closer to the actual world which includes \(c\) but not \(e\). This creates a problem because we consider any causal connection between \(c\) and \(e\) as contingent. Rather we would expect that if we face a case of backward causation where both a present event \(c\) and a past event\(e\) occur, the following counterfactual would be true: “If \(c\) had not occurred, then \(e\) would not have occurred.” The truth evaluation of this counterfactual, if it were to represent backward causation, would require that the closest world without \(c\) is also one without \(e\). Nevertheless, the traditional theory does not allow such an evaluation.

How else can causality be specified so that the order of the cause-effect relationship is not time-dependent? Several possibilities seem open for such an account. Here we shall just mentioned some. One could hold that the cause makes the effect more probable in the circumstances; one could argue that causation can be understood in terms of manipulation and intervention; one could argue that we can specify causation in terms of transmission of information or conserved physical quantities. Or, finally, one could argue that causality is a primitive notion that may imply, or be used to explain, regularities, counterfactuals, probabilities, transmission of signals, or manipulation and intervention, but it cannot be completely analyzed in any of these terms. If we take into consideration that higher animals show a sense of causation, it may be a good indication that the origin of this notion goes back in history and that it stems from the cognitive evolution of grasping in which ways one’s environment is stable and in which ways one’s behavior can interact and change the environment.

This observation may come close to Lewis much later analysis of causation as influence (Lewis, 2000). Thus, it is through our ability to influence our environment that we improve our ability to manipulate and intervene in the cause of events and through which we receive knowledge of causal relationships and the causal order of this relationship (Faye, 1989; Woodward, 2003). However, such an understanding of causation is already rather complex, building on our capacity of foreseeing the effect of our own actions, on our capacity of foreseeing the effects of others’ actions, on our understanding the cause of others actions, and on our understanding the cause of physical events (Gärdenfors, 2006, p. 41).

2.4 The Bilking Argument

Can the bilking argument be challenged in such a way that the mere possibility of intervention does not generate any serious paradoxes? The bilking argument is due to Max Black (1956) who assumed the following scenario. Suppose Houdini makes a prediction about the outcome of, say, a coin about to be flipped \(B\) before someone actually does the flipping \(A\). We may also assume that in the past Houdini rarely failed in his predictions. In this case we might be tempted to say that the Houdini’s answer is caused by the later flipping. But, as Black argued, after Houdini’s prediction of \(B\), we can always intervene such that the coin is not flipped or arranged opposite to Houdini’s prediction. The implication is that \(A\) seems both to be the cause and not to be the cause of \(B\). Black also argued that if \(A\) is the cause of \(B\), then the causal antecedents of \(A\) are independent of \(B\). Hence, if we cannot, after \(B\) has occurred, prevent \(A\) from happening, then \(A\) cannot be said to be causally independent of \(B\). But since it is in human power to intervene with respect to \(A\), Black concluded that \(A\) cannot be the cause of \(B\)

Since manipulation and intervention is so central for our knowledge of causal relations, the image of our capability of intervening in the course of backward causation, after the alleged effect has occurred, seems to violate the whole idea that the notion of backward causation is coherent. However, the force of the bilking argument can, it seems, be weakened in various ways.

First, one may hold that it is not a problem for our notion of backward causation that we can in principle intervene in the course of the events. Usually, we find out whether two events are causally connected trough manipulation and intervention. In case we can produce one event \(Q\) by bringing about another \(P\), or we can obstruct one event \(Q\) by preventing another \(P\), we think that \(P\) is the cause of (\(Q\). Likewise, we believe that if \(P\) causes \(Q\) in the relevant circumstances, we may be able to prevent \(Q\) from happening if we intervene in the causal order after \(P\) occurs by changing some of these circumstances, which make \(P\) causing \(Q\). Should \(Q\) occurs in spite of this intervention, there must under the new circumstances be another event \(X\) rather than \(P\) that causes \(Q\).

Now, the bilking argument holds that backward causation is impossible because we can always intervene after we have observe that the alleged effect occurs and obstruct the alleged cause from occurring. Since nothing prohibits us from doing this whenever we want, it demonstrates that backward causation does not take place. Indeed, if we actually intervene and prevent \(A\) after \(B\) has occurred, then of course a particular later \(A\) (which does not exist) cannot be the cause of a particular earlier \(B\) (which exists). But in all those cases where nobody actually intervenes, events of the same type as \(A\) may be the cause of events of the same type as \(B\). This situation is not different from what may happen in some cases of forward causation. Assume that \(P\) causes \(Q\) in the relevant circumstances. We may still prevent a particular \(P\) from happening, but at the same time a particular \(Q\) may nevertheless occur because in the given circumstances it is caused by another event than \(P\).

Second, if a later event \(A\) really causes an earlier one \(B\), then it would be impossible to intervene into the cause of the event after \(B\) has happened and therefore impossible to prevent \(A\) from happening. If someone tries, she will by all means fail. It may intuitively sound strange as long as we think of backward causation as consisting of something we can control directly by our everyday actions. But if backward causation is a notion that is applicable only to processes that human beings are unable to control in any foreseeable way the notion would not provoke our intuitions so much.

But even if we would have full control of backward causal processes and able to intervene in their cause of events, we may not, in such cases where we actually intervene, exclude backward causation from taking place. Assume someone tosses a coin a minute after the magician Houdini has predicted whether it would be heads or tails. Furthermore, assume that Houdini’s predictions are highly correlated with the outcomes of the tossed coin. Presumably, no such high correlation would exist unless we were facing a case of backward causation. However, it turns out that the construction of a correlation may behave differently depending on whether we consider Houdini’s predictions to be purely physical events or to have a semantic content.

In an example like the one mentioned it is reasonable to think that we discover the correlation between Houdini’s predictions and the subsequent outcomes of the tossed coin by comparing the semantic content of the predictions with one of the two iconic sides of the coin that define the semantic content. The side facing up determines whether the prediction is true or not. First, in order to establish a causal correlation between the content of the predictions and the outcome of the tosses we would look for a high percentage of correct statements made by Houdini. This is an epistemically necessary condition for establishing a causal correlation. Second, there cannot ontologically be a causal correlation between the semantic content of Houdini’s prediction and the (reading of) outcome of the head or tail if no flipping of the coin takes place. His predictions would not carry any truth-value and we would think of them as pure guesses. Hence, when someone attempts to bilk this experiment, he or she will either arrange the outcome opposite to the content of Houdini’s prediction or abstain from flipping the coin.

However, one might suggest that a possible reply to Black’s bilking argument is to say that both tossing the coin and preventing the toss may backwardly cause Houdini’s behavior. That the preclusion of the coin from being tossed may be a cause of Houdini’s response has also been proposed by Brian Garrett (2020). But he argues, in contrast to the scenarios described below, that the lack of flipping the coin may be the direct cause of the Houdini’s earlier prediction (because of backward causal preemption) and not only the cause of an earlier lack of prediction. Thus, it seems at least consistent to argue that both the toss and the prevention could cause Houdini’s earlier behavior regardless of whether this behavior is a prediction or the lack of a prediction, but only as long as we consider both actions to be physical events. Indeed, if we solely consider Houdini’s prediction (regardless of its semantic content) or his lack of prediction as purely physical events and do the same with the actions “tossing the coin” and “preventing tossing the coin,” we may have a high correlation of these physical events.

Thus, it seems that we have three scenarios in which we can observe backward causation even though in two of them one may attempt to bilk the cause after the alleged effect has occurred.

Scenario 1: The experimenter asks Houdini to predict the outcome of a tossed coin a minute later. It turns out that there is a high positive correlation between Houdini’s answers and the actual heads or tails.

Scenario 2: The experimenter now asks Houdini to make his predictions, but arranges the coin such that it shows heads or tails opposite to Houdini’s pronouncements. In this case, there will be a negative correlation between the semantic content of his answers and the outcome of the tosses. (Indeed, you could also arrange the outcome so there would be no correlation at all.) But one could still argue that the very fact that Houdini did not abstain from responding was because the physical act of handling the coin automatically prompted him to produce an answer. One will observe a high positive correlation between Houdini making physical pronouncements and the physical handlings of the coin, although there exists a negative or no correlation between the semantic content of his answers and the outcomes in the form of heads and tails.

Scenario 3: The experimenter asks Houdini to make his predictions. However, he abstains in situations where someone subsequently prevents the coin from flipping, but in situations where no one intervenes; there is a high correlation between his predictions and the outcomes. In those cases where someone prevents the coin from being flipped, and Houdini therefore abstains from saying anything, there cannot be any correlation between the truth-value of Houdini’s answers (since he does not produce any). However, there still seems to be a high correlation between his behaviors (i.e. the physical lack of responses) and the subsequent prevention of any outcome.

For those reasons one may argue that the bilking argument is not as powerful as Max Black might have thought.

2.5 Free will

Does backward caution imply fatalism? An often advanced objection against backward causation is that if eternalism and backward causation are possible, then the future is already determined. And if it is already determined now what the future is going to be, then it does not matter what an agent will do, since everything in the future is set and done. An agent cannot do other than what the future is determined to be. Although this argument seems very appealing, it may not hold for a closer scrutiny.

Being an eternalist one may distinguish between a determined future and a determinate future. Also this pair of concepts have different names in the literature. Sometimes determinism is called physical determinism, causal determinism or nomological determinism, whereas determinateness is named logical determinism, temporal determinism, or block determinism. A future event is determined now if and only if a present event is causally or nomologically sufficient for it to happen. In contrast, a future event is determinate with respect to the present if and only if this event occurs tenselessly at a future time. Thus, eternalists will say that an agent still has a choice to make tomorrow about whether or not she will go and see her parents, because no present event causally determined her choice tomorrow. Her choice is nevertheless determinate, and therefore it is true today what she will do tomorrow.

The discussion of free will has a long history and the overwhelming parts of this discussion has been dedicated to the problem that if the world is completely governed by deterministic laws, does it then make sense to talk about free will? Indeed, the outcome of this discussion very much depends on how we understand the notion of free will. Usually the concept of free will connects to whether or not a human agent could have done otherwise. Some philosophers, the compatibilists, believe that as long a human agent is not subject to any external or internal forces, that individual is free to do whatever he or she wants. But then the compatibilists have to dismiss some part of the following argument of consequence.

  1. We cannot change the past.
  2. We cannot change the laws of nature.
  3. Hence, we cannot change either the past or the laws of nature (by 1 and 2).
  4. If determinism is true, then our present actions are necessary consequences of the past and the laws of nature.
  5. Hence, if determinism is true, then we can do nothing now to change the fact that our present actions are necessary consequences of the past and the laws of nature (by 4).
  6. Hence, if determinism is true, then we cannot change that our current actions occur (by 3 and 5).
  7. Hence, if determinism is true, then we have no power to do things differently than what we do (by 6).
  8. Free will requires a power to do things differently.
  9. Hence, if determinism is true, then we do not have free will (by 7 and 8).

The non-compatibilist will argue that we have free will in the sense that we could have done otherwise. Hence determinism cannot be true.

Indeed, the compatibilist will accept (1), because even an advocate of backward causation does not claim that the past can be changed. Moreover, the compatibilist does not have to accept backward causation. Most likely the compatibilist will not challenge the non-compatibilist by saying that we may be able to influence the past. It is much more likely that the compatibilist will object to the argument either by saying that not all laws of nature are deterministic or by saying that the brain operates based on ceteris paribus laws including a clause of the absence of external and internal forces. For the compatibilist this suffices to say that the agent could have done otherwise. In other words, the compatibilist’s objection would usually not concern the determinateness of the past.

As we can see, the above argument of consequence combines determinateness of the past and determinism of laws. Whatever the compatibilist would object in order to reject the argument of consequence, the argument cannot be used mutatis mutandis to argue against eternalism or the block universe, because in contrast to the discussion of free will and the past that focuses on determinism, the discussion of free will and the future focuses on determinateness. For even if indeterminism is true, i.e. if some processes of nature are indeterministic, one could still argue in favor of the block universe as some of its advocates pointed out long time ago (See Grünbaum, 1967, 28–35). Therefore, the argument against backward causation based on free will has to be different from the one posed against traditional fatalism. It has to look something like this:

  1. If backward causation is possible, then the future has to be determinate.
  2. If the future is determinate, it is now the case that a wanted action occurs at a later time t or it is now the case that it does not occur at this later time t(by 1).
  3. If it is now the case that a wanted action occurs at a later time t or it is now the case that it does not occur at this later time t, I cannot perform a wanted action that does not occur at this later time t.
  4. Hence if I cannot form a wanted action at a later time t, then I cannot be free to do otherwise (2 and 3).
  5. Now, assuming that the future is determinate.
  6. Hence, I am not free to do otherwise (by 4 and 5).
  7. Hence, I have no free will.
  8. However, I know from experience that I could have done otherwise.
  9. Hence, the future is not determinate.
  10. Hence, backward causation is not possible.

A common criticism has been that if the agent’s actions tomorrow are determinate, and it is therefore true today that the agent, say, will visit her parents, then the agent cannot do anything other than visit her parents. However, this conclusion seems to be a non sequitur. In order to reach such a conclusion, one must tacitly assume that the agent’s action causally determines the outcome of her choice, whereas the argument were believed to show that backward causation violates the notion of free will.

In contrast, the eternalist could argue that the reason why it is true today that an agent will visit her parents tomorrow is because the agent makes a decision that causally determines her visit before she goes to see them. If the agent makes the opposite decision tomorrow, it will be true today that she will not visit her parents. Whatever she chooses tomorrow, it will be her decision which makes it true today that she is going to see her parents. The outcome of her decision tomorrow is determinate not because the present truth value fixes her decision but because her future outcome fixes the present truth value. (Nor is it the case that the outcome of her decision causally determines her previous decision.) Thus, the eternalist may argue that even though the future is determinate, it does not exclude people from having free will. If people have free will, the argument goes, the fact that the outcome of their future decision is determinate with respect to the past does not affect their ability to choose freely.

3. Paradoxes

Of all the philosophical problems to which backward causation (and time travel) gives rise, the paradoxes are those that have generated the most heat in both physics and philosophy because, if they are valid, they exclude backward causation from being both metaphysically and logically possible. The paradoxes can grossly be divided into three kinds: (1) Bootstrap paradoxes involve a causal or information loop; (2) Consistency paradoxes involve generating a possible inconsistency; and (3)Newcomb’s paradox seems to foreclose free will. So if backward causation (and time travel) should be logically possible, one has to show that the paradoxes can be resolved and that therefore arguments based on them are invalid.

3.1 The Bootstrap Paradoxes

The bootstrap paradoxes arise in cases where you have a causal chain consisting of particular events in which \(a\) causes \(b, b\) causes \(c\), and \(c\) causes \(a\). The problem here is that the occurrence of \(a\) presupposes the occurrence of \(c\); in other words, the cause presupposes its effect. But how can something be required of what itself requires? Indeed this seems paradoxical. Some philosophers therefore think that this makes the idea of causal loops incoherent. Hugh Mellor even believes that

the possibility of causal loops can be excluded a priori, and so therefore can the closed timelike paths entailed by closed time, backward time-travel and all kinds of backward causation. (1991: 191).

His proof goes like this. Take four chains of events. Each of them consists of three particular events \(a, b\), and \(c\), all different tokens of the same kind of events \(A, B\) and \(C\). We then construct the chain such that

  1. \(b \Rightarrow c \Rightarrow a\)
  2. \({\sim}b \Rightarrow{\sim}c \Rightarrow{\sim}a\)
  3. \(b \Rightarrow c \Rightarrow{\sim}a\)
  4. \({\sim}b \Rightarrow{\sim}c \Rightarrow a\)

The first two sequences may be called G-chains and the other two H-chains. Moreover, Mellor assumes that all tokens of \(A, B\) and \(C\) are distributed among the four chains so that the number of chains is exactly the same, namely one fourth of the sequences. Mellor then defines a causal relation between two singular events \(a\) and \(b\) in terms of a situation \(k\) which makes \(b\) more likely to occur given \(a\) than without \(a\), i.e., \(\rP(b\mid a) \gt \rP(b\mid {\sim}a)\). But we can see that the number of chains in which \(b\) is combined with \(a\) is equal to the number of chains in which \(b\) is not combined with \(a\). In fact we have that \(\rP(b\mid a) =\) \(\rP({\sim}b\mid {\sim}a) =\) \(\rP(b\mid {\sim}a) =\) \(\rP({\sim}b\mid a)\). From this it follows that a particular \(b\)’s chance in \(k\) cannot increase with respect to \(a\) compared to its chance without \(a\). Hence \(a\) cannot affect \(b\), and therefore causal loops are impossible.

Some philosophers have not found this argument very convincing. Faye (1994) has pointed to the following problematic issues. First, Mellor measures the probability of singular events (propensities) instead of the probability of certain kinds of events. Second, he does not differentiate between circumstances in which a \(B\) is followed by an \(A\) and those in which a \(B\) is not followed by an \(A\). The argument is valid only if it can be proved, and not be stipulated, that (1) and (3) happen surrounded by the same facts. Many people would say that in a world of (1) must be different from a world of (3) in some other important respects than merely containing \(a\) or \({\sim}a\), especially since Mellor claims that the argument is valid for deterministic situations as well. Third, the equal distribution of the various chains seems quite selective. In Mellor’s G&H world, in which the number of the four chains is equal, and therefore in which the probabilities are equal, there cannot be any causal relationship between the individual \(b\) and the individual \(a\) due to the fact that the occurrence of \(a\) or \({\sim}a\) happens under exactly the same circumstances given \(b\). Finally, fourth, it seems appropriate to claim that any negative argument, like Mellor’s, should be able to show that what holds true of one world can be proved to hold true of every other world similar in all relevant respects, but in which G-chains and H-chains are not equally distributed.

It is clear that any world which contains G-chains rather than H-chains does not show the same inconsistency as Mellor’s G&H-world does. If it can be proved that causal loops in such worlds are consistent with the adopted definition, then causal loops are possible. In other words, if we set up a consistent model in which \(A\) increases the probability of \(B\), and \(B\) increases the probability of \(A\), we have then proven that causal loops are possible and that Mellor’s argument is invalid. The claim is therefore that both

  1. \(\rP(A\mid B) \gt \rP(A\mid {\sim}B)\)
  2. \(\rP(B\mid A) \gt \rP(B\mid {\sim}A),\)

can be shown to be true with respect to a world containing \(A\)s and \(B\)s. Assume the following probabilities, which hold for the distributions among \(A, {\sim}A, B\), and \({\sim}B\), are

\[\begin{align} \rP(A \amp B) &= 0.7 \\ \rP(A \amp{\sim}B) &= 0.1 \\ \rP({\sim}A \amp B) &= 0.1 \\ \rP({\sim}A \amp{\sim}B) &= 0.1. \end{align}\]

On the basis of the definition of the conditional probability, we get

\[\begin{align} \rP(A\mid B) = \frac{\rP(A \amp B)}{\rP(B)} &= 7/8 \\ \rP(A\mid {\sim}B) = \frac{\rP(A \amp{\sim}B)}{\rP({\sim}B)} &= 1/2 \\ \rP(B\mid A) = \frac{\rP(A \amp B)}{\rP(A)} &= 7/8; \\ \rP(B\mid {\sim}A) = \frac{\rP({\sim}A \amp B)}{\rP({\sim}A)} &= 1/2. \end{align}\]

Thus (i) and (ii) are both true with respect to the stated world; hence we have proven, according to Mellor’s own definition of causality, that it is consistent to talk about causal loops. Mellor has not been able to establish any satisfying a priori argument against causal loops or backwards causation.

Moreover, even if one assumes that Mellor were correct in ruling out causal loops a priori, he may be wrong in holding that this impossibility entails the impossibility of time travel as well as backward causation. Mellor’s argument presupposes that it is the same kind of processes obeying the same kind of macroscopic physical laws which enters into both the forward and backward part of the causal loop. This assumption may hold for time travel but not for backward causation.

3.2 The Consistency Paradoxes

The consistency paradoxes arise when you, for instance, try to kill your younger self by a backward causal process but evidently have to fail. The reason why you must fail is quite obvious. Your younger self belongs to the past and therefore, since you cannot change the past, you cannot commit retro-suicide. This answer tacitly assumes that resurrection is impossible. You may, of course, kill your younger self in the past without changing the past if you have come alive again later on. This is not what is paradoxical. What is paradoxical is the fact that you are assumed to be able to kill your younger self in the sense that you are well-equipped to make these kinds of retro-killings, you may even be targeting your younger self, but you must always miss. The same holds, indeed, for all those people who stay alive into the present. You cannot retro-kill somebody yesterday who is alive today. There must be certain constraints which prohibit you from making retro-suicide or retro-killing, and these constraints may be very local, changing from case to case, or they may be universal in nature depending on some physical laws. So, on the one hand, the assumption is that it physically possible for you to kill somebody in the past; but, on the other hand, it is physically impossible for you to do what is physically possible. This is the paradox.

A way out of the paradox was suggested by David Lewis (1976) who argued that the ability of killing somebody should be understood as a possibility compossible with the relevant fact. As an opera singer, for example, you are able to sing operas, since you have the physical capacity and training to do so, but because of a temporary loss of voice, you cannot hum a single tune. What you can do relative to one set of facts, is something you cannot do relative to another set of facts. This contextual solution explains why you are able to retro-kill your younger self, given the fact that your gun is in proper working-order, you have a good aim at your target, and no one forces you to abstain from taking action. But it also explains why you are unable to retro-kill anybody who is alive today because you cannot change the past. The consistency paradox exists only in virtue of an equivocation of a context-sensitive ‘can’, and if we notice that, we see that the paradox vanishes like dew before the sun.

Some may reply that we are still talking about different abilities. In contrast to the case in which the opera singer sometimes cannot sing, your attempt to carry out retro-suicide inevitably fails. The opera singer is able to sing operas because he has shown it before and can demonstrate it again, but the attempted retro-killer has not proved and can never prove his ability. Therefore you are never in a situation where you can kill your younger self. If we accept this objection, we may reformulate the solution by saying that the contextual solution explains why you should be able to retro-kill your younger self under the appropriate circumstances. But, again, how can we talk about the ability to make retro-suicide relative to certain facts at all, if there are no possible worlds in which you carry out your deed. It seems reasonable to say that you have the ability to do something if there is a possible world in which you carry out this action. This is true of the opera singer. He can sing operas because he does it in a possible world in which he has not lost his voice. But you cannot make retro-suicide because there is no possible world in which you kill your younger self. You are unable, even in principle, to do so.

In sum, the consistency paradox is no paradox as long as you do not insist on changing the past. You are unable to change the past, and therefore you are unable to retro-kill anybody who is alive when you try to kill them. The paradox seems to arise only because you wrongly believe that you are able to do something you are unable to do.

Now if there is no paradox on the conceptual level, what then is it that makes retro-suicide physically impossible? It could be either local facts or global facts. Local facts that could constrain your action of retro-killing are many. Your hand was shaking while firing your gun, you got a fly in your eye, you were disturbed by a cat, you just fainted, etc. These constraining facts seem reasonable by themselves; they could have happened independently of your overall capacity of killing somebody in the past, but also in the actual situation interact with your ability and turn the action into an unsuccessful event. The problem is merely that such an explanation looks suspicious. It is a general fact that we cannot retro-kill anybody who is alive after the time the death purportedly took place. Likewise it is a general fact, assuming that backward causation (or time travel) is physically possible, that we can retro-kill anybody who is not alive after the time the purported death took place. But the explanation of a general fact requires an appeal to a general fact or a law of nature. Thus a reference to a singular contingent fact to explain why you never succeed in killing your younger self seems not to fulfil the requirement of being an explanation.

The problem may be better understood in following way: each time you try to retro-kill somebody who is not alive after the time the purported effect of killing took place, your assassination may still fail because of your hand was shaking, etc. Such particular facts explain why you actually missed the target which you in principle were able to hit. But to say that you are in principle able to perform retro-killing means that there are laws of nature that normally allow you to perform such an action in the appropriate circumstances. Similarly, each time you try to retro-kill somebody who is alive after the purported death took place, you may fail for one reason or another. But you must always fail to retro-kill somebody who is alive after you did your action, i.e., you are in principle unable to retro-kill such a person. In those cases it is physically impossible for you to kill, say, your younger self. It seems, therefore, that there should be some laws of nature, working on either a local level or a global level, which violate such an action and makes it physically impossible.

A possible solution may be found in a recent result which shows that the most basic features of quantum mechanics may ensure that we could never alter the past, even if it should be possible to interact with the past. The two physicists, Daniel Greenberger and Karl Svozil (2005 in Other Internet Resources), imagine some form of quantum mechanical feedback by introducing figurative beam splitters which are unitary, i.e., the splitters allow the feedback loop to be reversed because they have the same number of entry ports and exit ports. From quantum mechanics we know that an object may behave like a wave and that some unitary operator describes the propagation of a physical system. The system is represented by a wave function, also referred to as a path, and the time evolution of the system is calculated as a sum over all possible paths from the initial state to the final state. This calculation is usually restricted to the forward direction of time. Now, if we think of some of the paths as unfolding backwards in time, Greenberger and Svozil are able to prove that either the forward and the backward component paths of the loop cancel out, or that the propagator, which establishes the feedback in time, “wipes out the alternative possible futures, thus guaranteeing the future that has already happened”. Thus, if you could aim at something in the past, the laws of nature prohibit you to act in ways that are in conflict with what makes the future what it is (what it already turned out to be). The authors’ conclusion is that if you go back in time or effect “the past quantum mechanically, you would only see those alternatives consistent with the world you left behind you”.

3.3 The Newcomb Paradox

This thought experiment involves a player playing a game against a fortune teller. In this game there are two boxes of which the player may select one or both. One of the two boxes is transparent, let’s call it \(A\), the other is opaque, call it \(B\). Before the player makes her choice the fortune teller, based on her prediction of the player’s choice, puts a certain amount of money in one or both boxes. When the player makes her choice, the following information is available to her: 1) Up to now the fortune teller has been able to predict the future with absolute certainty and has foreseen what other players have chosen. Moreover: 2) sometimes the fortune teller puts 1,000,000 dollars in box \(B\), but only if the player selects box \(B\) and does not take both boxes, whereas she puts 1,000 dollars in box \(A\), regardless of whether the player chooses box \(A\) or both boxes. So when the player has to choose between the two boxes, it is already determined whether box \(B\) contains 1,000,000 or nothing. If the fortune teller is correct in her prediction, the player will get 1,000,000 dollars, only if she selects box \(B\); however, if the player wants to earn 1,001,000 dollars and selects both boxes, she will miss most of the fortune and only receive 1,000 dollars, which she can already see in box \(A\).

This puzzle was originally proposed by William Newcomb but never published. After its first publication by Robert Nozick (1969) it was much discussed within decision theory. But it has also been debated in the context of backward causation, because it gives a nice illustration of some of the philosophical problems that arise in relation to backward causation. In this debate it has been used to demonstrate various claims: that backward causation is impossible or that it implies fatalism or determinism. The earliest discussion of some of the consequences for backward causation and free will can be found in George Schlesinger (1974) and in an exchange between Don Locke (1978, 1979) and André Gallois (1979). Here Schlesinger argued that there are good arguments for taking both boxes, \(A\) and \(B\), and equally good arguments for taking only box B, whereas Locke held that backward causation is irrelevant and the player ought to take both boxes. However, Gallois believed that Locke’s arguments for taking both boxes are misconceived.

Two opposite arguments for what the player should decide can be given. Assuming the player has a free will it seems rational to say that the fortune teller cannot in principle predict what the player is going to do. When the player makes her choice, it is already determinate whether box \(B\) contains 1,000,000 dollars or nothing. Therefore her choice cannot be affected by the fortune teller’s prediction, and she would be better off by selecting both boxes, hoping that there already is 1,000,000 dollars in box \(B\). The other argument maintains that based on previous experience—which tells us that the fortune teller has always been correct about her predictions—it would be most rational of the player to take only \(B\). From here philosophers have disagreed about the strength of the argument. One could insist that fortune teller can predict the player’s choice only based on relevant knowledge of that person’s past or present behavior or state of mind (compatibilism). Alternatively one could argue that the fortune teller could have such a perfect knowledge only from information about the player’s choice in the future.

Nevertheless, it has been argued that the Newcomb paradox demonstrates that backward causation is impossible. George Schlesinger (1980:75 ff.), for instance, imagines a perfect judge who is allowed to check the two boxes after the fortune teller has placed the money in the boxes, but before the player has made her choice. It is clear that if the perfect judge then informs the player about the content of the two boxes, we have a case where the fortune teller’s prediction causes the player to select both boxes as she is informed about the 1,000,000 dollars in box \(B\). Indeed this would be a clear example of Black’s case of bilking. But Schlesinger also argues that the same holds true, if the perfect judge merely knows it without informing the player. However, it is difficult to understand why this should be the conclusion. If we assume that the player has a free will and that the fortune teller is able to predict the result of the player’s choice, it seems most rational for the player to learn from experience and opt for box \(B\) only rather than being greedy and take both boxes. As long as the perfect judge is silent, his knowledge about the content of the two boxes seems not to be able to influence the player’s decision. Nor does the player’s possible knowledge of the existence of a perfect judge seem to have any effect on her decision, because this information does not add anything to the information she already has; namely, that the fortune teller has placed the money in the boxes before she makes her decision and that the fortune teller has never failed to predict the outcome in advance.

Another problem is that the paradox seems to indicate that backward causation implies fatalism and determinism. If backward causation is possible we cannot have a free will. If the result of the player’s action can be predicted, because it is already true today what the player will choose tomorrow, she cannot be free to pick. If the fortune teller already knows that the player will choose both boxes, this has to be true, and the player cannot do otherwise. And if the fortune teller already knows that the player will select only box \(B\), this has to be true, and the player cannot but do it. However, this argument seems to be misguided.

The intuitive strength of the argument stems from the general assumption that backward causation presupposes an ontologically closed future—a metaphysical position about time usually named eternalism. Hence it is not an argument only against backward causation but against eternalism as well. Suppose it is now already true or false what is going to happen tomorrow; then there must be some future truth-makers that determine that it is now already true or false what is going to happen. The consequence seems to be that what the player is going to do tomorrow is already determined today; hence the player cannot do otherwise tomorrow than what is true today. Therefore the player cannot have a free choice, and it seems futile of her to make any decision.

However, it can be maintained that the player still has her free choice. Nothing around the fortune teller causes the player to make a particular decision. The player is as free as she would be with no prediction. What the fortune teller is able to predict is the result of the player’s choice. The choice itself may nevertheless be free. Moreover, unless one replaces forward causation with backward causation, one cannot argue that it is the outcome of the player’s choice that causes her decision. The statement about the outcome of her decision is true, according to the fortune teller, because of the particular decision the player makes; a statement about the player’s decision is not true because of the outcome of her decision. Consequently, even with respect to the fortune teller, the player’s decision may be regarded as free in the sense that nothing in its past nor in its future determines what the decision actually becomes. The reason why the fortune teller is able to make her prediction could be that the player’s choice instigates an information channel backwards in time.

Philosophers who reject eternalism may not leave the discussion here. They could argue that it may very well be the case that the player’s choice is neither causally determined by past events nor by future events. Yet, eternalism implies that the player’s decision is ontologically determinate before it is made, since it is true today what she will decide tomorrow. Therefore she is not as free as she would be if the future is ontologically open, i.e., it is not yet ontologically determinate what the future is going to be, including the player’s choice. The eternalist may attempt to rebut these critics by arguing that as long as the player’s decision is not causally determined, it is free in any possible sense.

4. Physics

The notion of backward causation raises a very different set of questions that need to be answered before a physically adequate notion has been developed.

  1. What, if anything, would in physical terms characterize backward causation?

One has to remember that causality as such is an everyday notion that has no natural application in physics. How we could physically identify backward causal processes depends very much on which feature we take our ordinary notion of causation to apply to a physical process. In physics we may be tempted to associate it with different physical notions of processes. Four suggestions have been put forward: (a) the causal link can be identified with the transference of energy; (b) it can be identified with the conservation of physical quantities like charge, linear and angular momentum; (c) it can be identified with interaction of forces; or (d) it can be identified with the microscopic notion of interaction. It appears with respect to all four suggestions, however, that the involved descriptions are invariant under the time reversal operation.

The most fundamental laws of nature are time reversal invariant in the sense that our physical theories allow description of the fundamental reactions and processes in terms of the time reversed order. Such processes are said to be reversible in time. Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism, for instance, admits two kinds of mathematical solutions for the equations describing the radiation of energy in an electromagnetic field. One is called the retarded solution where radiation appears as outgoing concentric waves, the other is named the advanced solution according to which radiation appears as incoming concentric waves.   Apparently the advanced solution describes the temporal inverse phenomena of the retarded solution so that these two solutions are usually regarded as the time reverse solution of the other. Nevertheless, retarded waves, like the increase of entropy in quasi-closed systems, appear to be de facto irreversible although they are described in terms of time invariant laws. Nature seems to prefer certain processes rather than their temporally inversed counterparts in spite of the fact that the laws of nature do not show such a preference. Light, radiation and ripples on a pond always spread outwards from their source rather than inwards just like entropy of a quasi-closed system is always moving from lower to higher states.

4.1 The Wheeler-Feynman Absorber Theory

Why do we not see any advanced waves in nature? Wheeler and Feynman (1945) came up with an answer. If we assume, they said, that radiation from an isolated accelerated charged particle is equally retarded and advanced, that is half retarded and half advanced to be exact, we can explain why it appears to be fully retarded in terms of the influence distant absorbers make on the source. The absorber consists of charged material that reacts with the source field by radiating with half retarded and half advanced waves. It is this half advanced field of the charged particles of the absorber which is added to the half retarded field of the source. The advanced waves of the absorber interfere constructively with the retarded waves of the source, whereas the same waves cancel out the advanced waves of the source in a destructive interference. Thus one of the consequences of Wheeler and Feynman Absorber Theory is the idea that emitters are intrinsically symmetric, another is that there is no intrinsic difference between so-called emitters and so-called absorbers. In other words, if this theory is true we have to conclude that radiation from a source is a time symmetric process but the presence of an absorber makes it asymmetric.

The Wheeler-Feynman theory takes for granted that outgoing, expanding waves are identical with retarded radiation and incoming, contracting waves with advanced radiation. But is such identification without any problems? Not quite. An example with retarded and advanced emitters illustrates clearly why. Think of a stone being thrown directly into the middle of a circular pond. The ripples move outwards from the point where the stone hits the water (the source) in a coherent, organized wave front and eventually reach the edges (the absorber). Moreover, the source acts earlier than the absorber.  What will the inverse process look like? It depends on how we understand such a process, whether or not we consider a case that includes a reversed source and a reversed absorber. (A) If they are included, the edges of the pond will now act as the source and the converging waves will eventually reach the middle of the pond. We may create something like this if we dropped a big ring horizontally into the pond. Inside the ring the waves would move inwards in an organized wave front towards the centre.   In this case the source (the drop of the ring) would still act earlier than the absorber (the ripples meeting at the middle of the pond from all sides). (B) But if our understanding of the inverse process does not include an exchange of the source with the absorber and vice versa, then the ripples reach the edges of the pond (the absorber) earlier than the stone plunges into the water (the source). This is definitely not a state of affairs we could bring about. Furthermore, if we were to observe such a process, the ripples would seem to move inwards as contracting waves. The problem is that both kinds of inverse processes would seem to appear to us as organized incoming waves but one would be a case of retarded radiation and the other of advanced radiation.

This may not be the only problematic assumption of the Wheeler and Feynman theory. Huw Price (1996) has singled out other problems. Among them is the question of how we may experience the difference between retarded and advanced waves. When Wheeler and Feynman attributed to the source a field of half retarded and half advanced waves, they assumed that the field actually consists of retarded as well as an advanced component. Price objects, however, that there is no measurable difference between the two kinds of waves, and we cannot justify such a distinction by an appeal to the nature of the source because both emitters and absorbers can be associated with retarded as well as advanced waves. Instead he believes that these components are fictitious and that Wheeler and Feynman’s formalism merely offer two different descriptions of the same wave. The problem of the asymmetry, as he sees it, has nothing to do with the fact that transmitters are associated with outgoing radiation rather than incoming radiation but that transmitters are centered on organized outgoing wave fronts whereas receivers are not centered on similar organized incoming wave fronts.

4.2 Tachyons

When the discussion of tachyons began to appear in physics in the 1960s, it was soon noticed that such particles according to some frames of reference were associated with negative energies going backwards in time. To understand how, consider the trajectory of the same tachyon in relation of three different reference frames, \(S, S^*\), and \(S^{**}\) in the Minkowski-space. Now assume that \(A\) is, in relation to \(S\), the emission of a tachyon at \(t_{1}\) and \(B\) is the absorption of the tachyon at \(t_{2}\). According to an observer in \(S, A\) will be earlier than \(B\) and the tachyon will carry positive energy forward in time. Nevertheless it is always possible to select a reference frame \(S^*\) in relation to which an observer will see \(A\) happen simultaneously with \(B\) and yet another reference frame \(S^{**}\) in relation to which an observer sees \(A\) happens at \(t_{2}^{**}\) whereas \(B\) happens at \(t_{1}^{**}\). According to the observer in \(S^{*}\), \(A\) will take place later than \(B\) and the tachyon carries negative energy backwards in time (See Figure 1).

[Three diagrams each with a vertical axis labelled ‘time’ and an arrow pointing up and two horizontal perpendicular axes labelled ‘space’]

Figure 1: Spacetime diagram of tachyon

In Figure 1 the planes represent the hypersurfaces of simultaneity. In relation to frame \(S\) the tachyon source is at rest, and a tachyon is emitted at event \(A\), with a superluminal but finite velocity. The absorption of the tachyon, event \(B\), will accordingly occur later than \(A\) in relation to the observer in \(S\), and the arrow of trajectory is for that reason pointing into the future above the hypersurface passing through \(A\) and standing perpendicular to the world-line of the source. But neither with respect to the frame \(S^*\) nor \(S^{**}\) is the tachyon source at rest and the hypersurfaces are therefore tilted in relation to the arrow of trajectory. An observer in \(S^*\) observes the tachyon to have infinite speed, and therefore the hypersurface is tilted so much that it coincides with the arrow. The observer in \(S^{**}\) is moving so fast with respect to the tachyon source that the hypersurface becomes titled so much that the arrow points into the past below the hypersurface.

E. Recami (1978) tried to avoid the idea that tachyons could move backwards in time by introducing the so-called reinterpretation principle according to which all negative energy tachyons should be interpreted as if they have positive energy and move forward in time. This would mean that the causal order of tachyons should not be regarded objective since both \(A\) and \(B\) sometimes denoted the emission and sometimes the absorption depending on the frame of reference. There are, however, good reasons to believe that this suggestion does not solve the problems it was intended to (Faye 1981/1989).

4.3 Quantum Mechanics

Other physical candidates for backward causation can be founded in the physics literature. Richard Feynman once came up with the idea that the electron could go backwards in time as a possible interpretation of the positron (Feynman 1949). In fact he imagined the possibility that perhaps there were only one electron in the world zig-zagging back and forth in time. An electron moving backwards in time would carry negative energy whereas it would with respect to our ordinary time sense have positive charge and positive energy. But few consider this as a viable interpretation today (Earman 1967a, 1976).

More recently, the Bell type experiments have been interpreted by some as if quantum events could be connected in such a way that the past light cone might be accessible under non-local interaction; not only in the sense of action at a distance but as backward causation. One of the most enticing experiments of this kind is the Delayed Choice Quantum Eraser designed by Yoon-Ho Kim et al. (2000). It is a rather complicated construction. It is set up to measure correlated pairs of photons, which are in an entangled state, so that one of the two photons is detected 8 nanoseconds before its partner. The results of the experiment are quite amazing. They seem to indicate that the behavior of the photons detected these 8 nanoseconds before their partners is determined by how the partners will be detected. Indeed it might be tempting to interpret these results as an example of the future causing the past. The result is, however, in accordance with the predictions of quantum mechanics.

However, David Ellerman (2015) argues that interpreting delayed-choice experiments or similar experiments as revealing cases of backward causation or retrocausation relies on what he calls the separation fallacy:

We have seen the same fallacy of interpretation in two-slit experiments, which-way interferometer experiments, polarization analyzers, and Stern-Gerlach experiments. The common element in all the cases is that there is some separation apparatus that puts a particle into a certain superposition of spatially “entangled” or correlated eigenstates in such a manner that when an appropriately spatially-positioned detector induces a collapse to an eigenstate, then the detector will only register one of the eigenstates. The separation fallacy is that this is misinterpreted as showing that the particle was already in that eigenstate in that position as a result of the previous “separation.” In fact the superposition evolves until some distinction is made that constitutes a measurement, and only then is the state reduced to an eigenstate. The quantum erasers are more elaborate versions of these simpler experiments, and a similar separation fallacy arises in that context.

Thus, Ellerman argues that when one describes a system in a superposition of certain eigenstates, it does not mean that the system is in any of these eigenstates before some measurement is carried out. Therefore, it is wrong to interpret delayed-choice experiments, and their like, as if the future measurement determines some past eigenstates, which all were parts of a superposition.

In his discussion of the experimental violation of Bell’s inequalities Don Howard (1989) distinguishes, based on an earlier work done by Jon Jarrett, between locality and separability. The locality condition states that a measurement of a pair of objects emerging from a singlet is statistically independent of the setting of the apparatus used to measure its counterpart. However, the separability condition is defined as the joint probability is equal to the product of the probability of each state. We know that the experimental violation of Bell’s inequalities involves the invalidation of one of these conditions. Moreover, if we take Ellerman’s argument into consideration, the two entangled particles, although separated, are still in a state of superposition until the measurement takes place.

If we consider the notion of the entangled state in quantum mechanics, we find that it is characterized as a unified, non-separable state due to the help of the notion of superposition of possible eigenstates represented by one common wave function for the correlated pair. Such a superposition is neither distance-dependent nor time-dependent. Therefore it is not surprising that based on the correct predictions of quantum mechanics it is impossible to find support of the violation of normal causation within this kind of experiment. With reference to the philosophical discussion about quantum mechanical entanglement, we can conclude that the experimental results of this sort violate the principle of separability rather than the principle of locality.

Phillippe Eberhard and Ronald R. Roos (1989) have established a theorem which says that if quantum mechanics is correct, it is impossible to use quantum effects to generate a break in the chain of normal causation. Quantum field theory does not allow any superluminal communication between different observers. Indeed, this is not so strange, since quantum field theory is relativistically invariant whereas superluminal frames of reference are not. But Eberhard and Roos’ theorem does not rule out all forms of backward causation. Two possible scenarios are still open: (1) entangled pairs exchange some form of superluminal information (and energy) below the limits of Heisenberg’s uncertainty relations; or (2) causation may be symmetrical so that the direction of causation in a physical system is determined by its boundary conditions.

Costa de Beauregard (1977, 1979), for instance, has suggested that when a system of two photons in a singlet state is measured by two observers in two regions separated by a space-like distance, then it is precisely the act of observation that produces the past of the measuring process in the sense that it influences the source that emitted the two photons. de Beauregard’s idea is that the element of reality being revealed in the formulation of the EPR paradox is real only because it was created by actually performed acts of observation that was propagated backwards in time with one of the two correlated quantum objects from the measuring device to the source of the photons.

Some physicists, like Elitzur et al. (2016), suggest a form of too-late-choice experiment that supports such a time-symmetric interpretations of quantum mechanics according to which backwards causation plays a significant role. In the normal EPR experiment, each measurement determines, say, the spin value of two separated, say, electrons in a singlet state along a certain orientation of the apparatus. The outcome then proves that the spin value of one electron has been affected by the distant experimenter’s choice of spin orientation of the other electron. However, what Elitzur et al. now imagine is a reversal setting in which a chosen spin value determines the corresponding orientation. Based on their analysis, they conclude that “it turns out that the orientation is similarly subject to nonlocal effects [as the spin value.]”

Several other philosophers and physicists have come forward with similar ideas. Aharonov and Vaidman (1997) have formulated a two vector approach to quantum mechanics “in which a quantum system is described, at a given time, by two (instead of one) quantum states: the usual one evolving toward the future and the second evolving backwards in time from a future measurement.” Also Cramer’s transactional interpretation of quantum mechanics involves the idea of a second wave travelling backwards in time (Cramer, 1986). The basic assumption behind all of them is that in the micro-world we find only causal symmetry, and this fact together with proper boundary conditions can be used to give an explanation of outcomes that seem otherwise paradoxical. Such quantum correlation experiments can, however, be interpreted in many other ways. In the end it seems as if it all depends one whether one assumes that Bell experiments break with either the locality condition or the separability condition. A time-symmetric interpretation of quantum mechanics is required only if one believes that it is the locality condition that is violated in order to avoid being in conflict with relativity theory.

4.4 Two alternatives

These alleged examples of backward causation have one thing in common. They are all based on the idea that fundamental physical processes are by themselves symmetric in nature. Our ordinary notion of causation does not track any nomological feature of the world. What counts as the cause and the effect depends on the observer’s projection of his or her temporal sense onto the world. So it is still an open question how a coherent notion of backward causation can fit into this general understanding of nature. The question we therefore have to answer is the following:

  1. How can we distinguish between forward causation and backward causation if all basic physical processes are time symmetric according to our description of nature?

Two very different reactions to this problem seem possible.

4.4.1 Boundary Conditions

One proposal is to say that if we came across reversed cases of de facto irreversible processes, such as running a film backwards in which the cream converged in a coffee cup, such cases should be interpreted as examples of backward causation (Price 1996). Such a claim build on a common interpretation of time reversal invariance of processes according to which this descriptive feature of the dynamical equations of physics makes reversal processes symmetric in time. Many philosophers have defended such an interpretation, in particular Hans Reichenbach (1956, 1929 [1958]) and Adolf Grünbaum (1963). This also led them to argued that only de facto irreversible processes, such as those described by statistical thermodynamics, could be used to defined a physical orientation of time. Thus, it seems to be the case that the actual world consisting of mostly de facto irreversible processes on the macroscopic level due to a prevalent set of boundary conditions is temporally and causally symmetric on the microscopic level. On the macroscopic level, de facto irreversible processes emerge, because the boundary conditions are a result of the huge degree of freedom among microprocesses or coherence conditions forced upon the underlying microscopic processes.

The point is here to argue that it is the absence of the right initial or boundary conditions on the macroscopic level that makes backward causation so rare or nearly empirically impossible. This suggestion is based on three basic assumptions: (i) there is no objective asymmetry in the world, causal processes are intrinsically symmetric in nature, or causation is bidirectional, and therefore the fundamental processes of the micro-world are temporally symmetric; (ii) causal asymmetry is subjective in the sense that any attribution of an asymmetry between cause and effect depends on our use of counterfactuals and our own temporal orientation; (iii) backward causation, or advanced action, is nonetheless possible because sometimes the correlation of certain past events depends on the existence of causally symmetric processes and some future boundary conditions. For instance, advanced actions in electrodynamics require that the existence of transmitters in the future are centered on organized incoming wave fronts; and advanced actions in quantum mechanics require that their present states are in part determined by the future conditions (measurements) they are to encounter. This feature is then taken to explain quantum entanglement and the violation of Bell’s inequalities in quantum mechanics.

A simple consideration seems to support this interpretation. Think of a particle travelling between two boxes. The normal observer and the counter-observer who has an inverse time sense will describe the exchange in conflicting terms. To the normal observer Box 1, say, will be considered as the emitter because it loses energy before anything in Box 2 happens. Therefore, Box 2 will be considered as the receiver since it gains energy at a later time. So in relation to the normal observer, the particle travels from Box 1 to Box 2. The counter-observer, however, sees the situation with opposite eyes. In relation to him, Box 2 loses energy and not until thereafter does Box 1 gain a similar amount of energy. Accordingly, in relation to the counter-observer, the particle moves from Box 2 to Box 1. In other words whether a box is considered to be an emitter or a receiver depends on the observer’s time sense.

4.4.2 Nomic conditions

The other proposal denies that basic physical processes are time symmetric and argues, in contrast, that the causal asymmetry is objective and therefore that there exists an intrinsic difference between the cause and the effect of all physical processes. John Earman (1967b and 1969) may be the first who argued against the interpretation that time reversal invariance of processes is identical with invariance under the exchange of the temporal order between earlier and later. Two reversed tokens of the same type of physical process do not developed in the opposite direction of time.

Hence, backward causation should not be considered as a notion about boundary conditions but as a notion concerned with processes that nomically distinguish themselves from forward causal processes. Thus, if there are processes in the world that might be seen as a manifestation of backward causation, these are not to be depicted by a description that leaves them to be time reversed cases of ordinary forward causal processes (Faye 1981/1989, 1997, 2002). This alternative interpretation rests on a basic claim and four assumptions.

The fundamental claim is that for any observer it is possible to identify experimentally the cause and the effect so that these remain the same even in relation to counter-observers, i.e., observers having the opposite time sense of ours. In support of this claim consider the following thought experiment. Two boxes, each having a shutter, are facing each other. Assume, ex hypothesis, that Box 1 is the particle source and Box 2 is the particle receiver. The question is how a normal observer and a counter-observer can come to agreement that particles move from Box 1 to Box 2. The answer can be found through a series of manipulations with the shutters, I would say. There are four possible combinations of the two shutters: open-open, close-close, open-close, close-open. Let us call any change of energy in Box 1, regardless of whether it emits or receives a particle, \(A\) and, similarly, any change of energy in Box \(2 B\). Whether \(A\) or \(B\) stand for a gain or a loss of energy can be determined by weighing the two boxes. (i) In case both boxes are closed, no particle will leave Box 1 and no particle is received by Box 2, thus no gain or loss of energy occurs, and both the normal observer and the counter-observer see a situation of not-\(A\), not-\(B\). (ii) In case both boxes are open a particle leaves Box 1 and is received by Box 2. Again this can be observed by measuring the change of energy in the two boxes. Thus the observers will see a situation of both \(A\) and \(B\). (iii) In case Box 1 is closed and Box 2 is open, they will observe no change of energy in Box 1 (because it is closed) and, since no particle is leaving Box 1, no particle will reach Box 2 although its shutter is open. Hence the observers measure no energy change in this box. Thus they see not-\(A\) and not-\(B\). (iv) Finally, if Box 1 is open and Box 2 is closed, a particle leaves Box 1, but none is received by Box 2. In other words, there is a loss or a gain of energy in Box 1, but no loss or gain of energy in Box 2. So the observers see \(A\) and not-\(B\). The upshot of this toy experiment is that the normal observer as well as the counter-observer experience two \(A\)s but only one \(B\), and one not-\(A\) but two not-\(B\)s; therefore both will agree that the particles move from Box 1 to Box 2.

This means that what a normal observer identifies as a forward causal process will be regarded as a backward causal process in relation to the counter-observer in the sense that the very same event acting as a past cause for the normal observer will act as a future cause for the counter-observer. This indicates, too, that in relation to a normal observer forward causation and backward causation cannot be regarded as two different manifestations of nomologically reversible (but de facto irreversible) processes since both manifestations—the common process and the very improbable reversed process—would develop forward in time. If this claim is true, it implies that the description of physical processes should reflect such an intrinsic asymmetry in a way that the nomic description varies according to whether the process in question goes forward or backwards in time. Moreover, we must also be able to distinguish theoretically (and not only experimentally) between the normal observer’s report and the counter-observer’s report of the same process by a separate convention in respect to whether the process is forward moving or backward moving. What we want is a characterization of every physical process so that the invariance of cause and effect corresponds to nomological irreversibility.

In order to establish a nomic, intrinsic distinction between forward causal processes and backward causal processes one has to take departure in four assumptions. (i) Process tokens and process types are distinct in the sense that only process types are reversible, process tokens are not. (ii) A normal observer will describe causal processes propagating forward in time in terms of positive mass and positive energy states pointing into her future whereas she will describe the same tokens in terms of negative mass and energy states pointing into her past. This reflects two possible solutions of the four-momentum vector in the theory of relativity. (iii)Thus, one must distinguish between a passive time reversal operation and an active time reversal operation. The passive transformation is applied to the same process token by describing it in terms of opposite coordinates and opposite energy states. The active transformation, in contrast, brings about another token of the same process type in virtue of some physical translation or rotation of the system itself, both tokens having the same energy sign pointing in the same direction of time. (iv) The description in terms of positive mass and the positive energy flow corresponds to the intrinsic order of the propagation.

Now, let us try to apply the nomic interpretation to the above consideration concerning the exchange of a particle between two boxes. In relation to the normal observer who describes the particle in terms of its positive energy component, it travels from Box 1 to Box 2 because Box 1 looses energy at an earlier time and Box 2 gains energy at a later time. The same situation is by the counter-observer described in terms of the particle’s negative energy component as a situation where something happens in Box 2 before it happens in Box 1. In relation to the counter-observer, Box 2 would not, as the boundary interpretation suggests, loose energy. On the contrary, Box 2 would seem to gain energy, but the counter-observer would describe the particle as a series of negative energy states reaching into his future supposing the particle to be moving from Box 2 to Box 1 carrying negative energy. But, as we have just argued, the particle really moves from Box 1 to Box 2, from the counter-observer’s future into his past carrying positive energy.

Consequently, the nomic interpretation holds that in relation to our normal time sense the causal direction of ordinary processes is identical with that of their reversed processes. In other words, take two tokens of a nomologically reversible process type, say \(A\) and \(B\), and let \(B\) be the actively time reversed process of \(A\), then this interpretation claims that \(A\) and \(B\) causally develop in the same direction of time. So, according to this view, neither incoming, contracting electromagnetic waves nor the decrease of entropy would count as examples of backward causation as long as such processes involve ordinary types of matter, i.e., matter that possesses positive mass and/or energy pointing, in relation to our normal time sense, towards the future. The notion of backward causation should instead be applied to matter of a different type, particles that appear to have, according to usual conventions, negative mass and/or energy pointing, in relation to our normal time sense, towards the future but positive mass and/or energy pointing towards the past. Such advanced matter, if it exists, should be distinguished from both ordinary retarded matter as well as tachyons by always being described with respect to our time sense in terms of negative mass and energy stretching forward in time. A consequence is that a world in which advanced matter exists together with retarded matter, and where advanced matter is able to interact directly with the same amount of retarded matter, both would, in case they actually did interact, annihilate without leaving any trace of energy.

How and whether the notion of backward causation has a role to play in physics has yet to be seen. But as long as no common agreement exists among philosophers and physicists about what in the physical description of the world corresponds to our everyday notion of causation, it would still be a matter of theoretical dispute what counts as empirical examples of backward causation.


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Other Internet Resources

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Thanks to John Norton for his editorial suggestions and for his drawing of Figure 1.

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