Causation in the Law

First published Thu Oct 3, 2019; substantive revision Sun Feb 4, 2024

In this context the basic questions concerning causation in the law are: (i) what are the criteria in law for deciding whether one action or event has caused another (generally harmful) event; (ii) whether and to what extent causation in legal contexts differs from causation outside the law, for example, in science and everyday life; and (iii) what reason(s) (presumably based in the law’s use of causation to attribute responsibility) explain and/or justify such differences as may be found to exist.

1. Introduction

Seemingly the central interests that justify having an entry on causation in the law in a philosophy encyclopedia are: to understand just what is the law’s concept of causation, if it has one; to see how that concept compares to the concept of causation is use in science and in everyday life; and to examine what reason(s) there are justifying or explaining whatever differences there may be between the two concepts of causation. Other entries in this encyclopedia deal with the nature of causation as that relation is referred to in science and in everyday life. The philosophical interest in the law’s concept of causation is largely comparative: how does the law’s concept differ, if at all, from the more general concept of causation analyzed in philosophy, and are there good reasons explaining why there are such differences?

These three questions—what is the law’s concept of causation and how and why does it differ from the general notion of causation in science and everyday life—are deceptively simple in their appearance. Yet describing a concept like causation as it is used in a body of discourse such as law, depends on a number of variables examination of which early-on will precisify the questions later pursued in this entry. These preliminary, clarificatory variables are four in number.

First: human law, unlike the “natural law” of morality, is inherently parochial in the sense that human law varies from place to place. (It does this because human law’s existence depends in part upon facts of institutional history and these facts vary from place to place.) So the question, “whose law?”, looms large at the start of an enquiry such as this. What follows describes causation as it is used in what may broadly be called the Anglo-American legal tradition—the legal tradition of the United Kingdom, the domains of its Commonwealth, and the United States. Despite this confession of a somewhat parochial focus, there are nonetheless universalist implications of this analysis. This is because there are strong similarities in the legal uses of causation in all presently existing legal systems, even when one is not confined to those of the English-speaking world.

Second, even when we restrict our focus to the law of some one legal tradition, within that tradition there will be discrete areas of law that make use of causation in their liability rules, such as the areas of contracts, torts, property, constitutional, and criminal law within the Anglo-American legal tradition. It is arguable that the precise contours (and maybe even the central notion) of causation differs between such areas; for example, it is plausible to think that there is a significant difference between contract law’s notion of consequential damages following upon breach and criminal law’s notion of the proximate causation needed to make out a completed crime (Moore 2009a: Appendix). Accordingly, to prescind from any such differences as may exist between areas of law, this entry focuses on what those within the Anglo-American legal tradition regard as the dominant usage of causation in the law, which usage is to assign responsibility to actors who cause harms to others. The areas of law where such assignment of cause-based responsibility predominates is in the law of crimes and the law of torts. The entry accordingly focuses on those two areas of law because they are central to the Anglo-American (and probably to any) legal system’s use of causation. They are also the areas of law in which (by far) the greatest attention has been paid to causation in both law and legal theory.

Third, we need to distinguish propositions of law containing the concept of causation, from propositions about the law of causation. Our concern is with the former kinds of propositions; the latter propositions are the hypotheses of theorists (such as the present writer) about the content of the propositions that obligate legal professionals within their roles as legal professionals, i.e., law. But it is the law itself that is the data from which a legal concept such as causation-in-the-law is to be extracted.

Fourth, teasing out the contours of a concept such as causation from a body of discourse such as the law is not (just) a matter of quoting or paraphrasing explicit legal definitions of that concept, no matter how authoritative such definitions purport to be. Legal definitions of causation are only the start of an analysis of what “cause” means in law. Also needed are two other items. One is the implicit concept of cause to be teased out from usages of the concept in propositions of law. Complex legal concepts as used in the decided cases will only rarely coincide completely with official legal definitions (which Roscoe Pound [1910] called, respectively, “the law in action” and “the law in the books”), even when such definitions speak univocally in favor of some particular concept.

The other additional item needed is the purpose or value served by legal doctrines employing a concept of causation. Legal concepts are functional (sometimes styled, “interpretive”) concepts in that their meaning is shaped by the values they serve in the doctrines in which they appear, as much as it is shaped by the linguistic (definitional and usage) facts above mentioned (Fuller 1958).

The law’s concept of causation is thus a product of three factors in combination:

  1. Causation’s explicit definition in authoritative legal texts.
  2. Its implicit definition extracted from the totality of usages of the concept in the legal doctrines making up a body of law.
  3. The value(s) served by the use of a concept of causation in the legal doctrines employing the concept.

In addition to these three factors (and remembering the cautionary, third point made earlier distinguishing propositions of law from propositions about law), there are theories about what causation does or should mean in law. Such theories have been proposed by legal theorists as they utter propositions about law. Such theories, despite their non-authoritative source, have played a major role in the history of thought about the nature of causation in the law. Some of such theories, to the extent their content accurately mirrors propositions of law, have even become part of the law of which they are theories (Raz 2012).

2. The Law’s Explicit Definition of Causation

2.1 The dominant two-tier definition of causation in the law

The conventional wisdom about the causation requirement in both criminal law and torts is that it in reality consists of two very different requirements for liability. The first requirement is that of “cause in fact”. Such conventional wisdom holds that the “cause-in-fact” requirement is the only truly causal component of the law’s two requirements (despite the fact that both are framed in causal terms), because this doctrine is the only one that corresponds with any scientific or even factual notion of causation. Whether cigarette smoking causes cancer, whether the presence of hydrogen or helium caused an explosion, are factual questions to be resolved by the best science the courts can muster, and these are classed as “cause-in-fact” questions. By contrast, it is contested whether the second requirement, that of “proximate” or “legal” cause, is an evaluative issue, to be resolved by arguments of policy, or whether it too is a matter of causal fact. Suppose a defendant knifes his victim, who then dies because her religious convictions are such that she refuses medical treatment while knowing that such refusal will kill her (Regina v. Blaue). Has such a defendant (legally) caused her death? The doctrines of proximate cause are used to resolve such questions, it being controversial whether such resolutions are matters of natural fact or of moral fact (“policy”).

2.2 The dominant definition of cause-in-fact

Those who accept the conventional division of causation in the law into two parts, then posit a very minimalist notion of the first requirement, that of “cause-in-fact”. This minimalist requirement is by far the dominant explicit test for cause in fact in both torts and criminal law. It is the “sine qua non”, or “but-for” test. Such a test asks a counterfactual question: “but for the defendant’s action, would the victim have been harmed as she was?” This test is also sometimes called the necessary condition test, because it requires the defendant’s action have been necessary to the victim’s harm. The appeal of this test stems from this fact. The test seems to isolate something we seem to care a lot about, both in explaining events and in assessing responsibility for them, namely, did the defendant’s act make a difference vis-à-vis how the world would have been had she not done what she did? Insofar as we increase moral blameworthiness and legal punishment for actors who cause bad results (and not just try to), we seemingly should care whether a particular bad result would have happened anyway, even without the defendant.

2.3 The dominant definition(s) of proximate cause

There is no equivalently clear, crisp definition of legal or proximate cause. At the general level of an overall definition, the most one gets are the bromides: that a proximate cause cannot be remote from its putative effect; it must be a direct cause of the effect; it must not involve such abnormality of causal route that is freakish; it cannot be of harms that were unforeseeable to the actor; its connection to the harm cannot be coincidental; it must make the harm more probable; etc. These bromides are often uttered as if they were synonyms, which in truth the decided cases reveal that they are not.

3. The Data from Which an Implicit Concept of Legal Cause Is to Be Extracted: Sixteen Legal Facts About Cause-Based Liability in Anglo-American Tort and Criminal Law

To the definitions just mentioned, we should add the usage facts about how “causation” is used in resolving the problems that arise in particular cases. This allows one to compare the explicit legal definitions of causation that we have just surveyed with the concept of causation implicit in the decided cases. It also allows philosophers to compare their favored resolutions of various causal conundrums with the resolutions of those same conundrums by people who have no philosophical axes to grind but whose deliberations carry real world consequences with them, i.e., judges. (As J.L. Austin (1957) said, philosophers may have as much to learn from lawyers on such issues as causation, as lawyers do from philosophers.) With considerable selectivity, some simplification, and little claim to completeness, sixteen facts are below selected as salient in the legal usage of the concept of causation.

1. Causation is ubiquitous in the law’s prohibitions of actions because the causative verbs of action (such as, “killing”) imply causation of some harm such as death by an act; and conversely (if controversially—Byrne, 2021,2022), causation of such harms imply that such an action as killing has taken place.

2. In cases of actions rather than omissions, usually (but not always—see the discussion below of the action-overdetermination cases) if the harm did not counterfactually depend on the defendant’s action, then the defendant is not liable for that harm because he is not said to have caused it (American Law Institute 1962).

3. If the defendant’s act does not increase the probability of some harm occurring, and particularly if that act decreases such probability, then the defendant is not liable for that harm because he is not said to have caused it, even if that harm’s occurrence counterfactually depended on the defendant’s action (Oxendine v. State; Johnson, 2021).

4. With regard to liability for omissions, usually there is no liability for omitting to prevent some harm even in cases where there is counterfactual dependence of the occurrence of that harm on that omission; yet sometimes (the status, undertaking, and causing of peril exceptions) there is such liability (so long as the occurrence of the harm counterfactually depends on such omission; Dressler 1995: 466–467).

5. With regard to liability for “double preventions” (where, for example, a defendant prevents a lifeguard from preventing another from drowning), often there is a supposedly cause-based liability for the unprevented harm in such cases because a defendant preventing a preventer from preventing some harm is regarded as the cause of that harm (Skow, 2022, calls these “interrupting” double prevention cases). Yet sometimes (for double preventions amounting to the “allowings” as conceived by the centuries-old doing/allowing distinction) double preventions are treated just like omissions so that there is no legal causation and no liability except for those exceptional circumstances (the status, undertaking, and causing of peril exceptions) that exist for omission liability (Moore 2009a: 61–65, 459–460).

6. In cases of probability-raising actions, omissions, and doubly-preventative actions, there is occasionally and inconsistently still no liability for harms that counterfactually depend on such actions, omissions, and double preventions if such harm does not also counterfactually depend on that aspect of those actions, etc., that made the defendant culpable.

7. There is a complex pattern of liability for multiple cause cases involving actions: First, in ordinary, garden-variety concurrent cause cases (two or more factors individually necessary and only jointly sufficient for some harm), there is commonly liability even though the defendant’s act is but one of many causal factors producing a harm and such liability is full (“joint and several”) individual liability of such co-causing joint tort-feasors in torts and co-causing principals in criminal law. Second, in the symmetrical overdetermination variety of concurrent cause cases (where two or more factors are individually sufficient and only jointly necessary for some harm), there is universally liability where the acts of each of two or more culpable defendants is independently sufficient (and thus not individually necessary) for the harm, and there is almost always liability where the sufficient condition alternative to the defendant’s action is not the act of another human agent but is a natural event or condition such as an avalanche. Third, there is also liability in mixed cases (“mixed” between overdetermination and garden variety concurrent cause cases in that there are three or more factors, any two of which are sufficient for the harm, meaning no factor is individually necessary for that harm; Johnson 2016). Fourth, there is also liability in asymmetrical overdetermination concurrent cause cases, these being cases where one factor is sufficient and other factors are neither individually necessary nor individually sufficient, such liability uniformly being imposed for the big cause (the sufficient factor) and non-uniformly and inconsistently being imposed for the little causes (the insufficient and unnecessary factors; Wright 1985b). Fifth, in the pre-emptive variety of multiple cause cases (where one sufficient factor pre-empts another equally sufficient factor from operating on this occasion), there is liability for the pre-empting sufficient factor but there is no liability for the pre-empted sufficient factor.

8. There is also a complex pattern of liability for a harm in multiple cause cases involving omissions that is different than it is for actions, even when we restrict our gaze to omission cases where there is a legal duty on each omitter not to omit to prevent that harm: First, there is liability on each omitter in ordinary, garden-variety, concurrent omission cases just as there is in multiple cause cases involving actions and not omissions. Second, predominantly (but not universally) there is no liability for the overdetermination variety of concurrent omissions—this is universally true where one of the absences sufficient for the occurrence of the harm is natural, not human, and it is predominantly true where all of the absences individually sufficient for the occurrence of the harm are the omissions of culpable human actors (Fisher 1992; Abrams, 2022). Third, there are no pre-emptive omission cases because such cases are conceptually impossible, and thus any liability questions here are moot (Moore 2011b: 479–482; 2013: 342–348; Abrams, 2022).

9. There is also a complex pattern of liability for a harm in multiple cause cases involving double preventions rather than actions or omissions, and this pattern of liability is different yet again than it is in cases of actions or omissions: First there is liability in ordinary, garden-variety, concurrent double-prevention cases just as there is for actions and omissions. Second, there is predominantly (but not universally) no liability for the overdetermination variety of concurrent double-preventions—this is universally true where one of the doubly-preventative acts sufficient for the occurrence of the harm is a natural event, not a culpable human action, and it is predominantly true where all doubly-preventative acts sufficient for the occurrence of the harm are the actions of culpable human actors (Moore 2009a: 466–467). Third, unlike in omission cases, there is such a thing as a pre-emptive double prevention case; in such cases, there is liability for the pre-empting double prevention but not for the pre-empted action that would otherwise have been a double prevention (Moore 2011b).

10. Liability exists for harms caused by a defendant even though such harms would not have occurred but for the victim’s freakishly abnormal condition so long as that condition pre-existed the defendant’s action (this is the common law’s “thin-skulled man” or “you take your victim as you find him” maxim).

11. Yet no liability exists for harms in part caused by a defendant if that harm was also in part caused by a freakishly large natural event that intervened between the defendant’s act and the harm that he in part caused (the “vis major” part of the common law’s “superseding cause” doctrine; Larremore 1909).

12. There is no liability for harms due to a “coincidence” (defined as a freakishly unusual conjunction of events) even though such harms would not have occurred but for the defendant’s culpable action, so long as that coincidence is not used by the defendant as a means to bringing about the harm (another part of the common law’s “superseding cause” doctrine; Hart & Honoré 1959, 1985).

13. Intention has supposed aphrodisiac powers to extend legally relevant causal influence to what otherwise would be legally remote events (the “no harm is too remote if intended” maxim of the common law; Terry 1914: 17; Knobe and Shapiro 2021: 205–206).

14. Under the intervening human actor branch of the common law’s superseding cause doctrine, there is no liability if a subsequent human actor (rather than a natural event) intervenes to “break the causal chain” otherwise existing (because of counterfactual dependence) between the harm and the defendant’s earlier act, where that intervening actor:

  1. Acts subsequently to defendant’s act, and is thus not a co-causer of the harm.
  2. Does an act that is causally significant with respect to the harm.
  3. Acts independently of any motive to so act supplied by the defendant.
  4. Acts with great culpability in bringing about the harm (usually intentionally or sometimes recklessly, but not merely negligently, with respect to the harm).
  5. Acts voluntarily in the narrow, technical sense of the law, namely, the relevant bodily movements are not reflexive, done while asleep, unconscious, in shock, under hypnosis, or otherwise not the product of the defendant’s will.
  6. Acts voluntarily in the sense that he is not coerced by threats, by natural necessity, or by the compunctions of legal duty.
  7. Is a responsible agent (not very young, insane, or very drunk).

15. The set of doctrines presupposing scalarity of the causal relation as that relation is used in law (Moore 2009a: 65–76, 118–123):

  1. The use of “strength of causal connection” as one factor (along with degrees of fault) in apportioning liability in multiple cause cases in torts, of particular importance in strict liability cases where liability does not depend on fault (American Law Institute 2010: sec. 6).
  2. The seeming dependence on degree of causal contribution to license use of the balance of evils defense in cases of aiding nature or other persons to cause harm, and in the redirection of force cases.
  3. The puzzling use of something like degree of causal contribution to license the balance of evils defense in the acceleration cases (cases where the defendant merely accelerates a harm that was about to happen anyway.
  4. The “petering out” of degrees of causal contribution in cases of simple spatio-temporal remoteness.

16. The absence of liability in the freakish route cases even when a harm counterfactually depends on the defendants act, including both cases where the route is freakish vis-à-vis the defendant’s plans or expectation, and cases where the route is freakish to an outside observer.

4. The Value(s) Served by Causal Requirements in the Law of Torts and of Crimes

There are two reasons to care about the rationale for the law’s use of causation in the liability doctrines of tort and criminal law. The less relevant one here is the legal reformer’s motive, which is to assess what the best test for causation is and to recommend that such a test ought to be legislated for future legal use. The second, and the more relevant motive here, is the lawyer’s motive, which is to understand what the requirement for causation presently is under existing law. As was previewed in section 1, what the law provides on a given topic like causation is in part constituted by the function such a requirement serves in a body of law, and such function thus constitutes the third ingredient we need to consult as we reconstruct the law’s concept of causation.

Lawyers and legal theorists alike have an unfortunate penchant for proclaiming that the law is, should be, and must be, autonomous from other disciplines (such as philosophy) in its use of concept like causation (Stapleton 2008; 2015). As Sir Frederick Pollack put it over a century ago, “the lawyer cannot afford to adventure himself with philosophers in the logical and metaphysical controversies that beset the idea of cause” (1901: 36). Yet whether such conceptual autonomy is desirable, necessary, or even possible, presupposes that the law has purposes for its causal requirements that do not dovetail with the metaphysics of causation so studied by philosophy.

As we will see below in section 5.2, the legal economists and other utilitarians believe that legal rules attaching liability to those who cause harm, have as their rationale preventing sub-optimal levels of such harms; they do this by incentivizing future behavior by the placement of liability (or rewards) on past behavior. On such a view, causation in the law might well mean something different than it means when used in ordinary or scientific discourse—for to gain incentive effects from cause-based liability rules, one might well identify “cause” with the raising of conditional probability, as the legal economists have indeed often urged.

An alternative view of legal purposes, however, returns the law to the metaphysics of causation. That view holds that criminal law serves the value of retributive justice just as tort law serves the value of corrective justice. Retributive justice requires that those who culpably cause harm suffer the censure and deprivations constitutive of punishment; corrective justice requires that those who culpably cause harm to another correct that injustice by compensating that other. In both cases, serving such kinds of justice demands that one not identify “cause” as used in legal liability rules as anything other than that with which it is identified in such justice theories. Because such moral theories of justice require that the true metaphysics of causation determines when someone has caused an injury or other harm to another, so too must the law of torts and of crimes. On such an alternative view of the rationale for causal requirements in the law of torts and of crimes, the lawyer thus must “adventure herself with the philosopher” on the metaphysics of causation. Those who so adventure themselves will not regard all the candidates for the law’s concept of causation with equal favor.

To be sure, metaphysics in general, and causal metaphysics in particular, is anathema to many lawyers and legal theorists, including many of those who consider themselves to be corrective justice theorists about torts and retributive justice theorists about criminal law. Some of such revulsion at metaphysics stems from the kind of skepticism examined below, a skepticism about the metaphysics of causation being capable of yielding determinate answers as to causation’s nature. But another strand to such rejections of metaphysics in this context is based on an alternative view of what justice demands: on this view, the harms that corrective justice demands be compensated and that retributive justice demands be punished, are not harms actually caused by some culpable action but only those “common sense” would regard as having been so caused. Hart and Honore (1959, 1985) explicitly set out to chart the “common man’s” concept of causation because in their view it was such “folk” notions of causation that were relevant; more recent legal theorists (Knobe and Shapiro 2021; Lagnado and Gerstenberg 2017) have followed suit, relying on the now considerable literature on causal modeling and causal reasoning (Pearl 2000 [2009]; Halpern 2019) to chart out this folk concept of causation. Whether such an alternative moral view can be sustained is doubtful, because absent some relativistic meta-ethic it is implausible to make responsibility turn on common views about the nature of natural properties like causation or intention (rather than on the nature of such states or relations themselves).

However one comes out on any of these divides between theorists of causation, it is in any case true that the law of causation needs to be if it is to serve the value(s) constituting the function of the rules in which causation appears, thus makes a considerable difference to what the law of causation is. As we proceed to describe what the law’s concept of causation is, we should be eclectic on what these values are. We shall thus regard as unsettled what most theorists regard as settled (not that they agree on how it is settled), and consider things not only from the two perspectives of those who think that criminal law and torts serve the ends of retributive and corrective justice, but also from the perspectives of those who think that these areas of law serve other values (both utilitarian and otherwise), or even no systematic set of values at all.

5. Combining These Three Sources into a Concept of Causation in the Law

How one should combine these three ingredients—the explicit legal definitions of causation, the concept implicit in legal usages of “causation”, and the value(s) served by requiring that causation be present before one be held responsible for some harm—is a contested matter about which legal theorists have long disagreed. The discussion that follows does not attempt to suppress these disagreements. Different consolidations are thus described and some problems are raised for each.

5.1 The variety of cause-in-fact tests in the law

The supposed dominance of the sine qua non test in the law is superficial. The reality is that that test is modified/abandoned in a variety of ways by the courts that are supposedly applying it. The best way to understand the various modified tests for cause in fact in law is by examining problems that have been raised for the counterfactual test, for it is these problems that motivate alternative tests of cause in fact.

5.1.1 Problems for the counterfactual test of cause-in-fact

Very generally, there are four sorts of problems with the counterfactual test for causation in fact that are raised in the legal literature. The first of these problems has to do with proof and evidence. As an element of the prima facie case, causation in fact must be proven by the party with the burden of proof. In criminal cases, that is the prosecution, who must prove beyond a reasonable doubt what would have happened absent the defendant’s act. Counterfactuals by their nature are difficult to prove with any degree of certainty, for they require the fact finder to speculate what would have happened if the defendant had not done what she in actual fact did. Suppose a defendant culpably destroys a life preserver on a seagoing tug. When a crewman falls overboard and drowns, was a necessary condition of his death the act of the defendant in destroying the life preserver? (New York Central RR. v. Grimstad). If the life preserver had been there, would anyone have thought to use it? thrown it in time? thrown it far enough? gotten it near enough to the victim that he would have reached it? We often lack the kind of precise information that could verify whether the culpable act of the defendant made any difference in this way.

A second set of problems stems from an indeterminacy of meaning in the test, not from difficulties of factual verification. There is a great vagueness in counterfactual judgments. The vagueness lies in specifying the possible world in which we are to test the counterfactual (Cole 1964a,b; Lewis 1973b). Suppose a defendant negligently destroyed a life preserver and a sailor drowns for want of one. When we say “But for the defendant’s act of destroying the life preserver”, what world are we imagining? We know we are to eliminate the defendant’s act, but what are we to replace it with? A life preserver that was, alternatively, destroyed by the heavy seas? A defendant who didn’t destroy the life preserver because she had already pushed the victim overboard when no one else was around to throw the life preserver to the victim? And so on and so on. To make the counterfactual test determinate enough to yield one answer rather than another, we have to assume that those applying this test share an ability to specify some definite possible world that is “similar” to our actual world save that in that world the defendant did not do what she did in the actual world.

The third and fourth sets of problems stem from the inability of the counterfactual test to match what for most of us (including judges) are firm causal intuitions. The third set of problems arises because the counterfactual test seems too lenient in what it counts as a cause. The criticism is that the test is thus overinclusive. The fourth set of problems arises because the counterfactual test seems too stringent in what it counts as a cause. The criticism here is that the test is underinclusive.

The overinclusiveness of the test has mostly been raised in cases of coincidence. Suppose a defendant culpably delays his train at t1; much, much later at t2, and much further down the track, the train is hit by a flood (Denny v. New York Central RR). Had the delay at t1 not occurred, there would have been no damage or loss of life at t2. In this case, the counterfactual test yields the unwelcome result that the defendant’s delaying caused the harm. Such cases of overt coincidences are rare, but they are the tip of the iceberg here, in that innumerable remote conditions are necessary to the production of any event. Oxygen in the air over England, timber in Scotland, Henry VIII’s obesity, and Sir Francis Drake’s perspicuity, were all probably necessary for England’s defeat of the Spanish Armada; but we should be loath to say that each of these was a cause of that defeat. The problem is greatly exacerbated by the admission of omissions as causes: the Spanish Armada was also defeated because Martian spaceships didn’t show up to help them. (Walen 2022)

The fourth set of problems for the counterfactual test has to do with the test’s underinclusiveness, mostly exhibited in legal theory in the well-known overdetermination cases. These are cases in which each of a pair of two events, c1 and c2, is independently sufficient for some third event e. Logically, the sufficiency of c1 and of c2 entails that neither c1 nor c2 is individually necessary for e, and thus, on the counterfactual analysis of causation, neither of them can be the cause of e. The law uniformly rejects this conclusion (howevermuch some philosophers such as David Lewis have claimed uncertainty in their own intuitions about there being causation in such cases), so such cases pose a real problem for the counterfactual analysis of causation in law.

Legal theorists have long distinguished two distinct kinds of overdetermination cases. The first are the concurrent cause cases: two fires, two shotgun blasts, two noisy motorcycles are each sufficient to burn, kill, or scare some victim. The defendant is responsible for only one fire, shot, or motorcycle. Yet his fire, shot, or noise joins the other one, and both simultaneously cause their various harms. On the counterfactual analysis, the defendant’s fire, shot, or noise was not the cause of any harm because it was not necessary to the production of the harms—after all, the other fire, shot, or noise was by itself sufficient. Yet the same can be said about the second fire, shot, or noise. So on the but-for test, neither was the cause! And this conclusion has seemed absurd to legal decision-makers.

The preemptive kind of overdetermination cases are different. Here the two putative causes are not simultaneous but are temporally ordered. The defendant’s fire arrives first and burns down the victim’s building; the second fire arrives shortly thereafter and would have been sufficient to burn down the building, only there was no building to burn down. Here our intuitions are just as clear as in the concurrent overdetermination cases, but those intuitions are here different: the defendant’s fire did cause the harm, and the second fire did not. Yet the counterfactual analysis again yields the counterintuitive implication that neither fire caused the harm because neither fire was necessary (each being sufficient) for the harm.

Situated rather nicely between these two sorts of overdetermination cases are what have been called the asymmetrical overdetermination cases (Moore 2009a: 417–18). Suppose one defendant non-mortally stabs the victim at the same time that another defendant mortally stabs the same victim; the victim dies of loss of blood, most of the blood gushing out of the mortal wound. Has the non-mortally wounding defendant caused the death of the victim? Not according to the counterfactual analysis: given the sufficiency of the mortal would, the nonmortal wound was not necessary for, and thus not a cause of, death. This conclusion is contrary to common intuition as well as considerable (but not universal) legal authority (People v. Lewis).

5.1.2 Modifications/abandonments of the counterfactual test

Defenders of the counterfactual analysis of “cause-in-fact” are not bereft of replies to these four objections (as, for example, on the overdetermination problems, Andreas, Armgardt, and Guenther 2023), but rather than pursuing this further we shall move on to discuss other tests that have been substituted for the counterfactual test in an attempt to avoid these four problems. With regard to the problem posed by the overdetermination cases, the best known alternative is to propose an “INUS” (an Insufficient but Necessary element of an Unnecessary but Sufficient set) test (Mackie 1980) or a “NESS” (Necessary Element of a Sufficient Set) test (Wright 1985b; 2013): an event c causes an event e if and only if c is a necessary element in a set of conditions sufficient for e where the set itself need not be necessary for e. It is the stress on sufficiency in these tests that is supposed to end-run the overdetermination problems. In the concurrent cause cases—the two sufficient fires joining to burn the victim’s house—each fire is said to be a necessary element of its own sufficient set, so each fire is a cause. In the preemptive case—the fires do not join and one arrives first before the second can get there to do the job—the first fire is a necessary element of a sufficient set, and so is the cause; the second fire is not, because it is not thought to be part of a set that is sufficient at the time of the destruction (absent from its set is the existence of a house to be burned).

Other modifications of the counterfactual test have also been adopted in order to avoid problems for the test existing because of the overdetermination cases. One of these is the “fine-grained effect” approach of the Commentary to the Model Penal Code. On this test, one does not ask whether a harm of a certain type would have occurred but for the defendant’s act; rather, one asks whether the particular harm that actually occurred would have occurred in the exact way that it did, in the absence of the defendant’s act. So in the concurrent cause case of the two independently sufficient fires that join to burn down the victim’s house, we do not ask,

Was the defendant’s fire necessary to a destruction of plaintiff’s house?

Rather, we ask,

Was the defendant’s act necessary to the destruction of the victim’s house where, when, and in the manner that it was destroyed?

It is much more likely that the defendant’s fire was necessary to the destruction of the victim’s house in just the way it was destroyed, so the counterfactual test seems to do somewhat better in the concurrent overdetermination cases with this fine-graining of the effect approach (although the stunning problem remains that fine-graining enough to get rid of all counterexamples seems to imply that everything is the cause of everything else).

For the preemptive overdetermination cases, the problem is easier for the counterfactual test. Here one introduces a stipulation about the time of the event: if the defendant’s act was necessary to the house destruction being earlier than it otherwise would have been, then he was the cause, but if his act was only necessary to the house destruction happening at some time or other (including later), his act is not necessarily the cause. As the cases put this point, causes must accelerate their effects; if they fail to accelerate them (either by making no change in temporal location or by retarding them), then such factors are not causes even though necessary to when the putative effect happened (Oxendine v. State). This helps with the preemptive cause cases because a preempting fire is necessary to a house’s destruction at t1, even if (given that there is a preempted fire right behind it at t2) that first fire is not necessary either to a house destruction later (at t2) or to a house destruction sometime (t1 or t2). This stipulation regarding temporally asymmetrical necessity is only partly successful in dealing with the preemptive kind of counterexamples in that it fails to treat adequately what are called “trumping preemption” cases; but in any event it should be regarded as a third modification of the law’s counterfactual test.

The coincidence objection to the counterfactual test yields a fourth modification to that test. In cases like that of the negligently speeding train that, because of its speed, arrives at just the place where a falling tree hits it (Berry v. Borough of Sugar Notch), one should not ask, “But for the act of driving would the train have been hit?” Rather, one should isolate that aspect of the act that made it negligent—speeding, not the act itself—and ask whether that aspect was necessary to the train having been struck. And arguably driving in excess of the speed limit (“speeding”) was not necessary for the impact because any speed above as well as below the speed limit would have resulted in no impact on the train. Speeding, in other words, wasn’t necessary, only the exact speed at which the driver in fact drove. Asking after the necessity of qualities of acts like speeding is called the “aspect cause” version of the counterfactual test (Keeton 1963; Wright 1985b).

A fifth modification to the counterfactual test of cause in fact is more by way of substitution than of amendment. This is the First and Second Restatement of Torts “substantial factor” test. Motivated mostly by worries about overdetermination cases, the American Law Institute in both of its first two Restatements urged that a “substantial factor” test be substituted for sine qua non as the test for cause-in-fact in torts. The test asks only whether a defendant’s action was a substantial factor in the production of the harm complained of. This admittedly circular and vague test was thought to help in overdetermination cases like that of the joint fires, because so long as each fire was quite substantial (in comparison to the other fire) each was a cause of the harm, even though neither fire was a necessary condition of the harm.

Notice that the substantial factor test “solves” the overdetermination problem mostly because it does not say enough to get itself into trouble in such cases. It thus allows our clear causal intuitions full play in these cases. The ad hoc nature of this solution is evident when one sees how the First and Second Restatement of Torts managed to salvage what they could of the sine qua non test: if a putative causal factor is a necessary condition of some harm, then (under the Restatements) it is per se substantial. Necessary condition–hood, in other words, is sufficient for cause in fact. But necessary condition–hood is not necessary for cause in fact, so that a factor can be substantial even if it is not a necessary condition. This amounts to saying that one should use the necessary condition test when it works, but when it yields counterintuitive results (as in the overdetermination cases) one shouldn’t use it but should rely instead on causal intuitions that are not based on counterfactual relations. As much is admitted in a recent revival of the two Restatements’ primitivism about causation, according to which one is explicitly directed to find either counterfactual dependence of a harm or a primitive and mysterious “actual contribution” to that harm (Stapleton 2015).

The sixth and final modification of the counterfactual test of cause in fact is motivated by the proof problem. Particularly in criminal cases (where one has to prove causation “beyond a reasonable doubt”) it is often impossible to prove that the harm would not have happened but for the defendant’s act. What courts in effect adopt is a “lost chance” approach to counterfactuals. On this modified test, one does not ask whether the act was necessary to the harm actually occurring; rather, one asks only whether the act was necessary to the harm having the chance of occurring that it did (Lewis 1986). This is a “necessary to chance (of harm)” sort of test, not a “necessary to harm” test (Johnson 2005).

What courts and legal theorists have actually done in “modifying” the counterfactual test in these six ways is to propose quite different theories about the nature of causation. The INUS and NESS tests, for example, are in reality nomic sufficiency tests, a version of a generalist theory of causation that reduces singular causal relations to general causal laws and does not make essential use of counterfactuals (except insofar as counterfactuals are part of the analysis of the idea of a scientific law.) The substantial factor test, to take another example, is really the law’s version of a primitivist approach to singular causation, a version of singularist theories of causation in metaphysics. The necessary-to-chance modification is in reality the substitution of a probabilistic theory of causation for a purely counterfactual theory. It is thus a mistake to think that the law’s explicit definition of cause in fact—sine qua non—in fact evidences any deep or univocal commitment of the law to a theory of causation that is truly counterfactual in its nature (as is for example Lewis 1973a).

5.2 Skeptical approaches to the cause-in-fact requirement

Legal theory, like philosophy, has had its share of skeptics about causation. Most of such legally located skepticism has been directed at the proximate cause half of the conventional two-part definition of causation in the law. As we shall see shortly, such skepticism there considers “proximate cause” a misnomer and reinterprets the proximate cause requirement in noncausal, policy terms. More radical is the skepticism here considered. Some legal theorists are skeptical of there being any natural relation in the world named by “causation”. This skepticism includes what the law names “cause in fact” as well as “proximate cause”.

Before we describe such skepticisms in legal theory, we do well to be sure we have a firm grasp on what skepticism about causation is. Take David Hume, often listed as a skeptic about causation. Hume famously identified singular causal relations as spatiotemporally located instances of causal laws, and he identified causal laws as no more than uniformity in sequence between types of events. Hume was thus doubly a reductionist about the causal relation, reducing it ultimately to regular concurrence. In this, he is commonly said to be a skeptic.

Because Hume’s analysis takes “the glue” out of the causal relation—a cause doesn’t make its effect occur, it is only regularly followed by its effect—it is commonly classified as skeptical. And in a sense it is, if one treats the making-things-happen “glue” to be essential to any relation properly called “causal”. But Hume’s views are not radical enough to count as skeptical in the sense intended by legal theoreticians. For Hume gives what Saul Kripke calls a “skeptical solution” to the problem of causation (1982: 66–68): Hume doesn’t deny that causation exists, but he reduces it to something less ontologically queer than “glue”.

A better model of the radical skepticism here considered is the “ascriptivist” views that Herbert Hart once held (but later repudiated). In a famous analysis of our usage of the causative verbs of action such as “A hit B”, Hart urged that we describe no natural relations (such as that A caused there to be contact on B’s body), but rather we ascribe responsibility to A for the contact on B’s body. (Hart 1949) If this bit of pre-Austin speech act analysis were true, then causatives (and analogously, more explicit words of causation) would only be the labels used to express conclusions about responsibility. Such words would not name real relations that could be the justifying grounds for attributing responsibility to someone.

Such are the conclusions of the legal skeptics here considered. Such skeptics appear to deny that causation exists as any kind of natural relation, be it a “glue-like” natural relation, regular concurrence in nature, or something else. Because it is easiest to approach such skepticism historically, I shall begin with the badly named American Legal Realists (badly named because in no sense were they realists in the philosophical sense), with whom almost all of the skepticisms about proximate causation also originated.

5.2.1 The skepticism about causation of the American Legal Realists

Most of Henry Edgerton’s much-cited work details his skepticism about proximate causation. Some of it, however, reveals him to have been a skeptic about the cause-in-fact requirement as well. He notes, for example, that the symmetrically concurrent overdetermination cases were divided into two camps by the cause-in-fact doctrines of his day: where there were two culpable actors starting fires (where the fires joined to produce a larger fire burning down the plaintiff’s house), either actor was a cause of the destruction; but when only one of the fires was of culpable origin, the other being either natural or of innocent human origin, then the culpable actor was not a cause of the destruction. From such examples, Edgerton suggested that the cause-in-fact requirement was (like the proximate cause requirement) all a matter of policy, a matter, that is, depending on “our free and independent sense of justice and—perhaps—the interests of society”.

A relatively late blooming of this Legal Realist conclusion was the well-known work of Wex Malone (1956). Malone largely focused on an issue that preoccupied philosophers of causation in the 1950s: the pragmatic features by which we pick out “the cause” of some event (Feinberg 1970: 143–147). Malone found, unsurprisingly, only context-specific, practical interests guiding such locutions of causal emphasis, and skeptically concluded that that was all there was to causation itself. To be said to be “the cause” of some harm was just another way of saying one was responsible for the harm. Malone’s focus on causal selection has been revived quite recently (Knobe and Shapiro 2021), albeit with a more modest conclusion about morality’s role in causal reasoning than animated Malone and the other Legal Realists.

5.2.2 The skepticism about causation of the Critical Legal Theorists

The skepticism of American Legal Realism has had two intellectual descendants in legal theory. One of these consists of the self-styled “critical” theorists—the Critical Legal Studies movement (or “Crits”) whose heyday was in the 1970s and 1980s in America. Much of this movement’s skepticism is simply warmed-over postmodernism, itself a passing fashion in many disciplines besides law (Moore 1989). More interesting intellectually were criticisms that were not based on postmodernist platitudes but were specific to causation.

Mark Kelman’s skepticism was of this latter kind. Kelman urged that all causal requirements in the law were part of the “liberal myth” of objective criteria for liability, but rather than reciting (yet again) the platitude of the historically situated knower, Kelman actually directed arguments against the law’s cause-in-fact tests, arguments denying that such tests mirrored anything in natural fact. Kelman accurately perceived that the NESS variation of the counterfactual theory was an ineffectual version of it, and he produced some of the criticisms of that variation that others who are not causal skeptics have also pursued. From the perceived failure of this one variation of the counterfactual theory of cause in fact, Kelman concluded that cause in fact itself cannot be a matter of fact (Kelman 1987).

The general, positive prescription that is supposed to flow from the skepticisms of the Legal Realists and the Crits is not so clear. One gathers that once skepticism (about causation being a matter of objective fact) has removed the blinders, we can see that it is only interests and policies that lead us to conclusions about moral responsibility and legal liability. Presumably, then, the positive prescription is for us to do this openly, balancing all relevant considerations of policy in deciding who should be liable and then casting those liability conclusions in terms of what was the cause of what.

5.2.3 The skepticism about causation of the legal economists

The other intellectual descendant of the American Legal Realists on causation is the law and economics movement in contemporary legal theory. These theorists are seeking to show that legal rules and institutions either are or should be efficient, in the post-Pareto sense of that word distinctive of modern welfare economics.

Like the Crits, legal economists tend to be radical skeptics about causation. The leading early papers on causation all express skepticism about “causation” picking out any real relation in the world. On this skeptical view, lawyers are just doing intuitive economics or some other policy balancing in their use of causal idioms, because that is all they can be doing. Shavell (1980), and Landes and Posner (1983) explicitly rely on Edgerton, picking up precisely where Edgerton began his skepticism, in the liability rules for symmetrically concurrent overdetermination cases.

Like other skeptics about causation, the legal economists do not rest content in their demythologizing of the metaphysics of causation. Such economists also have a more positive account of what should be made of the law’s causation-drenched requirements for liability. The positive, reconstructive prescriptions of the law and economics theorists differ from those of the Crits and the Legal Realists in that the policy favored is much more specific: liability (including the supposedly causal requirements for liability) should give incentives for efficient behavior. Yet unnoticed by the economists was that this monistic policy focus on efficiency made their causal skepticism unnecessary and beside the point in their recommendations about what “cause” should mean in law.

This is because if efficiency is the normative polestar for both tort and criminal law, then there is a basis for denying the relevance of the metaphysics of causation to the interpretation of legal usages of “cause” that does not depend on any skepticism about that metaphysics. Such a basis begins with the quite correct insight that legal texts are to be interpreted in light of the purposes (values, functions, “spirit”, “mischief”, etc.) such texts serve. Often such purposes will justify an interpreter in holding the legal meaning of a term to be quite different from its ordinary meaning in non-legal English. Whether this is so in the case of the legal uses of “cause” depends on what one takes to be the purpose of those legal texts that use “cause”. Consider American tort law.. Following the welfare economics of A. C. Pigou (1920), it was for a time fashionable to think that the purpose of liability rules in tort law was to force each enterprise or activity within an economy to pay its “true costs”. Those costs included damage caused to others by the activity as much as they included traditional cost items of production like labor, raw materials, and capital. The thought was that only if each enterprise paid its true costs would the goods or services produced by that enterprise be correctly priced, and only if such correct pricing occurred would markets achieve an efficient allocation of resources. This came to be known as “enterprise liability” in the tort law theory of 1950s America (Calabresi 1961).

If the point of tort law were to achieve an efficient allocation of resources, and if such efficiency could be achieved only by discovering the “true costs” of each activity when such costs are defined in terms of that activity’s harmful effects, then “cause” as used in tort liability rules should mean whatever the metaphysics of causation tells us the word means. For on this theory it is the harmful effects that an activity really causes that are the true costs for that activity; and this rationale thus demands a robust use of some metaphysical view about causation.

This Pigouvian view of tort law has given way to the post-1960 view of Ronald Coase: tort law indeed exists in order to achieve an efficient allocation of resources, yet such efficiency will be achieved whether tort liability tracks causal responsibility or not. Coase’s essential insight was that to economically rational actors opportunity costs are real costs too, so that a forgone opportunity to accept a payment in lieu of causing another person some harm already forces the harm-causer to “internalize” all costs of his activities. Such a harm-causer need not be liable for such harms in order to have him pay for the “true costs” of his activity; he already “pays” by forgoing the opportunity to be bought off by the sufferer of the harm. As each harm-causer and harm-sufferer decides on the desired level of his activity, he will thus take into account all effects of his interaction without a cause-based tort liability forcing him to do so (Coase 1960).

On this Coasean analysis of tort law, there is simply no need for liability to turn on causation. Rather, either tort liability is irrelevant to efficient resource allocation (in a world of low transaction costs), or tort liability should be placed on the cheapest cost-avoider (in a world where transaction costs are high) in order to induce that person to take the cost-effective precautions. In either case, legal liability should not track causal responsibility, for even when there are high transaction costs the causer of a harm need not be the cheapest cost-avoider for that kind of harm.

The irrelevance of causation to the giving of efficient incentives has left economists struggling to make sense of the cause-in-fact requirement of criminal law and tort liability rules. Since no metaphysical reading of “cause” is appropriate to the goal of efficiency, some policy calculus is given as the legal meaning of “cause”. Such policy calculus typically generates a probabilistic interpretation of “cause”, so that any activity that raises the conditional probability of some harm that has occurred is said to have “caused” that harm (Calabresi 1975). For any theory seeking to use the law to give incentives to efficient behavior in a world of high transaction costs, this probabilistic interpretation is seemingly just what is required. To criticize such probabilistic interpretation of legal cause on the ground that probability is a poor metaphysical account of what causation is (Wright 1985a, 1988, 2015), would thus be beside the point—so long as one adheres to the economists’ utilitarian views about the proper function of the concept of causation in the law.

5.3 The variety of proximate cause tests in the law

It was useful in taxonomizing the seven variations of the counterfactual test to show how such variations were produced in response to problems perceived to exist for the first variation, which was the simple, unmodified counterfactual test. While there is no test of proximate causation that is comparably dominant in law (even if only in lip service) to the counterfactual test of cause-in-fact, it is nonetheless useful to display the various proximate cause tests as they react to problems in other tests of proximate causation. Some discussion of standard problems with each version of the tests within legal theory is thus included as we describe what motivates others of the tests.

The basic taxonomizing principle here is to separate tests that do not view proximate causation as having anything to do with real causal relations (the conventional view within legal theory) from tests that are motivated by the contrary thought. We shall begin with the former kind of test, what should be called policy-based proximate cause tests. Policy-based proximate cause tests are themselves usefully divided into two camps. Some—general policy tests—are justified by their service of a wide range of policies, indeed, as wide as are the policies that justify liability at all in torts or criminal law. By contrast, other tests are in the service of only one policy: the measurement of the culpability of the actor in terms of the mental state she had or should have had as she acted.

Beginning with the general policy-based proximate cause tests: the first of these are what we may call “ad hoc policy tests”. The idea is that courts balance a range of policies in each case that they adjudicate where a defendant has been found to have caused-in-fact a legally prohibited harm. They may balance certain “social interests”, like the need for deterrence, with certain “individual interests”, like the unfairness of surprising a defendant with liability (Edgerton 1924). Courts then decide wherever such balance leads. Whatever decision is reached on such case-by-case policy balancing is then cast in terms of “proximate” or “legal” cause. Such labels are simply the conclusions of policy balances; the labels have nothing to do with causation in any ordinary or scientific sense (Green 1929).

The second sort of test here is one that adopts general rules of legal causation. Such rules are adopted for various policy reasons also having nothing to do with causation, but such rules differ from the ad hoc test by their eschewal of case-by-case balancing; rather, it is the per se rules of legal causation that are adopted for policy reasons. Thus, at common-law the rule for homicide was that death must occur within a year and a day of the defendant’s harmful action, else he could not be said to have legally caused the death. Analogously, the last wrongdoer rule of both torts and criminal law held that when a single victim is mortally wounded by two or more assailants, acting seriatim over time and not in concert, only the last wrongdoer could be said to be the legal cause of the death. As a third example, tort law for a time observed what was called a “first house rule”, according to which a railroad whose negligently emitted sparks burned an entire town was only liable for the house or houses directly ignited by its sparks, not for other houses ignited by the burning of those first burnt houses (Ryan v. New York Central RR). There is no pretense of making truly causal discriminations by such rules; rather, such rules were adopted for explicit reasons of legal policy. The first house rule, for example, was said to be justified by the policy of subsidizing the then developing railroad industry by protecting it from a liability that was thought to be potentially ruinous in its extent.

The main problem with both ad hoc and rule-based policy tests does not lie with their “functionalist” approach (Cohen 1935; 1937). to legal concepts such as causation, for we should always ask after the purpose of the rule or institution in which a concept figures in order to ascertain its legal meaning. Yet for anyone who thinks that criminal law and torts have dominant, justice-oriented purposes, the open-endedness of these policy tests will be disqualifying. If retributive justice is the value served by criminal law, and if such justice requires that we grade punishment proportionately to causation, then criminal law’s proximate cause tests should aid in finding when offenders really cause a harm. Analogously, a tort law that uses causation to mark out those owing duties of corrective justice will limit those owing such duties of compensation to those who have really caused the harms for which compensation is sought. On such a view of tort law, proximate causation should aid in separating those who really have caused a harm from those who have not. To serve both retributive and corrective justice, thus, the last thing one wants to do is to define legal causation so that the label names a balance of values rather than the factual state of affairs (real causation) that determines moral blameworthiness. The Legal Realists’ explicit policy tests are anathema to any justice-oriented scheme of punishment or of compensation.

This problem does not so obviously infect the next two policy-based proximate cause tests, the foreseeability and the harm-within-the-risk tests. For those tests do seek to describe a factual state of affairs that plausibly determines both moral blameworthiness and connects a defendant’s culpability to particular harms. These tests are thus serving the kinds of policies that must be served by the concept of causation in justice-oriented theories of criminal law and of torts. Their novelty lies in their relocation of how and where legal causation determines fault. On these theories, “legal cause” is not a refinement of an admitted desert-determiner, true causation; it is rather a refinement of another admitted desert-determiner, culpable state of mind.

Consider first the well-known foreseeability test. Unlike the case with the rule-based policy tests, here there is no multiplicity of rules for specific situations (like long drawn out processes of death, intervening wrongdoers, railroad fires, etc.). Rather, there is one rule universally applicable to all criminal and tort cases: was it foreseeable to a defendant at the time that she acted that her act would cause the harm that it in fact caused? (Green 1967). This purportedly universal test for legal causation is usually justified by one of two policies: either the unfairness of punishing (or extracting compensation from) someone for harms that they could not foresee, or the inability to gain any deterrence by sanctioning such actors (since the threat value of tort or criminal law sanctions is commonly thought to be nonexistent for unforeseeable violations of liability rules).

Some jurisdictions restrict the foreseeability test to one kind of situation. When some human action or natural event intervenes between the defendant’s action and the harm, the restricted test asks not whether the ultimate harm to the victim was foreseeable but rather, whether that intervening action or event was foreseeable to the defendant when he acted. This restricted foreseeability test is like the restricted rules we saw before and is unlike the universal test of legal causation the foreseeability test usually purports to be.

Precisely because it is a culpability test, the foreseeability test becomes subject to its own policy-based objection. The objection is that of redundancy. Why should we ask two culpability questions in determining blameworthiness? After we have satisfied ourselves that a defendant is culpable—either because she intended or foresaw some harm, or because she was unreasonable in not foreseeing some harm, the foreseeability test bids us to ask “Was the harm foreseeable?” This is redundant, because any harm intended or foreseen is foreseeable, and any harm foreseeable enough to render an actor unreasonable for not foreseeing it, is also foreseeable.

The only way the foreseeability test avoids redundancy is by moving toward the other alternative here, the harm-within-the-risk test. That is, the law could have said that in situations where the defendant was culpable in intending, foreseeing, or unreasonably risking some harm type H, but what his act in fact caused was an instance of harm type J, one should ask whether J was foreseeable, a different question than the one asked and answered as a matter of mens rea (which was about H). Of course, H must be “close” to J for there to be a mind guilty with respect to the harm for which responsibility is sought. Yet this is to do the work of the harm-within-the-risk test, which is to solve what should be called the “fit problem” of mens rea (fitting the harm actually done, J, to the harm foreseen, intended, or risked, H; Moore 2011a). Moreover, it is to do such work badly. Foreseeability is not the right question to ask in order to fit the harm in fact caused by a defendant to the type of harm with respect to which she was culpable (either because she intended to achieve, or foresaw that she would cause, or unreasonably risked achieving, such a harm). If to avoid redundancy the foreseeability test is to be restricted to this non-redundant work, it is better abandoned for the harm-within-the-risk test.

Let us examine, then, this fourth policy-based proximate cause test, the misleadingly labeled “harm-within-the-risk” test. Like the foreseeability test, this test purports to be a test of legal cause that is universally applicable to all tort and criminal cases. This test, too, is justified on policy grounds and does not pretend to have anything to do with factual or scientific causation. Doctrinally, however, the test differs from a simple foreseeability test.

Consider first the arena from which the test takes its name, which is from crimes or torts of risk creation. If the defendant is criminally charged with negligent homicide (or wrongful death in torts), for example, this test requires that the death of the victim be within the risk that made the actor’s action negligent. If it was negligent to drop a can of nitroglycerin because it might explode and kill the victim, but instead it kills him by cutting his toe and causing him to bleed to death, then the harm that happened (bleeding) was not within the risk of harm (explosion) that made it negligent to drop the can (American Law Institute 1934). Similarly, if the charge is manslaughter (for which consciousness of the risk is required in some jurisdictions), this test requires that the death of the victim be within the risk the awareness of which made the defendant’s action reckless.

Extension of this test to non-risk-creation crimes or torts requires some modification. For crimes or torts of strict liability, where no mens rea is required, the test requires that the harm that happened be one of the types of harms the risk of which motivated the lawmaker to prohibit the behavior. For torts or crimes requiring knowledge (or “general intention”) for their mens rea, the test asks whether the harm that happened was an instance of the type of harm the foresight of which by the defendant made her culpable. For torts or crimes requiring purpose (or “specific intent”) for their mens rea, the test asks whether the harm that happened was an instance of the type of harm intended by the defendant which intention made him culpable.

What motivates all of these variations of the harm-within-the-risk test is the following insight: when assessing culpable mens rea, there is always a “fit problem”. Suppose a defendant intends to hit his victim in the face with a stick; suppose further he intends the hit to put out the victim’s left eye. As it happens, the victim turns suddenly as she is being hit, and loses her right ear to the blow. Whether the harm that happened (right ear loss) is an instance of the type of harm intended (left eye loss) is what is called the fit problem. Fact finders have to fit the mental state the defendant had to the actual result he achieved and ask whether it is close enough for him to be punished for a crime of intent like mayhem. (If it is not close enough, then he may yet be found guilty of some lesser tort or crime of battery or reckless endangerment.)

The essential claim behind the harm-within-the-risk test is that “legal cause” is the label lawyers should put on a problem of culpability, the problem called the fit problem. Proponents of this test urge that legal cause, properly understood, is really a mens rea doctrine, not a doctrine of causation at all (American Law Institute 1985).

The main problem for the harm-within-the-risk test does not lie in any of the directions we have just explored with respect to foreseeability as a test. The harm-within-the-risk test is in the service of a justice-oriented policy in its seeking of a true desert-determiner (culpable mental state), and it does not ask a redundant question. To grade culpability by the mental states of intention, foresight, and risk, we do have to match the harm done to the type of harm intended, foreseen, or unreasonably risked. The real questions for the harm-within-the-risk test are why this culpability question is labelled as a problem of legal causation, and whether this grading by culpable mental states is all that is or should be going on under the rubric of “legal cause”.

Consider this last question in light of two well-known sorts of legal cause cases. It is a time-honored maxim of criminal and tort law that “you take your victim as you find him”. Standard translation: no matter how abnormal may be the victim’s susceptibilities to injury, and no matter how unforeseeable such injuries may therefore be, a defendant is held to legally cause such injuries. Hit the proverbial thin-skulled man, and you have legally caused his death if he dies, no matter how rare his condition might be. This is hard to square with the harm-within-the-risk test. A defendant who intends to hit or to cut does not necessarily (or even usually) intend to kill. A defendant who foresees that his acts will cause the victim to be struck or cut, does not necessarily (or even usually) foresee that the victim will die. A defendant who negligently risks that his acts will cause a victim to be struck or cut is not necessarily (or even usually) negligent because he risked death.

The second sort of case involves what are often called “intervening” or “superseding” causes. Suppose the defendant sets explosives next to a prison wall intending to blow the wall and to get certain inmates out. He foresees to a practical certainty that the explosion will kill the guard on the other side of the wall. He lights the fuse to the bomb and leaves. As it happens, the fuse goes out. However, a stranger passes by the wall, sees the bomb, and relights the fuse for the pleasure of seeing an explosion; or, alternatively, lightning hits the fuse, reigniting it and setting off the bomb. When the guard on the other side of the wall is killed by the blast, standard doctrines of intervening causation hold that the defendant did not legally cause the death of the guard. Yet this is hard to square with the result that seemingly should obtain under the harm-within-the-risk test. After all, did not the defendant foresee just the type of harm an instance of which did occur? Because the harm-within-the-risk question asks a simple type-to-token question—was the particular harm that happened an instance of the type of harm whose foresight by the defendant made him culpable—the test is blind to freakishness of causal route (Moore 2009a: ch. 10).

The American Law Institute’s Model Penal Code modifies its adoption of the harm-within-the-risk test in section 2.03 by denying liability for a harm within the risk that is “too remote or accidental in its occurrence to have a [just] bearing on the actor’s liability or on the gravity of his offense” (American Law Institute 1962). This language was not intended as a general, stand-alone test of proximate causation, as it is sometimes construed to be (Dan-Cohen 1983). Rather, the language gives a qualifying caveat to the more general harm within the risk test of the Model Penal Code. Such a caveat is an explicit recognition of the inability of the harm-within-the-risk test to accommodate the issues commonly adjudicated as intervening cause issues.

Such a recognition is not nearly broad enough to cover the inadequacy of the harm-within-the-risk approach. The basic problem with the test is that it ignores all the issues traditionally adjudicated under the concept of legal cause. The test is blind not only to freakishness of causal route in the intervening cause situations, blind not only to the distinction between antecedent versus after-arising abnormalities so crucial to resolution of the thin-skulled man kind of issue, but the test also ignores all those issues of remoteness sought to be captured by Sir Francis Bacon’s coinage “proximate causation”. Even where there is no sudden “break” in the chain of causation as in the intervening cause cases, there is a strong sense that causation peters out over space and time. Caesar’s crossing the Rubicon may well be a necessary condition for your reading of this essay, but so many other events have also contributed that Caesar’s causal responsibility has long since petered out. The logical relationship at the heart of the harm-within-the-risk test—“was the particular harm that happened an instance of the type of harm whose risk, foresight, or intention made the defendant culpable?”—is incapable of capturing this sensitivity to remoteness. As such, the harm-within-the-risk test is blind to the basic issue adjudicated under “legal cause”. The harm-within-the-risk test asks a question that well serves justice-oriented theories of torts and criminal law, but it asks it in the wrong place and in substitution of other questions needing an answer for desert to be assessed.

We turn now from the policy-based tests of proximate causation to those tests based on the view that proximate causation, like cause in fact, has to do with real causal relations in the world. The oldest of these tests is that suggested by Sir Francis Bacon’s coinage “causa proxima” (1630: first maxim). The simple idea behind such a remoteness test is that causation is a scalar relation—a more-or-less sort of thing, not an all-or-nothing sort of thing—and that it peters out over time.

A criticism of the remoteness test, often voiced in the legal literature, is that distance in space and remoteness in time are irrelevant to degrees of causal contribution. Examples like People v. Botkin, where poisoned candy went a great distance (from California to the victim in New Jersey), or an undetonated bomb left buried for many years before it explodes and injures a victim, are trotted out in support of the criticism. Justice Cardozo rejoined that such criticism surely ran counter to strong community sentiment that spatiotemporal distance does matter to degrees of causal contribution (Bird v. St. Paul F. and Minneapolis Ins. Co.), but one would hope that one could do better than that. Spatiotemporal distance is perhaps a serviceable proxy for the number of events or states of affairs through which a cause exerts its influence on its effects, and the number of events could be relevant to the degree of causal contribution. This is the metaphysical view that causation “tires” through its links and that in this way the relation is not fully a transitive one.

A second and quite distinct kind of cause-based proximate cause test is the “direct cause” test. Despite the name, this test does not require that there be a complete absence of any event or state of affairs intervening between a cause and its effect, for that cause to be “direct”. Not even the ancient direct/indirect distinction between the writs of trespass and trespass-on-the-case in torts was this stringent in its requirement of directness (for trespass; Scott v. Shepard). On the contrary, chains can be sufficiently direct for the direct cause test even though they are quite long chains extending over considerable space and time. It is only if a special kind of event—an “intervening” (aka “superseding”, “extraneous”) cause—intervenes that the chain is insufficiently direct. The heart of the direct cause test is thus the idea that there are these chain-breaking, intervening causes.

Beginning with a series of articles in the 1950s and culminating in their massive book of 1959, Causation in the Law, second edition 1985, Herbert Hart and Tony Honoré sought to describe the idea of intervening causation that they saw the law adopting from everyday causal idioms. One can see their concept most easily in three steps. First, presuppose some version of the counterfactual analysis: a cause is at least a necessary condition for its effect, or perhaps a NESS condition (Honoré 1997). Second, a cause is not just any necessary condition; rather, out of the plethora of conditions necessary for the happening of any event, only two sorts are eligible to be causes rather than mere “background conditions:” free, informed, voluntary human actions, and those abnormal conjunctions of natural events we colloquially refer to as “coincidences”. Third, such voluntary human action and abnormal natural events cause a given effect only if some other voluntary human action or abnormal natural event does not intervene between the first such event and its putative effect. Such salient events, in other words, are breakers of causal chains (“intervening causes”) as much as they are initiators of causal chains, so if they do intervene they relegate all earlier such events to the status of mere background conditions.

Hart and Honoré built on considerable case-law support for their two candidates for intervening causes (Carpenter 1932, 1940–43; Eldredge 1937). Indeed, it is arguable that the basic distinction between principal and accomplice liability in criminal law depends in large part on this conceptualization of causation (Kadish 1985), as does the tort law distinction between “in concert” and “concurrent causer” kinds of joint tort-feasors. One worry for this view of causation, nonetheless, is that it is incomplete with respect to the remoteness range of issues usually dealt with under the rubric of “legal cause” in the law. Causation in the law fades out gradually as much it breaks off suddenly, and the direct cause analysis ignores this.

5.4 Unified (or “one tier”) approaches to causation in the law

The problems with the conventional legal analysis of causation—in terms of a bifurcation into cause in fact and proximate causation—have tempted some legal theorists to abandon the bifurcation of causation in the law and to search for a unitary notion of causation that is much more discriminating (in what it allows as a cause) than the hopelessly promiscuous counterfactual cause-in-fact test of the conventional analysis. Indeed, the search is for a unitary concept of causation that is so discriminating that it can do the work that on the conventional analysis is done by both cause-in-fact and proximate cause doctrines. It is far from obvious that causation is in fact a sufficiently discriminating relation that it can do this much work in assigning responsibility. Nonetheless, there are three such proposals in the legal literature, each having some doctrinal support in the law.

One we have seen already in the fourth variation in the counterfactual test for cause in fact. If one does not ask whether the defendant’s act was necessary for the occurrence of the harm—if one instead and more discriminatingly asks whether that aspect of her act that made her negligent or otherwise culpable caused the harm—then one has a causal test almost as discriminating as the simple counterfactual test coupled with a harm-within-the-risk version of the proximate cause test (Keeton 1963; Wright 1985b). This is not surprising, because both tests rule ineligible any aspects of the defendant’s act that does not make her culpable. For the aspect-causation view, such culpability-irrelevant aspects of the defendant’s action are not (relevantly) the cause of the harm; for the harm-within-the-risk test, such culpability-irrelevant aspects of the defendant’s action do not fit the culpable mental states of the defendant. Whether one puts it as causation (the aspect-cause view), or as culpability (the harm-within-the-risk view), the discriminating power is roughly the same.

A second unified view of causation in the law is the oldest of these kinds of proposals. It conceives of causation as a metaphysical primitive. Causation is not reducible to any other sort of thing or things, so there is little by way of an analysis that one can say about it and so very little that juries should be told about it (Smith 1911). The one thing we can say is that the causal relation is a scalar relation, which is to say, a matter of degree. One thing can be more of a cause of a certain event than another thing. Given the scalarity of causation, all the law need do is draw the line for liability somewhere on the scale marking degrees of causal contribution. On matters that vary on a smooth continuum, it is notoriously arbitrary to pick a precise break-point; where is the line between middle age and old age, red and pink, bald and not-bald, or caused and not-caused? This approach thus picks an appropriately vague line below which one’s causal contribution to a given harm will be ignored for purposes of assessing responsibility. Let the defendant be responsible and liable for some harm only when the degree of his causal contribution to that harm has reached some non de minimus, or “substantial”, magnitude. This is the original “substantial factor” test, as articulated by Jeremiah Smith in 1911. To the common objection that the test tells us little, its defenders reply that that is a virtue, not a vice, for there is little to be said about causation. Like hard-core pornography, causation is something we can “know when we see it” (Potter Stewart’s language about pornography in Jacobellis v. Ohio), without need of general definitions and tests (Borgo 1979).

The third and last of these unified notions of causation is physicalist in its ambitions. Some theorists have thought that we can say more about the nature of the causal relation than that it is scalar and that a substantial amount of it is required for responsibility. On this third view, the nature of causation is to be found in the mechanistic concepts of physics: matter in motion, energy, force (Beale 1895, 1920; Epstein 1973). This test is similar to the substantial factor view in its conceiving the causal relation to be scalar but differs in its reductionist ambitions: causation is not a primitive but can be reduced to some kind of physical process.

This view handles easily the overdetermination cases that are such a problem for the conventional analysis. When two fires join, two bullets strike simultaneously, two motorcycles scare the same horse, each is a cause of the harm because each is doing its physical work. When one non-mortal wound is inflicted together with a larger, mortal wound and the victim dies of loss of blood, each is a cause of death because each did some of the physical work (loss of blood) leading to death (People v. Lewis).

Such a mechanistic conception of causation is mostly a suggestion in the legal literature because of the elusive and seemingly mysterious use of “energy” and “force” by legal theorists (Hart & Honoré 1959). One suspects that some such view is often applied by jurors, but unless theorists can spell out the general nature of the relation being intuitively applied by jurors, this test tends to collapse to the metaphysically sparer (because primitivist) substantial factor test.

5.5 Summary of the differing concepts of causation in the law

As we have seen, the Anglo-American law of torts and of crimes has a bafflingly large number of conceptions of legal causation. Displayed below is a review of what has been described above, organized by the variables discussed earlier.

  1. Conventional bifurcated test: legal causation is constituted by two distinct components, cause- in-fact and proximate causation, with each component of this bifurcated test having contested meanings:
    1. Cause-in-fact tests
      1. Explicitly defined counterfactual test: the defendant’s action must be necessary to the occurrence of the harm.
      2. Modified counterfactual tests, where the defendant’s act must be:
        1. A necessary element of a set of factors that are together sufficient for the harm, where the total set of factors is itself unnecessary for that harm to have occurred (the “INUS” and “NESS” tests)
        2. Necessary to every detail in the time, place, and manner of an effect’s occurrence
        3. Necessary to accelerations (but not retardings) of the effect
        4. Not necessary in the sense that the existence of the act is necessary, so long as that aspect of the defendant’s action as made that act culpable, is necessary
        5. A “substantial factor” in the production of the harm, where the necessity of that act is an always sufficient criterion of a causal factor being “substantial” while not being a necessary criterion
        6. Necessary to an increase in the chance of an effect occurring (rather than being necessary to the effect actually occurring)
      3. Tests for causal skeptics: cause in fact as a conclusion of policy rather than a natural relation existing antecedent to law
        1. Ad hoc balancing of all policies (Critical Legal Studies and Legal Realists)
        2. Incentive-based policies and probabilistic tests of cause-in-fact (legal economists)
    2. Proximate cause tests
      1. Tests regarding proximate “causation” to be a balance of policies
        1. Tests based on a wide range of policies
          1. Ad hoc policy balancing in each case where the resulting policy balance is honored as a conclusion of “proximate causation” in that case
          2. Rules justified by policy balancing, such as:
            • Year and a day rule
            • First house rule
            • Last wrongdoer rule
        2. Tests based on the single policy of gauging culpability (mental state) of the actor
          1. Foreseeability test: was the harm foreseeable to the defendant as he acted?
          2. Harm-within-the-risk test: was the harm that occurred an instance of the type of harm the risk of which (or the intent or foresight of which by the defendant) made the defendant’s action negligent (or otherwise culpable)?
      2. Tests regarding proximate causation to be a matter of fact (about real causal relations) rather than a matter of policy
        1. Space-time proximity tests and the petering out of causation as it runs through a large number of events in the chain between cause and effect
        2. Direct cause test: sudden breaks in the causal chain formed by the existence of “intervening” or “superseding” causes that literally break causal chains that would otherwise exist
      3. Tests regarding proximate causation to be partly causal and partly policy: direct cause combined with the requirement that the intervening cause be unforeseeable to the defendant at the time she acted
  2. Unified tests: legal causation requires a natural, unitary, causal relation
    1. Aspect cause (above, I.A.2.d.) aggressively applied
    2. Cause as a scalar primitive: the original substantial factor test
    3. Physically reductionist tests: cause as physical process

6. Conclusion

Although it is possible to hold the view that causation in the law shares nothing with causation in science and in everyday life (save use of the same word), such a view is very counterintuitive; some relation between the two concepts of causation surely exists. That leaves two more plausible views of this relation. A strong view of this relation would be that the concepts are the same. The three unified tests for legal causation last considered, and the two metaphysical views of proximate causation earlier mentioned, all would make such a strong relation plausible. A weaker view of this relation would be to regard part of the law’s concept of causation—“cause-in-fact”—to be the same as causation in science and everyday life, but to regard the other part—“proximate causation”—to be the conclusions of policy analyses having nothing to do with anything that could be thought of as causation in any ordinary sense.

To decide which version of this relation is the correct one, one has to adjudicate between the various competing conceptions of causation in the law that we have examined. To have a baseline of comparison, one must also resolve the many conundrums surrounding the search for the true metaphysics of causation in philosophy; among other things, this involves hiving off all the features of ordinary usage of “cause” that are merely pragmatic features of appropriate utterance rather than semantic features fixing the reference of the term. These are daunting tasks to be done on both sides of the equation. To complete them, truly the lawyer must “adventure himself with philosophers in the logical and metaphysical controversies that beset the idea of cause” (Pollack 1901: 36). For philosophical lawyers and legal philosophers, that will not be a cost but a benefit.


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Other Internet Resources


The author would like to acknowledge the work of Antony Honoré and John Gardner on the previous entry in the SEP on this entry. The present entry pursues the same basic questions as did they in their earlier entry, as outlined in the present opening paragraph.

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