Collective Intentionality

First published Thu Jun 13, 2013; substantive revision Wed Dec 9, 2020

Collective intentionality is the power of minds to be jointly directed at objects, matters of fact, states of affairs, goals, or values. Collective intentionality comes in a variety of modes, including shared intention, joint attention, shared belief, collective acceptance, and collective emotion. Collective intentional attitudes permeate our everyday lives, for instance when two or more agents look after or raise a child, grieve the loss of a loved one, campaign for a political party, or cheer for a sports team. They are relevant for philosophers and social scientists because they play crucial roles in the constitution of the social world. In joint attention, the world is experienced as perceptually available for a plurality of agents. This establishes a basic sense of common ground on which other agents may be encountered as potential cooperators. Shared intention enables the participants to act together intentionally, in a coordinated and cooperative fashion, and to achieve collective goals. The capacity for shared belief provides us with a common stock of knowledge, and thus with a background against which relevant new information which we may want to share with others becomes salient. Collective acceptance is crucial for the development of language, and for a whole world of symbols, institutions, and social status. Collective emotions provide us with a shared conception of what matters to us, together, and they establish readiness for joint action. In virtue of capacity for collective intentionality, we can (and should) engage in joint reasoning and deliberation, and (re-)organize ourselves to make sure that the way we live together is how we, collectively, want it to be, from our small-scale communities to global politics.

Collective intentional attitudes involve a plurality of participants in such a way that the attitudes in question can be ascribed to individuals as a group, or unit. The main philosophical challenge connected with the analysis of collective intentionality is in the tension within the expression “individuals as a group”. It can be spelled out as a contradiction between the following two widely accepted claims (the Central Problem):

  1. Collective intentionality is no simple summation, aggregate, or distributive pattern of individual intentionality (the Irreducibility Claim);
  2. Collective intentionality is had by the participating individuals, and all the intentionality an individual has is their own (the Individual Ownership Claim).

Over the last couple of decades, a number of theories of collective intentionality have been proposed, pointing towards different ways to solve this tension.

1. The Central Problem

Suppose you intend to visit the Taj Mahal tomorrow, and I intend to visit the Taj Mahal tomorrow. This does not make it the case that we intend to visit the Taj Mahal together. If I know about your plan, I may express (or refer to) our intention in the form “we intend to visit the Taj Mahal tomorrow”. But this does not imply anything collective about our intentions. Even if knowledge about our plan is common, mutual, or open between us, my intention and your intention may still be purely individual. For us to intend to visit the Taj Mahal together is something different.

Distributions (summations, aggregates) of individual intentions do not make for collective intentions, even if combined with common knowledge, or mutual belief. This is accepted by an increasing number of contributors to the recent debate. Collectively intentional attitudes are not just sets of run-of-the-mill individual intentional attitudes combined with common knowledge or mutual belief. Another way of putting this is to say that collective intentionality is irreducible to individual intentionality (though this is generally accepted only insofar as individual intentionality is narrowly understood). It is only in virtue of its irreducibility that the intentional state in question can be attributed to the participants as a group.

What does it mean for us to intend as a group? Surely, if we intend to visit the Taj Mahal together, it is you and me who intend the shared activity, not some third subject over and above our heads, the group. That we intend as a group does not displace you and me as the intenders of the action in question. To say that the group intends to go for a walk is the same as saying that the participating individuals intend to go for a walk— if “together” is added to the latter clause (and where exactly it has to be inserted is a crucial philosophical question). Collective intentions can be attributed to individuals, but only collectively, it seems, and not distributively. The view that the intentional attitudes in question are the participant individuals’ collectively rather than distributively, however, is in tension with the view that even if an individual participates in collective intentionality, all the intentional attitudes that individuals has are their own (the Individual Ownership Thesis).

On the naturalist version of the Individual Ownership Thesis, any (primary) intentional state is a higher order feature of a brain. It is not the case that in collective intentionality, individual brains are integrated in a Borg-like manner to form a collective super-brain. Therefore, it seems that collective intentionality reduces to an aggregate, or combination, of individual brain states. According to an internalist version, all the intentionality an individual has is structurally independent of the existence or non-existence of anything outside the individual mind. The question of whether or not an individual’s intentional states are collective is therefore settled by internal features of individual minds. A third version, that might seem attractive to non-naturalists and externalists, emphasizes that intentional states are, or involve, commitments. It seems, however, that only an individual agent’s own intentional states can commit them to a particular course of action, or to inferences. Other individuals’ intentional states may provide an agent with a reason only on the base of what they themselves believe or desire. Thus, it seems that the commitments involved in collective intentional states are the individual commitments of each of the participants.

In all of these and related versions of the Individual Ownership Thesis, the basic claim is that each individual has a mind of their own and has a sort of intentional autonomy that is incompatible with the view that individual minds are somehow fused when intentional states are shared. Thus, the Individual Ownership Thesis places tight restrictions on non-reductivism about collective intentionality. Most participants in the current debate accept a version of the Irreducibility Claim, and a version of the Individual Ownership Thesis, and they set out to show how these could be modified in such a way as to be mutually compatible.

2. History

The label “collective intentionality” is fairly recent (in its current meaning, it was introduced by John Searle in his 1990 paper “Collective Intentions and Actions”). In contrast to the label, the concept is not new. The idea of collective intentionality is implied in such notions as Aristotle’s concept of koinonía (common striving), Jean-Jacque Rousseau’s collective will (volonté générale), or in notions such as the spirit of peoples and related concepts as developed in German Idealism or the Historical School of Law. Somewhat more explicit conceptions of collective intentionality can be found in early social and sociological theory (2.1), Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy (2.2), and in the works of Robin G. Collingwood and Wilfrid Sellars (2.3). These largely independent sources focus on key issues in the analysis of collective intentionality that persist through history into the present.

2.1 Social and Sociological Theory

Emile Durkheim (1898) and Max Weber (1922) have developed conceptions of collective intentionality under other labels, and they have come to quite different and indeed opposite views.

Durkheim claims that social facts have to be accounted for in terms of collective consciousness rather than individual attitudes. His (1898) example of people who are involved in a mass emotion, of which they cannot make sense in terms of their own personal views and feelings, is often quoted as an illustration. Indeed, Durkheim’s view is sometimes even argued to be the direct historical root of the current debate on collective intentionality (Olen/Turner 2015). Durkheim’s remarks on the role of collective consciousness suggest a view of the collective “taking over control” and bypassing individual intentional psychology in the explanation of action (though Durkheim’s views can also be reconstructed along less collectivist lines; see Turner 1986). Durkheim’s work is one of the historical sources for the analysis of collective emotions (von Scheve and Salmela 2014).

Weber, by contrast, is famous for assigning the decisive role in the explanation of social facts to the intentional attitudes of individuals. He claims that many social situations are situations of strategic interdependence between individual decisions. In such situations, fully rational agents choose their preferred course of action on the basis of what they cognitively expect other agents to do. However, Weber is well aware of the fact that where dependence of each participant’s choice on his or her expectation concerning the other’s behavior is out in the open, the situation becomes unstable. In addressing this issue, Weber discusses the case in which people act on the assumption of being in agreement with other agents, which then enables them to have normative expectations concerning each other’s behavior. This is a decisive step beyond what has later become known as rational choice theory. Such agents do not choose according to what they think to be best given what they think others are likely to do; rather, they rely on others to do what they ought to do. This need not, Weber claims, be a matter of explicit agreement, but may be grounded in a sense of the agent’s shared aims (and thus, we would now say, in collective intentionality). However, such action orientation appears as not fully rational in Weber’s conception (Weber 1922). Weber’s conception thus foreshadows the neglect of collective intentions and actions in later rational choice and game theory.

(Quasi-)Durkheim’s and Weber’s conceptions mark the Scylla and the Charybdis of the debate. The Scylla is a straightforward anti-reductivism about collective intentionality that comes at the cost of a flat-out rejection of individual intentional autonomy. The Charybdis is a reductionist attempt that denies collective intentionality for rational social agents.

2.2 Phenomenology

Substantive and concise philosophical analyses of collective intentionality can be found in early Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy. These contributions have attracted increasing attention in recent years (Salice & Schmid 2016; Moran & Szanto 2016). Among the many relevant contributions and contributors (including Edmund Husserl, Edith Stein, and Jean-Paul Sartre), two stand out as particularly important: Gerda Walther (1923), and Max Scheler (1954 [1912]). The paradigm case in their (implicit) controversy is shared experience.

Walther claims that for A and B to share the experience of x, i) A has to experience x, and B has to experience x, ii) A has to empathize with B’s experience and vice versa, iii) A has to identify with B’s experience and vice versa, and iv) there has to be mutual empathetic awareness of the other’s identification (Walther 1923: 85f.). Walther offers substantive analyses of empathetic experience and identification, but the question remains why the reciprocal intentional attitudes required from the participants in shared experience stops at level three (current accounts that follow similar lines usually require full common knowledge). How could there be a shared experience between A and B if A is unaware of the fact that B is empathetically aware of A’s identification with B’s experience, or some such? It seems easy to develop a scenario in which Walther’s conditions are met, but in which there is no shared experience for lack of awareness of what the other takes to be the case. If collective intentionality is analyzed in terms of a combination of individual intentionality and mutual recognition of some sorts, it seems that an infinite progress of reciprocal attitudes is set off.

Scheler’s most important contribution to the analysis of collective intentionality is largely negative. Joint intentionality is not, Scheler holds, a combination of individual intentionality with a structure of reciprocal awareness, whatever the structure and kind of the reciprocal awareness in question may be. From his analysis emerges the view that when people share an attitude, it is not the case that each participant has an attitude of his or her own, but that the intentional attitude at stake here is really one and the same, so that many minds are in a numerically identical state. The most conspicuous examples Scheler discusses are the experience of grief which parents, without thinking of each other, share at the deathbed of their child (Scheler 1954 [1912]: 145), and the chillingly positive account of the shared national enthusiasm (the August Madness) at the outbreak of World War One (Scheler 1982 [1914]: 272ff.). Without mentioning his source, Martin Heidegger follows roughly Schelerian lines in his discussion of more innocent examples in (1996 [1928/29]). The idea is that collective intentionality is not a combination of individual intentionality and reciprocal attitudes, but irreducibly collective (for a recent re-statement of this point see Searle 1995: 27). A problem of irreducibility-claims of this sort, however, is that it is hard to believe that the participants in a collective intentional attitude do not represent, in some way, each other, even if they need not have occurrent beliefs or conscious empathetic experience. A participant’s intention represents the others as co-intenders in some way, or so it seems (Searle seems to concede this point in Searle 2010: 15). An important question to consider is whether the relation between the co-intenders is of the cognitive, normative, or rather of the affective kind. Tuomela & Miller (1988) and Michael Bratman (1999) argue that the participants have to know what the others are up to, Alonso (2009) argues that they just have to rely on them, while Gilbert (1990) claims that they have to normatively expect others to do their parts. Schmid (2013) argues that the attitude in question is trust, and that this combines cognitive and normative components. The question of how participants in collective intentionality “represent” each other becomes particularly pressing if it is assumed that basic cases of shared intentionality are developed at an age where infants do not have a theory of mind, such as in Michael Tomasello’s (2009) view.

2.3 Sellars’ Conception of We-Intention

Whereas the mainstream of present debate about collective intentionality probably has no direct roots in early social theory or phenomenology, Wilfrid Sellars’ concept of we-intention is widely acknowledged as the point of departure (Tuomela & Miller 1988). We-intentions play a crucial role in Sellars’ practical philosophy. As we-attitudes, normative judgments can both express people’s attitudes, and have a claim to intersubjective validity. The concept of a we-intention thus bridges emotivism and intuitionism (Sellars 1974). We-intentions are attitudes, but at the same time, they are not merely private, but involve a shared point of view from which the participants may critically assess each other’s contributions.

Sellars argues that even though we-intentions are not private, they do not involve a group mind. His view is that we-intentions are had by individuals, but that they differ from individual intentions in their form. According to the taxonomy developed below, his is a mode-account of collective intentionality. Sellars’ conception of we-intention can be traced back to Robin G. Collingwood’s New Leviathan (1947), where Collingwood defines society as

the sharing of certain persons in a practical social consciousness verbally expressed in a formula like ‘We will go for this walk’ or ‘We will sail this boat’. (Collingwood 1947: 146)

In a chapter by the title “Society as joint will”, Collingwood argues that there is nothing mysterious about practical social consciousness (148). All the individual participant needs to have is a however vague general idea of the enterprise as a whole, and a special idea of the part in it allotted to himself. In addition, the participant must know that there are other agents who are partners with him- or herself in this common endeavor, without having to know who exactly they are. As “social consciousness,” society

is nothing over and above its members. It has no will but the will of its members; no activity but the activity of its members; no responsibility but the responsibility of its members. (149ff.).

Sellars’ interests differ from Collingwood’s, but his analysis closely follows Collingwood’s lines. Sellars agrees with Collingwood that the attitude in question requires no group mind capable of belief or intention over and above the heads of the participating individuals (Sellars 1968: 203). On this account, all intentionality involved in group intention and group action is had by individuals, but it is conceived as intentionality of a special sort, which Sellars calls “action we-referential intention”, or, in short, “we-intention”. It is thus individuals, and not a group, that intend a joint action (Sellars 1980: 98). This, however, leads Sellars to one of the deepest problems in the analysis of collective practical intentionality. One cannot intend what one takes to be entirely beyond one’s abilities, or beyond one’s control (Sellars calls this the “‘up to the agent’ness” [Sellars 1980: 98] of intention). Objects of intention are taken, by the agent, to be “up to her”, to some degree at least. How, then, can individuals have we-intentions? It seems plausible to assume that the behavior of each individual, insofar as it is an action, is up to that individual him- or herself. An individual who has an action-we-referential intention, however, does not only intend his or her own behavior, but also the behavior of the other participants, and this behavior is not up to him- or herself, but up to others. Thus we-intention seems to be incompatible with the ‘up to the agent’-ness of intention.

In the current debate, this problem is sometimes bypassed by shifting from action-referential to propositional intentions. Michael Bratman analyzes shared intentions in terms of “intention, that” rather than “intention to” (in a closely related vein, Raimo Tuomela distinguishes action intentions from aim intentions in parts of his work, e.g., Tuomela 2007: 84f.). To intend that the door be closed is different from intending to close the door in that in the former case, the subject having that intention may differ from the subject of the intended action. Thus, the problem with we-referential intentions seems to disappear as soon as intention is conceived of in propositional rather than in action-referential terms. Sellars is fully aware of the possibility of that move:

It is important to see that I can not only intend to do something myself, I can also intend that someone else do something, i.e., that it be the case that he does it. (Sellars 1968: 184)

Yet Sellars sees clearly that this apparent escape route is really a dead end, and again, he follows Collingwood, who argued that consciousness, insofar it is practical, is not a matter of “making up your mind that”, but a matter of “making up your mind to” (Collingwood 1947: 139). Talk of “intention that something be the case”, Sellars argues, may be grammatically correct, but it is understandable as talk of practical commitments only in virtue of its relation to “intention to”. When spelled out, the intention that p is really the intention to make it the case that p (Sellars 1968: 184). Thus, a person’s intention that “we” do x, or that somebody else does x, is a practical commitment only as an action-referential intention (intention to): one intends to do whatever is necessary to make it the case that we do x, or that somebody else does x. This yields a solution to the problem (which Sellars later calls “superficial”). A person may simply assume that it is up to her what other people do because she takes herself to have an influence on these other people (Sellars 1968: 188).

That we can influence people is as relevant to practical reasoning as that we can influence sticks or stones. (Sellars 1980: 88)

An agent who intends to bring her influence on others to bear in such a way as to make it the case that others do what is necessary for the intended state to obtain, however, does not have a proper we-intention. The reason is that such intentionality does not go beyond an egocentric perspective; it involves an extension of the range of one’s own intentionality into other people’s agency rather than any sense of sharing. Remember that Sellars develops the idea of we-intention with an eye on making the intuition that normative judgments express intentional attitudes compatible with the view that they involve a claim to intersubjective validity. Just that I intend to influence other people to behave in a certain way, or to form certain intentions, does not make my attitude intersubjective in such a way as to provide a stance for mutual critical assessment.

In On Reasoning about Values (1980), Sellars offers an alternative solution to the ‘up to the agent’ness problem of we-intention: it involves

the fact […] that to say that the intendible constituents of an intention are those which are present sub specie ‘up to me’ is equivalent to accompanying them with the conditional ‘if it is up to me’. […] Now ‘up to me’ is the first-person form of ‘up to X’. […] Thus, the correct answer to the above challenge consists in calling attention to the fact that the ‘up to the agent’ness of action we-referential intention is to be formulated as follows: ‘Shall [each of us, if it is up to them, do A]’ And this in no way requires that what others do be up to me. (1980: 98)

Thus, Sellars’ view is that when individuals we-intend to do something together, each one has his or her own we-intention. “[T]he intendings are two in number, but the content of these intendings is the same” (1968: 217).

In Sellars’ view, we-intentions are intentions had by individuals; we-intending individuals have their own intention, and the action intended by a we-intending agent is limited to what the agent takes to be up to him- or herself. This means that the existence of we-intention does not imply that an intention is actually shared, an idea that resembles Searle’s claim that collective intentionality can be had by envatted brains (1990: 406). This raises the question of what has to be the case for a we-intending individual actually to intend together with others. One person’s we-intention does not make for a collective intention. Other we-intending individuals need to be around. But is it enough for an intention to be joint that other individuals happen to be around who have a we-intention with the exact same content? If one brain in a vat cannot we-intend alone, can two, if not together? How do the we-intentions of individual participants have to be related to each other in order to constitute a genuine collective intention? Sellars’ analysis may not provide a conclusive answer, but he presents at least two further insights that seem highly relevant to the current debate.

First, Sellars emphasizes the difference between two types of I-referential intentions. Primary I-referential intentions are different from we-derivative I-referential intentions in that the content of the latter are contributions to joint actions. A great many intentions are we-derivative in that sense. My intention to move a pawn on the chessboard is derivative from our intention to play a game of chess.

Second, Sellars leaves ample room for what could be called intentional dissidence. Many current analyses assume that for us to intend x, each of us has to intend to do his or her share. Sellars is keenly aware that this may not always be the case. Intentions may be ascribed to groups, as shared, without assuming that each participant intends to do his or her share. Yet Sellars acknowledges that the less of our collective intentions and beliefs an individual shares, the more difficult it becomes to see him or her as “one of us” (Sellars 1968: 203). We-intentions are a matter of a “shared point of view” that involves identification with a group (Sellars 1980: 101). The question of whether or not group identification needs to be in the individual participants’ self-interest remains open. Whether or not a situation of choice is looked at in terms of one’s “private” or “shared” point of view depends on whom one takes oneself to be: a solitary individual or a group member. Sellars’ aim is not to provide a theory of identity selection. His claim is that the moral point of view requires us to abandon the egocentric perspective, and to conceive of ourselves as “one of us”. The “we” at play here has to be understood in the least parochial sense. Only such we-intentionality actually serves the purpose for which Sellars devised the term “we-intention”; only the we-intentions that are universally shared, and no parochial group attitudes, constitute the moral point of view.

3. What Is Collective about Collective Intentionality?

A common starting point of the theory of intentionality can be rendered as follows: (1) intentionality is taken to be a feature of minds, (2) minds are to be conceived as individual minds (or minds of individuals), and (3) each individual has his or her own mind. We call this third statement, which is most relevant to the topic at hand, the Individual Ownership Thesis. But how can intentional attitudes be shared in more than a merely distributive sense? Or how can what we call the Irreducibility Claim be true? In meeting the challenge of making irreducibility compatible with individual ownership, a lot depends on where exactly the collectivity is placed in the analysis of collective intentionality.

Intentionality is commonly divided into three constitutive features. First, intentionality has content. The content of an intentional attitude is whatever the attitude in question is about (e.g., the content of the intention to visit the Taj Mahal is to visit the Taj Mahal). Second, intentionality has a mode. The mode is what distinguishes a case of fear from a case of intention, or a belief from a desire. Basic modes are the modes of conative or practical intentional attitudes (such as intentions or desires), cognitive or theoretical intentional attitudes (such as beliefs or perceptions), and affective or emotional attitudes (such as hopes and fears). And third, intentionality has a subject, that is, an entity whose intentionality it is, and to whom it can be ascribed as its source or bearer.

Whereas there is a widely shared consensus among the participants in the debate that there is no straightforward reduction of collective intentional attitudes to a set of individual intentional attitudes, the question of what exactly is collective about collective intentionality is highly controversial. Each of the three components of intentional attitudes has been quoted as the seat or locus of the sharedness or collectivity in question. Some authors claim that collective intentionality is intentionality with a collective content, others seem to invoke a special mode, while still others claim that what’s collective about collective intentionality has to be the subject. Content-accounts claim that for A and B’s intention to visit the Taj Mahal tomorrow to be collective, each A and B have to intend to visit the Taj Mahal together. Mode-accounts insist that the element of collectivity has to extend to the intending; in their view, A and B have to intend collectively to visit the Taj Mahal (together). Subject-accounts hold that the element of togetherness is really in the subject; in their view, A and B have to form a plural subject or a unified group that is the subject of—and has—the intention to visit the Taj Mahal.

The paradigm of collective intentionality in the recent debate is joint intention (collective practical intentionality). Analyses of joint intention will thus serve as a common reference point in the following discussion of content-, mode-, and subject-accounts of collective intentionality.

3.1 Content

What do the agents A and B have to intend for their intention to go for a walk to be collective? A first approach consists in saying that the relevant intentions of A and B do not refer to their own individual walks, but to their joint walk. Instead of each intending to go for a walk, A and B would each intend the joint walk. This move is crucial to Michael Bratman’s approach to the analysis of what he terms ‘shared cooperative activity’ (cf. Bratman 1999, chaps. 5–8, 2006, and 2014). It is based on the view that action intentions do not just come in the form “I intend to X,” as when an agent intends to perform some action. On Bratman’s account, intentions can also take the form “I intend that we J” (cf. Bratman 1999, chap. 8), where J refers to a joint activity in which the intending agent participates. This represents the participating agents as not just intending their respective contributions, but as intending the joint activity; in the case at hand, A and B are said to intend that they go for a walk together. Although the focus at this point should be on that core element, it is expedient to cite one version of the entire analysis.

We intend to J if and only if

  1. (a) I intend that we J and (b) you intend that we J.
  2. I intend that we J in accordance with and because of 1a, 1b, and meshing subplans of 1a and 1b; you intend that we J in accordance with and because of 1a, 1b, and meshing subplans of 1a and 1b.
  3. 1 and 2 are common knowledge between us. (Bratman 1999: 121)

This gives the structure of what Bratman calls a “shared intention,” which he takes to be an intention to J shared by the participants. It is depicted as consisting in a complex nexus of interdependent individual attitudes and not as the intention of a collective agent or as a state of some collective mind (cf. Bratman 1999: 122–3). For there to be a joint activity, Bratman holds, the participating agents have to intend this activity in such a way that their so intending is aligned both socially and with other plans (or subplans) on each side and that it is common knowledge between them.

Thus, the claim here is that intentions of the form “I intend that we X” are basic to the intentionality of joint action. Critics have argued that Bratman’s account is defective in so far as it treats intentions of that form as basic, since they violate either (1) the condition that one can only intend one’s own action, or (2) the condition that one can only control one’s own and no other agent’s actions, or (3) the condition that one can only intend what one can take to be in a position to settle (see Baier 1997; Stoutland 1997; Velleman 1997). Bratman clarifies in reply (in Bratman 1999, chap. 8) that intentions of the form “I intend that we X” are formed under the assumption that the partner in a shared activity does or will come to intend likewise. Instead of positing that in order to form such an intention an agent has to be certain about their partner’s intentions, Bratman contends that an agent is typically in a position to reliably predict whether the other will come to form a corresponding intention. Given that both agents form their intentions in this manner, whereby a shared intention comes into existence, they can both regard themselves as having partly settled the issue in question. On this account, neither of the agents controls for the other’s intention formation or action as their intentions are each understood as partially constitutive of the shared intention.

Another charge against Bratman’s and other accounts that ground an understanding of collective intentionality in individual agents’ intentions is that such intentions are circular (cf. the discussion of Tuomela 2005 below). The idea behind this criticism is that such intentions presuppose rather than constitute collective intentionality (cf. Schmid 2005; Petersson 2007). For how can an individual refer to a joint activity without the jointness, i.e., the ‘we,’ already being in place? How can an agent assume that others will intend likewise without presupposing the collectivity of their so intending? Instead of being foundational for shared intentions or collective intentionality, such intentions might turn out to be redundant expressions of an already existing collective intentionality.

A reply available within Bratman’s account may refer to a presupposition of the formation of a shared intention. According to Bratman (1999, chap. 5), shared agency requires that the individual agents involved be mutually responsive, i.e., that each seeks to be responsive to the other’s intentions and actions and that each seeks to guide their own behavior with an eye to the behavior of the other. It is in this sense, and the phrase “in accordance with and because of” in the scheme given above signals this, that the ways the agents involved form their respective intentions can be said to interconnect. Hence the idea behind this reply would be to ground the intentional reference to the joint activity in mutual responsiveness. (Bratman 2014, chapter 2, offers more reflections of the charge of circularity; cf. Petersson 2015 for discussion.)

It is not clear whether this response can successfully deal with the charge of circularity. Whereas it may be that in some scenarios the agents involved actually realize that they want to cooperate so that their processes of intention formation interconnect and they come to have intentions as Bratman specifies them, the problem of circularity may just crop up again with respect to the required interconnection. It could be that instantiating interconnected processes of intention formation just presupposes the collectivity it is meant to constitute.

The merits of Bratman’s approach clearly lie in its highlighting that whatever joint intentions are, they do involve interrelated intentional attitudes on the part of the individual agents involved. However, many critics think that treating reference to the joint activity as central and at the same time retaining the ‘I’-form of the constitutive individual intentions makes for a fundamental problem of circularity.

Before turning to a different type of account in which this particular problem of circularity is (at least apparently) circumvented, it should be noted that Bratman’s adherence to the ‘I’-form of intentions is expressive of the individualism underlying his approach. Already in the first statement of his account he points out that it is “reductive in spirit” (Bratman 1999: 108) and clarifies that the core “claim […] is that shared intention consists primarily of attitudes of individuals and their interrelations” (1999: 129). Even though Bratman has specified the dimensions of the interrelations between the attitudes of the individual agents involved (cf. Bratman 2006), some critics have taken issue with the claim that the attitudes constitutive of shared intentions have to stand in the singular, i.e., the ‘I’-form (cf. Baier 1997; Stoutland 1997; Schmid 2009; Schweikard 2011). This line of criticism pertains to the picture thus drawn of shared intention as a social phenomenon that is constructed out of I-form-attitudes as building blocks, a picture that understates the relevance both of relations between the individuals involved and of the role of social identification expressed by the use of ‘we.’

3.2 Mode

Other contributors to the analysis of collective intentional states claim that the collectivity resides not just in the content of the intentionality but also in a specifically collective mode or we-mode. If individuals share an intention, it is not just the case that they each intend a joint action; rather, they intend the joint action collectively.

This shift of focus is best grasped by noticing two main elements: first, mode accounts include the claim that the attitudes that constitute shared or joint attitudes are to be verbalized using the plural pronoun “we,” as in “we intend to go to the Taj Mahal” or “we believe that the Taj Mahal is in India.” Second, (some) mode accounts emphasize that such attitudes are not just verbalized in a certain way but are expressive of the particular and fundamental sociality of their bearers. Raimo Tuomela (2007, 2013) suggests distinguishing between (different strengths of) I-mode and we-mode, picking out different ways of having intentional attitudes, where having an attitude in the I-mode means having it ‘as a private person’ and having it in the we-mode means having it ‘as a group member’ (cf. Tuomela 2007: 46).

The distinctions between attitudes verbalized in the singular form and attitudes verbalized in the plural form, and between I-mode and we-mode, are not to be conflated with the distinction between modes of intentionality introduced above. Instead, the idea underlying mode accounts is to spell out a distinction that can be applied to practical (or conative), to cognitive, and to affective intentional states, yielding a conceptual framework for analyzing the entire spectrum of collective intentional states. The idea is that the participating agents have attitudes of a special kind or form.

A direct and explicit predecessor of mode accounts is Wilfrid Sellars, to whom, as was noted above, Tuomela and Miller refer as a source of their original account of we-intentions (cf. Tuomela & Miller 1988). Focusing on cases of joint action and the respective intentional states, they analyze an individual agent’s we-intention regarding a joint activity as consisting of (1) the intention to do her part, (2) a belief that others will to their parts, and (3) a belief that there is (or will be) mutual belief among the agents involved that the relevant opportunities for performing the joint activity obtain (cf. Tuomela & Miller 1988: 375; see also Tuomela 1991: 252; Tuomela 2005: 340–41)

In conceiving of we-intention as a special kind of intention had by an individual agent, the analysis is true to Sellars’ understanding of we-intentions (cf. section 2.3 above). As Tuomela and Miller put it, an individual agent can be said to ‘we-intend’ the joint action X if she has a respective individual intention regarding her contribution and certain beliefs about the actions and beliefs of the other agents involved. Such a we-intention is not in itself an action intention on a par with the participatory intention of a single agent, it is an ‘aim intention’ directed at the joint action (cf. Tuomela 2005; 329–30). By contrast to content accounts, this account posits that the intentionality of joint action consists in a particular form of intending instantiated by the individual agents involved. If the members of a group perform a joint action together, then this is in virtue of each of them having a we-intention of the form given here; e.g., their joint action of going to the Taj Mahal is performed in virtue of each having the we-intention to go to the Taj Mahal.

In his first contribution to this debate, John Searle criticized Tuomela’s and Miller’s account as typical “in that it attempts to reduce collective intentions to individual intentions plus beliefs” (Searle 1990: 404; cf. Searle 2010: 46). In particular, Searle rejects the idea of reducing ‘we’-attitudes to ‘I’-attitudes. But he does not understand the reverse claim, according to which collective intentionality is irreducible or “primitive” (Searle 1990: 404), as having an impact on the internalist claim that all intentionality “has to exist inside individuals’ heads” (Searle 2010: 44; cf. Searle 1990: 406). From Searle’s perspective, Tuomela and Miller are right in not positing the existence of a form of intentionality that somehow transcends individuals’ minds, but they go wrong in claiming that we-intentions can be reduced to I-intentions plus beliefs. Such a reduction fails, Searle holds, because thinking and conceiving of a joint action in the “we”-form is the core characteristic of cooperation. When A and B go to the Taj Mahal together, Searle’s account has it that each of them has the thought “We are going to the Taj Mahal” in his head; and this is what makes theirs a joint action, since each derives his contributory or participatory intention from his collective intention, assuming that the respective other will perform his contribution (cf. Searle 2010: 52–53).

Searle’s account of the structure of collective intentionality has been criticized precisely with respect to the combination of the claim that the ‘we’ is irreducible with the claim that all intentionality resides in individual minds. Some critics have noted that Searle embraces a solipsistic and individualistic methodology (see Searle 1990: 415 and Searle 2010: 47) that makes it impossible to account for the intersubjective or interpersonal relations that characterize joint activities and social communities (see e.g., Meijers 1994, 2003; Schmid 2003, 2009; Zaibert 2003). Such relations are explicitly bracketed out in Searle’s account. But it seems plausible to hold that successful coordination of efforts in pursuit of shared goals requires that the relations between the agents involved and the attitudes of the respective others figure in the intentional structure of this social process. For a complex event to be not just a coincidentally matching pattern of actions by individual agents but an intentional joint action, it needs a complex structure of attitudes in which the agents involved refer to one another. The only reference to a collectivity Searle incorporates into his account, the plural indexical ‘we,’ is taken to be primitive and accessible to a solipsistic analysis (cf. Searle 1990: 415). Although this insistence on the we-form of the intentionality allows classifying Searle’s conception as a mode-account, its elaboration does not look convincing. His conception renders collective intentionality distributive in the sense that the distinctive mark of the phenomena in question is claimed not to be instantiated by individuals together, by individuals-in-relations, by plural subjects or groups, but to the full by each of the individuals involved.

The description of this strand of the debate sidesteps the fact that it is not entirely clear whether the point of Tuomela’s and Miller’s analysis of we-intention is to provide a reductive account of collective intentionality. In fact, Tuomela has repeatedly rejected this interpretation of the analysis (see, for instance Tuomela 1995, chap. 9; Tuomela 2005: 342). He clarified that his analysis of we-intention, which remained essentially unchanged throughout subsequent work of his, “is rather meant to elucidate the irreducible notion of we-intention in a functionally informative way” (Tuomela 2005: 358) and grounded in an “ontically individualistic or, better, interrelational” framework (2005: 342). This suggests reading the analysis not as reductive but as explicative in the sense that it explicates the complex structure of attitudes that constitutes an individual agent’s we-intending. This again provides the core element of Tuomela’s conception of the intentionality that guides joint action, i.e., the analysis of what he calls ‘joint intention:’

(JI) Agents A1, …, Ai, …, Am have the joint intention to perform a joint action X if and only if

  1. these agents have the we-intention (or are disposed to form the we-intention) to perform X; and
  2. there is a mutual belief among them to the effect that (a).

In the case of joint intention the conatively used ‘We will do X’ is true of each participant Ai. (Tuomela 2005: 342)

This scheme not only makes explicit that on Tuomela’s account each participant in a joint action is viewed as having a we-intention in the sense specified above, it also highlights important similarities between this conception and Bratman’s conception of ‘shared intentions.’ However, as signaled by the respective choice of terminology, Tuomela thinks of the intentional structure of collective action as consisting in individual attitudes joined together, whereas Bratman conceives of it as being shared among the participants. According to both accounts it is a core element of collective intentionality that each of the individual agents involved refers to the others’ intentions and beliefs regarding the joint activity. However, even if it is granted that the crucial difference between these accounts regards the mode of the constitutive attitudes, it needs to be seen whether the charge of circularity discussed above also affects Tuomela’s account of we-intentions (cf. Miller 2001 and Schmid 2005).

The charge of circularity targets the element of Tuomela’s (and Miller’s) analysis of we-intentions according to which the we-intending individual agent refers to her part of the joint action X and has beliefs regarding others’ contributions and beliefs. If the agent is to intend to do her part of X and if she is to be able to refer to others’ contributions and beliefs, so the objection goes, then the collectivity that is meant to be constituted by we-intentions has to be presupposed. Tuomela’s reply to this objection has the following three elements: first, the point of the analysis is not that collectivity is constituted by but that it consists in the participants’ having we-intentions, where this crucially depends on their satisfaction of what Tuomela calls the ‘collectivity condition,’ i.e., the condition that one participant can only have a we-intention if others have an isomorphic we-intention (cf. Tuomela 2005: 333 and 339). Second, Tuomela takes the analysis of we-intention not to be an instance of vicious circularity (cf. Tuomela 2005, sec. VI.), since from the pre-analytic perspective of the participant the performance of the joint action, including an allocation of contributions, is presumed and anticipated but not presupposed. Third, Tuomela does not view we-intentions and other elements of his account as independent building blocks but only as analytically isolatable parts of a complex whole (cf. Tuomela 2007: 125–6); once again, the guiding idea is not to track the composition of collectivity from basic and independent elements, but to elucidate what collectivity consists in.

In his more recent work on collective intentionality, Tuomela has generalized the idea underlying his analysis of we-intention to a differentiated conception of the socially shared point of view that underlies social and collective phenomena (see especially Tuomela 2003, 2007, and 2013; for a critical discussion see Schmitz 2017). At the core of this conception lies a fine-grained distinction between variations of what he calls the ‘I-mode’ and the ‘we-mode,’ all of which specify ways in which individuals have attitudes relative to a group whose member they are. When an individual reasons or has attitudes in the ‘I-mode,’ she does function as a group member but her commitments relative to the respective attitudes are private, i.e., they regard her goals qua private person. When she reasons or has attitudes in the ‘we-mode,’ she functions as a group member and conceives of herself as being bound by and committed to what is collectively accepted and subject of collective commitment within the group. Spelling out the details of this conception—especially the notions of collective acceptance (see Tuomela 2002 and 2007, chap. 6) and collective commitment as well as the so-called group ethos (see Tuomela 2007, chap. 1)—would exceed the scope of the present discussion. But the contours of the approach should have become clear: according to Tuomela, collective intentionality resides in a specific mode of having attitudes, and collective phenomena are individuated in terms of complex intentional structures that involve such specific attitudes.

A more general criticism of the content accounts and mode accounts of collective intentionality discussed in this and the previous section aims at the individualist framework within which they are formulated (see, e.g., Baier 1997; Stoutland 1997; Meijers 2003). More specifically, some authors have called for overcoming the intentional individualism the most prominent approaches to collective intentionality adopt (cf. Schmid 2009 and Schweikard 2011). This move involves leaving behind the view that all attitudes are (reducible to) attitudes by individuals, taken in isolation, and are to be verbalized in the ‘I’-form; this does away with the problem of circularity. The alternative here is to acknowledge that some attitudes take a genuine ‘we’-form and are rightly attributed to individuals standing in certain social relations. The point of such a non-individualist line is not to posit mysterious supra-individual forces or to undercut the intentional autonomy of individual agents, where these are the worries that seem to motivate the individualistic stance. It is, rather, to treat collective intentionality as irreducible with respect to its content and mode, and relational with respect to the structures that ground individuals’ reference to plural contents and their self-conception as subject-in-relations. A non-individualist account, according to which collective intentionality is irreducible and relational, relies on an analysis of the specific relations individuals are in when they share intentional attitudes with one another. One aspect—whose investigation is still in the early stages of development—that helps to further illuminate this is the particular nature of the first person plural indexical ‘we’ (cf. Gilbert 1989; Nunberg 1993; Pettit 2003; de Bruin 2009; Schweikard 2011; Schmid 2005).

3.3 Subject

The philosophically intriguing issues in the theory of intentionality are not confined to its content and mode but include the question as to what sort of entity is or can be a subject of intentionality. This is obviously another core question in the theory of collective intentionality, one where philosophical analysis meets with the interests of social science and normative theorizing. Does it ever make sense to say that a social group is the subject of, or just has, an intention, a belief, or an emotion? Or are such attributions of intentionality to groups merely metaphorical shorthand for referring to the attitudes of their members (Quinton 1975)?

Some authors have developed qualified affirmative responses to the first of these questions and claimed that groups can indeed be subjects (or bearers) of intentional states. One apparently straightforward approach consists in applying the ‘intentional stance’ to groups, i.e., in making groups’ status as intentional subjects dependent on whether their behavior can be interpreted as intentional (cf. Tollefsen 2002a, 2002b, and 2015). For instance, if I see a number of people trying to pull a car out of a ditch, I may be warranted in ascribing relevant beliefs and desires to the group, as in “the group wants to move the car back onto the road.” Cases like this one are familiar from everyday parlance, in which we often encounter attributions of intentional states to corporations or governments. In this respect, interpretationism has the clear advantage of shedding light on the social practice of ascribing intentionality to groups, but the view needs to integrate an account of the conditions under which such ascriptions are justified. It just does not seem to be all there is to being a collective subject of intentionality that a given group can be viewed as such. What is needed to establish that groups can be subjects of intentional states is an elaborate account of their internal structure, i.e., of what constitutes them as proper targets for ascriptions of intentionality. Tollefsen’s interpretationist account here focuses on the rational unity certain groups, such as organizations, are capable of displaying (see Tollefsen 2002a and 2002b, and Rovane 1998).

One influential account along these lines is Margaret Gilbert’s plural subject theory (Gilbert 1989, 1990, 1996, 2000, 2006, 2009, and 2014). Gilbert starts from the basic case of two individuals going for a walk together. On her account, such an activity requires that they take on what she calls a ‘joint commitment,’ which she explains as

a kind of commitment of the will. In this case, the wills of two or more people create it, and two or more people are committed by it. (Gilbert 2006: 134)

A joint commitment can, on this account, only be brought about (or rescinded) jointly. A joint commitment of this kind does not require a “single centre of consciousness” or a “distinctive form of ‘subjectivity’” (2006: 134), it is the commitment precisely of those bound by it. According to Gilbert, each joint commitment is a joint commitment to do X as a body, where substitutions for “X” include “intend”, “believe”, “accept”, and so on. A joint commitment to believe something as a body, for instance, is a commitment to constitute as far as possible a single body that believes that thing, where

the concept of a ‘single body’ is neutral with respect to the question whether the body in question is in some sense composed of individual human beings. (2006:137)

Gilbert takes this not to imply that the individuals involved are (or have to be) personally committed to the attitude in question, e.g., that each or any of them believes what they are jointly committed to believing as a body (cf. Gilbert 2009). However, joint commitments thus specified imply a normative relationship between the parties thereby committed: if A and B are jointly committed in some way, then each of them is obligated to act accordingly and each of them is entitled to demand the other’s conforming action; in other words, they owe each other such action (cf. Gilbert 2009).

Gilbert uses this basic structure of joint commitment to define the type of social group she calls ‘plural subject’:

A and B […] constitute a plural subject (by definition) if and only if they are jointly committed to doing something as a body—in a broad sense of ‘do’. (Gilbert 2006: 145)

Such plural subjects, as a particular sort of social group, can be subjects of intentional states such as intentions, beliefs, and acceptance; this is the point at which the account regards the subject of collective intentionality.

A number of criticisms can be put forth against Gilbert’s plural subject theory; although they were voiced at earlier stages of the development of the theory, their target has not decisively been moved. The first critical point to note is familiar from the discussions in earlier sections of this entry, as it regards a problem of circularity. Does the formation of a joint commitment not already presuppose the sort of joint action by plural subject it is meant to bring about? It seems to be crucial to the account that when two agents say, for instance, ‘Let’s go to the Taj Mahal together!’, they unite in virtue of the joint commitment this involves. But why start precisely there? Couldn’t the two also say, at an earlier point in time, ‘Let’s jointly commit to going to the Taj Mahal together’? There is an apparent danger of regress or indeed of circularity. However, this objection may rely on a superficial reading of Gilbert’s theory. Already in the first complete statement of her view (in Gilbert 1989), she elaborated that the formation of a plural subject, or the entering of a joint commitment, is preceded by an open display of ‘readiness’ on the part of the individual agents. So before they actually become jointly committed to do such-and-such ‘as a body,’ A and B each indicate that they are ready or willing to do so. This reply by extended narrative is weaker than it might look, for either this means that joint commitments are, as it were, put together from personal attitudes of the participants or the respective attitudes instantiate the same sort of circularity that was to be avoided. A possible resort consists in saying that the agents themselves do not presuppose the complicated technical structure termed ‘joint commitment’ or ‘plural subject,’ which renders the alleged problem of circularity one that exists only for the theorist.

A related critical point is that the process through which joint commitments are brought about, in Gilbert’s analysis, already involves some form of collective intentionality. This seems obvious in the case of explicit communication, as any communication is a joint action. But it is also true in those cases in which the agreement is tacit rather than explicit, as this implies some form of mutual understanding between the participants. It seems plausible to assume that mutual understanding, even if it is tacit, is collectively intentional. If Gilbert’s claim is that all collective intentionality is of the form of a joint commitment, her account of the process through which joint commitments are generated seems to presuppose another joint commitment. If individuals already have to be jointly committed in some way in order to enter into a joint commitment, however, either a vicious circle or an infinite regress seems to ensue. A possible solution would be to claim that joint commitments of the sort that Gilbert envisages are a special kind of collective intention, and that they presuppose more basic forms of collective intentionality, which are not joint commitments of the Gilbertian sort (Schmid 2005).

A third critique regards the normative internal structure of plural subject, i.e., the claims that the parties to a joint commitment assume mutual obligations and entitlements and that this is characteristic of the basic phenomenon of joint action. In his discussion of Gilbert’s view, Bratman (1999, chap. 7; 2014, chap. 5) rejects the claim that mutual obligations and entitlements are constitutive features of joint action. He deems it part of the normal etiology of joint activities that the participants create mutual expectations and take on obligations to fulfill them (cf. also Alonso 2009, who elaborates a similar point using the concept of ‘reliance’). But Bratman regards these as consequences rather than as constituents of such activities. In support of Gilbert it should be clarified that she does not speak of the obligations and entitlements in question as moral obligations and entitlements, but treats them rather as directed obligations and as part of the social relationship between the participants (cf. Gilbert 2006: 155).

A fourth criticism of Gilbert’s view targets the scalability of the conception of joint commitment and plural subjects. Gilbert affirms this at great length and claims that even political communities (or societies) can be understood along those lines, thus arguing for a view of which she takes traditional social contract theory to be one version (cf. Gilbert 2006, part II). The merits of such a contractualist approach need not be discussed in the present context, but the underlying claim that one can extrapolate from the basic case of joint action runs into difficulties when it is viewed in combination with Gilbert’s claim that joint commitments cannot be rescinded unilaterally, but only jointly by all of the individuals who undertake it (cf. Gilbert 2009: 182). This feature of the account may seem counterintuitive already in cases of rather spontaneous small-scale joint actions, such as when I meet a colleague on the way to the lecture hall and we fall into walking together for a bit. But the larger the scale, the more implausible this implication becomes. Are we to accept, by way of reductio, that one member of a political community can hold all others to a social contract (Baltzer 2002)?

Although these critical points might affect the overall reception of Gilbert’s theory, it surely provides insights concerning some features a group is likely to exhibit in order to count as a subject of collective intentionality. In particular, its members need to create a structure that turns the group into an unified entity in the sense that it is made the subject of attitudes they together accept and are committed to act on. This may, as Hindriks (2008a) notes, imply that more is needed than the joint commitment that can be explicated in view of phenomena such as spontaneous joint walks. For instance, the formation of an effective citizens’ movement may require that the individual agents involved accept the goal of the joint enterprise and an internal structure in which roles, competencies and decision-making mechanisms are defined (see also French 1984).

Raimo Tuomela gives a more detailed account of the internal structure of what he calls ‘we-groups,’ which he takes to come in different varieties, depending on the strength of their members’ endorsement of and identification with the respective group’s goals (Tuomela 2007, 2013). He draws an analogy between single agents and collective agents (cf. 2007: 85–86), thus setting the stage for the study of the intentionality specific to group phenomena. Tuomela acknowledges that the most familiar collective agents, organizations and corporations, require a more detailed internal structure that encompasses the relationships between their members, relationships between the members and the respective collective agents, and a number of organizational characteristics. In summary, these features comprise members’ collective acceptance of and collective commitment to the group’s goals, a distinction between operative and non-operative group members, the definition of roles and positions within the group, and the institution (or even codification) of a group-internal authority system (see also French 1984 for a similar view of the structure of groups).—It would not pay out at this point to reiterate the reflections on Tuomela’s individualism and we-mode analysis mentioned above; instead, we do well to focus on his specification of the status of such groups.

Tuomela explains that his

account entails that a we-mode group […] is a collective artefact and indeed an organized institutional entity […]. Group members are viewed as functioning in group positions (be they differentiated or not). Thus, a we-mode group can indeed be said to consist of such positions. (Tuomela 2007: 20)

Despite the emphasis he puts on the organizational features of groups, the following statement testifies to the reductionist social ontology Tuomela adopts:

We are here somewhat metaphorically viewing groups as analogous to individual agents (persons). […] In a nutshell, my view is that groups can but need not be taken as (singular) entities, and they are agents and persons only in a metaphorical sense. (Tuomela 2007: 140 and 145)

Thus, on this account, the aforementioned analogy between single and collective agents is not to be overstated and used to infer that collectives are agents that are (ontologically) on a par with single agents. But they may, even on Tuomela’s account, qualify as subjects of intentional states, even as autonomous (cf. Tuomela 2007: 234), insofar as they consist in a particular organizational structure and are upheld by the respective (we-mode-) attitudes of their members.

A third influential ‘subject account’ of collective intentionality was propounded by Philip Pettit (2001a,b, 2003, 2009). The theory of group agency Pettit has since expounded jointly with Christian List (see List & Pettit 2011) is not specifically tailored to this issue or voiced in the respective terminology; the reconstruction in the following thus concentrates on a brief account of Pettit’s initial statement of his view, as it is (in argument and terminology) more explicitly stated within a framework that overlaps with other conceptions of collective intentionality. In contrast to other accounts, Pettit’s does not start from an analysis of joint action or collective intentional states, thus treating the issues of joint agency and group agency as distinguishable (cf. Pettit & Schweikard 2006). Instead, he approaches the issue of whether groups can be subjects of (or have) intentions directly by asking whether they can fulfill general conditions of agency. And he claims that not only can groups fulfill such conditions, but that such groups fulfill them as collective units of agency whose attitudes may be discontinuous with the attitudes of their members (cf. Pettit 2002 and 2003).

In the present context, the latest statement and defense of the entire argumentation centered on conditions of agency cannot be taken up (see Pettit 2007a and List & Pettit 2011, chapters 1–3), the focus will instead be on a partial argument regarding one important step in the larger argumentation. It concerns the question whether groups can be subjects of intention. Here it is:

First premise: there is no intention without a minimum of rationality on the part of the relevant agent. Second premise: collectives can display that minimum of rationality only insofar as they collectivise reason, as I shall put it. Conclusion: only groups that collectivise reason can properly have intentions. (Pettit 2001b: 241)

In short, the argument supports the view that only those groups qualify as subjects of intentions that instantiate a specific kind of rationality (see also Tollefsen 2002). In the initial defense of this view Pettit refers to consistency, closure, and completeness as requirements of rationality (see Pettit 2001b: 243). By this he means that in order to be rational an entity has to maintain only co-tenable attitudes, it forms

all those beliefs and intentions, and performs those actions, that are rationally required by the things it is rightly said to intend (ibid.),

and it forms attitudes on all matters relevant to what it can rightly be said to intend. Whether these requirements are really weak enough to ground only a ‘minimum of rationality’ is not entirely clear.

In view of this description of the conditions of rationality it would not seem as though fulfilling them required a complex form of social organization. A number of agents, one might say, could simply get together, jointly pursue a certain goal and decide all relevant matters by majority voting; it might need some organizational structure, depending on the size of the group, but the aforementioned conditions of rationality should be satisfiable in this way. Pettit rejects this view on the basis of observations about schemes of majority voting that were first, under the label “doctrinal paradox,” noted in jurisprudence, then generalized under the label of the “discursive dilemma” and became the starting point for the ‘theory of judgment aggregation’ (cf. Kornhauser 1992; Pettit 2003; List 2012). The central tenet of these debates is that there is no principled way of securing that aggregations of consistent sets of votes on interconnected issues are themselves consistent.

According to a main lesson from the discursive dilemma, a group that is to count as a subject of intentional states has to implement an internal structure and in particular a mechanism for decision-making. If it is to fulfill the requirements initially given by Pettit, it is “forced to collectivize reason” (Pettit 2001a: 110). This again means that it has to ensure that the majority votes, which are each treated as the group’s view on the respective question, form a consistent set of attitudes, even if that implies reconsidering past or constraining future judgments. So the group has to monitor its attitudes or it may institute a straw vote procedure, which facilitates joint awareness of and deliberation about the group’s views (cf. Pettit 2007a). In the case described above, the only satisfactory strategy, Pettit holds, would consist in treating the majority votes regarding p and q as authoritative, embrace the logical implication and affirm >p&q< (cf. Pettit 2001b: 247). In this way, the group could meet the requirements of rationality. This concludes Pettit’s (early) analysis of the conditions under which groups can count as subjects of intentional states. It targets primarily the processes of group-internal reflection and decision-making.

To conclude this section, it bears mentioning that there is an important but often neglected alternative to studying the subject-aspect of collective intentionality with respect to social groups only. According to this alternative, the subject of intentionality does not have to be a ‘rational unity’ of agents (cf. Rovane 1998; Tollefsen 2002; Pettit 2003). Instead, a conception of collective intentionality can be open to the view that two or more individuals jointly form the subject of their collective intentional attitudes (cf. Smith 2011). At this systematic juncture, the ontological commitment of an account that specifies the nature of the subject of collective intentionality takes center stage. Here again the crucial questions—and the structure is familiar from the discussion of the other two issues of collectivity—are whether what one wants to call the subject of an intentional attitude is irreducible, whether reference to such collective subjects is merely metaphorical, or whether this particular kind of subjecthood can be instantiated by two or more agents jointly.

4. Specific Issues

Whereas the focus of the discussion about collective intentionality is mostly within the domain of the philosophy of mind and action, a series of neighboring philosophical disciplines and social sciences are highly pertinent to this topic.

4.1 Social and Institutional Facts

The interest in the nature of social reality as well as in the structure and normativity of social practices and institutions had been part of philosophical debates long before the incipience of specific debates about collective intentionality. But by now it seems clear that analyses of collective intentionality provide significant contributions to the study of social phenomena, and that they form an important part of the main projects of social ontology (for an overview see Hindriks 2018).

Take the example of money (see Searle 1995: 1): there is an enormous practical difference between a blank piece of paper and a five-dollar bill, but what does this difference consist in? To this some authors, including Searle (1995, 2010) and Tuomela (2002), have replied that the existence of money depends at least partly on collective intentional attitudes, or on a shared practice of treating certain pieces of paper, and not others, as money. This mechanism, which according to Searle (2010) involves the imposition of status functions and specific deontic structures, generalizes to the way communities create and maintain social institutions, to public offices, conventions and cultural sites (such as the Taj Mahal); collective attitudes such as collective acceptance seem to play an ineliminable role in the constitution of such social and institutional facts. The precise structure of collective acceptance, however, is not all that clear. While it is meant to play the role of both creating and maintaining institutional facts—it is by way of collective acceptance that we say that such-and-such is (or counts as) money and it is by way of collective acceptance that we acknowledge of such-and-such that it is (or counts as) money—, it is not easy to see how an attitude, whether collective or not, can fulfill these two functions with opposing directions-of-fit (see Laitinen 2014).

Regardless of these details, integrating a conception of collective intentionality into the study of collective phenomena, which encompass institutional phenomena, is promising for the following very fundamental reason. The central concern of the theory of intentionality is to grasp the unity of, or the interaction between, the natural and the mental. The central concern of the theory of collective intentionality is to grasp the connections and interactions between the mental and the social. And this is how the theory of collective intentionality can be viewed as part of an encompassing ontological project.

On a more confined terrain, the theory of collective intentionality raises and contributes to elaborating on several specific issues in social ontology. As noted in the previous subsection, the theory of group agency—including the issue of whether collective entities can count as subjects of intentional states—poses questions about the ontological status of groups and group agents, and it invites reiterations of familiar discussions about reduction, supervenience, constitution, and composition (and more). But the theory of joint action, especially if it is viewed as involving questions about the specific relations between cooperators or co-agents, already raises issues regarding the social identity of persons. And once intersubjective relations are cast against the background of joint projects and shared practices, the study of collective intentionality enters a direct exchange with the analysis of recognition and recognitive attitudes (cf. Ikäheimo & Laitinen (eds.) 2011).

4.2 Collective Responsibility

The debates about collective responsibility began at least six decades ago and by now constitute a distinct field of research in moral, political, and legal philosophy (cf. the entry on collective responsibility). Accounts of collective intentionality, of joint action and group agency, can contribute to clarifying the conceptual, action-theoretic and ontological foundations of the phenomena in question (cf. May & Tuomela (eds.) 2007). Indeed, some influential contributions to the study of social phenomena stem from debates about collective responsibility and they proved to be important points of reference in discussions about collective intentionality (cf., e.g., Copp 1979, 1980; French 1979, 1984; see also May & Hoffman (eds.) 1991 and Barzagan-Forward & Tollefsen (eds.) 2020).

The closest systematic connection between these two fields regards the preconditions of (ascriptions of) responsibility. Assuming, more or less uncontroversially, that there is no responsibility without agency, intentionality, freedom, or autonomy on the part of the entity to whom responsibility is ascribed or who is held accountable, an account of collective responsibility will have to include conceptions of collective agency, collective intentionality, collective freedom, and/or collective autonomy (see, e.g., Hindriks 2008b, Smiley 2018). In analogy to the now widely accepted differentiations between joint action and group agency, one may also ask under what conditions a number of agents, who do not form or belong to an organized group, can be jointly responsible for an action they performed jointly, for an event they brought about through the joint action, or for events that occurred as a consequence of a joint omission (cf. Petersson 2008).

As with the most discussed issues in the theory of collective intentionality, there is a fundamental divide between individualist and non-individualist (or collectivist) conceptions of collective responsibility (cf. May 1992; Miller & Makela 2005; Miller 2006). The former hold that only individual agents or natural persons can be properly held responsible, while the latter hold that some collectives do count as subjects of responsibility (cf. Mathiesen 2006; Pettit 2007b; Hindriks 2009); depending on context and group size, there may be a number of tenable intermediate positions on this spectrum. In any case, it seems plausible to assume that one’s account of collective responsibility should not be starkly discontinuous with one’s account of collective agency. And it seems hardly spectacular to assume that a differentiated account of collective intentionality can inform a differentiated account of collective responsibility. Systematically minded social philosophers are called upon to take up these challenges.

4.3 Team Reasoning

Coordination is a basic social phenomenon. It comes into play when there are two or more agents each of which has two or more options which are known to the agents to be interdependent in such a way that it does not matter so much to any individual participant which option is chosen, just as long as all agents converge on one option. Coordination usually involves conventions. Driving on the right side may not per se be seen as preferable to driving on the left side, but all rational participants in motorized traffic easily agree that there needs to be some convention here, and observe it in practice. If in situations of pure coordination (with no conflict of interest) there is a convention, it seems natural to say that it is rational for the participants to act accordingly.

Surprisingly, classical game theory fails to support this intuition. From a classical game theoretical point of view, the fact that the right-side traffic rule is common knowledge between agents does not make it rational to act accordingly. All that can be said is that it is rational for A to stick to the convention if A expects the other to stick to the convention, too. However, the same holds true for a violation of the convention. If A expects B to violate the convention, it is rational for him to do likewise in order to avoid a collision. As there is common knowledge of rationality, however, A knows that B will stick to the convention only if he or she expects A to do likewise. Thus the condition cannot be settled, and the assertoric judgment that it is better to stick to the convention cannot be derived from the hypothetical judgment that this is the thing to do if the other does so as well. As the rational choice, classical game theory recommends a mixed strategy in such situations, which is remarkably bad advice for real life, and luckily descriptively inadequate.

One might think that rational coordination is made easier for the agents posited in game theoretic models if deviation from the convention is sanctioned (e.g., by fines inflicted on those drivers which violate the traffic rule). In that case, there is typically one coordination equilibrium which is better for both, and another coordination equilibrium which is worse for both, but still better as failures to coordinate. Yet this does surprisingly little to change the situation from a classical game-theoretic point of view. In fact, this shifts the recommended mixed strategy somewhat into the direction of more frequent selection of violation of the convention.

A series of authors have argued that this reveals a fundamental flaw in the game-theoretic setting and appeals to collective intentionality have persistently been made in this context. The idea is that agents may choose from a joint perspective; they do not consider what’s best for them, individually, given the other’s expected choice, but look at such situations with an eye on what’s best for them, jointly. One way of putting this is to say that the failure of the classical model is to assume an identity of the chooser that is fixed on the individual rather than seeing the identity of the chooser as variable. Michael Bacharach (2006), Robert Sugden (1993, 2000) and Martin Hollis (1998) have developed corresponding accounts. In contrast to the literature on collective intentionality, these accounts focus on ways of reasoning rather than forms of intention, or mental attitudes. However, these approaches can be seen as complementary to each other (Hakli, Miller & Tuomela 2010; see also Petersson 2016). Gold and Sugden (2007) criticize Tuomela’s, Bratman’s, Searle’s and Gilbert’s accounts of collective intentionality, arguing that focusing on mental states or attitudes rather than modes of reasoning makes it impossible to see what is genuinely collective about collective intentions. In their view, collective intentions are the product of we-reasoning—a view that is challenged by the phenomenon of spontaneous joint intentions, and perhaps by the circularity problem that team reasoning already supposes some sense of doing something together.

4.4 The Mark of Mankind

Collective or shared intentionality has been assigned a prominent role in recent research in evolutionary anthropology and developmental psychology. Michael Tomasello and his collaborators have suggested that our capacity for shared intentionality is the most basic difference between humans and other primates. The evidence quoted for this claim is that while other primates seem to be apt strategic reasoners with an impressively well-developed sense of what other individuals perceive and want, the propensity to joint attention and the inclination to cooperation even where this does not immediately serve one’s own purposes is uniquely human. Tomasello argues that this basic cooperative-mindedness expresses a specifically human capacity for shared intentionality (Tomasello & Racokzy 2003). It is only on this base that other distinctively human capacities, such as the capacity for language and morality, can develop (Tomasello 2009, 2016). Tomasello refers to Searle’s, Gilbert’s and Bratman’s accounts, but remains largely noncommittal as to the question of what exactly the conception of shared intention he has in mind amounts to (Schmid 2012). However, his conception suggests that a Searlean version may be the basic form of shared intention, and that a normatively stabilized conception of collective intentionality as developed by Gilbert may be adequate for the forms of shared intention coming a later stage in development. If Tomasello is right in claiming that the basic capacity for shared intention precedes the development of a full theory of mind, this places tight conceptual restriction on an adequate analysis of basic shared intention, this seems to rule out the common knowledge-condition that is implied even in Searle’s (2010) account.


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Other Internet Resources


We would like to thank Margaret Gilbert, Raimo Tuomela, Deborah Tollefsen, Arto Laitinen, Thomas Smith, Alessandro Salice, Frank Hindriks, Michael Schmitz, Natalie Gold, Katharina Bernhard, and an anonymous referee for their helpful comments on previous drafts of this entry.

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