First published Thu Oct 4, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jun 7, 2024

Communitarianism is the idea that human identities are largely shaped by different kinds of constitutive communities (or social relations) and that this conception of human nature should inform our moral and political judgments as well as policies and institutions. We live most of our lives in communities, similar to lions who live in social groups rather than individualistic tigers who live alone most of the time. Those communities shape, and ought to shape, our moral and political judgments and we have a strong obligation to support and nourish the particular communities that provide meaning for our lives, without which we’d be disoriented, deeply lonely, and incapable of informed moral and political judgment.

Communitarian ideas have a long history, in the West, China, and elsewhere, but modern-day communitarianism began in the upper reaches of Anglo-American academia in the form of a critical reaction to John Rawls’ landmark 1971 book A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971). Drawing primarily upon the insights of Aristotle and Hegel, political philosophers such as Alasdair MacIntyre, Michael Sandel, Charles Taylor and Michael Walzer disputed Rawls’ assumption that the principal task of government is to secure and distribute fairly the liberties and economic resources individuals need to lead freely chosen lives. These critics of liberal theory never did identify themselves with the communitarian movement (the communitarian label was pinned on them by others, usually critics),[1] much less offer a grand communitarian theory as a systematic alternative to liberalism. Nonetheless, certain core arguments meant to contrast with liberalism’s devaluation of community recur in the works of the four theorists named above (Avineri & de-Shalit 1992, Bell 1993, Berten et al. 1997, Mulhall & Swift 1996, and Rasmussen 1990), and for purposes of clarity one can distinguish between claims of three sorts: methodological claims about the importance of tradition and social context for moral and political reasoning, ontological or metaphysical claims about the social nature of the self, and normative claims about the value of community.[2]

This essay is therefore divided in three parts, and for each part I present the main communitarian claims, followed by an argument (in each part) that philosophical concerns in the 1980s have largely given way to the political concerns that motivated much of the communitarian critique in the first place.

1. Universalism Versus Particularism

Communitarians have sought to deflate the universal pretensions of liberal theory. The main target has been Rawls description of the original position as an “Archimedean point” from which the structure of a social system can be appraised, a position whose special virtue is that it allows us to regard the human condition “from the perspective of eternity”,[3] from all social and temporal points of view. Whereas Rawls seemed to present his theory of justice as universally true, communitarians argued that the standards of justice must be found in forms of life and traditions of particular societies and hence can vary from context to context. Alasdair MacIntyre and Charles Taylor argued that moral and political judgment will depend on the language of reasons and the interpretive framework within which agents view their world, hence that it makes no sense to begin the political enterprise by abstracting from the interpretive dimensions of human beliefs, practices, and institutions (Taylor 1985, ch. 1; MacIntyre 1978, chs.18–22 and 1988, ch.1; Benhabib 1992, pp. 23–38, 89n4). Michael Walzer developed the additional argument that effective social criticism must derive from and resonate with the habits and traditions of actual people living in specific times and places. Even if there is nothing problematic about a formal procedure of universalizability meant to yield a determinate set of human goods and values, “any such set would have to be considered in terms so abstract that they would be of little use in thinking about particular distributions” (Walzer 1983, 8; Young 1990, 4). In short, liberals who ask what is just by abstracting from particular social contexts are doomed to philosophical incoherence and liberal theorists who adopt this method to persuade people to do the just thing are doomed to political irrelevance.

Rawls has since tried to eliminate the universalist presuppositions from his theory. In Political Liberalism, (Rawls 1993) he argues in a communitarian vein that his conception of the person as impartial citizen provides the best account of liberal-democratic political culture and that his political aim is only to work out the rules for consensus in political communities where people are willing to try for consensus. In the Law of Peoples, (Rawls 1999) he explicitly allows for the possibility that liberalism may not be exportable at all times and places, sketching a vision of a “decent, well-ordered society” that liberal societies must tolerate in the international realm. Such a society, he argues, need not be democratic, but it must be non-aggressive towards other communities, and internally it must have a “common good conception of justice”, a “reasonable consultation hierarchy”, and it must secure basic human rights. Having said that, one still gets the sense that the liberal vision laid out in A Theory of Justice is the best possible political ideal, one that all rational individuals would want if they were able to choose between the available political alternatives. There may be justifiable non-liberal regimes, but these should be regarded as second best to be tolerated and perhaps respected, not idealized or emulated.

Other liberal theorists have taken a harder line against communitarian concessions, arguing that liberal theory can and should present itself as a universally valid ideal. Brian Barry, for one, opens his widely cited book Justice as Impartiality by boldly affirming the universality of his theory: “I continue to believe in the possibility of putting forward a universally valid case in favor of liberal egalitarian principles” (Barry 1995, 3). Barry does recognize that a theory of justice must be anchored in substantive moral considerations, but his normative vision appears to be limited to the values and practices of liberal Western societies. He seems distinctly uninterested in learning anything worthwhile from non-Western political traditions: for example, his discussion of things Chinese is confined to brief criticisms of the Cultural Revolution and the traditional practice of foot-binding. One might consider the reaction to a Chinese intellectual who puts forward a universal theory of justice that draws on the Chinese political tradition for inspiration and completely ignores the history and moral argumentation in Western societies, except for brief criticisms of slavery and imperialism.

Still, it must be conceded that 1980s communitarian theorists were less-than-successful at putting forward attractive visions of non-liberal societies. The communitarian case for pluralism for the need to respect and perhaps learn from non-liberal societies that may be as good as, if not better than, the liberal societies of the West may have been unintentionally undermined by their own use of (counter) examples. In After Virtue, Alasdair MacIntyre defended the Aristotelian ideal of the intimate, reciprocating local community bound by shared ends, where people simply assume and fulfill socially given roles (MacIntyre 1984). But this pre-modern Gemeinschaft conception of an all-encompassing community that members unreflectively endorse seemed distinctly ill-suited for complex and conflict-ridden large-scale industrialized societies. In Spheres of Justice, Michael Walzer pointed to the Indian caste system, “where the social meanings are integrated and hierarchical” (Walzer 1983, 313) as an example of a non-liberal society that may be just according to its own standards. Not surprisingly, few readers were inspired by this example of non-liberal justice (not to mention the fact that many contemporary Indian thinkers view the caste system as an unfortunate legacy of the past that Indians should strive hard to overcome). In short, this use of ill-informed examples may have unintentionally reinforced the view that there are few if any justifiable alternatives to liberalism in modern societies. Communitarians could score some theoretical points by urging liberal thinkers to be cautious about developing universal arguments founded exclusively on the moral argumentation and political experience of Western liberal societies, but few thinkers would really contemplate the possibility of non-liberal practices appropriate for the modern world so long as the alternatives to liberalism consisted of Golden Ages, caste societies, fascism, or actually-existing communism. For the communitarian critique of liberal universalism to have any lasting credibility, thinkers need to provide compelling counter-examples to modern-day liberal-democratic regimes and 1980s communitarians came up short.

By the 1990s, fairly abstract methodological disputes over universalism versus particularism faded from academic prominence, and the debate now centers on the theory and practice of universal human rights. This is largely due to the increased political salience of human rights since the collapse of communism in the former Soviet bloc. On the liberal side, the new, more political voices for liberal universalism have been represented by the likes of Francis Fukuyama, who famously argued that liberal democracy’s triumph over its rivals signifies the end of history (Fukuyama 1992). This view also revived (and provoked) the second wave communitarian critique of liberal universalism and the debate became much more concrete and political in orientation.

Needless to say, the brief moment of liberal euphoria that followed the collapse of the communism in the Soviet bloc has given way to a sober assessment of the difficulties of implementing liberal practices outside the Western world. It is now widely recognized that brutal ethnic warfare, crippling poverty, environmental degradation, and pervasive corruption, to name some of the more obvious troubles afflicting the developing world, pose serious obstacles to the successful establishment and consolidation of liberal democratic political arrangements. But these were seen as unfortunate (hopefully temporary) afflictions that may delay the end of history when liberal democracy has finally triumphed over its rivals. They were not meant to pose a challenge to the ideal of liberal democracy. It was widely assumed that liberal democracy is something that all rational individuals would want if they could get it.

The deeper challenge to Western liberal democracy has emerged from the East Asian region.[4] In the 1990s, the debate revolved around the notion of “Asian values”, a term devised by several Asian officials and their supporters for the purpose of challenging Western-style civil and political freedoms. Asians, they claim, place special emphasis upon family and social harmony, with the implication that those in the chaotic and crumbling societies of the West should think twice about intervening in Asia for the sake of promoting human rights and democracy. As Singapore’s Lee Kuan Yew put it, Asians have “little doubt that a society with communitarian values where the interests of society take precedence over that of the individual suits them better than the individualism of America”.[5] Such claims attracted international attention primarily because East Asian leaders seemed to be presiding over what a U.N. human development report called ‘the most sustained and widespread development miracle of the twentieth century, perhaps all history’.[6] In 1997–98, however, the East Asian miracle seemed to have collapsed. And it looks like Asian values was one casualty of the crisis.

The political factors that focused attention on the East Asian challenge remain in place, however. East Asian economies did eventually recover. China in particular looks set to become an economic and political heavyweight with the power to seriously challenge the hegemony of Western liberal democratic values in international fora (see Bell 2015). Thus, one hears frequent calls for cross-cultural dialogue between the West and the East designed to understand and perhaps learn from the other side. Failing to take seriously East Asian political perspectives risks widening misunderstandings and setting the stage for hostilities that could have been avoided.

From a theoretical point of view, however, it must be conceded that the official debate on Asian values has not provided much of a challenge to dominant Western political outlooks. The main problem is that the debate has been led by Asian leaders who seem to be motivated primarily by political considerations, rather than by a sincere desire to make a constructive contribution to the debate on universalism versus particularism. Thus, it was easy to dismiss—rightly so, in most cases—the Asian challenge as nothing but a self-serving ploy by government leaders to justify their authoritarian rule in the face of increasing demands for democracy at home and abroad.

Still, it would be a mistake to assume that nothing of theoretical significance has emerged from East Asia. The debate on Asian values has also prompted critical intellectuals in the region to reflect on how they can locate themselves in a debate on human rights and democracy in which they had not previously played a substantial part. Neither wholly rejecting nor wholly endorsing the values and practices ordinarily realized through a liberal democratic political regime, these intellectuals are drawing on their own cultural traditions and exploring areas of commonality and difference with the West. Though often less provocative than the views of their governments in the sense that few argue for the wholesale rejection of Western-style liberal democracy with an East Asian alternative these unofficial East Asian viewpoints may offer more lasting contributions to the debate. Let me (briefly) note three relatively persuasive East Asian arguments for cultural particularism that contrast with traditional Western arguments for liberal universalism (see Bell 2006, ch. 3):

  1. Cultural factors can affect the prioritizing of rights, and this matters when rights conflict and it must be decided which one to sacrifice. In other words, different societies may rank rights differently, and even if they face a similar set of disagreeable circumstances they may come to different conclusions about the right that needs to be curtailed. For example, U.S. citizens may be more willing to sacrifice a social or economic right in cases of conflict with a civil or political right: if neither the constitution nor a majority of democratically elected representatives support universal access to health care, then the right to health care regardless of income can be curtailed. In contrast, the Chinese may be more willing to sacrifice a civil or political liberty in cases of conflict with a social or economic right: there may be wide support for restrictions on the right to form independent labor associations if they are necessary to provide the conditions for economic development. Different priorities assigned to rights can also matter when it must be decided how to spend scarce resources. For example, East Asian societies with a Confucian heritage will place great emphasis upon the value of education, and they may help to explain the large amount of spending on education compared to other societies with similar levels of economic development.

  2. Cultural factors can affect the justification of rights. In line with the arguments of “1980s communitarians” such as Michael Walzer, it is argued that justifications for particular practices valued by Western-style liberal democrats should not be made by relying on the abstract and unhistorical universalism that often disables Western liberal democrats. Rather, they should be made from the inside, from specific examples and argumentative strategies that East Asians themselves use in everyday moral and political debate. For example, the moral language (shared even by some local critics of authoritarianism) tends to appeal to the value of community in East Asia, and this is relevant for social critics concerned with practical effect. One such communitarian argument is that democratic rights in Singapore can be justified on the grounds that they contribute to strengthening ties to such communities as the family and the nation (see below, section III).

  3. Cultural factors can provide moral foundations for distinctive political practices and institutions (or at least different from those found in Western-style liberal democracies). In East Asian societies influenced by Confucianism, for example, it is widely held that children have a profound duty to care for elderly parents, a duty to be forsaken only in the most exceptional circumstances.[7] In political practice, it means that East Asian governments have an obligation to provide the social and economic conditions that facilitate the realization of this duty. Political debate tends to center on the question of whether the right to filial piety is best realized by means of a law that makes it mandatory for children to provide financial support for elderly parents as in mainland China, Japan, and Singapore or whether the state should rely more on indirect methods such as tax breaks and housing benefits that simply make at-home care for the elderly easier, as in Korea and Hong Kong. But the argument that there is a pressing need to secure this duty in East Asia is not a matter of political controversy.

    Thinkers influenced by East Asian cultural traditions such Confucianism have also argued for distinctive as-yet-unrealized political practices and institutions that draw on widely-held cultural values for inspiration. For example, the Chinese thinker Jiang Qing has argued for a tricameral legislature appropriate for the Chinese context, with a meritocratic “House of Exemplary Persons” and a “House of Cultural Continuity” that would complement and balance a democratic legislature (Jiang 2012). Korean scholars Hahm Chaihark and Jongryn Mo argue for the need to revive and adapt for the contemporary era such Choson dynasty institutions as policy lectures and the Confucian censorate, traditional institutions that played the role of monitoring the dealings of the Emperor (Hahm (Chaihark) 2003, Mo 2003, Bell 2000, ch. 5).

In contrast to 1980s communitarian thinkers, East Asian critics of liberal universalism have succeeded in pointing to particular non-liberal practices and institutions that may be appropriate for the contemporary world. Some of these may be appropriate only for societies with a Confucian heritage, others may also offer insights for mitigating the excesses of liberal modernity in the West. What cannot be denied is that they have carried forward the debate beyond the implausible alternatives to liberalism offered by 1980s communitarian thinkers.

It is worth emphasizing, however, that contemporary communitarians have not been merely defending parochial attachments to particular non-liberal moralities. Far from arguing that the universalist discourse on human rights should be entirely displaced with particular, tradition-sensitive political language, they have criticized liberals for not taking universality seriously enough, for failing to do what must be done to make human rights a truly universal ideal. These communitarians—let us label them the “cosmopolitan critics of liberal universalism”—have suggested various means of improving the philosophical coherence and political appeal of human rights.

In fact, there is little debate over the desirability of a core set of human rights, such as prohibitions against slavery, genocide, murder, torture, prolonged arbitrary detention, and systematic racial discrimination. These rights have become part of international customary law, and they are not contested in the public rhetoric of the international arena. Of course many gross violations occur off the record, and human rights groups such as Amnesty International have the task of exposing the gap between public allegiance to rights and the sad reality of ongoing abuse. This is largely practical work, however. There is not much point writing about or deliberating about the desirability of practices that everyone condemns at the level of principle.

But political thinkers and activists around the world can and do take different sides on many pressing human rights concerns that fall outside what Walzer terms the “minimal and universal moral code” (Walzer 1987, 24; Walzer 1994). This gray area of debate includes criminal law, family law, women’s rights, social and economic rights, the rights of indigenous peoples, and the attempt to universalize Western-style democratic practices. The question is: how can the current thin list of universal human rights be expanded to include some of these contested rights?

Charles Taylor has put forward the following proposal (Taylor 1999). He imagines a cross-cultural dialogue between representatives of different traditions. Rather than argue for the universal validity of their views, however, he suggests that participants should allow for the possibility that their own beliefs may be mistaken. This way, participants can learn from each others’ “moral universe”. There will come a point, however, when differences cannot be reconciled. Taylor explicitly recognizes that different groups, countries, religious communities, and civilizations hold incompatible fundamental views on theology, metaphysics, and human nature. In response, Taylor argues that a “genuine, unforced consensus” on human rights norms is possible only if we allow for disagreement on the ultimate justifications of those norms. Instead of defending contested foundational values when we encounter points of resistance (and thus condemning the values we do not like in other societies), we should try to abstract from those beliefs for the purpose of working out an “overlapping consensus” (to borrow from Rawls’s 1993 terminology) of human rights norms. As Taylor puts it, “we would agree on the norms while disagreeing on why they were the right norms, and we would be content to live in this consensus, undisturbed by the differences of profound underlying belief” (Taylor 1999, 124).

While Taylor’s proposal moves the debate on universal human rights forward, it still faces certain difficulties. For one thing, it may not be realistic to expect that people will be willing to abstract from the values they care deeply about during the course of a global dialogue on human rights. Even if people agree to abstract from culturally specific ways of justifying and implementing norms, the likely outcome is a withdrawal to a highly general, abstract realm of agreement that fails to resolve actual disputes over contested rights. For example, participants in a cross-cultural dialogue can agree on the right not to be subject to cruel and unusual punishment while radically disagreeing upon what this means in practice—a committed Muslim can argue that theft can justifiably be punished by amputation of the right hand,[8] whereas a Western liberal will want to label this an example of cruel and unusual punishment.

As we have seen, the debate on universalism versus particularism has moved from fairly abstract methodological disputes between Anglo-American philosophers to relatively concrete international political disputes between philosophers, social scientists, government officials, and NGO activists. The distinctive communitarian contribution has been to cast doubt on universal theories grounded exclusively in the liberal moralities of the Western world, on the grounds that cultural particularity should both make one sensitive to the possibility of justifiable areas of difference between the West and the rest and to the need for more cross-cultural dialogue for the purpose of improving the current thin human rights regime. Various contributions from East Asia and elsewhere have given some meat to these challenges to liberal universalism. In any case, let us now turn to the second main area of controversy between liberals and communitarians—the debate over the self that has similarly moved from philosophy to politics.

2. The Debate Over the Self

Communitarian thinkers in the 1980s such as Michael Sandel and Charles Taylor argued that Rawlsian liberalism rests on an overly individualistic conception of the self. Whereas Rawls argues that we have a supreme interest in shaping, pursuing, and revising our own life-plans, he neglects the fact that our selves tend to be defined or constituted by various communal attachments (e.g., ties to the family or to a religious tradition) so close to us that they can only be set aside at great cost, if at all. This insight led to the view that politics should not be concerned solely with securing the conditions for individuals to exercise their powers of autonomous choice, as we also need to sustain and promote the social attachments crucial to our sense of well-being and respect, many of which have been involuntarily picked up during the course of our upbringing. First, however, let us review the ontological or metaphysical debate over the self that led to this political conclusion.

In an influential essay titled “Atomism”, Charles Taylor objected to the liberal view that “men are self-sufficient outside of society”. (Taylor 1985, 2000) Instead, Taylor defends the Aristotelian view that “Man is a social animal, indeed a political animal, because he is not self-sufficient alone, and in an important sense is not self-sufficient outside a polis” (Taylor 1985, 190). Moreover, this atomistic view of the self can undermine liberal society, because it fails to grasp the extent to which liberalism presumes a context where individuals are members of, and committed to, a society that promotes particular values such as freedom and individual diversity. Fortunately, most people in liberal societies do not really view themselves as atomistic selves.

But do liberal thinkers actually defend the idea that the self is created ex-nihilo, outside of any social context and that humans can exist (and flourish) independently of all social contexts? In fact, Taylor’s essay was directed at the libertarian thinker Robert Nozick. As it turns out, the communitarian critique of the atomistic self does not apply to Rawlsian liberalism: in Part III of Theory of Justice, Rawls pays close attention to the psychological and social conditions that facilitate the formation of liberal selves committed to justice (Lefebvre 2024). But few readers ever got to Part III of Rawls’ massive tome, so communitarians got quite a bit of mileage from their critique of liberal atomism. This charge didn’t stick, however.

While liberals may not have been arguing that individuals can completely extricate themselves from their social context, the liberal valuation of choice still seemed to suggest an image of a subject who impinges his will on the world.[9] Drawing on the insights of Heidegger and Wittgenstein, communitarians argued that this view neglects the extent to which individuals are embodied agents in the world. Far from acting in ways designed to realize an autonomously arrived-at life-plan, vast areas of our lives are in fact governed by unchosen routines and habits that lie in the background. More often than not we act in ways specified by our social background when we walk, dress, play games, speak, and so on without having formulated any goals or made any choices. It is only when things break down from the normal, everyday, unchosen mode of existence that we think of ourselves as subjects dealing with an external world, having the experience of formulating various ways of executing our goals, choosing from among those ways, and accepting responsibility for the outcomes of our actions. In other words, traditional intentionality is introduced at the point that our ordinary way of coping with things is insufficient. Yet this breakdown mode is what we tend to notice, and philosophers have therefore argued that most of our actions are occasioned by processes of reflection. Liberals have picked up this mistaken assumption, positing the idea of a subject who seeks to realize an autonomously arrived-at life-plan, losing sight of the fact that critical reflection upon one’s ends is nothing more than one possibility that arises when our ordinary ways of coping with things is insufficient to get things done.

Some liberals have replied by recognizing the point that vast areas of our lives are governed by unchosen habits and routines, that the deliberate, effortful, choosing subject mode may be the exception rather than the rule. They emphasize, however, that the main justification for a liberal politics concerned primarily with securing the conditions for individuals to lead autonomous lives rests on the possibility and desirability of normative self-determination, that is, on the importance of making choices with respect to things that we value (Doppelt 1989). While it may be true that certain communal practices often, or even mostly, guide our behavior behind our backs, it doesn’t follow that those practices ought to be valued, or reflectively endorsed in non-ordinary moments of existence, much less that the government ought somehow to promote these practices. And what liberals care about ultimately is the provision of the rights, powers, and opportunities that individuals need to develop and implement their own conceptions of the good life.

This qualified version of the liberal self, however, still seems to imply that moral outlooks are, or should be, the product of individual choice. One’s social world, communitarians can reply, provides more than non-moral social practices like table manners and pronunciation norms—it also provides some sort of orientation in moral space. We cannot make sense of our moral experience unless we situate ourselves within this given moral space, within the authoritative moral horizons. What Charles Taylor calls “higher, strongly evaluated goods” (Taylor 1989)—the goods we should feel committed to, those that generate moral obligations on us regardless of our actual preferences are not somehow invented by individuals, but rather they are located within the social world which provides one’s framework of the lower and the higher. Thus, the liberal ideal of a self who freely invents her own moral outlook, or private conception of the good, cannot do justice to our actual moral experience.

But once again, liberals need not deny the assumption that our social world provides a framework of the higher and the lower nor need it be presumed that we must regard our own moral outlook as freely invented. Will Kymlicka, for example, explicitly recognizes that things have worth for us in so far as they are granted significance by our culture, in so far as they fit into a pattern of activities which is recognized by those sharing a certain form of life as a way of leading a good life (Kymlicka 1989, 166). That one’s social world provides the range of things worth doing, achieving, or being does not, however, undermine the liberal emphasis on autonomy, for there is still substantial room for individual choice to be made within this set. The best life is still the one where the individual chooses what is worth doing, achieving, or being, though it may be that this choice has to be made within a certain framework which is itself unchosen.

Communitarians can reply by casting doubt on the view that choice is intrinsically valuable, that a certain moral principle or communal attachment is more valuable simply because it has been chosen following deliberation among alternatives by an individual subject. If we have a highest-order interest in choosing our central projects and life-plans, regardless of what is chosen, it ought to follow that there is something fundamentally wrong with unchosen attachments and projects. But this view violates our actual self-understandings. We ordinarily think of ourselves, Michael Sandel says, “as members of this family or community or nation or people, as bearers of this history, as sons or daughters of that revolution, as citizens of this republic”, (Sandel 1981, 179) social attachments that more often than not are involuntarily picked up during the course of our upbringing, rational choice having played no role whatsoever. I didn’t choose to love my mother and father, to care about the neighborhood in which I grew up, to have special feelings for the people of my country, and it is difficult to understand why anyone would think I have chosen these attachments, or that I ought to have done so. In fact, there may even be something distasteful about someone who questions the things he or she deeply cares about—certainly no marriage could survive too long if fundamental understandings regarding love and trust were constantly thrown open for discussion! Nor is it obvious that, say, someone who performs a good deed following prolonged calculation of pros and cons is morally superior than a Mother-Teresa type who unreflectively, spontaneously acts on behalf of other people’s interests.

Liberals can reply that the real issue is not the desirability of choice, but rather the possibility of choice. There may well be some unchosen attachments that need not be critically reflected upon and endorsed, and it may even be the case that excessive deliberation about the things we care about can occasionally be counter-productive. But some of our ends may be problematic and that is why we have a fundamental interest in being able to question and revise them. Most important is not choosing our own life-plans; rather, liberalism founded on the value of self-determination requires only that we be able to critically evaluate our ends if need be, hence that “no end or goal is exempt from possible re-examination” (Kymlicka 1989, 52; Dworkin 1989, 489; Macedo 1990, 247). For example, an oppressed woman has a fundamental interest in being able to critically reflect upon traditional understandings of what it means to be a good wife and mother, and it would be unjust to foreclose her freedom to radically revise her plans.

This response, however, still leaves open the possibility of a deep challenge to liberal foundations. Perhaps we are able to reexamine some attachments, but the problem for liberalism arises if there are others so fundamental to our identity that they cannot be set aside, and that any attempt to do so will result in serious and perhaps irreparable psychological damage. In fact, this challenge to liberalism would only require that communitarians be able to identify one end or communal attachment so constitutive of one’s identity that it cannot be revised and rejected. A psychoanalyst, for example, may want to argue that (at least in some cases) it is impossible to choose to shed the attachment one feels for one’s mother, and that an attempt may lead to perverse and unintended consequences. A feminist theorist may point to the mother-child relationship as an example of a constitutive feature of one’s identity and argue that any attempt to deny this fails to be sensitive to women’s special needs and experiences (Frazer & Lacey 1993, 53–60). An anthropologist may argue on the basis of field observations that it is impossible for an Inuit person from Canada’s far north to suddenly decide to stop being an Inuit and that the only sensible response is to recognize and accept this constitutive feature of his identity. Or a gay liberation activist may claim that it is both impossible and undesirable for gays to repress their biologically-given sexual identity. These arguments are not implausible, and they seem to challenge the liberal view that no particular end or commitment should be beyond critical reflection and open to revision.

Let us assume, for the sake of argument, that we can identify one particular attachment so deeply-embedded that it is impossible to really bring to conscious awareness and so significant for one’s well-being that an individual can only forsake commitment to its good at the cost of being seriously psychologically disturbed. This end is beyond willed change and one loses a commitment to it at the price of being thrown into a state of disorientation where one is unable to take a stand on many things of significance (Taylor 1989, 26–7). Does this really threaten liberal politics? It may, if liberal politics really rests on the liberal self. Fortunately, that is not the case. Rereading some of the communitarian texts from the 1980s, there seems to have been an assumption that once you expose faulty foundations regarding the liberal self, the whole liberal edifice will come tumbling down. The task is to criticize the underlying philosophy of the self, win people on your side, and then we can move on to a brand new communitarian society that owes nothing to the liberal tradition. This must have been an exhilarating time for would-be revolutionaries, but more level-headed communitarians soon realized that overthrowing liberal rights was never part of the agenda. Even if liberals are wrong to deny the existence of constitutive ends—even if the philosophical justifications for a liberal form of social organization founded on the value of reflective choice are rotten to the core—there are still many, relatively pragmatic reasons for caring about rights in the modern world. To name some of the more obvious benefits, liberal rights often contribute to security, political stability and economic modernization.

In short, the whole debate about the self appears to have been somewhat misconceived. Liberals were wrong to think they needed to provide iron-clad philosophies of the self to justify liberal politics, and communitarians were wrong to think that challenging those foundations was sufficient to undermine liberal politics. Not surprisingly, both sides soon got tired of debating the pros and cons of the liberal self. By the early 1990s, this liberal-communitarian debate over the self had effectively faded from view in Anglo-American philosophy.[10]

So what remains of the communitarian conception of the self? What may be distinctive about communitarians is that they are more inclined to argue that individuals have a vital interest in leading decent communal lives, with the political implication that there may be a need to sustain and promote the communal attachments crucial to our sense of well-being. This is not necessarily meant to challenge the liberal view that some of our communal attachments can be problematic and may need to be changed, thus that the state needs to protect our powers to shape, pursue, and revise our own life-plans. But our interest in community may occasionally conflict with our other vital interest in leading freely chosen lives, and the communitarian view is that the latter does not automatically trump the former in cases of conflict. On the continuum between freedom and community, communitarians are more inclined to draw the line towards the latter.

But these conflicts cannot be resolved in the abstract. Much turns on empirical analyses of actual politics—to what extent our interest in community is indeed threatened by excess liberal politics, to what extent the state can play a role in remedying the situation, to what extent the nourishment of communal ties should be left to civil society, and so on. This is where the political communitarians of the last decade have shed some light. Let us now turn to the politics of community, the third major strand of the communitarian thought.

3. The Politics of Community

In retrospect, it seems obvious that communitarian critics of liberalism may have been motivated not so much by philosophical concerns as by certain pressing political concerns, namely, the negative social and psychological effects related to the atomistic tendencies of modern liberal societies. Whatever the soundness of liberal principles, in other words, the fact remains that many communitarians seem worried by a perception that traditional liberal institutions and practices have contributed to, or at least do not seem up to the task of dealing with, such modern phenomena as alienation from the political process, unbridled greed, loneliness, urban crime, and high divorce rates. And given the seriousness of these problems in the United States, it was perhaps inevitable that a second wave of 1990s communitarians such as Amitai Etzioni (1929–2023) and William Galston would turn to the more practical political terrain of emphasizing social responsibility and promoting policies meant to stem the erosion of communal life in an increasingly fragmented society.[11] Much of this thinking was been carried out in the flagship communitarian periodical, The Responsive Community, which was edited by Amitai Etzioni and includes contributions by an eclectic group of philosophers, social scientists, and public policy makers [this periodical, regrettably, folded in 2004 due to financial constraints]. Etzioni was also the director of a think-tank, Institute for Communitarian Policy Studies, that produces working papers and advises government officials in Washington.[12]

Such political communitarians blame both the left and the right for our current malaise. The political left is chastised not just for supporting welfare rights economically unsustainable in an era of slow growth and aging populations, but also for shifting power away from local communities and democratic institutions and towards centralized bureaucratic structures better equipped to administer the fair and equal distribution of benefits, thus leading to a growing sense of powerlessness and alienation from the political process. Moreover, the modern welfare state with its universalizing logic of rights and entitlements has undermined family and social ties in civil society by rendering superfluous obligations to communities, by actively discouraging private efforts to help others (e.g., union rules and strict regulations in Sweden prevent parents from participating voluntarily in the governance of some day care centers to which they send their children), and even by providing incentives that discourage the formation of families (e.g., welfare payments are cut off in many American states if a recipient marries a working person) and encourage the break-up of families (e.g., no-fault divorce in the US is often financially rewarding for the non custodial parent, usually the father).

Libertarian solutions favored by the political right have contributed even more directly to the erosion of social responsibilities and valued forms of communal life, particularly in the UK and the US. Far from producing beneficial communal consequences, the invisible hand of unregulated free-market capitalism undermines the family (e.g., few corporations provide enough leave to parents of newborn children), disrupts local communities (e.g., following plant closings or the shifting of corporate headquarters), and corrupts the political process (e.g., US politicians are often dependent on economic interest groups for their political survival, with the consequence that they no longer represent the community at large). Moreover, the valorization of greed in the Thatcher/Reagan era justified the extension of instrumental considerations governing relationships in the marketplace into spheres previously informed by a sense of uncalculated reciprocity and civil obligation. This trend has been reinforced by increasing globalization, which pressures states into conforming to the dictates of the international marketplace.

More specifically in the American context, communitarian thinkers such as Mary Ann Glendon indict a new version of rights discourse that has achieved dominance of late (Glendon 1991). Whereas the assertion of rights was once confined to matters of essential human interest, a strident rights rhetoric has colonized contemporary political discourse, thus leaving little room for reasoned discussion and compromise, justifying the neglect of social responsibilities without which a society could not function, and ultimately weakening all appeals to rights by devaluing the really important ones.

To remedy this imbalance between rights and responsibilities in the US, political communitarians proposed a moratorium on the manufacture of new rights and changes to our “habits of the heart” away from exclusive focus on personal fulfillment and towards concern with bolstering families, schools, neighborhoods, and national political life, changes to be supported by certain public policies. Notice that this proposal takes for granted basic civil and political liberties already in place, thus alleviating the concern that communitarians are embarking on a slippery slope to authoritarianism. Still, communitarian thinkers quietly lifted the call for a moratorium on the minting of new rights, presumably because of growing consensus that marginalized groups, such as same-sex couples seeking the right to legally sanctioned marriage, have a legitimate claim to new rights (Macedo, 2015) and would be paying the price for the excesses of others if the moratorium is put into effect.

More serious from the standpoint of those generally sympathetic to communitarian aspirations, however, is the question of what exactly this has to do with community. For one thing, Etzioni himself sought to justify his policies with reference to need to maintain a balance between social order and freedom, (Etzioni 1996) as opposed to appealing to the importance of community. But there is nothing distinctively communitarian about the preoccupation with social order; both liberals such as John Stuart Mill and Burkean conservatives affirm the need for order. And when the term community is employed by political communitarians, it seems to mean anything they want it to mean. Worse, as Elizabeth Frazer has argued, it has often been used to justify hierarchical arrangements and delegitimize areas of conflict and contestation in modern societies (Frazer 1999).

Still, it is possible to make sense of the term community as a normative ideal.[13] Communitarians begin by positing a need to experience our lives as bound up with the good of the communities out of which our identity has been constituted. This excludes contingent attachments such as golf-club memberships, that do not usually bear on ones sense of identity and well-being (the co-authors of Habits of the Heart (Bellah et al. 1985) employ the term “lifestyle enclaves” to describe these attachments). Unlike pre-modern defenders of Gemeinschaft, however, it is assumed that there are many valued forms of communal life in the modern world. So the distinctive communitarian political project is to identify valued forms of community and to devise policies designed to protect and promote them, without sacrificing too much freedom. Typically, communitarians would invoke the following types of communities:

  1. Communities of place, or communities based on geographical location. This is perhaps the most common meaning associated with the word community. In this sense, community is linked to locality, in the physical, geographical sense of a community that is located somewhere. It can refer to a small village or a big city. A community of place also has an affective component—it refers to the place one calls “home”, often the place where one is born and bred and the place where one would like to end one’s days even if home is left as an adult. At the very least, communitarians posit an interest in identifying with familiar surroundings.

    In terms of political implications, it means that, for example, political authorities ought to consider the existent character of the local community when considering plans for development (Jane Jacobs famously documented the negative effects of razing, instead of renovating, run-down tenements that are replaced by functionally adequate but characterless low-income housing blocs (Jacobs 1965). Even big cities can and should strive to protect and promote a distinctive ethos (Bell and de-Shalit 2011). Other suggestions to protect communities of place include: granting community councils veto power over building projects that fail to respect existent architectural styles; implementing laws regulating plant closures so as to protect local communities from the effects of rapid capital mobility and sudden industrial change; promoting local-ownership of corporations; (Shuman 1999) and imposing restrictions on large-scale discount outlets such as Walmart that threaten to displace small, fragmented, and diverse family and locally owned stores (Ehrenhalt 1999).

  2. Communities of memory, or groups of strangers who share a morally-significant history. This term—first employed by the co-authors of Habits of the Heart—refers to imagined communities that have a shared history going back several generations. Besides tying us to the past, such communities turn us towards the future—members strive to realize the ideals and aspirations embedded in past experiences of those communities, seeing their efforts as being, in part, contributions to a common good. They provide a source of meaning and hope in peoples lives. Typical examples include the nation and language-based ethnocultural groups.

    In Western liberal democracies, this typically translates into various nation-building exercises meant to nourish the bonds of commonality that tie people to their nations, such as national service and national history lessons in school textbooks. Self-described republicans such as Michael Sandel place special emphasis upon the national political community and argue for measures that increase civic engagement and public-spiritedness (Sandel 1996). However, there is increased recognition of the multi-national nature of contemporary states, and modern Western states must also try to make room for the political rights of minority groups. These political measures have been widely discussed in the recent literature on nationalism, citizenship, and multiculturalism (Kymlicka 1995, Miller 1995, Macedo 2000, Tamir 1993).

  3. Psychological communities, or communities of face-to-face personal interaction governed by sentiments of trust, co-operation, and altruism. This refers to a group of persons who participate in common activity and experience a psychological sense of togetherness as shared ends are sought. Such communities, based on face-to-face interaction, are governed by sentiments of trust, cooperation, and altruism in the sense that constituent members have the good of the community in mind and act on behalf of the community’s interest. They differ from communities of place by not being necessarily defined by locality and proximity. The differ from communities of memory in the sense that they are more “real”, they are typically based on face to face social interaction at one point in time and consequently tend to be restricted in size.[14] The family is the prototypical example. Other examples include small-scale work or school settings founded on trust and social cooperation.

    Communitarians tend to favor policies designed to protect and promote ties to the family and family-like groups. This would include such measures as encouraging marriage and increasing the difficulty of legal marriage dissolution. These policies are supported by empirical evidence that points to the psychological and social benefits of marriage (Waite 1996). Communitarians also favor political legislation that can help to restructure education in such a way that peoples deepest needs in membership and participation in psychological communities are tapped at a young age. The primary school system in Japan, where students learn about group cooperation and benefits and rewards are assigned to the classroom as a whole rather than to individual students, could be a useful model (Reid 1999).

What makes the political project of communitarianism distinctive is that it involves the promotion of all three forms of valued communal life. This leads, however, to the worry that seeking the goods of various communities may conflict in practice. Etzioni, for example, argued for a whole host of pro-family measures: mothers and fathers should devote more time and energy to parenting (in view of the fact that most childcare centers do a poor job of caring for children), labor unions and employers ought to make it easier for parents to work at home, and the government should force corporations to provide six months of paid leave and another year of unpaid leave (Etzioni 1993, ch.2 and Etzioni 1996, ch.6). The combined effect of these changes of the heart and public policies in all likelihood would be to make citizens into largely private, family-centered persons.

Yet Etzioni also argued that the American political system is corrupt to the core, concluding that only extensive involvement in public affairs by virtuous citizens can remedy the situation: “once citizens are informed, they must make it their civic duty to organize others locally, regionally, and nationally to act on their understanding of what it takes to clean up public life in America” (Etzioni 1993, 244) But few can afford sufficient time and energy to devote themselves fully to both family life and public affairs, and favoring one ideal is most likely to erode the other. Surely it is no coincidence that republican America in Jefferson’s day relied on active, public-spirited male citizens largely freed from family responsibilities. Conversely, societies composed of persons leading rich and fulfilling family lives (such as contemporary Singapore) tend to be ruled by paternalistic despots who can rely on a compliant, politically apathetic populace.

Communitarians who advocate both increased commitment to public affairs and strengthened ties to the workplace (to the point that it becomes a psychological community) also face the problem of conflicting commitments. Michael Sandel, for example, speaks favorable of “proud craftsmen” in the Jacksonian era and of Louis Brandeis’s idea of “industrial democracy, in which workers participated in management and shared responsibilities for running the business” (Sandel 1996, 170, 213) Identification with the workplace and industrial democracy are said to improve workers civic capacities, but that may not be the case. In the same way that extensive involvement in family life can conflict with commitments to public life, few persons will have sufficient time and energy for extensive participation in both workplace and public affairs. Recall that the republican society of ancient Athens relied on active, public-spirited males freed from the need to work (slaves did most of the drudge labor).

It is also worth noting that devotion to the workplace can undermine family life. As Tatsuo Inoue of Tokyo University argues, Japanese-style communitarianism—strong communal identity based on the workplace—sometimes leads to karoshi (death from overwork) and frequently deprives workers of “the right to sit down at the dinner table with their families” (Inoue 1993). Just as liberals (pace Ronald Dworkin) sometimes have to choose between ideals (e.g., freedom and equality) that come into conflict with one another if a serious effort is made to realize any one of them fully, so communitarians may have to make some hard choices between valued forms of communal life.

Still, there may be some actual or potential win-win scenarios cases where promoting a particular form of communal life can promote, rather than undermine, other forms—and political communitarians will of course favor change of this sort. For example, critics have objected to residential community associations, or “walled communities”, on the grounds that they undermine attachment to the polity at large and erode the social cohesion and trust needed to promote social justice and sustain the democratic process (McKenzie 1994).[15] Might it then be possible to reform urban planning so that people can nurture strong local communities without undermining attachment to the national community, perhaps even strengthening broader forms of public-spiritedness? Many practical suggestions along these lines have been raised. Architects and urban planners in the US known as the New Urbanists, for example, have proposed various measures to strengthen community building—affordable housing, public transport, pedestrian focused environments, and public space as an integral part of neighborhoods—that would not have the “privatizing” consequences of gated communities. The problem, as Gerald Frug points out, is that “virtually everything they want to do is now illegal. To promote the new urbanist version of urban design, cities would have revise municipal zoning laws and development policy from top to bottom.”[16] This points to the need for public policy recommendations explicitly designed to favor complementing forms of communal attachments.

Just as it would be wrong to assume that communitarian goals always conflict, so one should allow for the possibility that individual rights and communitarian goals can co-exist and complement each other.[17] In Singapore, for example, it can be argued that more secure democratic rights would have the effect of strengthening commitment to the common national good.[18] The Singapore government does not hide the fact that it makes life difficult for many who aim to enter the political arena on the side of opposition parties: Between 1971 and 1993, according to Attorney General Chan Sek Keong, eleven opposition politicians were made bankrupt (and hence ineligible to run in elections).[19] Whether intended or not, such actions send an unpatriotic message to the community at large: Politics is a dangerous game for those who haven’t been specially anointed by the top leadership of the ruling party, so you should stick to your own private affairs. As Singaporean journalist Cherian George puts it, one can hardly blame people for ignoring their social and political obligations “when they hear so many cautionary tales: Of Singaporeans whose careers came to a premature end after they voiced dissent; of critics who found themselves under investigation; of individuals who were detained without trial even though they seemed not to pose any real threat; of tapped phones and opened letters”. The moral of these stories: In Singapore, better to mind your own business, make money, and leave politics to the politicians.’[20] Put positively, if the aim is to secure attachment to the community at large, then implementing genuinely competitive elections, including the freedom to run for the opposition without fear of retaliation,[21] is an important first step (see also Chan 2014). The communitarian case for democratic elections is particularly powerful in small communities where it is easier to establish a sense of communal solidarity (in larger political communities, such as China, elections may contribute to disharmony; see Bell 2015, chs. 1 and 4).

The Singapore case, however, points to another dimension of the politics of community that brings us back to the communitarian defense of cultural particularism. Democratic reformers in Singapore typically think of democracy in terms of free and fair competitive elections what Western analysts often label “minimal democracy”. In Hong Kong, the situation is similar—the aspiration to “full” democracy put forward by social critics turns out to mean (nothing more than) an elected legislature and Chief Executive. Put differently, it is quite striking that the republican tradition in communitarian thought with its vision of strong democracy supported by active, public-spirited citizens who participate in political decision-making and held shape the future direction of their society though political debate seems largely absent from political discourse in Singapore and Hong Kong, and perhaps East Asia more generally. Many East Asians are clamoring for secure democratic rights, but this rarely translates into the demand that all citizens should be committed to politics on an ongoing basis or the view that, as David Miller puts it, “politics is indeed a necessary part of the good life” (Miller 2000). At one level, the relative absence of republican ideals can be explained by the fact that there are no equivalents of Aristotle and Jean-Jacques Rousseau in East Asian philosophy. It can also be argued that republicanism fails to resonate because East Asians typically place more emphasis on other forms of communal life—the family in particular has been important theme in Confucian ethical theory and practice (relative to Western philosophy). To the extent that different forms of communal life do conflict in practice, in short, it may the case that different cultures will draw the line in different places.

But this is not to suggest that each community draws the line in its own way, and there is no more room for moral debate or social critique. While there may be a strong case for endorsing “the way things are done” if shared understandings conform to the views shared by both defenders and critics of the political status quo, more often than not social critics will find fault with the communitarian excesses in particular societies. For example, Chang Kyung-Sup argues that Korean “familism” harms individuals and poses a serious stumbling block to the establishment of a democratic polity in Korea (see Chang 2004). In this context, it may well be counter-productive to place too much emphasis on the moral qualities of family life[22]. But other societies—relatively individualistic societies suffering from the undesirable social consequences of divorce and single-parent families or communitarian societies that justify sacrificing families in the interests of the workplace—may need to rejuvenate family life and they may well look to Korean “familism” for ideas. In other words, what seems like a communitarian excess’ in one society can be a source of inspiration for another.

So, the conclusion is, yes, community is valuable—at least as valuable as the need for freedom, if not more so[23]. Communitarians have usefully distinguished between forms of valuable communities and Anglo-American political communitarians have designed menus of policy options to promote those forms of communities. The varieties of communitarian politics in East Asia offers further possibilities. However, which form of community to emphasize and which form to deemphasize depends upon the needs and problems of particular societies. The political implications of communitarianism, in short, depend upon the cultural outlooks and social priorities of particular contexts[24].

Let me end with the question of why East Asians should look to communitarianism when the rich and diverse Confucian tradition can be drawn upon to express communitarian values. After all, there is substantial overlap between the two philosophies—both emphasize the value of relationships for the good life as well as stress the importance of education and non-coercive modes of moral education with legal rights as last resort fall-back mechanisms (see Bell 2008, ch. 9)—so why not stick to the “local” philosophy of Confucianism? In an East Asian context, it seems strange to promote a communitarian philosophy that was shaped by concerns about individualistic excesses in Western countries when the communitarian Confucian tradition continues to shape values and inform “habits of the heart” (see Sun 2013; Hammond and Richey 2015; Billioud and Thoravel 2015). And it’s still a matter of argument whether communitarianism really constitutes a philosophy or tradition, as opposed to a critical extension of the liberal tradition. But nobody doubts that Confucianism constitutes its own tradition. So what good reason can there be for East Asians to identify with communitarianism rather than Confucianism?

One response is that Confucianism has been tainted by its apparent endorsement of immoral practices, such as patriarchal values that have contributed to the subordination and suffering of women. But contemporary feminist theorists have reinterpreted Confucianism to make it more compatible with modern-day values while maintaining commitment to central Confucian values (see, e.g., Chan 2007). And those central Confucian values—commitment to the family, to the material well-being of the people, to meritocracy in education and politics, to ritual (li), humaneness (ren), diversity in harmony (he), and this-wordly outlooks—may in fact be more appropriate for modern-day societies than many other philosophies (consider the fact that most Western philosophers prior to the twentieth century devalued the family). Bai Tongdong, for example, argues that a modernized form of central Confucian values can inspire humane governance both at home and abroad (Bai 2019).

In an East Asian context, what communitarianism can do is help to remedy the drawbacks of Confucianism. For example, there is a tension between the universalizing impulses of early Confucianism—Confucius and Mencius did not consider the possibility of morally legitimate alternatives to their values—and the moral pluralism that tends to characterize the modern world. Communitarians can remind Confucians that their philosophy may be more appropriate in certain settings than others, and that they should allow for the possibility of morally legitimate alternatives in different contexts. It seems strange, for example, for Confucians to think that Christian believers should change their primary religious allegiance from God to family ancestors (just as it seems strange for Christians to ask Confucians to do the opposite).

Communitarian insights about civil society as the sites for moral education can help to remedy the Confucian focus on the family as the only (or main) springboard for moral learning. Confucians have long argued that it is possible and desirable to extend family values outside the family, but the family-centered reality in most East Asian societies with a Confucian heritage suggests that Confucianism may not be sufficient. There has been some work exploring the ’intermediary associations’ in Confucianism (see, e.g., de Bary 1998), but the communitarians debates in the West may offer more insights in this respect. Also, the Confucian emphasis on meritocratic rule by the most talented and virtuous members of the community may encourage excessive political passivity on the part of ordinary citizens. Again, Confucians can look to communitarianism (as well as contemporary debates about deliberative democracy) for insights about values and practices that allow ordinary citizens to make meaningful contributions to the political process, even in political contexts (such as China) without democratic elections to choose top leaders. Democratic education is not, to say the least, a Confucian imperative. In short, communitarian insights can usefully supplement Confucian values in an East Asian context, just as they can supplement liberal values in Western societies.

Overall, though, it must be conceded that communitarianism has lost salience as a motivating political ideal in both East Asia and the West. Do we have any reason to think it might be revived? In East Asia, we can expect that communitarian themes will continue to take the form of Confucian values. In the West, however, the excesses of populism may present an opportunity for communitarian-inspired political activists. Populism, arguably, is a response to the decline of valued forms of community. Strongmen such as Donald Trump rail against elites and promise to restore traditional sources of meaning to disempowered and atomized individuals. But the problem is not elitism or hierarchy per se. Any modern society needs hierarchies and the task is to distinguish between bad forms of hierarchy that benefit the powerful and oppress the weak, and good forms of hierarchy that express morally defensible values (Bell and Wang 2020). Hierarchical forms of communal life can be reinterpreted and modernized so they are compatible with progressive values. What’s missing is a social and political movement that can restore and reinterpret forms of communal life appropriate for the modern world.


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Other Internet Resources


The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) and Nicholas Joll for notifying us about several typos in this entry.

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