Supplement to Compatibilism

Compatibilism: State of the Art

Those interested in the state of the art are invited to read this supplementary section. It surveys six of the positions currently on stage. Each view will receive only a brief discussion. [For other survey-oriented discussions of the state of the art for compatibilism, see the essays by Berofsky (2002), Haji (2002), and Russell (2002b) in Kane, ed. (2002). See also Levy and McKenna, 2008.] More advanced treatment is best found in the current journals or directly from the relevant author’s book-length treatments.


Before discussing any particular view, it is worth focusing upon two related issues that have an important bearing upon contemporary compatibilism. One involves a forceful style of argument for incompatibilism. Another concerns a distinction that is thought by some compatibilists to be useful in replying to this sort of argumentation.

The argument

Frankfurt’s (section 4.2), Wolf’s (section 4.3), and Fischer’s (section 4.4) views all face problems with an especially troubling set of manipulation cases. Recall, in these sorts of cases, an incompatibilist opponent puts before the compatibilist a case involving an agent who, the incompatibilist alleges, satisfies pertinent compatibilist-friendly sufficient conditions for moral responsibility—hierarchies, meshes, or mechanisms—but who comes to satisfy those conditions through a process of manipulation that intuitively suggests that the agent is not free and morally responsible for some act, X, which she performs (say killing an innocent person). With such an example in hand, the incompatibilist then constructs a Manipulation Argument. She argues roughly as follows: (1) Any agent so manipulated into X-ing is not free or morally responsible, despite satisfying the pertinent compatibilist-friendly conditions. (2) Any agent who is determined to X is no different in any relevant respect from an agent manipulated into X-ing in the manner specified. Therefore, (3) any agent who is determined to X (or, generalizing, perform any other action) does not X freely and is not morally responsible for X-ing.

Various philosophers have developed some version of a manipulation argument (e.g., Kane, 1996, and Taylor, 1974). But recently the force of it has been crystallized by Derk Pereboom with his Four-Case Argument for incompatibilism (2001). [In section F below, I will consider yet another highly influential recent manipulation-like argument for incompatibilism by Alfred Mele.] Like others who have developed similar arguments, Pereboom initially draws upon a case of covert manipulation of an agent by direct electronic stimulation of her brain, causing her every moment to moment decision and action in such a way that she still satisfies (says Pereboom) what various compatibilists contend is sufficient for moral responsibility. And yet, Pereboom claims, this agent is clearly not free or morally responsible when she commits an act of murder. So far, we have here roughly the same argumentation as others have advanced. But Pereboom then appeals to a simple principle of moral reasoning: treat like cases alike. He then considers a second manipulation case in which the manipulators tinker with the agent from a temporal distance by “programming in” the relevant psychological details that will later lead to the agent’s act of murder. The agent then lives out what is seemingly a normal life until one day the relevant act is done. Since, he argues, there is no relevant difference between the first case and the second, and since we must treat like cases alike, the agent in the second case is also not free or morally responsible. But now, if we shift to a third case and make the relevant “manipulation” the strong indoctrination of the person in her early childhood through her youth, this process is not different in any relevant respect from the pre-programing from a temporal distance that occurs in case two. And so here too, when the agent murders, we should conclude that the agent is not free and responsible. Finally, Pereboom argues that the best explanation for why these first three agents are not free and responsible is because the process of manipulation deterministically caused each of them to act as they did. And so, finally, in a fourth case in which a normally developed agent at a determined world murders, this case also is no different from the others, and given that we should treat like cases alike, we should conclude that, due to determinism, this agent is not responsible. In all four cases, what underwrites the lack of freedom or responsibility, Pereboom concludes, is the fact that the source of the agent’s actions can be traced back in their entirety to originating conditions that were completely beyond her control.

Note that Pereboom’s conclusion can be used to help advance the first premise of the source incompatibilist argument (discussed in section 1.2). That premise states that a person acts of her own free will only if she is its ultimate source. A lively literature has emerged around Pereboom’s Four-Case Argument, and it, along with one other (to be discussed in section F below), has emerged as a kind of litmus test for the credibility of a compatibilist theory: Can such and such theory provide an adequate answer to Pereboom’s Four-Case Argument?

Compatibilists will respond in one of two different ways to a manipulation argument. Some will be inclined to reject the first premise and argue that if the manipulation is sufficiently complex, despite how sweeping and pervasive it might be, such an agent will in fact act of her own free will and be morally responsible for what she does. This compatibilist strategy is one of defying what at least appears to be intuitive plausibility. Other compatibilists, however, will be inclined to reject the second premise, arguing that the pertinent style of manipulation (the one made use of in the argument under consideration, such as direct stimulation of the brain) is relevantly different than a normal causally deterministic history whereby an agent comes to perform a relevant act. It is at this point, when reflecting on strategies for resisting the second premise, that a certain distinction has proved useful.

The distinction

Many compatibilists inclined to resist the second premise in relevant manipulation arguments want to show that some causal histories giving rise to agents and their actions are freedom-and-responsibility-undermining while others are not. Of course, these compatibilists will try to show that determinism is consistent with a history that is not freedom-or-responsibility undermining, whereas the manipulation featured in (some of) the arguments is. A very plausible way to make the divide between those who would emphasize the relevance of causal history to freedom and responsibility and those who would not is to distinguish between internalist theories of free will and moral responsibility on the one hand, and externalist theories of free will and moral responsibility on the other (for example, see Mele 1995; and Fischer and Ravizza, 1998). Internalist theories look only to internal features of an agent’s psychological resources as they pertain to the production of free and morally responsible action. They acknowledge that any manner of acquisition of the relevant psychological structure or mesh is irrelevant to whether at a moment in time it provides an agent with a freedom-and-responsibility-conferring structure. Internalist theories are thus current time-slice theories. They require only the satisfaction of a certain psychological structure at a moment in time. In this way, internalist compatibilist conditions for free will and moral responsibility are comparable to other current time-slice properties such as weight or shape, neither of which are impugned by the manner in which an object comes to have the weight or shape it has. These sorts of properties are often called snapshot properties. Externalist theories consider external features of an agent’s psychological resources as they pertain to the production of action. They acknowledge that the freedom-and-responsibility-conferring psychological structure sought at a moment in time is partially determined by the causal history giving rise to that structure at that moment in time. That history will include causal features stretching outside the agent herself, such as the manner of education and socialization that shapes a person’s values and beliefs. Externalist theories are thus historical theories. They require a sort of history that is freedom and responsibility-conferring as opposed to freedom and responsibility-threatening. In this way, externalist compatibilist conditions for free will and moral responsibility are comparable to other historical properties, such as being a sunburn or being a genuine dollar bill, each of which requires a certain causal history: If a burn is not caused by the sun, then it cannot be a sunburn; if a dollar is not produced by the relevant government-sanctioned means, then it is not genuine but counterfeit.

In a highly influential paper, “Responsibility and the Limits of Evil: Variations on a Strawsonian Theme,” the compatibilist Gary Watson took a very honest look at how historical considerations influence intuitive judgments of moral responsibility (1987). While entertaining the internalist position, Watson proceeded to call attention, in forceful detail, to just how much historical considerations do matter. Watson focused upon a case of extreme evil, a horrible crime by Robert Alton Harris for the murder of two young boys. Drawing upon a couple of articles from the Los Angeles Times, Watson first quoted a description of Harris’s crime and his attitude afterwards. The story is sickening. Harris’s was an act of astounding callousness. But Watson then quotes from a follow up article in which Harris’s life was detailed, a life punctuated almost exclusively by abuse and cruelty, youth detention centers and then adult prisons. Watson is careful to avoid the suggestion that Harris’s history caused him to be in some way incapacitated for morally responsible agency. Indeed, on an internalist, compatibilist-friendly account, it looked as if Harris had a terrible history that caused his being a free and morally responsible agent—an especially morally contemptuous one. But Watson observes that a recognition of Harris’ past gives one reason to regard with ambivalence judgments of blame. Somehow recognizing a history that shapes a person to be terribly evil can influence our judgments of a person’s moral responsibility for even the most evil of conduct.

Watson’s essay and the case he featured have had a powerful influence on recent compatibilist work. The compatibilist does have a burden here, and Watson makes this clear. How is it that histories matter? Even the internalist should have something to say in response to the appearance that they do. Of course, the internalist’s response will have to show that when histories do matter, they aid in understanding a freedom-and-responsibility-undermining impairment that itself involves only snapshot properties.

A. Identification, Hierarchy & Mesh Theories

As discussed above (in section 4.2), Frankfurt’s hierarchical theory needed supplementing so as to avoid the problem of an ever ascending conflict of higher-order desires. Recall that one way an agent’s freedom might be jeopardized is when she faces conflicting first-order desires. Frankfurt theorized that an agent’s freedom (of the sort required for moral responsibility) consisted in her being able to form second-order volitional desires through which she would identify herself with one desire and distance herself from another. (This formed the basis for categorizing Frankfurt’s as a real self theory.) But this hierarchical step is not alone sufficient to capture the relevant freedom since an agent could also face conflicts at the level of second-order, or even higher orders, of desire.

The viability of Frankfurt’s hierarchical model as developed in his earlier work was in jeopardy. His account of identification needed buttressing. Frankfurt’s more recent work on the topics of freedom and the will, as well as different features of personhood (such as the emotion of love), bolster his original appeal to identification, an appeal which previously rested solely on an agent’s having a higher-order volitional desire that some first-order desires be effective in leading her to act. One effort Frankfurt made to speak to the problem of conflicting higher-order desires is to hold that a person properly identifies with a lower-order desire (normally a first-order desire) when she has an unopposed higher-order volition to act in accord with the lower-order desire, and she judges that further deliberation would not influence her resolve (1987). But suppose that a person’s unopposed higher-order desire, the one on the basis of which Frankfurt’s theory grounds the person’s identification, is one towards which the agent is passive. The person’s will is affected by this desire as an external one that has, so to speak, merely “happened” to the agent. (Consider the case of a willing addict who has simply given up the struggle and drearily resigned herself to her addiction. She’ll be willing; why resist? There is nothing she can do to stop the train she is on!) Such a person would satisfy Frankfurt’s amended theory, but still seem not to identify in a deep sense with her will—not in a way that would reveal her real self. So Frankfurt further amended his view with the requirement that an agent’s identification must be active. Her stance towards her own will is that it determines itself (1994). She and it are fully integrated. When an agent’s will is so fashioned, then she reveals her real self in it; she regards it wholeheartedly.

Not long after Frankfurt presented the earlier formulation of his hierarchical theory, Gary Watson offered an alternative model (1975). Like Frankfurt, Watson was interested in accounting for free and morally responsible agency in terms of a kind of harmony or mesh between different elements in the mental economy of persons qua agents. Of course, as noted earlier (section 4.2.2), it was Watson who originally objected to Frankfurt’s mere appeal to higher-order desires to account for identification. This precipitated Frankfurt’s further amendments. But Watson also offered an alternative proposal based on a Platonic conception of motivation wherein judgment or evaluation can be its own source of motivation. The proper way to account for an agent who acts freely and who, in Frankfurt’s terms, would identify with the sources of her agency is not in terms of a proper mesh located in the structures of desires in a hierarchy, but rather between different systems within an agent; one being her motivational system, which is influenced by elements such as one’s appetitive desires; and another being her valuational system, whereby an agent judges what she takes to be valuable (some might just say, good, or instead, desirable). A free agent is one whose motivational system works in harmony with her valuational system. On Watson’s account, it seems that if anything is to do the work of identification, it is an agent’s valuational system, which apparently can be plagued by opposing desires arising from an agent’s motivational system, gumming up the works and causing agents to act unfreely or against their wills by virtue of acting contrary to what they judge it best to do.

As J. David Velleman has pointed out (1992), the trouble is that Watson’s appeal to a valuational system seems susceptible to the same sort of objection that he (Watson) put to Frankfurt. Why take an agent’s judgment issuing from her valuational system to be the source of who she is, what she identifies with, and hence, the spring of her free action? Velleman’s insightful question brings into clear relief that once we begin to theorize about free and morally responsible agency in terms of the structure of an agent’s will, however the mesh is alleged to be harmonized, whatever the elements specified as the basis for a kind of identification with the agent, we can always ask why these elements are to play that role. The puzzle has sparked a great deal of controversy in recent work (such as Velleman’s own 2000, Watson’s 2004, and several essays in the 2002 collection by Buss and Overton).

In a series of recent papers, Michael Bratman has embraced the problematic framed by the controversy between Frankfurt and Watson, and has offered a distinctive attempt to answer Velleman’s challenge (see, e.g., Bratman, 1997, 2003, 2004, and several of the essays in his 2007 collection). Bratman builds an account of morally responsible agency by drawing upon his planning theory of intentions. According to Bratman, intentions are explained by taking them, in typical cases, to be embedded in larger plans. An agent’s intentional actions are understood as intentional in light of plans into which her actions fit. My intention to head to the local pub, for instance, is understood as intentional in relation to my plan of meeting my friends there for an evening of good cheer. Note that here too we have a kind of meshing of one element, an intention, within wider aspects of agency, a plan (Bratman, 1997), and while this is not itself a matter of hierarchy, it is suggestive that at a more primitive level of agency, a kind of mesh is required for persons to get about in the world, to make today’s activities gel with tomorrow’s travel plans, and to make tomorrow’s travel plans conform with the unexpected contingencies that tomorrow might turn up. Turning directly to the question of why Frankfurtian wholeheartedness or Watsonian valuation has “agential authority” to speak for the agent, for her source of identification, of who she is, Bratman looks not as Frankfurt does to higher-order desires, nor as Watson does to evaluative judgments, but instead to what Bratman calls an intention-based theory (2007, p. 239) in which an agent’s commitment to self-governing policies of practical reasoning and action take center stage. These policies will involve diachronic commitments to managing one’s life in ways that allow her to be effective in carrying out her other plans and intentions. A commitment to work hard after dinner, for example, will constrain other potential plans. It will be given a ranking priority that will help one across the stretch of large swaths of the days. Such a self-governing policy will also be hierarchical, though in a way that differs from Frankfurt’s. It will be hierarchical in so far as it will govern (by constraining or fostering) other plans that are liable to arise in the course of a life (2007, pp.240–3). But now why will such a self-governing policy, as opposed to other candidate features of agency (such as higher-order desires), have the authority to speak for the agent? One reason Bratman offers is because it will bind the agent’s activities across time with the same threads that bind her identity across time, and so, in a sense, will capture her depth as an agent, who she truly is (2007, pp.243–9).

Bratman’s intention-based theory of morally responsible agency offers an intriguing addition to other mesh theories such as Watson’s and Frankfurt’s. But along with theirs, there remain worries about how to unpack notions such as “real self”, “agential authority”, and what is meant by that which “speaks for an agent”. One factor that clearly drives all of these mesh theorists’ concerns is the need to account for such phenomena as weakness of will and compulsion. A case of compulsion due to an irresistible desire seems clearly a freedom-and-responsibility-undermining condition (assuming that the person who suffers it is not responsible for acquiring it). One way to account for such a case, it is thought, is by showing that the problematic desire is in some way alien to the agent, or to what “speaks for” the agent; it’s not part of her “real self”. But opponents, such as reasons-responsive theorists, might be inclined to think that instead we get a much more elegant explanation—one that avoids the metaphorical language often invoked in the mesh theorists’ proposals—by thinking about what an agent controls or has control over, rather than what is part of an agent’s deep self, or what elements of the agent have agential authority, or instead speak for the agent (see, for example, Mele, 1995).

Perhaps Frankfurt’s treatment of wholeheartedness has shielded his hierarchical view from the problem of ever ascending conflicts amongst higher-order desires. Or perhaps instead Watson’s or Bratman’s proposal will help to account for the core insights of a mesh theory. How do such views stand up to manipulation arguments? How, for instance, does Frankfurt respond to worries about manipulation? Could Frankfurt’s compatibilist-friendly conditions be artificially induced in an agent at a time in such a way that she could just, right then, as an internalist would have it, satisfy conditions sufficient for moral responsibility? In considering the prospect of adding to his account an historical condition so as to rule out manipulation cases, Frankfurt writes:

What we need most essentially to look at is, rather, certain aspects of the psychic structure that is coincident with the person’s behavior….

A manipulator may succeed, through his interventions, in providing a person not merely with particular feelings and thoughts but with a new character. That person is then morally responsible for the choices and the conduct to which having this character leads. We are inevitably fashioned and sustained, after all, by circumstances over which we have no control. The causes to which we are subject may also change us radically, without thereby bringing it about that we are not morally responsible agents. It is irrelevant whether those causes are operating by virtue of the natural forces that shape our environment or whether they operate through the deliberate manipulative designs of other human agents (2002, p. 27).

For Frankfurt, free will and moral responsibility are snapshot properties. Frankfurt is a pure internalist. Tough-minded compatibilist that he is, he simply bites the bullet: In pertinent cases, determined agents are no different in any relevant respect from manipulated agents. Still, some of the latter, and likewise, some of the former, act of their own free will. (Various critics have argued against Frankfurt on this very point, including Fischer and Ravizza, 1998; Haji, 1998; and Mele, 1995. For a limited defense of Frankfurt’s internalist position, see McKenna, 2004.)

Notice, however, that Bratman’s mesh theory, unlike Frankfurt’s, commits Bratman to an historical thesis, since for him, what is at the core of his theory of morally responsible agency is a planning theory of intentions in which an agent’s intentions at a time are accounted for in terms of her trans-temporal relations to past activities and future commitments. This makes clear that, as an externalist, Bratman will respond to some manipulation challenges by arguing that agents who are manipulated in ways that break the threads that bind their present mental lives to their own pasts have had their responsible agency violated, and so are not morally responsible for what they do. (Here Bratman would deny the first premise of a manipulation argument, as I have characterized it above.) This, however, might not be enough for Bratman to answer some versions of a manipulation argument. Consider, for instance, Pereboom’s second case, of the agent who is manipulated from a temporal distance, so that her later intentions and plans are “programmed in” at an early time, maybe at her birth. If the program is written to account for the trans-temporal commitments, we have the makings of a manipulation argument that can “load in”, so to speak, Bratman’s historical requirements.

B. Moderate Reasons-Responsiveness

In recent work, John Martin Fischer joined company with Mark Ravizza. Together they addressed unsettled business left in Fischer’s earlier reasons-responsive account. As set out above (see section 4.4), Fischer defends a mechanism-based, actual sequence form of reasons-responsiveness. This view allows Fischer to couple reasons-responsiveness with guidance control as the freedom-relevant condition for moral responsibility. His earlier account faced two serious problems, of which he was fully aware. One had to do with a proper specification of the scope of the reasons to which a morally responsible agent’s mechanism of action is responsive. Making the mechanism too responsive to reasons (via strong reasons-responsiveness) sets the bar too high. Those doing moral wrong knowingly would fall short, and hence count as not acting freely merely by virtue of their wrongful conduct. But making the mechanism too unresponsive (via weak reasons-responsiveness) allowed a person with only a very limited or insane pattern of sensitivity to reasons to count as satisfying the freedom condition. This set the bar too low. Another problem that Fischer’s earlier account faced had to do with how an agent might come to own the reasons-responsive mechanism that does issue in her freely willed actions. This problem was connected with manipulation worries since, without some ownership condition on a reasons-responsive mechanism, Fischer’s view was open to criticism by appeal to cases in which an agent acts from an artificially installed reasons-responsive mechanism. In Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility (1998), Fischer and Ravizza advance a rich account of guidance control designed to address these two problems.

B.1 Moderate Reasons-Responsive Mechanisms

Fischer and Ravizza seek to slip between the two extremes of weak and strong reasons-responsiveness by advancing an account of moderate reasons-responsiveness (1998, pp. 62–91). Essentially, their goal is to show that an appropriately sensitive reasons-responsive mechanism responds to a rich pattern of reasons, reasons that hang together rationally as a class and fit a coherent or sane pattern. All the same, the mechanism needn’t respond to all good reasons to act otherwise. As just one example of what Fischer and Ravizza have in mind, suppose Matilda, who is at a dance, is having the time of her life and would not stop waltzing for $100.00, or for any number of other reasons that might be put to her. But if waltzing Matilda were offered $1,000.00 to stop dancing, needing the money as she does, she would stop dancing. If this reason is to aid in confirming the basic rationality and sanity that might bear on Matilda’s conduct, then other like weighted reasons would have to affect her mechanism of action similarly. So suppose that Matilda would not stop Waltzing for $1,001.00, or for any other sum of money other than precisely $1,000.00. Then Matilda, it seems, would not act from a mechanism that was responsive to fairly modest rational constraints. Matilda would not act from an appropriately reasons-responsive mechanism.

If instead Matilda would respond to a coherent pattern of reasons (e.g., bribes of $1,000.00 or higher, and other sorts of incentives), then she would act from a sufficiently reasons-responsive mechanism, even if it was not a strongly responsive one. That is, it is acceptable if the mechanism from whence Matilda acts is not responsive to all good reasons to so act. For instance, if Matilda had been told that her mother had been seriously injured in an accident and needed her help, perhaps Matilda would not have stopped waltzing even then. She might even have continued waltzing while recognizing herself, by her own standards of decent conduct, that she should stop. Imagine her proclaiming as she continued to waltz, “I really ought to stop and help dear old mum out, but I just am having too much fun!” Matilda’s insensitivity to this sufficient reason to act otherwise would not impugn the requisite responsiveness of Matilda’s mechanism of action just so long as her insensitivity to this reason is situated within a set of cases that demonstrate a rich sensitivity to some rational and stable range of reasons.

This brief description of Fischer and Ravizza’s analysis of reasons-responsiveness barely scratches the surface of their account. For instance, Fischer and Ravizza distinguish between different features of reasons-responsiveness. A typical deliberative mechanism in the actional repertoire of a normally functioning agent involves elements that are receptive to reasons, and other elements that are reactive to reasons. One feature of responsiveness, the receptivity feature, allows an agent to come up with and process good reasons. Another feature, the reactivity feature, allows an agent to act upon the good reasons the agent recognizes at the receptivity stage. (In the example of Matilda and her injured mother, Matilda, by way of her mechanism of action, was receptive to the reason to stop waltzing and help her mother. But she was not reactive to it.) Fischer and Ravizza also require that the mechanism be responsive to some moral reasons.

Several intricate debates have now emerged in discussion of Fischer and Ravizza’s account of a moderately reasons-responsive mechanism. (See, for example, McKenna, 2000, 2001b; Mele, 2000; Russell, 2002a, 2002b; Todd & Tognazzini, 2008; Stump, 1996b; and Watson, 2001. And for replies to several of his critics, see Fischer’s 2004 and 2006.) For instance, on Fischer and Ravizza’s view, a determined agent can be blameworthy for knowingly doing moral wrong from a reasons-responsive mechanism because, were different reasons brought to bear upon her mechanism of action, the agent, by way of the mechanism, would act otherwise. But consider the reason to act otherwise that was present to the agent in the actual world (not doing moral wrong), the one the agent actually ignored. Given that determinism is true in the actual world, in the nearest possible world in which that very same reason is present, the agent does not respond differently to it. Hence, given that the agent is determined, it seems that she is not reactive to the very reason that serves as the basis for moral blame in the actual world. It is because she did not respond appropriately to the moral wrongness she herself recognized that she is blameworthy. The irony seems to be this: On Fischer and Ravizza’s view, that an agent satisfies the freedom relevant condition for moral responsibility is confirmed by her reactivity to reasons other than the one that serves as the basis for blaming her in the actual world. That very reason, the one she failed to act on, because determinism is true, is one to which she does not react (McKenna, 2000, 2005; and Russell, 2002a). Although the consequence might be ironic, is it reason to reject the view? This is just one point of controversy currently taking shape over the details of Fischer and Ravizza’s account of moderate reasons-responsiveness.

B.2 Taking Ownership of One’s Reasons-Responsive Mechanisms

What about the other difficulty Fischer faced in his earlier defense of reasons-responsive compatibilism? How do Fischer and Ravizza stave off manipulation cases involving freedom-and-responsibility-undermining implantation of reasons-responsive mechanisms? Can they meet a well crafted manipulation argument? They endorse the externalist position that only a certain sort of history will permit a reasons-responsive action to issue appropriately in freely willed actions (1998, pp. 194–206). This history, they theorize, is resistant to fabrication through artificial means. Hence, Fischer and Ravizza treat free will and moral responsibility as historical and not snapshot properties.

According to Fischer and Ravizza, an agent’s mechanism is appropriately reasons-responsive, and issues in conduct constitutive of guidance control, only if she has come to own that mechanism by means of a process whereby she takes responsibility for the mechanisms giving rise to her actions (1998, pp. 207–39). On their view, taking responsibility involves a subjective component. In order to take responsibility for her conduct, an agent must see herself in a certain manner. According to Fischer and Ravizza, taking responsibility requires that an agent recognize that her conduct is efficacious in altering the outcome of the world around her, and she accepts that the spectrum of morally reactive attitudes of others can be properly directed at her. That is, she acknowledges the propriety of members of the moral community placing moral expectations upon her that she guide her conduct within certain boundaries. Further, she must come to these beliefs through an appropriate means (and not, for instance, through deception or brainwashing or trickery in some manner or other). Fischer and Ravizza maintain that when an agent does come to take responsibility for her mechanisms of action through this means, she owns her mechanisms of action, and when they are moderately responsive to reasons, then she acts with guidance control and has satisfied the freedom-relevant condition for morally responsible agency.

It is easy to see how the historical resources upon which Fischer and Ravizza draw allow them to handle certain formulations of a manipulation argument. In particular, they seem easily able to handle any instance of that argument that builds upon a case of manipulation in which an agent is massively altered at a moment in time, say by being given a Frankfurtian desire structure that she previously lacked, or by having numerous reasons-responsive mechanisms installed in an instant. Or consider a case introduced by Mele (1995) of a person, Beth, who is subject to overnight brainwashing without her knowledge so as to render her a near psychological duplicate of another agent, Ann (when prior to the intervention, Beth was nothing like Ann). When Beth the next day acts on her newly installed values and such, it seems that she is not free in the way Ann is, even if both agents act in the same way and are at the time of action roughly intrinsically psychological duplicates. Fischer and Ravizza have a clear way of accounting for these sorts of manipulation cases: The agents in them, such as Beth, did not acquire the relevant springs of their actions under their own steam, but were caused to do so in ways that subverted their freedom and responsibility. And this causal process is very different from one that, even at a determined world, is the outgrowth of an agent coming to take responsibility for the mechanisms (or springs) of her own actions as she grows out of childhood and into adulthood. Note that this allows Fischer and Ravizza to reject the second premise in the formulation of the manipulation argument as set out above (in the introduction), which contends that an agent so manipulated is no different in any relevant respect from an agent caused to be in such a state due to a normal deterministic history.

Trouble, however, seems to arise for other sorts of manipulation cases and the arguments built upon them. The problem is that Fischer and Ravizza do not (and perhaps cannot) foreclose a kind of manipulation whereby part of the way the agent is manipulated is by way of causing all of the subjective processes through which she takes responsibility for the mechanisms of her actions (see, e.g., McKenna, 2000; Mele, 2000; Stump, 1996b, and 2002; and D. Zimmerman, 2002). Note that, according to Pereboom (2001, p. 121), his Four-Case Argument can be adjusted so that the details of how the agents in each of his first three cases are manipulated will include causes about how the agents come to view themselves subjectively and thereby take responsibility for their mechanisms of action. And in these cases, the agents will, Pereboom contends, satisfy Fischer and Ravizza’s sufficient conditions for moral responsibility, and yet the agents so manipulated will not be free or responsible.

The debate between Fischer and Pereboom remains very much alive. (See Fischer’s reply in 2004, and 2006; Pereboom’s counter in Fischer, et. al. 2007; and Fischer’s further reply in Fischer. et. al. 2007.) An instructive general point to note from the preceding discussion—one that applies beyond the controversy over just Fischer and Ravizza’s particular compatibilist theory—is that externalism will not automatically shield the compatibilist from manipulation cases that (apparently?) do the work of satisfying a set of compatibilist sufficient conditions for moral responsibility; all that needs to be done is for an incompatibilist pressing the argument, such as Pereboom, to build the relevant historical requirements in. Then it looks like even these historical compatibilists will have to reject the first premise of a manipulation argument, and so contend that an agent manipulated in such a way is, after all, free and morally responsible. [See McKenna, 2004 for this point. Note that Fischer goes part of the way here, as regards Pereboom’s formulation, since he does grant (at 2006, p.232) that in Pereboom’s first three cases, the agents are morally responsible. But he really does only go part of the way, as he also claims that none of the agents are blameworthy, due to the manipulation. This point of Fischer’s is subtle and cannot be explored further here.]

Set aside the controversy over the manipulation argument. The subjectivist feature of Fischer and Ravizza’s view is also subject to scrutiny. It entails that a person could be exempt from moral responsibility merely by failing to adopt the proper subjective perspective on her own conduct. Often a failure to take responsibility for one’s conduct, a failure to see oneself as the source of moral harm, is precisely the basis for one’s responsibility and guilt (see Eshleman, 2001). Fischer and Ravizza defend their subjectivist component against this sort of objection, and indeed, their defense might withstand the heat put to it.

C. A Desire-Based Reasons-Responsiveness Theory

Ishtiyaque Haji defends a form of reasons-responsive compatibilism that differs in certain respects from Fischer and Ravizza’s. In his book Moral Appraisability, Haji shares with Fischer and Ravizza a rejection of regulative in favor of guidance control as applied to judgments of moral responsibility (1998, pp. 16–41). Haji also shares with Fischer and Ravizza a mechanism-based reasons-responsive approach that holds fixed in analysis the springs of action actually operative in bringing about a freely willed action (1998, pp. 65–85). What, according to Haji, is held fixed in analysis is the motivational precursor of an action (a volitional desire), along with an agent’s evaluative scheme. Fischer and Ravizza, unlike Haji, do not provide this sort of specificity as to what in the actual sequence is held constant. They merely speculate that some subset of an agent’s psychological characteristics plays the relevant causal role in bringing about action. Fischer and Ravizza simply call that—whatever it is—the mechanism of action. On Fischer and Ravizza’s view, it is this that gets held constant in analyses designed to demonstrate responsiveness to reason. Haji, on the other hand, gives content to what is held constant.

Haji’s mechanism-based, reasons-responsive analysis of guidance control (Haji calls it volitional control) appears to have a theoretical advantage over Fischer and Ravizza’s. In specifying the mechanism giving rise to freely willed action, Haji fixes upon some psychic features of agency that allow one to speculate about what flexibility one can place upon the mechanism while still assuming that it remains the same mechanism in different thought experiments. But Fischer and Ravizza, relying only upon examples and intuitive treatments of them, have no principled basis for mechanism individuation.

To bring into relief how Haji’s identity constraints on a mechanism of action differ from Fischer and Ravizza’s, consider the following problem faced by Fischer and Ravizza. In speculating about whether a mechanism is reactive to reasons, Fischer and Ravizza imagine an example in which an agent’s mechanism reacts differently only when an agent gets “considerably more energy or focus when presented with a strong reason to do otherwise” (1998, p. 74). Their example involves a person, Brown, addicted to Plezu (a highly pleasurable drug). Rather than conclude that this sort of case confirms that the same sort of mechanism might possess the capacity to react to just some range of reasons, Fischer and Ravizza conclude that, as the agent responds differently only to reasons of a certain strength, then it must be that a different mechanism is at work, a mechanism different from the one that is not reactive to (weaker) reasons. The difficulty with this response for Fischer and Ravizza is that it appears that there is simply no basis for interpreting the imagined data as they do (McKenna, 2001b). What speaks against simply saying that the very same mechanism possesses a general capacity to react differently only to reasons of a certain strength? Fischer and Ravizza want to avoid this latter interpretation because it counts against their thesis that all that is required for demonstrating reasons-reactivity is that an agent’s mechanism react differently to any one reason. A single case, Fischer and Ravizza hold, confirms a general capacity to react differently to any reason to which the agent’s mechanism of action is receptive. But if it turned out that the mechanism of action seemed only to react to reasons of a certain strength, this would undermine the thesis that the mechanism possesses the general capacity to react to all reasons put to it. Instead, in light of its merely reacting to a few strong reasons, it would seem only to reflect a general capacity to react to strong reasons, not any reasons. As Fischer and Ravizza acknowledge (1998, p.73), this would in turn create problems fitting their reasons-responsive theory for compatibilism.

An advantage of Haji’s mechanism-based reasons-responsive account is that his offers some theoretical basis with which to handle the sort of thought experiment that poses problems for Fischer and Ravizza’s view (McKenna, 2001a). The proximal desire (the mechanism) that Haji seeks to hold fixed in assessing reasons-responsiveness is fixed, on Haji’s view, by a motivational base and an evaluative scheme. Drawing upon Alfred Mele’s work, Haji explains that a motivational base of any desire contains positive and negative elements that figure in the motivational strength of that desire. These factors comprise the total motivational base of a desire. On Haji’s view, a desire is the same desire operative in different scenarios if one holds fixed the motivational base of the desire. Applied to cases of addiction, Haji’s identification of a mechanism of action should get Fischer and Ravizza the result that they want. A severe addict will act from a different sort of mechanism than the sort that a normally functioning agent will act upon. The general capacities to react will be impaired. An addict’s volitional desire, given such a strong motivational base for the drug, will react only to certain sorts of reasons (such as fear of immediate death). This sort of mechanism of action will not be sufficiently reactive to the domain of good reasons to conclude that the agent acts freely when she acts from such a mechanism. Of course, there is absolutely no reason that Fischer and Ravizza cannot see Haji’s account as a friendly amendment to their approach.

Also, like Fischer and Ravizza’s, Haji’s compatibilism is externalist. But Haji places the historical requirement in a different place from where other theorists such as Fischer and Ravizza do. For Fischer and Ravizza, the historical constraint on moral responsibility comes as a component of the freedom or control condition for morally responsible agency. So, for Fischer and Ravizza, guidance control requires the satisfaction of two conditions: that the mechanism of action is moderately reasons-responsive, and that an agent went through a process whereby she took responsibility for her mechanism of action (the latter is where the historical properties come in). But Haji’s treats a reasons-responsive mechanism of action as sufficient to satisfy the freedom or control condition necessary for moral responsibility. This seems only to require internalist, snapshot properties. Instead, Haji maintains that a condition for morally responsible agency distinct from the freedom or control condition is where an historical element emerges. According to Haji, a morally responsible agent must act freely from an authentic evaluative scheme, a scheme that is genuinely hers, and not one forced upon her by indoctrination, or electronic implantation, or by other means of manipulation (1998, pp. 124–39).

Haji’s authenticity condition, or some might say autonomy condition, points to a different place than freedom or control where determinism could pose a threat to morally responsible agency. On Haji’s view, manipulation cases do not threaten moral responsibility by threatening free will. As regards free will or control, Haji’s position is internalist. Rather, manipulation cases threaten moral responsibility by threatening an agent’s authenticity as an evaluator of what courses of action and way of life are valuable or worth pursuing. Hence, Haji’s historicism is designed to fight manipulators that artificially craft an agent’s framework of values.

According to Haji, authentic as opposed to inauthentic evaluative schemes arise through means that facilitate an agent’s ability to evaluate or assess them, and especially, allow her freedom not to act in accord with them. For example, the sweet child whose sweetness is beat into her does not act from an authentic evaluative scheme, but one forged with no regard to foster understanding or sensitivities that allow maturation. Indeed, such forms of indoctrination retard the capacity for self-evolution. Hence, Haji’s historicism, as applied to authenticity, is meant to rule out manipulation cases that implant an agent’s framework of evaluations in control subverting ways. But one might wonder, in exactly the same way under consideration when discussing Fischer and Ravizza’s view above (section B.2), whether Pereboom might be able to fashion his version of a manipulation argument so that the manipulation would satisfy Haji’s historical conditions. Couldn’t a manipulator simply manipulate in a manner that facilitated the relevant authenticity-friendly agential abilities? If so, would this sort of case undermine an agent’s status as a morally responsible agent?

D. Normative Standpoint Compatibilism

One powerful element in Strawsonian compatibilism concerns Strawson’s emphasis on the point of view of those in the moral community holding agents morally responsible (see section 4.5). Hence, Strawson emphasizes the morally reactive attitudes. On one interpretation of Strawson’s position, the best case for compatibilism begins from the vantage point of the reasons for holding and not holding an agent morally responsible. This vantage point looks first to the normally functioning interpersonal relationships of the members of the moral community. These relationships give shape to the moral expectations and demands within which a morally responsible agent must operate. In its strongest form, this Strawsonian approach leads one to regard with suspicion compatibilist efforts to capture free will by starting with action theoretic features of agency, features involving the springs of action (e.g., reasons-responsive mechanisms, or hierarchical or other structural features involving elements of an agent’s psychology). This tactic moves from action theoretic considerations to full accounts of morally responsible agency, and then to the propriety conditions for others holding an agent morally responsible. Given a certain Strawsonian orientation, the proper strategy is to begin with the standpoint of the members of the moral community holding an agent responsible. On this approach, the debate is best cast as a normative one about the sorts of principles that bear on when we should or should not treat a person as morally responsible. From these normative questions, we can then extrapolate what sort of action-theoretic characteristics are needed to live up to these normative expectations. [Of course, this normative standpoint strategy, when developed in its strongest form, is specious. Why should it be assumed that if we begin by looking at the standpoint of holding responsible, the philosophical controversy will amount to a merely normative one? Might not that standpoint itself make certain metaphysical presuppositions about the sorts of beings seen as the appropriate objects of our normative demands? Furthermore, if the legitimacy of the standpoint of holding responsible were itself challenged, one quite natural way to defend it would be to argue that it is designed to respond to beings of a certain sort. This would naturally realign the order of priority, giving privilege back to questions of agency.]

R. Jay Wallace is the rightful heir to this Strawsonian strategy. In his extremely influential Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments, Wallace made this Strawsonian strategy his own, supplementing it so as to avoid standard worries associated with Strawson’s formulation of compatibilism, and working towards an account of compatibilism that requires only guidance and not regulative control. Wallace gives structure to the morally reactive attitudes by distinguishing them from other attitudes and emotions. According to Wallace, a reactive attitude of resentment or moral indignation has as its object a certain sort of belief. The belief involves the judgment that a person has violated an obligation to which she should be held (1994, pp. 33–40). [By giving an account of holding responsible in terms of obligations, Wallace puts a Kantian spin on his account. For an alternative Humean approach to Strawsonian compatibilism, see Paul Russell’s excellent Freedom and Moral Sentiment (1995).] To hold an agent morally responsible (and blameworthy) for some bit of conduct is to respond to her (or to believe that it would be appropriate to respond to her) with the morally reactive emotion of resentment or moral indignation.

Wallace’s approach gives content to the morally reactive attitudes, thereby showing how they can be subject to critical evaluation by objective standards. If, for instance, it turns out that the belief serving as a basis for a morally reactive attitude is false—that is, if the person in question did not in point of fact violate the obligation in question—then the rational basis for the attitude is shown to be undercut. Hence, the attitude should be forsworn. Given this explication of the morally reactive attitudes, Wallace next turns to the Strawsonian question of when excuses or exemptions are appropriate. [Excuses involve specific pleas that one is not responsible for some bit of conduct, such as, “I did not see you there.” Exemptions involve pleas that a person is not competent to function as a morally responsible agent, such as, “She did not understand what she was doing. She is severely mentally ill.”] According to Wallace, that question turns upon two others. In the case of excuses, the question turns upon whether the agent in fact did violate the obligation to which others hold her (1994, pp. 118–53). In the case of exemptions, the question turns upon whether the agent possesses the general capacities to understand and act upon the moral demands placed on her by such obligations (1994, pp. 154–94). In each case, Wallace maintains, it is a normative principle of fairness that informs our excusing or exempting practices. In the case of excusing practices, the principle is one of desert: One does not deserve to be blamed for violating a moral obligation that she did not violate. In the case of exempting practices, the principle is one of moral reasonableness: It is unreasonable to demand of a person that she comply with moral demands if she simply hasn’t the capacities or resources to do so.

Wallace proceeds to argue that neither of these moral principles is threatened by determinism. Determinism would not show that no one ever violates moral obligations, nor would it show that everyone is incapacitated to understand or comply with the demands involved in moral obligations. Furthermore, as Wallace observes, excuses that appear to generate the demand for alternative possibilities (and hence, Garden of Forking Paths freedom and regulative control), such as, “I could not have done otherwise”, are excuses that cannot be generalized. They work, when they do, only by showing that an agent did not violate a moral obligation in acting as she did (1994, pp. 152–3). Factors other than her disregard for a moral obligation explain her action (e.g., she was forced to do something at gunpoint, or was physically unable to get to the emergency phone because her leg was broken, etc.). So it seems that Wallace shares with Frankfurt and Fischer the view that regulative control is not required for moral responsibility; only guidance control is.

But where does Wallace stand as regards manipulation cases and the internalist versus externalist (snapshot versus historical properties) approaches to free will and moral responsibility? In Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments Wallace addresses manipulation cases under the rubric of systematic behavior control or conditioning (1994, p. 155). His principle for distinguishing those exempt from morally responsible agency is informed exclusively by whether the persons in question are incapacitated to understand and comply with the demands of moral obligations. Therefore, it looks as if Wallace is committed to an internalist position, and to treating moral responsibility as a snapshot property. (However, Wallace himself never discusses the debate in these terms.) To the extent that any internalist position is susceptible to manipulation cases, it seems that Wallace’s is too. It looks as if Wallace must adopt the same style of response as Frankfurt (discussed in section A above).

Wallace approaches the free will issue from the normative standpoint of moral philosophy, whereas a view like Frankfurt’s or Fischer and Ravizza’s approaches the topic from the standpoints of metaphysics and action theory. There appears to be a serious tension between the two approaches, and Wallace openly considers this tension, arguing that his is to be preferred to the other approach (1994, pp. 85–95). [This contrast between metaphysical and normative might well be overdrawn. For instance, on Fischer and Ravizza’s view, a moderately reasons-responsive mechanism must be receptive to at least some moral reasons. Hence, “normative” considerations bleed into their metaphysical account. Similarly, on Wallace’s view, the normative principles of fairness that inform our practices of holding morally responsible concern persons. Hence, “metaphysical” considerations bleed into his normative account.] But any tension of methodology should not be too quickly associated with a tension in outcomes. Perhaps a view like Wallace’s might mesh with a view like Frankfurt’s or Fischer and Ravizza’s, so that the same sort of conditions of agency and responsibility apply in both cases. This would suggest that the different approaches can actually work in tandem, maybe because our normative principles of fairness informing our moral responsibility practices track our metaphysical and action-theoretical parsings.

E. Practical Standpoint Compatibilism

Hilary Bok has advanced a form of compatibilism that shares certain features with Daniel Dennett’s. In particular, Bok, like Dennett, develops a viewpoint argument—or as she puts it, a standpoint argument. Both maintain that a certain standpoint is a legitimate one, and is the one whence judgments of responsibility arise. Responsibility or freedom concepts at work within this viewpoint, each argue, are compatibilist-friendly ones, unthreatened by the possibility that determinism is true. Bok’s account, however, differs in various respects from Dennett’s. Unlike Dennett, Bok maintains that the relevant standpoint arises by distinguishing, in Kantian fashion, between the practical and the theoretical points of view. The former standpoint has as its goal answering questions about how one ought to act. The latter concerns truthfully describing and explaining events as necessary results of antecedent conditions (1998, pp. 62–5). It is Bok’s contention that, while both libertarian notions of free will and compatibilist notions of free will are found within the range of the “ordinary” concept of freedom, the one that matters as regards the free will debate is the one that a practical agent would have good reason to adopt (1998, p. 100). It is not that one, so to speak, captures the “real” truth about what the concept of free will is. It’s that one is useful to agency in a way that the other is not. Hence, Bok seeks to settle the free will problem by looking at the role of the concept of freedom from the point of view of a practical deliberator engaged in settling questions regarding how to act, how to live her life, what kind of person she wishes to be, etc.

Given her practical standpoint approach, Bok maintains that the sort of freedom that is of use to practical deliberators concerns possibilities restricted in scope to those consistent with what an agent understands to be practically possible from her limited epistemic perspective (1998, p. 108). These possibilities are much looser than the sort required by libertarian free will, the latter requiring attention only to possibilities given a precisely specified past and holding fixed the actual laws of nature. Bok’s favored possibilities allow an agent to reason about alternative courses of action conditional upon her choosing in one manner as opposed to another. Hence, Bok embraces a conditional analysis of free will. Naturally for Bok, for an alternative to be genuine, it need not be open given precisely the same past and laws of nature. It need only be genuine given the coarser facts about the conditional relation between an agent’s will and subsequent conduct likely to arise from it. If she chooses in one fashion, then a certain course of action will come to fruition; if she chooses in another, then another course of action will come to fruition (1998, p. 120).

So Bok embraces regulative control in order to capture the freedom-relevant condition for moral responsibility. Her appeal to a conditional analysis of regulative control, however, leaves her open to the same sort of criticism leveled against the classical compatibilist’s conditional analysis (see 3.3 above). On her view, an agent who does y and not x has free will with respect to the alternative course of action x if the following is true: If she chose to x, then she would x. But classical compatibilists faced a troubling sort of example that seemed to disprove any such equivalence. A person could lack free will with respect to a course of action since she might suffer from a psychological condition that made it impossible for her to choose that course of action x. All the same, it would still be true that, if she did choose the course of action x, then she would x. Hence, the analysis generates the result that an agent has free will in cases in which clearly she does not (Ginet, 2003; Haji, 2002; and McKenna, 2002).

It would, however, be unfair to dismiss Bok’s practical standpoint compatibilist theory simply because the particular account of freedom she relies upon is suspect. It might be true that conditional analyses are doomed to failure, but other treatments of agential possibility remain. So perhaps Bok could defend some notion of regulative control sans the classical compatibilists’ conditional analysis. Indeed, this is just what the new dispositionalists have attempted to achieve (see section 4.1), and there is no reason that Bok could not draw upon their proposal, one that embraces a dispositionalist account of regulative control, but shuns a conditional analysis of dispositions. So Bok’s position remains very much alive despite any worries of the sort currently under consideration. The important philosophical point, on Bok’s approach, is that the demands of the practical standpoint invite a looser notion of possibility than the sort that is at work when formulating precise definitions of determinism, or when attempting to fashion libertarian notions of free will. Some looser notion of agential possibility might allow a compatibilist to say that all the possibility that is needed for regulative control is something like epistemic possibility, i.e., “for all I as a practical agent know” possibility.

So set aside the (legitimate) criticism that Bok’s manner of developing regulative control falls prey to the same sorts of objections leveled against the classical compatibilist. Fix instead on the strategic effort to show that the practical standpoint encourages some looser notion of possibility than the sort relevant to determinism. How does Bok justify the import of this compatibilist notion of freedom? According to Bok, it is justified by our practical interest in improving the qualities of our wills, which are reflections of our selves, fashioners of the people we will become (1998, pp. 123–66). We care, when we deliberate, to evaluate possibilities in terms of how we acted in the past and how we might improve our conduct and ourselves in the future. A compatibilist notion of freedom will help us to do the work of improving our characters and fashioning our selves. It will allow us to conceive of what it is within our general range of capacities to do, and to evaluate our options in terms which lead to our improvement.

Bok’s justification for a compatibilist-friendly notion of freedom is surprisingly forward-looking. We care about the relevant notion of freedom since we care about future improvements to our wills and characters. This is in deep conflict with the spirit of approaches (such as Strawson’s) that have dismissed such consequentialist sorts of justifications of free will as unable to capture the intimate connection between an agent and her responsibility for what she has done. For her regret or guilt to be a genuine expression of her attitude towards her conduct and those whom she wronged, it had better be a response to what she did in the past, and not merely a vehicle for improving herself in the future. But set this sort of worry aside. Another implication of Bok’s forward looking account is that it seems that she must accept an internalist view (Haji, 2002). If the practical use of freedom is best understood as forward-looking, then however an agent is caused to come into existence and have the psychological structure she has, she can regard herself as free and responsible insofar as doing so will aid in improving her will somewhere down the pike. Bok, it seems, like Frankfurt and Wallace, is an internalist. If so, then in relevant sorts of manipulation cases as they figure in a manipulation argument, Bok must resist premise one, and contend that an agent manipulated into the relevant state, if she is at the time fully equipped to apply her capacities for practical reasoning, is free and morally responsible for what she does.

F. The Action Theory Theory

One classical compatibilist strategy that most contemporary theorists seem to have overlooked is an austere one that attempts to make do with as little as possible beyond more primitive features of agency itself. The classical compatibilist used only blunt instruments to fashion such a view (see section 2.1). All that she seemed to draw upon in an account of agency was the notion of a desire or want, and the negative condition that it be unimpeded. But despite her impoverished resources in capturing the springs of action, her strategy was a philosophically elegant one. Simply postulate no more than the features giving rise to agency. These features need be no fancier than the sort typically at play innormally functioning human persons. There is little reason to imagine that determinism is incompatible with such agency simpliciter. Next, to capture freely willed agency, append some negative conditions that secure that sometimes that basic sort of agency can function unhindered by coercive or compulsive forces. Voilà, free will! Add no more metaphysical constraints, nothing further to show how it gels with determinism. Leave compatibilism at that; simple is better.

In Autonomous Agency, Alfred Mele sketches a contemporary form of compatibilism that shares with the classical compatibilist the strategy of theoretical austerity: Capture free will by adding as little as possible beyond an account of mere agency. [As one subject editor pointed out, there might be a lot of metaphysical work loaded into Mele’s account of agency simpliciter, and it might be that the controversial compatibilist details are found there and not in any further metaphysical conditions (such as hierarchical accounts of the will).] Naturally, Mele draws upon a finely tuned set of conceptual tools to capture more clearly the contours of the springs of action. He makes use of philosophy’s matured understanding of action theory, an understanding to which he himself has contributed. But he attempts to append to his account of agency as little as possible in order to generate a form of compatibilism that speaks to the contemporary dialectic. Given that the theory of compatibilism that he advises attempts to build mostly from his work on the theory of action, it might be called the Action Theory Theory. (Mele himself is not a compatibilist. He remains agnostic between compatibilists and incompatibilists, but offers each camp a best shot at a workable theory.) On Mele’s view, free will is where the action is.

Mele does not fashion compatibilism in terms of free will and determinism, but instead in terms of autonomy and determinism. But as Mele openly acknowledges, he understands autonomy to be amongst the freedom concepts in discussions of moral responsibility (1995, p. 4). Mele understands autonomy, basically, as the capacity for self-governance or self-rule, and he looks to more basic features of self-control to explain the phenomena. A word of caution: Mele’s discussion of self-control should not be assimilated with the notions of guidance or regulative control discussed by Fischer (and used in this essay to distinguish different views of free will). Fischer and others who make use of the notion of control as synonymous with free will see the relevant notion of control as all that is needed to satisfy the freedom-relevant condition for morally responsible agency. But Mele does not presume that the notion of self-control he wishes to distinguish can do that compatibilist work. Indeed, as will become clear, Mele holds that the sort of self-control he wishes to distinguish, while a genuine actional feature found in most normally functioning agents, is not adequate to explain the kind of freedom at issue in discussions of moral responsibility.

What does Mele have in mind by a self-controlled agent? He has in mind the opposite of an agent who is akratic, that is, an agent who is weak-willed. Mele treats self-controlled and weakly-willed conduct as two sides of the same coin (1995, p. 5). Hence, he draws upon his account of weakness of will to help shed light on weak will’s opposite, self-control. According to Mele, weakness of will arises when one’s motivational states become misaligned with one’s judgments about the best (or better) course of action (1995, p. 7). Because, on Mele’s view, evaluations of things one desires can be out of line with the strength of one’s desires for those things, one’s best judgments sometimes are in disharmony with one’s strongest desires (desires that do appear to play a causal role in action) (1995, p. 25). It is in such cases of conflict that the self-controlled as opposed to the weak willed agent is able to resist acting upon her currently strongest desire and instead act in accord with what she judges it best to do (1995, p. 80). This is possible, on Mele’s view, since agents with the sort of sophistication of normally functioning persons are able to promise themselves rewards for resisting temptation, or direct their attention to less desirable features of the path more strongly desired, and generally, exploit less episodic and more stable motivation to exercise self-control. In so doing, they can bring their motivational condition into line with their “best judgments” (1995, pp. 81–83).

According to Mele, an agent can be both determined and exercise the actional resources to act with self-control. Hence, determinism is compatible with self-controlled agency. But it is Mele’s contention that even an optimally self-controlled agent can fall short of autonomous agency (1995, pp. 121–7). Hence, Mele concludes that more has to be added to his account of self-control to get all the way to autonomous agency. Notice that, up until this point, Mele’s theory appeals only to features of agency at work in the theory of action. These include such notions as best judgments, strongest desires, intentions, the ability to promise oneself rewards, the distinction between more and less episodic motivational factors, and questions about the potential conflict between best judgment and motivational desires.

How is it that, on Mele’s view, self-controlled agency is not itself sufficient to capture autonomous agency? Because, on Mele’s view, the beliefs, values and principles that inform one’s deliberation and conduct might be installed in a person in some autonomy (or responsibility) undermining manner. Such cases arise via various sorts of manipulation, through brainwashing or hypnosis, or even from a history of rigorous indoctrination during youth. The key element in an agent’s not having had, for instance, unsheddable principles and values installed in an autonomy-undermining manner is that the causal manner in which the agent acquired them did not bypass an agent’s critical capacities to assess the principles and values for herself (1995, pp. 166–73). In such cases, she had the opportunity to embrace or shed them. Hence, Mele postulates a negative historical constraint on autonomous agency: An agent acts autonomously if she acts with self-control, has beliefs that foster deliberation, is able to deliberate effectively, was not caused to endorse unsheddable values and principles (against which she is able to evaluate her reasons for action) by means that bypassed her capacities for critical evaluation (1995, p.193).

Another important feature of the compatibilist view Mele offers is that, like Fischer and Ravizza’s, it also eschews the demand for regulative control. In fact, Mele, along with David Robb, coauthored one of the most compelling defenses of Frankfurt examples in order to demonstrate that moral responsibility, and also free will and autonomous agency, do not require the freedom to do otherwise (Mele and Robb, 1998). Hence Mele, like Frankfurt, Fischer, and Wallace, avoids difficulties arising from incompatibilist attacks upon regulative control, such as the one posed by the Consequence Argument (see section 3.1).

Notice that Mele’s view differs from Fischer and Ravizza’s (see Section B.2 above) in that Mele’s historical constraint is a negative one. Hence, Mele, unlike Fischer and Ravizza, offers no specific account of what kind of causal history of owning one’s springs of action is required. Rather, Mele only states what kind of history cannot give rise to autonomous (or freely willed) agency. One important difference between Mele’s historical view and Fischer and Ravizza’s is that the latter offer a positive account of the sort of history that is required, which leads them to a subjectivist view. On Fischer and Ravizza’s subjectivist view, an agent is not morally responsible for her conduct if she does not believe herself to be a candidate for such evaluations. On Mele’s view, an agent might fail to have the relevant beliefs, and hence refuse to take responsibility for what others would insist she should. But so long as the values and principles that she does act upon did not arise through means that bypassed her capacities to evaluate them, then she is autonomous with respect to (and morally responsible for) the self-controlled actions arising from them—no matter what her subjective view of her self might be.

In Free Will and Luck (2006) Mele revisited his 1995 compatibilist proposal, defending it against various critics, and further amending it by considering it in light of a yet-more-refined version of an incompatibilists’ manipulation argument (which, as shall be explained below, is more accurately described as a creation argument). In an effort to discharge his first task, Mele revisits his case of Ann and Beth (introduced above in section B.2). Although the case is a manipulation case, and so most likely thought to be of use primarily to incompatibilists, Mele first introduced it, not to develop an incompatibilist argument against compatibilism, but to articulate his externalist, and so historical, compatibilist theory. Both Ann and Beth possess at a certain time of action the same intrinsic properties (roughly), and so are internal psychological duplicates. But if one (Ann) acts freely and is morally responsible and the other (Beth) is not, it is only history that could explain the difference. And so, Mele contends, compatibilists should be externalists and opt for a historical requirement, which, as just explained, for Mele is a negative one. An agent must not have acquired her values and principles (and then be forced to sustain them) by means that bypassed her ability to evaluate them. Ann did not acquire her values and principles in this way; Beth did. In his more recent book, Mele takes on Daniel Dennett (2003), Nomy Arpaly (2003), and Tomis Kapitan (2000), each of whom press Mele by contending either that we can understand cases like Beth’s in such a way that her lack of responsibility is due to some non-historical fact about her when she acts, and not her history (Dennett’s move), or instead, that Beth is free and morally responsible if Ann is (Arpaly’s move), or that there are other cases of manipulation whereby an agent satisfies Mele’s proposed compatibilist sufficient conditions for moral responsibility, and yet the agent is not free and responsible (Kapitan’s move). In each case, Mele defends his original proposal. (I’ll not set out the details here.)

One especially fruitful upshot of Mele’s reply to his previous critics comes in Mele’s response to Kapitan (Mele, 2006, pp.184–95). Kapitan was worried about a manipulation case in which an agent was manipulated (or rather created) at a deterministic universe to act at a certain time, but yet none of her values and principles are acquired by her in ways that undermine her (compatibilist) ability to critically evaluate them. In such a case, the agent would satisfy Mele’s proposed compatibilist sufficient conditions, and yet, Kapitan’s worry seemed to be that we should think such an agent is not free or morally responsible when she acts at the crucial time. [What Kapitan had in mind, it seems, is that the compatibilist would then not be able to deny premise 2 of the manipulation argument (as set out above in the introduction).] In the course of replying to Kapitan, Mele introduced a new argument for incompatibilism, the zygote argument, and used it so as to help clarify just what is involved in a commitment to compatibilism of the sort Mele has proposed. Very briefly, the argument begins with an example, not of manipulating an already existing agent, but of creating an agent “in utero,” as Mele puts it (2006, p.188). So, at a determined world, the goddess Diana creates a zygote that, thirty years later is (or becomes) Ernie, and performs some act, which was just the act that Diana intended that Ernie perform at the precise time he did. Bernie is just like Ernie, but lived out his life through a normal deterministic process and acts just like Ernie at the relevant time. Now, Mele asks, can a compatibilist consistently contend that Bernie is free and morally responsible when he acts while holding that Ernie is not? With this question in mind, Mele formulates the zygote argument for incompatibilism (2006, p.189). Roughly, the argument goes as follows: 1) Because of how Ernie’s zygote was formed, he is not free and morally responsible when he acts; 2) There is no relevant difference between how Ernie comes into existence and how an agent at a determined world (like Bernie) comes into existence; therefore, 3) determinism rules out free and morally responsible action.

Mele ultimately suggests that if the compatibilist is to resist this argument, she must resist the first premise and not the second. Hence, as Mele makes clear, externalism about freedom and moral responsibility will not guarantee the historical compatibilist a way to claim that in all “global” manipulation cases (if we can think of a creation case as an extreme manipulation case), the agent is not free and responsible. The historical compatibilist, of either Fischer and Ravizza’s or Mele’s stripe, will sometimes have to resist premise one rather than premise two (as set out in the introductory section, and as formulated in Mele’s zygote argument) of a well crafted manipulation argument. Mele’s zygote argument has rightly received a considerable amount of attention, as it seems to zero in on just the core thought driving the many other attempts to develop a manipulation argument. In fact, one might think that Mele’s case of Ernie is very much like the agent in Pereboom’s Case 2 (discussed above in the introduction). What Mele has done is articulate in a more precise way how an agent could be manipulated (or created) by a team of programmers (or a goddess) to move through a compatibilist-friendly history that is freedom and responsibility facilitating and eventually come to perform what a compatibilist would contend is a free act for which she is morally responsible. Of course Pereboom contends that such an agent is not free and responsible, and Mele also points out that this also is just what an incompatibilist would say. Regardless, the salient point is that the compatibilist is forced to accept what seems to be a counter-intuitive result: that agents so manipulated, or created, are nevertheless free and morally responsible. It is then the compatibilists’ burden to carry this weight and explain why it is worth the cost to carry it.

A good deal more could be said in an effort to explain the sort of compatibilism Mele suggests, but one of the more provocative and distinctive elements in his account is his strategic return to the austerity of the classical compatibilists. The Action Theory Theory gets a lot of mileage just out of action theory. It is an elegant philosophical maneuver and merits more serious attention than it has received up to this point.

G. Further Avenues to Explore

In closing, here are several other interesting avenues currently worth exploring.

G.1 Judgment-Sensitivity and Non-Voluntarism

Ever since Robert Adams published his famous 1985 paper, “Involuntary Sins,” some have been convinced that moral responsibility does not require free will or free action since it does not even require anything voluntary at all. According to Adams, a person might, for example, be responsible merely for entertaining racist thoughts, or possessing an objectionable character trait. Adams’s thesis, while intriguing, was not developed in the context of a full theory of moral responsibility, and perhaps partly for this reason was hard to assess. But in more recent times, theories of moral responsibility have been developed that explain how and why it is that a person might be morally responsible—and so praiseworthy or blameworthy—for things over which she did not exercise any voluntary control. Most notable here is T.M. Scanlon, who accounts for an agent’s moral responsibility in terms of what is revealed about her judgment-sensitivity (1998, and 2008). Scanlon does not fix attention on the non-voluntary, but it is clear that the resources that he uses to account for moral responsibility for action (in at least one of the two senses that he distinguishes) provide sufficient conditions for an agent’s being morally responsible for non-voluntary matters as well, such as unbidden racist thoughts, or lack of proper regard for those one loves. Here, Angela Smith (2005) has done much to develop this Scanlonian theme, and has explicitly argued for moral responsibility for non-voluntary elements of a person that reflect her sensitivity to moral considerations. Naturally, it becomes easier to see how to make moral responsibility compatible with determinism if there is no requirement on moral responsibility that an agent act with any free will at all. So as not to mislead, it should be pointed out that in the case of action, judgment-sensitivity theorists are inclined to require a kind of freedom, but one that simply shows that, in acting, an agent reveals her sensitivity to moral considerations. An agent who is not free because shoved, or because suffering from an irresistible compulsive desire, is one whose behavior is not linked to her sensitivity to moral judgments, as she would act in these ways irrespective of her judgments.

G.2 Compatibilism & Revisionism

J.J.C. Smart (1963) famously bifurcated the free will debate, denying the notion of moral responsibility built on the concept of desert (one seemingly incompatible with determinism), and in doing so dismissing the traditional free will problem. But Smart unabashedly proposed a revision of our ordinary concept of moral responsibility along the lines of utilitarian considerations of influenceability. Our common notion of moral responsibility and freedom might be no good, but Smart insisted that a better one should simply be taken on, one that can be assessed in terms of social utility. Smart’s appeal to utilitarian considerations alone did not cut much ice with many other philosophers (such as Strawson, 1963). But there might well be other ways to cultivate a revisionist program in ways that are broadly friendly to the overall compatibilist project. To this end, Manuel Vargas (e.g., in 2005, 2008, and Fischer, et al. 2007) has argued that our ordinary concept of moral responsibility, and the freedom required of it, is incompatibilist, but also unsatisfiable at this world. Nevertheless, we could reject this concept and instead build a revised concept of freedom and responsibility that lives up to our normative demands (unlike Smart’s utilitarian proposal) and is naturalistically plausible (unlike libertarian theories of free agency). Vargas’s revisionist compatibilism offers an especially intriguing option in light of some evidence from recent work by experimental philosophers indicating that our concept of moral responsibility might have some elements that pull in the direction of compatibilism, and others that pull in the direction of incompatibilism. (To appreciate the controversy over how we really should take the folk notion(s) of freedom and responsibility, see, e.g., Nichols, 2006; Nahmias, Morris, Nadelhoffer, and Turner, 2006; and Roskies and Nichols, 2008).

G.3 Orthonomy: Freedom in Belief and Desire

Phillip Pettit and Michael Smith (in, e.g., 1996) argue that we can account for the freedom bearing on moral responsibility in terms of orthonomy—right rule. An agent who is orthonomous is able to recognize standards of right belief and right desire and then adjust their beliefs and desires in the light of pertinent norms. The standards for sensitivity to the norms will involve some that are of a conversational nature (see especially Pettit, 2001). To believe rightly is in part to be prepared to be swayed by the good evidence other believers might make available. So too for desiring rightly. Others have also developed similar accounts of moral responsibility and freedom (or self-control), all of which are regarded to be compatible with determinism (e.g., Kennett’s common sense defense of self-controlled agency, 2001). One interesting question for these views is how much overlap they share with a reasons-responsive view, such as Fischer and Ravizza’s (discussed in section B above). Suppose, for instance, Pettit is right to contend that the crucial freedom for moral responsibility requires discursive control in one’s dealings with other persons, and suppose that in fact this does reach beyond anything Fischer and Ravizza explicitly say; it might nevertheless be that the two theses are easily conjoined, and that Fischer and Ravizza’s project really offers the right sort of metaphysical anchor for a proposal like Pettit’s.

G.4 Contractualism and Compatibilism

Turning to the moral theory of contractualism brings us back to the important work of T.M. Scanlon (1998, and 2008), wherein Scanlon draws upon his general commitments in moral theory to account for the warrantability of our judgments of moral responsibility. Very roughly, according to Scanlon, one kind of moral responsibility—of the sort whereby we hold each other accountable—is to be explained and justified by appeal to principles that one could not reasonably reject, were she to be prepared to consider a contract for mutual cooperation in our social relations. The core compatibilist move here for Scanlon is that the truth of determinism would have no bearing on rational agents’ grounds for accepting the relevant principles, including the sorts of sanctions involved in blaming behavior in those cases in which agents fail to live up to standards that it would not be reasonable to reject. Others have pursued a contractualist proposal along other lines (e.g., Lenman, 2006), and it is fair to say that a contractualist approaches the puzzle of the relation between moral responsibility and determinism in a way that seems largely to neuter the traditional action-theoretic worries most working on the free will problem take to be central.

G.5 Compatibilism without Desert: Wimpy or just Modest?

The hard incompatibilist Derk Pereboom argues that the really important sort of moral responsibility, the sort that has been at issue in the traditional free will debate, is the basic desert entailing kind. It is the kind according to which the wrongdoer who freely does wrong deserves to be blamed just because she has done wrong, and not for any other reason (such as a utilitarian or contractualist sort of reason) (Pereboom, 2001, and Fischer, et. al., 2007). But Pereboom contends that various non-desert entailing kinds of moral responsibility—for the moment let us call them “wimpy” ones—are ones he would be prepared to say are compatible with determinism. [In Pereboom, 2007 (p.86), he explicitly mentions Bok’s view, though various other compatibilists have openly argued for a version of compatibilism that is decoupled from considerations of basic desert, such as Wallace (1994), and Scanlon (1998).] So, for instance, if when a person did wrong and was, in compatibilist terms, acting from reasons-responsive springs, then it might well be right to engage her morally, to express our moral ill will, to make demands of her, and so on. Furthermore, such determined agents could be ones we could still love and respect, they could be liable to being influenced by the threat of punishment, and it would be reasonable to alter our emotional relations with them in ways that befit their having purposely harmed or benefited us. Now, some might contend that these wimpy resources are still rich enough to justify judgments of moral responsibility, and are, furthermore, readily shown to be compatible with determinism. An especially pressing question here is how much practical difference there would be between the desert-entailing kind of freedom and responsibility that Pereboom and other incompatibilists allege are incompatible with determinism, and the sort that Pereboom is prepared to treat in compatibilist fashion at a determined world. The person who blames from a desert entailing sort of moral responsibility might do no more in responding to a wrongdoer than shun her as a means of blaming her. And this is something the person who blames in the non-desert entailing way might do as well. Here there would be no difference in treatment at all, the only difference being in underlying justification and rationale. Wimpy compatibilism might be compatibilism enough, and if it is, then Pereboom, qua wimpy compatibilist, would be able to get nearly everything he contends cannot be gotten from a non-wimpy version. So, will wimpy do? One thing those who remain undecided should take care to guard against is being seduced into plumping for the tough standard (the basic desert entailing sort of moral responsibility) merely because the other is characterized as wimpy. The real question should simply be about reasonable and adequate resources for rationally justifying our attributions of freedom and responsibility. Maybe “wimpy compatibilism” is just “modest compatibilism” by another name.

Copyright © 2024 by
Michael McKenna <>
D. Justin Coates <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free