The Modern History of Computing

First published Mon Dec 18, 2000; substantive revision Fri Jun 9, 2006

Historically, computers were human clerks who calculated in accordance with effective methods. These human computers did the sorts of calculation nowadays carried out by electronic computers, and many thousands of them were employed in commerce, government, and research establishments. The term computing machine, used increasingly from the 1920s, refers to any machine that does the work of a human computer, i.e., any machine that calculates in accordance with effective methods. During the late 1940s and early 1950s, with the advent of electronic computing machines, the phrase ‘computing machine’ gradually gave way simply to ‘computer’, initially usually with the prefix ‘electronic’ or ‘digital’. This entry surveys the history of these machines.


Charles Babbage was Lucasian Professor of Mathematics at Cambridge University from 1828 to 1839 (a post formerly held by Isaac Newton). Babbage's proposed Difference Engine was a special-purpose digital computing machine for the automatic production of mathematical tables (such as logarithm tables, tide tables, and astronomical tables). The Difference Engine consisted entirely of mechanical components — brass gear wheels, rods, ratchets, pinions, etc. Numbers were represented in the decimal system by the positions of 10-toothed metal wheels mounted in columns. Babbage exhibited a small working model in 1822. He never completed the full-scale machine that he had designed but did complete several fragments. The largest — one ninth of the complete calculator — is on display in the London Science Museum. Babbage used it to perform serious computational work, calculating various mathematical tables. In 1990, Babbage's Difference Engine No. 2 was finally built from Babbage's designs and is also on display at the London Science Museum.

The Swedes Georg and Edvard Scheutz (father and son) constructed a modified version of Babbage's Difference Engine. Three were made, a prototype and two commercial models, one of these being sold to an observatory in Albany, New York, and the other to the Registrar-General's office in London, where it calculated and printed actuarial tables.

Babbage's proposed Analytical Engine, considerably more ambitious than the Difference Engine, was to have been a general-purpose mechanical digital computer. The Analytical Engine was to have had a memory store and a central processing unit (or ‘mill’) and would have been able to select from among alternative actions consequent upon the outcome of its previous actions (a facility nowadays known as conditional branching). The behaviour of the Analytical Engine would have been controlled by a program of instructions contained on punched cards connected together with ribbons (an idea that Babbage had adopted from the Jacquard weaving loom). Babbage emphasised the generality of the Analytical Engine, saying ‘the conditions which enable a finite machine to make calculations of unlimited extent are fulfilled in the Analytical Engine’ (Babbage [1994], p. 97).

Babbage worked closely with Ada Lovelace, daughter of the poet Byron, after whom the modern programming language ADA is named. Lovelace foresaw the possibility of using the Analytical Engine for non-numeric computation, suggesting that the Engine might even be capable of composing elaborate pieces of music.

A large model of the Analytical Engine was under construction at the time of Babbage's death in 1871 but a full-scale version was never built. Babbage's idea of a general-purpose calculating engine was never forgotten, especially at Cambridge, and was on occasion a lively topic of mealtime discussion at the war-time headquarters of the Government Code and Cypher School, Bletchley Park, Buckinghamshire, birthplace of the electronic digital computer.

Analog computers

The earliest computing machines in wide use were not digital but analog. In analog representation, properties of the representational medium ape (or reflect or model) properties of the represented state-of-affairs. (In obvious contrast, the strings of binary digits employed in digital representation do not represent by means of possessing some physical property — such as length — whose magnitude varies in proportion to the magnitude of the property that is being represented.) Analog representations form a diverse class. Some examples: the longer a line on a road map, the longer the road that the line represents; the greater the number of clear plastic squares in an architect's model, the greater the number of windows in the building represented; the higher the pitch of an acoustic depth meter, the shallower the water. In analog computers, numerical quantities are represented by, for example, the angle of rotation of a shaft or a difference in electrical potential. Thus the output voltage of the machine at a time might represent the momentary speed of the object being modelled.

As the case of the architect's model makes plain, analog representation may be discrete in nature (there is no such thing as a fractional number of windows). Among computer scientists, the term ‘analog’ is sometimes used narrowly, to indicate representation of one continuously-valued quantity by another (e.g., speed by voltage). As Brian Cantwell Smith has remarked:

‘Analog’ should … be a predicate on a representation whose structure corresponds to that of which it represents … That continuous representations should historically have come to be called analog presumably betrays the recognition that, at the levels at which it matters to us, the world is more foundationally continuous than it is discrete. (Smith [1991], p. 271)

James Thomson, brother of Lord Kelvin, invented the mechanical wheel-and-disc integrator that became the foundation of analog computation (Thomson [1876]). The two brothers constructed a device for computing the integral of the product of two given functions, and Kelvin described (although did not construct) general-purpose analog machines for integrating linear differential equations of any order and for solving simultaneous linear equations. Kelvin's most successful analog computer was his tide predicting machine, which remained in use at the port of Liverpool until the 1960s. Mechanical analog devices based on the wheel-and-disc integrator were in use during World War I for gunnery calculations. Following the war, the design of the integrator was considerably improved by Hannibal Ford (Ford [1919]).

Stanley Fifer reports that the first semi-automatic mechanical analog computer was built in England by the Manchester firm of Metropolitan Vickers prior to 1930 (Fifer [1961], p. 29); however, I have so far been unable to verify this claim. In 1931, Vannevar Bush, working at MIT, built the differential analyser, the first large-scale automatic general-purpose mechanical analog computer. Bush's design was based on the wheel and disc integrator. Soon copies of his machine were in use around the world (including, at Cambridge and Manchester Universities in England, differential analysers built out of kit-set Meccano, the once popular engineering toy).

It required a skilled mechanic equipped with a lead hammer to set up Bush's mechanical differential analyser for each new job. Subsequently, Bush and his colleagues replaced the wheel-and-disc integrators and other mechanical components by electromechanical, and finally by electronic, devices.

A differential analyser may be conceptualised as a collection of ‘black boxes’ connected together in such a way as to allow considerable feedback. Each box performs a fundamental process, for example addition, multiplication of a variable by a constant, and integration. In setting up the machine for a given task, boxes are connected together so that the desired set of fundamental processes is executed. In the case of electrical machines, this was done typically by plugging wires into sockets on a patch panel (computing machines whose function is determined in this way are referred to as ‘program-controlled’).

Since all the boxes work in parallel, an electronic differential analyser solves sets of equations very quickly. Against this has to be set the cost of massaging the problem to be solved into the form demanded by the analog machine, and of setting up the hardware to perform the desired computation. A major drawback of analog computation is the higher cost, relative to digital machines, of an increase in precision. During the 1960s and 1970s, there was considerable interest in ‘hybrid’ machines, where an analog section is controlled by and programmed via a digital section. However, such machines are now a rarity.

The Universal Turing Machine

In 1936, at Cambridge University, Turing invented the principle of the modern computer. He described an abstract digital computing machine consisting of a limitless memory and a scanner that moves back and forth through the memory, symbol by symbol, reading what it finds and writing further symbols (Turing [1936]). The actions of the scanner are dictated by a program of instructions that is stored in the memory in the form of symbols. This is Turing's stored-program concept, and implicit in it is the possibility of the machine operating on and modifying its own program. (In London in 1947, in the course of what was, so far as is known, the earliest public lecture to mention computer intelligence, Turing said, ‘What we want is a machine that can learn from experience’, adding that the ‘possibility of letting the machine alter its own instructions provides the mechanism for this’ (Turing [1947] p. 393). Turing's computing machine of 1936 is now known simply as the universal Turing machine. Cambridge mathematician Max Newman remarked that right from the start Turing was interested in the possibility of actually building a computing machine of the sort that he had described (Newman in interview with Christopher Evans in Evans [197?].

From the start of the Second World War Turing was a leading cryptanalyst at the Government Code and Cypher School, Bletchley Park. Here he became familiar with Thomas Flowers' work involving large-scale high-speed electronic switching (described below). However, Turing could not turn to the project of building an electronic stored-program computing machine until the cessation of hostilities in Europe in 1945.

During the wartime years Turing did give considerable thought to the question of machine intelligence. Colleagues at Bletchley Park recall numerous off-duty discussions with him on the topic, and at one point Turing circulated a typewritten report (now lost) setting out some of his ideas. One of these colleagues, Donald Michie (who later founded the Department of Machine Intelligence and Perception at the University of Edinburgh), remembers Turing talking often about the possibility of computing machines (1) learning from experience and (2) solving problems by means of searching through the space of possible solutions, guided by rule-of-thumb principles (Michie in interview with Copeland, 1995). The modern term for the latter idea is ‘heuristic search’, a heuristic being any rule-of-thumb principle that cuts down the amount of searching required in order to find a solution to a problem. At Bletchley Park Turing illustrated his ideas on machine intelligence by reference to chess. Michie recalls Turing experimenting with heuristics that later became common in chess programming (in particular minimax and best-first).

Further information about Turing and the computer, including his wartime work on codebreaking and his thinking about artificial intelligence and artificial life, can be found in Copeland 2004.

Electromechanical versus Electronic Computation

With some exceptions — including Babbage's purely mechanical engines, and the finger-powered National Accounting Machine - early digital computing machines were electromechanical. That is to say, their basic components were small, electrically-driven, mechanical switches called ‘relays’. These operate relatively slowly, whereas the basic components of an electronic computer — originally vacuum tubes (valves) — have no moving parts save electrons and so operate extremely fast. Electromechanical digital computing machines were built before and during the second world war by (among others) Howard Aiken at Harvard University, George Stibitz at Bell Telephone Laboratories, Turing at Princeton University and Bletchley Park, and Konrad Zuse in Berlin. To Zuse belongs the honour of having built the first working general-purpose program-controlled digital computer. This machine, later called the Z3, was functioning in 1941. (A program-controlled computer, as opposed to a stored-program computer, is set up for a new task by re-routing wires, by means of plugs etc.)

Relays were too slow and unreliable a medium for large-scale general-purpose digital computation (although Aiken made a valiant effort). It was the development of high-speed digital techniques using vacuum tubes that made the modern computer possible.

The earliest extensive use of vacuum tubes for digital data-processing appears to have been by the engineer Thomas Flowers, working in London at the British Post Office Research Station at Dollis Hill. Electronic equipment designed by Flowers in 1934, for controlling the connections between telephone exchanges, went into operation in 1939, and involved between three and four thousand vacuum tubes running continuously. In 1938–1939 Flowers worked on an experimental electronic digital data-processing system, involving a high-speed data store. Flowers' aim, achieved after the war, was that electronic equipment should replace existing, less reliable, systems built from relays and used in telephone exchanges. Flowers did not investigate the idea of using electronic equipment for numerical calculation, but has remarked that at the outbreak of war with Germany in 1939 he was possibly the only person in Britain who realized that vacuum tubes could be used on a large scale for high-speed digital computation. (See Copeland 2006 for m more information on Flowers' work.)


The earliest comparable use of vacuum tubes in the U.S. seems to have been by John Atanasoff at what was then Iowa State College (now University). During the period 1937–1942 Atanasoff developed techniques for using vacuum tubes to perform numerical calculations digitally. In 1939, with the assistance of his student Clifford Berry, Atanasoff began building what is sometimes called the Atanasoff-Berry Computer, or ABC, a small-scale special-purpose electronic digital machine for the solution of systems of linear algebraic equations. The machine contained approximately 300 vacuum tubes. Although the electronic part of the machine functioned successfully, the computer as a whole never worked reliably, errors being introduced by the unsatisfactory binary card-reader. Work was discontinued in 1942 when Atanasoff left Iowa State.


The first fully functioning electronic digital computer was Colossus, used by the Bletchley Park cryptanalysts from February 1944.

From very early in the war the Government Code and Cypher School (GC&CS) was successfully deciphering German radio communications encoded by means of the Enigma system, and by early 1942 about 39,000 intercepted messages were being decoded each month, thanks to electromechanical machines known as ‘bombes’. These were designed by Turing and Gordon Welchman (building on earlier work by Polish cryptanalysts).

During the second half of 1941, messages encoded by means of a totally different method began to be intercepted. This new cipher machine, code-named ‘Tunny’ by Bletchley Park, was broken in April 1942 and current traffic was read for the first time in July of that year. Based on binary teleprinter code, Tunny was used in preference to Morse-based Enigma for the encryption of high-level signals, for example messages from Hitler and members of the German High Command.

The need to decipher this vital intelligence as rapidly as possible led Max Newman to propose in November 1942 (shortly after his recruitment to GC&CS from Cambridge University) that key parts of the decryption process be automated, by means of high-speed electronic counting devices. The first machine designed and built to Newman's specification, known as the Heath Robinson, was relay-based with electronic circuits for counting. (The electronic counters were designed by C.E. Wynn-Williams, who had been using thyratron tubes in counting circuits at the Cavendish Laboratory, Cambridge, since 1932 [Wynn-Williams 1932].) Installed in June 1943, Heath Robinson was unreliable and slow, and its high-speed paper tapes were continually breaking, but it proved the worth of Newman's idea. Flowers recommended that an all-electronic machine be built instead, but he received no official encouragement from GC&CS. Working independently at the Post Office Research Station at Dollis Hill, Flowers quietly got on with constructing the world's first large-scale programmable electronic digital computer. Colossus I was delivered to Bletchley Park in January 1943.

By the end of the war there were ten Colossi working round the clock at Bletchley Park. From a cryptanalytic viewpoint, a major difference between the prototype Colossus I and the later machines was the addition of the so-called Special Attachment, following a key discovery by cryptanalysts Donald Michie and Jack Good. This broadened the function of Colossus from ‘wheel setting’ — i.e., determining the settings of the encoding wheels of the Tunny machine for a particular message, given the ‘patterns’ of the wheels — to ‘wheel breaking’, i.e., determining the wheel patterns themselves. The wheel patterns were eventually changed daily by the Germans on each of the numerous links between the German Army High Command and Army Group commanders in the field. By 1945 there were as many 30 links in total. About ten of these were broken and read regularly.

Colossus I contained approximately 1600 vacuum tubes and each of the subsequent machines approximately 2400 vacuum tubes. Like the smaller ABC, Colossus lacked two important features of modern computers. First, it had no internally stored programs. To set it up for a new task, the operator had to alter the machine's physical wiring, using plugs and switches. Second, Colossus was not a general-purpose machine, being designed for a specific cryptanalytic task involving counting and Boolean operations.

F.H. Hinsley, official historian of GC&CS, has estimated that the war in Europe was shortened by at least two years as a result of the signals intelligence operation carried out at Bletchley Park, in which Colossus played a major role. Most of the Colossi were destroyed once hostilities ceased. Some of the electronic panels ended up at Newman's Computing Machine Laboratory in Manchester (see below), all trace of their original use having been removed. Two Colossi were retained by GC&CS (renamed GCHQ following the end of the war). The last Colossus is believed to have stopped running in 1960.

Those who knew of Colossus were prohibited by the Official Secrets Act from sharing their knowledge. Until the 1970s, few had any idea that electronic computation had been used successfully during the second world war. In 1970 and 1975, respectively, Good and Michie published notes giving the barest outlines of Colossus. By 1983, Flowers had received clearance from the British Government to publish a partial account of the hardware of Colossus I. Details of the later machines and of the Special Attachment, the uses to which the Colossi were put, and the cryptanalytic algorithms that they ran, have only recently been declassified. (For the full account of Colossus and the attack on Tunny see Copeland 2006.)

To those acquainted with the universal Turing machine of 1936, and the associated stored-program concept, Flowers' racks of digital electronic equipment were proof of the feasibility of using large numbers of vacuum tubes to implement a high-speed general-purpose stored-program computer. The war over, Newman lost no time in establishing the Royal Society Computing Machine Laboratory at Manchester University for precisely that purpose. A few months after his arrival at Manchester, Newman wrote as follows to the Princeton mathematician John von Neumann (February 1946):

I am … hoping to embark on a computing machine section here, having got very interested in electronic devices of this kind during the last two or three years. By about eighteen months ago I had decided to try my hand at starting up a machine unit when I got out. … I am of course in close touch with Turing.

Turing's Automatic Computing Engine

Turing and Newman were thinking along similar lines. In 1945 Turing joined the National Physical Laboratory (NPL) in London, his brief to design and develop an electronic stored-program digital computer for scientific work. (Artificial Intelligence was not far from Turing's thoughts: he described himself as ‘building a brain’ and remarked in a letter that he was ‘more interested in the possibility of producing models of the action of the brain than in the practical applications to computing’.) John Womersley, Turing's immediate superior at NPL, christened Turing's proposed machine the Automatic Computing Engine, or ACE, in homage to Babbage's Difference Engine and Analytical Engine.

Turing's 1945 report ‘Proposed Electronic Calculator’ gave the first relatively complete specification of an electronic stored-program general-purpose digital computer. The report is reprinted in full in Copeland 2005.

The first electronic stored-program digital computer to be proposed in the U.S. was the EDVAC (see below). The ‘First Draft of a Report on the EDVAC’ (May 1945), composed by von Neumann, contained little engineering detail, in particular concerning electronic hardware (owing to restrictions in the U.S.). Turing's ‘Proposed Electronic Calculator’, on the other hand, supplied detailed circuit designs and specifications of hardware units, specimen programs in machine code, and even an estimate of the cost of building the machine (£11,200). ACE and EDVAC differed fundamentally from one another; for example, ACE employed distributed processing, while EDVAC had a centralised structure.

Turing saw that speed and memory were the keys to computing. Turing's colleague at NPL, Jim Wilkinson, observed that Turing ‘was obsessed with the idea of speed on the machine’ [Copeland 2005, p. 2]. Turing's design had much in common with today's RISC architectures and it called for a high-speed memory of roughly the same capacity as an early Macintosh computer (enormous by the standards of his day). Had Turing's ACE been built as planned it would have been in a different league from the other early computers. However, progress on Turing's Automatic Computing Engine ran slowly, due to organisational difficulties at NPL, and in 1948 a ‘very fed up’ Turing (Robin Gandy's description, in interview with Copeland, 1995) left NPL for Newman's Computing Machine Laboratory at Manchester University. It was not until May 1950 that a small pilot model of the Automatic Computing Engine, built by Wilkinson, Edward Newman, Mike Woodger, and others, first executed a program. With an operating speed of 1 MHz, the Pilot Model ACE was for some time the fastest computer in the world.

Sales of DEUCE, the production version of the Pilot Model ACE, were buoyant — confounding the suggestion, made in 1946 by the Director of the NPL, Sir Charles Darwin, that ‘it is very possible that … one machine would suffice to solve all the problems that are demanded of it from the whole country’ [Copeland 2005, p. 4]. The fundamentals of Turing's ACE design were employed by Harry Huskey (at Wayne State University, Detroit) in the Bendix G15 computer (Huskey in interview with Copeland, 1998). The G15 was arguably the first personal computer; over 400 were sold worldwide. DEUCE and the G15 remained in use until about 1970. Another computer deriving from Turing's ACE design, the MOSAIC, played a role in Britain's air defences during the Cold War period; other derivatives include the Packard-Bell PB250 (1961). (More information about these early computers is given in [Copeland 2005].)

The Manchester Machine

The earliest general-purpose stored-program electronic digital computer to work was built in Newman's Computing Machine Laboratory at Manchester University. The Manchester ‘Baby’, as it became known, was constructed by the engineers F.C. Williams and Tom Kilburn, and performed its first calculation on 21 June 1948. The tiny program, stored on the face of a cathode ray tube, was just seventeen instructions long. A much enlarged version of the machine, with a programming system designed by Turing, became the world's first commercially available computer, the Ferranti Mark I. The first to be completed was installed at Manchester University in February 1951; in all about ten were sold, in Britain, Canada, Holland and Italy.

The fundamental logico-mathematical contributions by Turing and Newman to the triumph at Manchester have been neglected, and the Manchester machine is nowadays remembered as the work of Williams and Kilburn. Indeed, Newman's role in the development of computers has never been sufficiently emphasised (due perhaps to his thoroughly self-effacing way of relating the relevant events).

It was Newman who, in a lecture in Cambridge in 1935, introduced Turing to the concept that led directly to the Turing machine: Newman defined a constructive process as one that a machine can carry out (Newman in interview with Evans, op. cit.). As a result of his knowledge of Turing's work, Newman became interested in the possibilities of computing machinery in, as he put it, ‘a rather theoretical way’. It was not until Newman joined GC&CS in 1942 that his interest in computing machinery suddenly became practical, with his realisation that the attack on Tunny could be mechanised. During the building of Colossus, Newman tried to interest Flowers in Turing's 1936 paper — birthplace of the stored-program concept - but Flowers did not make much of Turing's arcane notation. There is no doubt that by 1943, Newman had firmly in mind the idea of using electronic technology in order to construct a stored-program general-purpose digital computing machine.

In July of 1946 (the month in which the Royal Society approved Newman's application for funds to found the Computing Machine Laboratory), Freddie Williams, working at the Telecommunications Research Establishment, Malvern, began the series of experiments on cathode ray tube storage that was to lead to the Williams tube memory. Williams, until then a radar engineer, explains how it was that he came to be working on the problem of computer memory:

[O]nce [the German Armies] collapsed … nobody was going to care a toss about radar, and people like me … were going to be in the soup unless we found something else to do. And computers were in the air. Knowing absolutely nothing about them I latched onto the problem of storage and tackled that. (Quoted in Bennett 1976.)

Newman learned of Williams' work, and with the able help of Patrick Blackett, Langworthy Professor of Physics at Manchester and one of the most powerful figures in the University, was instrumental in the appointment of the 35 year old Williams to the recently vacated Chair of Electro-Technics at Manchester. (Both were members of the appointing committee (Kilburn in interview with Copeland, 1997).) Williams immediately had Kilburn, his assistant at Malvern, seconded to Manchester. To take up the story in Williams' own words:

[N]either Tom Kilburn nor I knew the first thing about computers when we arrived in Manchester University. We'd had enough explained to us to understand what the problem of storage was and what we wanted to store, and that we'd achieved, so the point now had been reached when we'd got to find out about computers … Newman explained the whole business of how a computer works to us. (F.C. Williams in interview with Evans [1976])

Elsewhere Williams is explicit concerning Turing's role and gives something of the flavour of the explanation that he and Kilburn received:

Tom Kilburn and I knew nothing about computers, but a lot about circuits. Professor Newman and Mr A.M. Turing … knew a lot about computers and substantially nothing about electronics. They took us by the hand and explained how numbers could live in houses with addresses and how if they did they could be kept track of during a calculation. (Williams [1975], p. 328)

It seems that Newman must have used much the same words with Williams and Kilburn as he did in an address to the Royal Society on 4th March 1948:

Professor Hartree … has recalled that all the essential ideas of the general-purpose calculating machines now being made are to be found in Babbage's plans for his analytical engine. In modern times the idea of a universal calculating machine was independently introduced by Turing … [T]he machines now being made in America and in this country … [are] in certain general respects … all similar. There is provision for storing numbers, say in the scale of 2, so that each number appears as a row of, say, forty 0's and 1's in certain places or "houses" in the machine. … Certain of these numbers, or "words" are read, one after another, as orders. In one possible type of machine an order consists of four numbers, for example 11, 13, 27, 4. The number 4 signifies "add", and when control shifts to this word the "houses" H11 and H13 will be connected to the adder as inputs, and H27 as output. The numbers stored in H11 and H13 pass through the adder, are added, and the sum is passed on to H27. The control then shifts to the next order. In most real machines the process just described would be done by three separate orders, the first bringing [H11] (=content of H11) to a central accumulator, the second adding [H13] into the accumulator, and the third sending the result to H27; thus only one address would be required in each order. … A machine with storage, with this automatic-telephone-exchange arrangement and with the necessary adders, subtractors and so on, is, in a sense, already a universal machine. (Newman [1948], pp. 271–272)

Following this explanation of Turing's three-address concept (source 1, source 2, destination, function) Newman went on to describe program storage (‘the orders shall be in a series of houses X1, X2, …’) and conditional branching. He then summed up:

From this highly simplified account it emerges that the essential internal parts of the machine are, first, a storage for numbers (which may also be orders). … Secondly, adders, multipliers, etc. Thirdly, an "automatic telephone exchange" for selecting "houses", connecting them to the arithmetic organ, and writing the answers in other prescribed houses. Finally, means of moving control at any stage to any chosen order, if a certain condition is satisfied, otherwise passing to the next order in the normal sequence. Besides these there must be ways of setting up the machine at the outset, and extracting the final answer in useable form. (Newman [1948], pp. 273–4)

In a letter written in 1972 Williams described in some detail what he and Kilburn were told by Newman:

About the middle of the year [1946] the possibility of an appointment at Manchester University arose and I had a talk with Professor Newman who was already interested in the possibility of developing computers and had acquired a grant from the Royal Society of £30,000 for this purpose. Since he understood computers and I understood electronics the possibilities of fruitful collaboration were obvious. I remember Newman giving us a few lectures in which he outlined the organisation of a computer in terms of numbers being identified by the address of the house in which they were placed and in terms of numbers being transferred from this address, one at a time, to an accumulator where each entering number was added to what was already there. At any time the number in the accumulator could be transferred back to an assigned address in the store and the accumulator cleared for further use. The transfers were to be effected by a stored program in which a list of instructions was obeyed sequentially. Ordered progress through the list could be interrupted by a test instruction which examined the sign of the number in the accumulator. Thereafter operation started from a new point in the list of instructions. This was the first information I received about the organisation of computers. … Our first computer was the simplest embodiment of these principles, with the sole difference that it used a subtracting rather than an adding accumulator. (Letter from Williams to Randell, 1972; in Randell [1972], p. 9)

Turing's early input to the developments at Manchester, hinted at by Williams in his above-quoted reference to Turing, may have been via the lectures on computer design that Turing and Wilkinson gave in London during the period December 1946 to February 1947 (Turing and Wilkinson [1946–7]). The lectures were attended by representatives of various organisations planning to use or build an electronic computer. Kilburn was in the audience (Bowker and Giordano [1993]). (Kilburn usually said, when asked from where he obtained his basic knowledge of the computer, that he could not remember (letter from Brian Napper to Copeland, 2002); for example, in a 1992 interview he said: ‘Between early 1945 and early 1947, in that period, somehow or other I knew what a digital computer was … Where I got this knowledge from I've no idea’ (Bowker and Giordano [1993], p. 19).)

Whatever role Turing's lectures may have played in informing Kilburn, there is little doubt that credit for the Manchester computer — called the ‘Newman-Williams machine’ in a contemporary document (Huskey 1947) — belongs not only to Williams and Kilburn but also to Newman, and that the influence on Newman of Turing's 1936 paper was crucial, as was the influence of Flowers' Colossus.

The first working AI program, a draughts (checkers) player written by Christopher Strachey, ran on the Ferranti Mark I in the Manchester Computing Machine Laboratory. Strachey (at the time a teacher at Harrow School and an amateur programmer) wrote the program with Turing's encouragement and utilising the latter's recently completed Programmers' Handbook for the Ferranti. (Strachey later became Director of the Programming Research Group at Oxford University.) By the summer of 1952, the program could, Strachey reported, ‘play a complete game of draughts at a reasonable speed’. (Strachey's program formed the basis for Arthur Samuel's well-known checkers program.) The first chess-playing program, also, was written for the Manchester Ferranti, by Dietrich Prinz; the program first ran in November 1951. Designed for solving simple problems of the mate-in-two variety, the program would examine every possible move until a solution was found. Turing started to program his ‘Turochamp’ chess-player on the Ferranti Mark I, but never completed the task. Unlike Prinz's program, the Turochamp could play a complete game (when hand-simulated) and operated not by exhaustive search but under the guidance of heuristics.


The first fully functioning electronic digital computer to be built in the U.S. was ENIAC, constructed at the Moore School of Electrical Engineering, University of Pennsylvania, for the Army Ordnance Department, by J. Presper Eckert and John Mauchly. Completed in 1945, ENIAC was somewhat similar to the earlier Colossus, but considerably larger and more flexible (although far from general-purpose). The primary function for which ENIAC was designed was the calculation of tables used in aiming artillery. ENIAC was not a stored-program computer, and setting it up for a new job involved reconfiguring the machine by means of plugs and switches. For many years, ENIAC was believed to have been the first functioning electronic digital computer, Colossus being unknown to all but a few.

In 1944, John von Neumann joined the ENIAC group. He had become ‘intrigued’ (Goldstine's word, [1972], p. 275) with Turing's universal machine while Turing was at Princeton University during 1936–1938. At the Moore School, von Neumann emphasised the importance of the stored-program concept for electronic computing, including the possibility of allowing the machine to modify its own program in useful ways while running (for example, in order to control loops and branching). Turing's paper of 1936 (‘On Computable Numbers, with an Application to the Entscheidungsproblem’) was required reading for members of von Neumann's post-war computer project at the Institute for Advanced Study, Princeton University (letter from Julian Bigelow to Copeland, 2002; see also Copeland [2004], p. 23). Eckert appears to have realised independently, and prior to von Neumann's joining the ENIAC group, that the way to take full advantage of the speed at which data is processed by electronic circuits is to place suitably encoded instructions for controlling the processing in the same high-speed storage devices that hold the data itself (documented in Copeland [2004], pp. 26–7). In 1945, while ENIAC was still under construction, von Neumann produced a draft report, mentioned previously, setting out the ENIAC group's ideas for an electronic stored-program general-purpose digital computer, the EDVAC (von Neuman [1945]). The EDVAC was completed six years later, but not by its originators, who left the Moore School to build computers elsewhere. Lectures held at the Moore School in 1946 on the proposed EDVAC were widely attended and contributed greatly to the dissemination of the new ideas.

Von Neumann was a prestigious figure and he made the concept of a high-speed stored-program digital computer widely known through his writings and public addresses. As a result of his high profile in the field, it became customary, although historically inappropriate, to refer to electronic stored-program digital computers as ‘von Neumann machines’.

The Los Alamos physicist Stanley Frankel, responsible with von Neumann and others for mechanising the large-scale calculations involved in the design of the atomic bomb, has described von Neumann's view of the importance of Turing's 1936 paper, in a letter:

I know that in or about 1943 or ‘44 von Neumann was well aware of the fundamental importance of Turing's paper of 1936 … Von Neumann introduced me to that paper and at his urging I studied it with care. Many people have acclaimed von Neumann as the "father of the computer" (in a modern sense of the term) but I am sure that he would never have made that mistake himself. He might well be called the midwife, perhaps, but he firmly emphasized to me, and to others I am sure, that the fundamental conception is owing to Turing, in so far as not anticipated by Babbage … Both Turing and von Neumann, of course, also made substantial contributions to the "reduction to practice" of these concepts but I would not regard these as comparable in importance with the introduction and explication of the concept of a computer able to store in its memory its program of activities and of modifying that program in the course of these activities. (Quoted in Randell [1972], p. 10)

Other Notable Early Computers

Other notable early stored-program electronic digital computers were:

  • EDSAC, 1949, built at Cambridge University by Maurice Wilkes
  • BINAC, 1949, built by Eckert's and Mauchly's Electronic Control Co., Philadelphia (opinions differ over whether BINAC ever actually worked)
  • Whirlwind I, 1949, Digital Computer Laboratory, Massachusetts Institute of Technology, Jay Forrester
  • SEAC, 1950, US Bureau of Standards Eastern Division, Washington D.C., Samuel Alexander, Ralph Slutz
  • SWAC, 1950, US Bureau of Standards Western Division, Institute for Numerical Analysis, University of California at Los Angeles, Harry Huskey
  • UNIVAC, 1951, Eckert-Mauchly Computer Corporation, Philadelphia (the first computer to be available commercially in the U.S.)
  • the IAS computer, 1952, Institute for Advanced Study, Princeton University, Julian Bigelow, Arthur Burks, Herman Goldstine, von Neumann, and others (thanks to von Neumann's publishing the specifications of the IAS machine, it became the model for a group of computers known as the Princeton Class machines; the IAS computer was also a strong influence on the IBM 701)
  • IBM 701, 1952, International Business Machine's first mass-produced electronic stored-program computer.

High-Speed Memory

The EDVAC and ACE proposals both advocated the use of mercury-filled tubes, called ‘delay lines’, for high-speed internal memory. This form of memory is known as acoustic memory. Delay lines had initially been developed for echo cancellation in radar; the idea of using them as memory devices originated with Eckert at the Moore School. Here is Turing's description:

It is proposed to build "delay line" units consisting of mercury … tubes about 5′ long and 1″ in diameter in contact with a quartz crystal at each end. The velocity of sound in … mercury … is such that the delay will be 1.024 ms. The information to be stored may be considered to be a sequence of 1024 ‘digits’ (0 or 1) … These digits will be represented by a corresponding sequence of pulses. The digit 0 … will be represented by the absence of a pulse at the appropriate time, the digit 1 … by its presence. This series of pulses is impressed on the end of the line by one piezo-crystal, it is transmitted down the line in the form of supersonic waves, and is reconverted into a varying voltage by the crystal at the far end. This voltage is amplified sufficiently to give an output of the order of 10 volts peak to peak and is used to gate a standard pulse generated by the clock. This pulse may be again fed into the line by means of the transmitting crystal, or we may feed in some altogether different signal. We also have the possibility of leading the gated pulse to some other part of the calculator, if we have need of that information at the time. Making use of the information does not of course preclude keeping it also. (Turing [1945], p. 375)

Mercury delay line memory was used in EDSAC, BINAC, SEAC, Pilot Model ACE, EDVAC, DEUCE, and full-scale ACE (1958). The chief advantage of the delay line as a memory medium was, as Turing put it, that delay lines were "already a going concern" (Turing [1947], p. 380). The fundamental disadvantages of the delay line were that random access is impossible and, moreover, the time taken for an instruction, or number, to emerge from a delay line depends on where in the line it happens to be.

In order to minimize waiting-time, Turing arranged for instructions to be stored not in consecutive positions in the delay line, but in relative positions selected by the programmer in such a way that each instruction would emerge at exactly the time it was required, in so far as this was possible. Each instruction contained a specification of the location of the next. This system subsequently became known as ‘optimum coding’. It was an integral feature of every version of the ACE design. Optimum coding made for difficult and untidy programming, but the advantage in terms of speed was considerable. Thanks to optimum coding, the Pilot Model ACE was able to do a floating point multiplication in 3 milliseconds (Wilkes's EDSAC required 4.5 milliseconds to perform a single fixed point multiplication).

In the Williams tube or electrostatic memory, previously mentioned, a two-dimensional rectangular array of binary digits was stored on the face of a commercially-available cathode ray tube. Access to data was immediate. Williams tube memories were employed in the Manchester series of machines, SWAC, the IAS computer, and the IBM 701, and a modified form of Williams tube in Whirlwind I (until replacement by magnetic core in 1953).

Drum memories, in which data was stored magnetically on the surface of a metal cylinder, were developed on both sides of the Atlantic. The initial idea appears to have been Eckert's. The drum provided reasonably large quantities of medium-speed memory and was used to supplement a high-speed acoustic or electrostatic memory. In 1949, the Manchester computer was successfully equipped with a drum memory; this was constructed by the Manchester engineers on the model of a drum developed by Andrew Booth at Birkbeck College, London.

The final major event in the early history of electronic computation was the development of magnetic core memory. Jay Forrester realised that the hysteresis properties of magnetic core (normally used in transformers) lent themselves to the implementation of a three-dimensional solid array of randomly accessible storage points. In 1949, at Massachusetts Institute of Technology, he began to investigate this idea empirically. Forrester's early experiments with metallic core soon led him to develop the superior ferrite core memory. Digital Equipment Corporation undertook to build a computer similar to the Whirlwind I as a test vehicle for a ferrite core memory. The Memory Test Computer was completed in 1953. (This computer was used in 1954 for the first simulations of neural networks, by Belmont Farley and Wesley Clark of MIT's Lincoln Laboratory (see Copeland and Proudfoot [1996]).

Once the absolute reliability, relative cheapness, high capacity and permanent life of ferrite core memory became apparent, core soon replaced other forms of high-speed memory. The IBM 704 and 705 computers (announced in May and October 1954, respectively) brought core memory into wide use.


Works Cited

  • Babbage, C. (ed. by Campbell-Kelly, M.), 1994, Passages from the Life of a Philosopher, New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press
  • Bennett, S., 1976, ‘F.C. Williams: his contribution to the development of automatic control’, National Archive for the History of Computing, University of Manchester, England. (This is a typescript based on interviews with Williams in 1976.)
  • Bowker, G., and Giordano, R., 1993, ‘Interview with Tom Kilburn’, Annals of the History of Computing, 15: 17–32.
  • Copeland, B.J. (ed.), 2004, The Essential Turing Oxford University Press
  • Copeland, B.J. (ed.), 2005, Alan Turing's Automatic Computing Engine: The Master Codebreaker's Struggle to Build the Modern Computer Oxford University Press
  • Copeland, B.J. and others, 2006, Colossus: The Secrets of Bletchley Park's Codebreaking Computers Oxford University Press
  • Copeland, B.J., and Proudfoot, D., 1996, ‘On Alan Turing's Anticipation of Connectionism’ Synthese, 108: 361–377
  • Evans, C., 197?, interview with M.H.A. Newman in ‘The Pioneers of Computing: an Oral History of Computing’, London: Science Museum
  • Fifer, S., 1961, Analog Computation: Theory, Techniques, Applications New York: McGraw-Hill
  • Ford, H., 1919, ‘Mechanical Movement’, Official Gazette of the United States Patent Office, October 7, 1919: 48
  • Goldstine, H., 1972, The Computer from Pascal to von Neumann Princeton University Press
  • Huskey, H.D., 1947, ‘The State of the Art in Electronic Digital Computing in Britain and the United States’, in [Copeland 2005]
  • Newman, M.H.A., 1948, ‘General Principles of the Design of All-Purpose Computing Machines’ Proceedings of the Royal Society of London, series A, 195 (1948): 271–274
  • Randell, B., 1972, ‘On Alan Turing and the Origins of Digital Computers’, in Meltzer, B., Michie, D. (eds), Machine Intelligence 7, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1972
  • Smith, B.C., 1991, ‘The Owl and the Electric Encyclopaedia’, Artificial Intelligence, 47: 251–288
  • Thomson, J., 1876, ‘On an Integrating Machine Having a New Kinematic Principle’ Proceedings of the Royal Society of London, 24: 262–5
  • Turing, A.M., 1936, ‘On Computable Numbers, with an Application to the Entscheidungsproblem’ Proceedings of the London Mathematical Society, Series 2, 42 (1936–37): 230–265. Reprinted in The Essential Turing (Copeland [2004]).
  • Turing, A.M, 1945, ‘Proposed Electronic Calculator’, in Alan Turing's Automatic Computing Engine (Copeland [2005])
  • Turing, A.M., 1947, ‘Lecture on the Automatic Computing Engine’, in The Essential Turing (Copeland [2004])
  • Turing, A.M., and Wilkinson, J.H., 1946–7, ‘The Turing-Wilkinson Lecture Series (1946-7)’, in Alan Turing's Automatic Computing Engine (Copeland [2005])
  • von Neumann, J., 1945, ‘First Draft of a Report on the EDVAC’, in Stern, N. From ENIAC to UNIVAC: An Appraisal of the Eckert-Mauchly Computers Bedford, Mass.: Digital Press (1981), pp. 181–246
  • Williams, F.C., 1975, ‘Early Computers at Manchester University’ The Radio and Electronic Engineer, 45 (1975): 237–331
  • Wynn-Williams, C.E., 1932, ‘A Thyratron "Scale of Two" Automatic Counter’ Proceedings of the Royal Society of London, series A, 136: 312–324

Further Reading

  • Copeland, B.J., 2004, ‘Colossus — Its Origins and Originators’ Annals of the History of Computing, 26: 38–45
  • Metropolis, N., Howlett, J., Rota, G.C. (eds), 1980, A History of Computing in the Twentieth Century New York: Academic Press
  • Randell, B. (ed.), 1982, The Origins of Digital Computers: Selected Papers Berlin: Springer-Verlag
  • Williams, M.R., 1997, A History of Computing Technology Los Alamitos: IEEE Computer Society Press

Copyright © 2006 by
B. Jack Copeland <>

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