Externalism About the Mind

First published Thu Dec 10, 2020

In the philosophy of mind, externalism is the view that what is going on in an individual’s mind is not (entirely) determined by what is going on inside her body, including her brain. Externalism comes in two principal forms: externalism about mental content and externalism about the vehicles or bearers of that content. The latter form of externalism is commonly known as the extended mind. At stake are important issues concerning the nature of the mind and its relation to the world, both natural and social.

1. Introduction

In the philosophy of mind, externalism is the view that what is going on inside an individual’s body does not always, on its own, fix what is going on inside that individual’s mind. The mind, in this sense, simply denotes the totality of mental occurrences undergone by an individual at any given time. The body, in this sense, delineates the biological boundaries of the individual which, in creatures such as us, coincide with the individual’s skin and, of course, includes the brain, traditionally taken as the crucial determinant of an individual’s mental life. Thus, externalism is the view that an individual’s bodily (including neural) events, states, processes, etc. do not always, on their own, determine the mental, states, processes had or undergone by that individual. The qualifier not always permits there to be cases—perhaps many—in which mental occurrences are fixed by bodily occurrences. Externalism, generically at least, is merely committed to the claim that this does not always happen. The qualifier on its own is intended to convey that even if an individual’s bodily occurrences do not completely determine which mental occurrences are had or undergone by that individual, the former will at least partially determine the latter and, indeed, can play an important role in such determination.

Externalism appears in two major forms. Content externalism is externalism about mental content—the content of mental states. It claims that the contents of at least some mental states are not solely determined by occurrences falling within the biological boundaries of that individual that has them. Since mental states that have content are typically individuated by that content, this entails that which mental states an individual has is not completely determined by occurrences falling within the biological boundaries of that individual. Vehicle externalism, more commonly known as the thesis of the extended mind, is externalism about the vehicles of mental content. According to the thesis of extended mind, the vehicles of mental content—roughly, the physical or computational bearers of this content—are not always determined or exhausted by things occurring inside the biological boundaries of the individual. Content externalism and extended mind are logically independent views, and it is not uncommon to find adherents of one view denying the other. These two forms of externalism diverge sharply not simply because they are externalism about different things—contents and vehicles, respectively—but also because they have different conceptions of this failure of determination. If mental contents are not determined solely by what is occurring inside the biological boundaries of an individual, this is quite different from the way in which the vehicles of content are not determined solely by what is occurring inside these boundaries. In other words, each form of externalism differs not only in what it claims to be external, but also in what it means by “external”.

2. Historical Antecedents

Externalism—whether of content or vehicle—is often viewed as a peculiar eruption of late twentieth-century analytic philosophy. This, however, is historically myopic. Cognate views with fairly clear externalist credentials have been advanced and defended much earlier than this, and in some of the defining works of twentieth-century philosophy (see Rowlands 2003: Chapters 3&4). Wittgenstein (1953) argued that meaning something by a sign does not consist in an inner state or process. Rather, the possibility of such meaning depends essentially on the existence of a custom or practice of using a sign in given way, and the mastery of a technique—i.e., the ability to adjust one’s use of the sign to bring in into accordance with this custom. According to the dominant—community—interpretation of the notion of a custom, this entails that the possibility of meaning something by a sign is dependent on the existence of a practice external to the individual meaner, and that what this individual means by a sign on any given occasion depends, at least in part, on this external practice. As we shall see, this social version of content externalism was later developed, powerfully, by Burge (1979, 1986).

There are earlier views that are, at least, closely aligned with externalism. Sartre (1943 [1957]) argued that consciousness—his term for intentional mental acts in general—is nothing in the sense that it exists only as a pure directedness towards the world, and is essentially dependent for its existence on the objects to which it is directed. As a consequence, Sartre claimed, consciousness has “no content”. What he meant by this that what we, today, would call the contents of intentional acts are always, necessarily, outside those acts—transcendent items in the world rather than immanent things inside consciousness. Content externalism seems to be a trivial implication of this. If it were possible to transplant a consciousness from one world to another—a staple, as we shall see, of later externalist literature, but which may or may not make sense on Sartre’s view—the contents of this consciousness would necessarily change. The reason this may not qualify as externalism in the standard sense, however, is that Sartre also defended a revisionist conception of the body. The body-as-lived, Sartre argued, is not identical with the body-as-object—the way the body is conceived of in the formulation of externalism. Rather, the body-as-lived is revealing activity whose boundaries in no way coincide with those of the body-as-object. Thus, rather than being a straightforward form of externalism, Sartre’s view may better be regarded as an abandoning the categories in terms of which the ideas of externalism—and its oppositional counterpart, internalism—are formulated. The same is true of Heidegger (1927 [1962]), to whom Sartre’s discussion of the body was heavily indebted. Heidegger urges us to think of human reality—dasein, the characteristic type of being possessed by humans—not as a biological organism but, rather, as a network of natural and social practices. Humans minds, to the extent they have any place in this scheme, would certainly not reside in human bodies. However—and this is why it does not qualify as externalism in the usual sense—neither do bodies. (But see Wheeler 2005, for a defense of extended mind grounded in Heidegger’s work.)

Whether or not they can ultimately be characterized as externalist, the views of Wittgenstein, Sartre and Heidegger play an important role in contextualizing the later development of externalism. Like externalism, they all occupy a position that can be labeled anti-Cartesian. They are all opposed to the idea that the mental processes had by an individual are always, and completely, determined by what is going on inside that individual’s body (or they expand the idea of the body in non-Cartesian ways, as in the case of Sartre and Heidegger). This type of view is not peculiar to philosophy. In psychology, expressions of the idea can be found in the work of the Soviet psychologists, most notably Vygotsky (1934 [1962]), and Luria and Vygotsky (1930 [1992]) and later in James Gibson’s (1966, 1979) development of an ecological psychology (see also Donald 1991 for a more recent development in this tradition). The roots of this anti-Cartesianism are not only broad but deep, predating Heidegger, and indeed the twentieth century. Gallagher (2018) argues that versions of this can be found in American pragmatism. It may be that the ultimate roots of this sort of anti-Cartesianism lie in Hegel (Crisafi & Gallagher 2010; Boldyrev & Herrmann-Pillath 2013). Whether or not this is correct, externalism—in either form—is best regarded as less an unprecedented eruption, and more as a recent expression of this historical tradition of anti-Cartesian thought.

3. Content Externalism

Many mental states or acts (some think all mental states or acts) are intentional in that they are about something or other. You do not simply think; you think something. You do not merely believe or desire; you believe or desire something. This something that you think, believe, desire or, for that matter, hope, fear, expect, anticipate, and so on, is the content of the thinking, believing, desiring, hoping, fearing, expecting and anticipating. Content externalism—sometimes known as semantic externalism, since content is sometimes known as semantic content—is externalism about the content of mental states or acts.

Content externalism is typically understood as a claim of dependent possession which is, in turn, grounded in a more basic claim of individuation dependence. The idea of dependent possession is straightforward: whether or not an individual can entertain the content that p (for example, by having a belief, thought, desire or other propositional attitude with this content) depends on the nature of that individual’s environment (and facts about its relation to that environment). It is not possible for an individual to entertain this content unless the environment contains the requisite objects, properties, facts, events etc. of a certain sort (McGinn 1989). Content externalism is the claim that, at least in some cases, though not necessarily all, the possession of a mental state with a given content is environmentally dependent in this sense.

This claim of dependent possession is derivative upon a further claim: individuation dependence. The general idea of individuation dependence is that the identity of an entity, as an entity of a particular kind s, depends upon things (objects, properties, facts, etc.) distinct from it. A planet is individuation dependent on a star around which it orbits in the sense that without this star, and resulting orbit, it would not be a planet but some other kind of celestial object. The identity of a particular celestial body as a planet is dependent on the star and orbit, items distinct from the planet itself. The planet is, in this sense, individuation dependent on the star (Macdonald 1990). A particular skin disturbance correctly classified as sunburn is individuation dependent on solar radiation in the sense that it can be sunburn only if it produced by solar radiation (Davidson 1987). Thus, the identity of a skin disturbance as an instance of sunburn depends on its standing in an appropriate relation to ultraviolet radiation, and it cannot be an instance of sunburn unless it stands in this relation. Sunburn is, in this sense, individuation dependent on solar radiation

Content externalism is the thesis that at least some mental content is, similarly, individuation dependent on the nature of the environment, understood as a collection of circumstances that reside outside the biological boundaries of the individual. The identity of given content p is dependent on circumstances that lie outside the biological boundaries of the (objects, properties, facts, events, etc.) of the individual who entertains this content.

3.1 Arguments for Content Externalism

Content externalism is most commonly associated with two vivid thought experiments, presented in the 1970s; the first by Hilary Putnam (1975), and the second by Tyler Burge (1979).

Putnam’s Twin Earth Thought Experiment

Imagine a planet, a twin earth. There are a few things you should know about this planet. First, it duplicates earth in almost every respect. On twin earth, at this very moment, a twin version of you is reading a twin version of this Stanford Encyclopedia entry, which has been written by a twin version of me. The twin version of you is your exact, molecule-for-molecule, duplicate. Second, the only difference between earth and twin earth is this: on twin earth, the substance that sits in oceans, flows in rivers, and comes out of faucets is not water. It is not water, because it is not made up of two parts of hydrogen to one part of oxygen. In fact, it is not made of hydrogen and oxygen at all but, rather, some other elements entirely absent on our earth. Nevertheless, third, this substance looks, tastes, and feels exactly like water does to people on our earth, and is used in the same way. Finally, this thought experiment is set in 1750 (and, a corresponding twin 1750), before people had any idea of the underlying molecular structure of substances such as water.

Suppose you say, or write, the sentence, “Water is wet”. Your twin produces a sentence with the same phonetic or syntactic form: “Water is wet”. Do the two sentence-tokens have the same meaning? Putnam’s answer is that they do not. This answer will be found inviting by anyone who thinks of meaning as a matter of reference, or truth-makers, or truth-conditions, or, in short, anyone who thinks that the meaning of a term or sentence is, at least in part, a matter of its relation to some kind of worldly correlate. The reference of the syntactic/phonetic form “water” differs between you and your twin. When you utter the sentence, you are making a report about water—a substance composed of hydrogen and oxygen. But your twin’s corresponding report is about the substance on twin earth. For purposes of identification, we can call this substance twater, but the twin earthlings, of course, call it no such thing. They speak twin-English, and so refer to this substance with the syntactic/phonetic form “water”. Moreover, your utterance and your twin’s utterance are both true, but different facts make them true. Your utterance is made true by a fact about water, whereas your twin’s utterance is made true by a fact about twater. The truth-conditions of the utterances also differ. For your utterance to be true, water must be wet. For your twin’s utterances to be true, twater must be wet. Thus, from the perspective of theories that think of meaning in terms of these kinds of worldly correlates—reference, truth-makers, truth-conditions—there are good reasons for endorsing Putnam’s conclusion.

As McGinn (1977), and Burge (1979), have pointed out, this claim can be extended to the content of propositional attitudes. In ascribing a propositional attitude—such as a thought, belief, desire—to a person, we use a “that”-construction, followed by an embedded sentence. The sentence is commonly thought to express the content of the propositional attitude: that is, the meaning of the sentence is identical with the content of the propositional attitude. Therefore, if the sentences expressed by you and your twin have different meanings, it is difficult to avoid the conclusion that the contents of your thoughts, beliefs and desires also vary. However, beliefs, and other propositional attitudes are individuated by their contents. The belief that grass is green is a different belief from the belief that snow is white because their contents are different. Therefore, if the contents of the beliefs had by you and your twin are different, then so too are your beliefs.

Despite its seemingly outlandish nature, this twin earth thought experiment is just a way of making graphic a simple point. You and your twin are, as a matter of stipulation, molecule-for-molecule duplicates. Thus, everything situated inside your head (and biological boundaries more generally) is, by stipulation, qualitatively (if not numerically) identical. Nevertheless, your beliefs (and other propositional attitudes) differ. The principle that emerges is, then, this: if you fix what is going inside the head (and biological boundaries more generally) of an individual and vary his or her environment, some of that individual’s mental states will vary with variations in the environment even though everything in his or her head remains the same. Therefore, what occurs inside the head is, in this sense, not sufficient to determine or fix everything that occurs in the mind.

Despite some initially over-exuberant formulations of Putnam (1975)—of the “Cut the pie any way you like, meaning just ain’t in the head”, variety—the correct conclusion of this thought experiment does not concern the location of (some) mental states but, rather, a claim about their individuation. External individuation does not entail external location. Sunburn, as Davidson (1987) pointed out, is externally individuated: individuation dependent on factors that lie outside the skin. Nevertheless, it is still located on the skin. That some mental states are individuation dependent on circumstances that exist outside the skin of an individual does not entail that those mental states are located outside the individual’s skin.

Burge’s “Arthritis” Thought Experiment

Imagine a person, let us call him Larry, who has a number of beliefs about arthritis. He believes that he has arthritis, that he has had it for years, that arthritis can be very painful, and that it’s better to have arthritis than pancreatic cancer, and so on. He also believes he has arthritis in his thigh. This belief, according to Burge, is (a) an arthritis-belief and (b) false. It is false because arthritis is an affliction of the joints only. But why is it an arthritis-belief—a belief about arthritis? Burge’s answer is that Larry inhabits a linguistic community made up of people who use the term “arthritis” in a certain way, and Larry would allow himself to be corrected by expert members of that community. Thus, when a doctor tells him, “No, that’s not arthritis you have. Arthritis is an affliction of the joints”. Larry would be inclined to accept this, and revise his belief accordingly.

Now we imagine Larry in a counterfactual situation. Counterfactual Larry is type-identical with Larry in point of functional profile, behavioral dispositions, and experiential history (all individualistically specified—that is, specified in such a way that does not presume the existence of anything outside Larry). The counterfactuality of the situation pertains only to Larry’s linguistic community. In this counterfactual situation, the phonetic or syntactic form “arthritis”—as used by physicians, lexicographers, and competent laypersons—applies not only to an affliction of the joints but also to various other rheumatoid ailments. That is, in the counterfactual situation, the correct use of the term “arthritis” encompasses Larry’s actual misuse. In this counterfactual situation, Burge argues, Larry possesses a true belief about what is going on in his thigh but, crucially, it is not an arthritis-belief. Rather, he has beliefs about a distinct condition—tharthritis, an amalgam of arthritis and rheumatism, as we might regard it.

If this is correct, Larry’s beliefs vary between actual and counterfactual situations. Larry, however, is identical in both situations. The only difference lies in the differing natures of his linguistic communities—specifically, the differing uses of the word-form, “arthritis”. As in Putnam’s thought-experiment, the difference in meaning again stems from a difference in extension of a term, resulting in different truth-conditions, truth-makers, and the like. But in Putnam’s case, the differences stem from differences in the natural environment. In Burge’s thought experiment, these differences stem from differences in linguistic practice. As in the Putnam case, the argument can easily be extended to the contents of propositional attitudes, and Burge, unlike Putnam, explicitly endorses this extension.

3.2 Responses to Content Externalism

Responses to content externalism divide into several kinds. The first type of response simply regards externalism as insufficiently supported by the kinds of arguments developed by Putnam and Burge, either because their conclusions are non sequiturs or because the arguments are deficient in some other way. In this vein, Boghossian (1997), for example, devises the case of “Dry Earth”, a planet whose inhabitants (who are our intrinsic duplicates) are under the illusion that there is a clear, colorless liquid flowing out of the faucets and filling the lakes and oceans. According to Boghossian, externalists are committed to implausible claims concerning the content of Dry Earthlings’ thoughts about this illusory liquid. (Segal [2000] endorses a variation on this argument from Dry Earth; see Korman [2006] and Pryor [2007] for externalist replies.). Crane (1991) argues that in Burge’s example, there is no reason for thinking that Jane has different concepts in the two situations, as her dispositions remain exactly the same. Crane thinks that in both situations, Jane lacks the concept of arthritis, but possesses the concept of tharthritis. Burge was, therefore, mistaken in attributing to Jane in the actual world the belief that she has arthritis in her thigh. Georgalis (1999) takes a similar view, as does Wikforss (2001).

A second type of response objects to these externalist arguments on broadly methodological grounds that concern the use of thought experiments, and intuitions more generally, in determining whether content is wide or narrow. Cummins (1991) argues that empirical research is needed to find out about the nature of belief, not thought experiments. Chomsky (1995) holds a similar view. The reliance of Putnam’s and Burge’s arguments on intuitions is anathema to many in the experimental philosophy movement who regard them as culturally-relative and shifting and, therefore, not philosophically significant (see, for example, Mallon et al. 2009).

A third type of response questions the legitimacy of the internalism-externalism debate. Gertler (2012), for example, has argued that there is no understanding of the distinction between internal and external properties, and related distinctions such as that between intrinsic and extrinsic properties, that will correctly categorize the views we take to be clearly externalist or internalist. If Gertler is correct, perhaps the most common way of understanding internalism, as the doctrine that content supervenes on the intrinsic properties of an individual, is unworkable. She therefore maintains that there is no genuine dispute at issue in the internalism-externalism debate, and recommends that philosophers drop the issue in favor of more well-defined questions. There is, more generally, an interesting question concerning how to understand the crucial distinction between a creature’s external properties and those that are intrinsic or internal. Many contributors to the debate over externalism take internal properties to be physical properties of a creature that do not depend for their instantiation on any property instantiated outside the boundary of the creature’s body and brain. A difficulty with this understanding of the distinction, pointed out by Farkas (2003), is that it appears to rule out the possibility of antiphysicalist internalists. This is ironic, given that Descartes is often held up as a paradigmatic example of an internalist about mental content. Williamson (2000) suggests that internalism can be understood as the doctrine that mental content supervenes on environmentally-independent phenomenal states, and Farkas (2003, 2008) makes a similar proposal.

3.3 Narrow Content

A fourth response to the arguments for content externalism involves accepting the force of those arguments but limiting their significance. According to this type of response, externalism is true of only one type of content, or of content understood in one particular way. The kind of content susceptible to Putnam/Burge-style considerations is wide or broad content. But there is, some have argued, another type of content—narrow content—that is immune to these kinds of arguments. In the years immediately following the publication of Putnam (1975), it was common to think of narrow content as phenomenal content (see, e.g., Fodor 1981, 1982; McGinn 1982). The motivation for this is the idea that even if the contents of you and your twin’s beliefs vary, there is still something that you and your twin have in common. You both believe, for example, that the colorless, odorless, transparent, potable etc. liquid in front of you is wet. This strategy faces at least two problems. First, it conflicts with Burge’s claim that his type of counterfactual earth argument applies to all concepts known by observational means, a category which includes properties such as being colorless, being odorless, etc. Second, even if the first objection can be avoided, it is not clear that we can purge these phenomenal specifications of content of all concepts immune to twin earth style considerations (for example, the concept of liquid as employed in the above specification) whilst retaining sufficient resources to adequately specify the content of the belief.

Fodor (1987) adopts a different strategy. He agrees that physically identical individuals have different wide contents when embedded in different contexts. However, Fodor suggests that their beliefs still have the same narrow contents, which are functions from contexts to wide contents. You and your twin share this: a something (it is impossible to specify what this is) which when plugged in to the earthly context yields the (broad) content that water is wet, but when plugged into the twin-earthly context yields the (broad) content that twater is wet (a content expressed by the twin-earthly “Water is wet”, of course). This strategy has been objected to by Stalnaker (1989) and Block (1991) on the grounds that narrow content, as conceived by Fodor, is not, in fact, content at all. If narrow contents, as Fodor argues, map contexts of thinking onto truth-conditions, they do not themselves have truth-conditions and therefore fail to qualify as contents in any recognizable sense. According to Stalnaker (1989), narrow content is, therefore, nothing more than syntax (understood as functional or computational role).

There are two more recent developments in semantic theory that can been used to identify and defend a concept of narrow content. One of these is two-dimensional semantics and its application to the contents of propositional attitudes (Lewis 1981, Jackson 2007, and Chalmers 2012). Chalmers, for example, argues that a generalized 2D semantic framework can be used to isolate an a priori aspect of meaning that will be shared by you and your twin. You and your twin, on this view, always have a priori access to the truth-conditions of your own thoughts or sentences. If correct, this entails that there is a type or component of content that is not vulnerable to twin earth manipulation and so might qualify as narrow.

The second development derives from the phenomenal intentionality theory. Advocates of the idea of phenomenal intentionality seek to ground the intentionality of mental states in phenomenal consciousness, the subjective, experiential features of those states. According to this view, phenomenal intentionality is basic, with any other forms of intentionality derivative upon this basic form (Horgan & Tienson 2002, Loar 2003, Kriegel 2013). According to many articulations of the phenomenal intentionality theory (e.g., Siewert 1998; Kriegel 2007, 2011; and Farkas 2008), the content of your thought and that of your twin is the same and that content is narrow. These attempts to construct a viable notion of narrow content have been systematically criticized by Yli-Vakkuri and Hawthorne (2018). If they are correct, there is no form of content that can be easily cordoned off from the world, and a thoroughgoing form of content externalism must, therefore, be true. (See entry on narrow mental content for more detailed discussion).

4. The Significance of Content Externalism

The significance of content externalism is potentially far-reaching though often unclear and disputed.

Idealism. Content externalism is sometimes portrayed as a thesis whose truth precludes idealism in at least some of its major forms (see Rowlands 2003, for example). However, it is not clear that this is really the case. For example, even a Berkeleian idealist could accept Putnam’s twin earth arguments if thus inclined. All that is required for Putnam’s argument to work is a distinction between the way water and twater appear and their underlying structures. This is something the Berkeleian idealist can, it seems, accommodate. For example, the Berkeleian idealist can explain the differences in underlying structure between water and twater in terms of the difference in the ideas that God would flash into your mind and that of your twin post 1750, when you both get down to the business of investigating (what you think of as) the underlying structure of the substance in your oceans and rivers. Content externalism requires a reality that exists independently of the thinking subject or subjects that feature in the thought experiment. But it does not appear to require that this reality be non-mental. Some forms of content externalism require this, supposition for example Sartre (1943 [1957]). But not all forms appear to do so. The relation between content externalism and idealism, in its various forms, is, therefore, not a straightforward one.

Content Externalism and Self-Knowledge. Externalism is importantly connected with issues surrounding our introspective knowledge of our own mental states. Such knowledge appears to be a priori, or at least privileged, in that it is acquired without relying on empirical evidence or observations. On the face of it, externalism threatens the existence of such privileged knowledge. If the contents of our thoughts are determined in part by our relations to the environment, then one might think that external observations are needed in order to know what we think. But self-knowledge does not come about through empirical investigations. So either, contrary to appearance, we do not really know the contents of our own thoughts or, if we do, externalism is false. (See the entry on externalism and self-knowledge for further discussion).

Externalism and Mind-Body Theories. Externalism has important consequences for a number of different mind-body theories. Burge (1979) believes that externalism refutes individualistic theories of intentional mental states. These are theories that define or explain what it is for a person to have an intentional mental state purely in terms of intrinsic facts about that person without reference to the environment. Examples of such theories include the identity theory, and functionalism (see entry) in its traditional guise. McGinn (1989) and Burge (1986, 1993) both argue that externalism refutes the token-identity theory (and hence the type-identity theory as well). This is contested by Davidson (1987), Macdonald (1990) Gibbons (1993), and Frances (2007). With regard to functionalism, one way to deal with externalism is to adopt a divide-and-conquer strategy. One might restrict functionalism to providing an account of what it is to be a particular kind of mental state (e.g., a belief) individualistically, while adopting an externalist theory of content (Fodor 1987). Alternatively, one might adopt a “long arm” functionalism that specifies functional roles in such a way that they incorporate worldly items and properties (Block 1990). On such a view, the functional role of your belief that water is wet would be different from the functional role of your twin’s belief that twater is wet, on the grounds that the functional role of your belief involves you perceiving and doing things with water whereas that of your twin involves her perceiving and doing things with twater.

Though externalism may (or may not) be incompatible with these internalist forms of physicalism, this should not be taken to imply that externalism is itself an antiphysicalist doctrine, for one might hold that although mental contents do not supervene on narrow physical properties, they do supervene on wide physical properties. There is no obvious reason for physicalism about the mind to require a creature’s mental properties to supervene on its narrow physical properties. (For discussion of the requirements on physicalism, see the entry on physicalism.)

Mental Causation. Another debate that arises out of externalism concerns the legitimacy of wide contents in causal explanations. Most philosophers agree with Davidson (1980) that beliefs and desires play an important role in the causal explanation of actions. However, it is not clear how this can be reconciled with externalism. The problem comes up because it has been suggested that causal explanations of behavior should appeal only to the intrinsic properties of our bodies, properties that describe what is happening here and now within us (Stich 1983). But externalism says that mental contents are determined by causal, social or historical factors, factors which extend spatially and temporally beyond the body. This seems to imply that wide mental contents cannot be causally relevant because of their relational nature.

There are two main strategies to show that wide mental contents can legitimately enter into causal explanations. The first strategy is to argue that the causal efficacy of a mental state with wide content derives from the causal efficacy of a corresponding internal state. To use a non-mental example, we often say that a mosquito bite causes swelling, even though being a mosquito bite is a relational property. However, one worry with this approach is why it doesn’t show that wide contents are not causally relevant after all, because it is the internal component (the skin itching, swollen skin disturbance) that is doing all the causal work. A different way to defend the explanatory relevance of wide content is to identify its distinctive explanatory role without them being parasitic upon the causal efficacy of intrinsic properties. For example, according to Dretske (1988), when my intention to drink water causes me to raise my glass, the behavior that is the object of the causal explanation is not a single event, but a complex process where an internal state causes some bodily movement. Dretske argues that the wide content of my intention plays a causal role because it provides a structural explanation of how the internal brain state comes to be recruited to cause the bodily movement. Williamson (2000) offers a different account of the explanatory role of wide contents. He thinks they provide us with a better understanding of the connection between the mental states of an agent and his actions in the non-immediate future, because our actions typically involve complex interactions with the environment. (For further discussion, see the entry on mental causation).

5. Extended Mind

The expression extended mind was coined by Clark and Chalmers (1998), but essentially the same view has gone by a variety of names, including “active externalism”, “extended cognition” (both Clark and Chalmers 1998), “vehicle externalism” (Hurley 1998), “environmentalism” (Rowlands 1999), and “cognitive integration” (Menary 2007). While this variegation in nomenclature is unimportant in itself, it is important to (a) to distinguish extended mind from other views with which it might be confused, and (b) capture the significant internal variegation in views that might be classified as versions of extended mind. First, however, the general idea needs to be delineated (see Menary 2010 for a collection of thematic papers, both pro and con).

Mental content is not free-floating. Wherever there is mental content there is something that has it—a vehicle of content. Mental states (belief, desires, hopes, and fears, etc.) are natural candidates for vehicles of content. So too are mental acts (believing, desiring, hoping, fearing, etc.). As a rough, initial approximation, extended mind is the view that not all mental states or acts are exclusively located inside the person who believes, desires, hopes, fears, and so on. Rather, some mental states or acts are, in part, constituted by factors (e.g., structures, processes) that are located outside the biological boundaries of the individuals that have them. Thus, extended mind differs from content externalism not merely in being about mental vehicles rather than mental contents, but also in being committed to a claim of external location rather than simply external individuation. If extended mind is true, some vehicles of content are not, entirely, located inside the biological boundaries of individuals that have them. Rather, they are, partly, constituted by, or are composed of, factors that lie outside those boundaries.

The distinction between states and acts is, in the context of this form of externalism, a significant one, and the general idea of extended mind can be developed in two quite different ways depending on whether we think of the vehicles of content as states or as acts. Thinking of the vehicles of content as states leads to a state-oriented version of extended mind. Thinking of these vehicles as acts leads to a process-oriented alternative.

5.1 State-Oriented Extended Mind

Clark and Chalmers (1998) provide a canonical argument for state-oriented extended mind. Otto is in the early stages of Alzheimer’s, and to facilitate his engagement with the world he writes down what he suspects will be useful information in a notebook. Reading in a newspaper that there is a particular exhibition going on at the Museum of Modern Art, Otto looks in his notebook, and finds the sentence, “The Museum of Modern Art is on 53rd Street”, and, desiring to see the exhibition, duly sets off to 53rd Street. Clark and Chalmers argue, or are commonly taken to argue, that the sentence should be regarded as one of Otto’s beliefs. Their argument is predicated on a functionalist conception of beliefs as individuated by their functional roles. The sentence plays a functional role in Otto’s psychological economy that is, if not precisely identical, similar enough to the functional role of a belief in the psychology of an unimpaired subject for the sentence to qualify as a belief. If this is correct, it means that at least one of Otto’s beliefs lies in the notebook rather than in his head. As usually understood, this view qualifies as a form of state-oriented extended mind to the extent that it identifies a mental state (a belief) with an external structure (a sentence).

5.2 Objections to State-Oriented Extended Mind

The identification of a belief with a sentence has proved controversial. One objection takes the form of an alleged reductio ad absurdum: the identification of a belief with a sentence leads to cognitive bloat (see Ludwig 2015). If the sentences in Otto’s notebook can qualify as his beliefs, why not the sentences in an encyclopedia or the sentences found on the internet—both of which Otto might also access with relative ease? Clark and Chalmers responded to this worry via two stipulations: (1) the subject must, at some time, have consciously endorsed this information, and (2) the subject must have entered the information in the book him- or herself. It is unclear whether these will work. Subliminal beliefs provide a problem for the first stipulation, for these are beliefs that have not been consciously endorsed by their possessors. If such beliefs exist, then conscious endorsement of a belief does not seem to be a necessary condition of its possession. With regard to the second stipulation, it is not clear if this is compatible with Clark and Chalmers’s underlying functionalism. According to functionalism, roughly, if something functions as belief then it is a belief. From a functionalist perspective, how a belief came to be acquired—entered into a person’s collection of beliefs—is not directly relevant. It would be relevant only if it could be shown that having personally entered the belief into one’s collection of beliefs it essential to it having the functional role of a belief. It is not clear what such an argument would look like.

Another objection to state-oriented extended mind is that it confuses the claim that vehicles of cognition are extended with the (weaker) claim that they are embedded or scaffolded or, equivalently, that it falls victim to a coupling-constitution confusion (Adams & Aizawa 2001, 2008; Rupert 2004). On the state-oriented interpretation, a vehicle of content is extended if it is identical with, or constituted by, a structure that lies outside the biological boundaries of an individual. But a vehicle of cognition is (merely) embedded if it depends on, or is coupled with (causally or otherwise) structures that lie outside the biological boundaries of the individual without being identical with those structures. According to this second objection, arguments for extended mind only establish that vehicles of content are embedded, or coupled, with the environment rather than being extended or constituted, by the environment.

A third type of objection to state-oriented extended mind is the original intentionality objection, versions of which have been leveled by Adams and Aizawa (2001, 2008), Fodor (2009), and Rowlands (2010). In a tradition instigated by Brentano, original intentionality is often taken to be the hallmark of the mental. Original intentionality is defined as intentionality that is not derived. And derived intentionality is intentionality that derives from the mental activity, often mediated by social conventions, of a subject. The intentionality of the sentence, “The Museum of Modern Art is on 53rd Street”, is clearly derived intentionality. In itself, this sentence is merely a pattern of shapes against a contrastive background and, in principle, could mean anything. To mean something, it must be interpreted, and its intentionality is, therefore, derived. Beliefs are mental entities. If original intentionality is the hallmark of the mental, then the sentence in Otto’s notebook is not mental. Therefore, the objection runs, it is difficult to see how it could be a belief.

5.3 Process-Oriented Extended Mind

State-oriented extended mind identifies a mental state (e.g., a belief) with an external structure (e.g., a sentence). However, mental states are not the only candidates for the vehicles of content. Mental acts—thinking, believing (or judging), remembering, etc.—have at least as much claim to be regarded as such vehicles. And switching the focus from states to acts affords the possibility of a more process-oriented interpretation of extended mind. We might regard Otto’s notebook as an item of scaffolding in roughly the sense championed by Vygotsky (1934 [1962]). In these terms, the state-oriented version of extended mind identifies a mental state with a piece of this scaffolding—if this piece plays the requisite functional role. In the process-oriented version of extended mind, focus switches from the scaffolding to the process of manipulating the scaffolding. This manipulating of the scaffolding can, on the process-oriented version of extended mind, form part of a cognitive process.

The process-oriented version of extended mind would interpret the case of Otto rather differently. There is no identification of a mental state with an external structure—a belief with a sentence. Rather, there is, first of all, a mental process. Describing this as a process of believing is, perhaps, a little forced: a process of remembering seems more apt. When Otto engages with, or manipulates, his notebook—flipping through the pages, and scanning each page—this manipulation forms part of his process of remembering the location of the Museum of Modern Art. This is only part of the process, of course: little remembering would get done without a suitable contribution from the brain. Nevertheless, Otto’s manipulation of the book is part of that process.

Two distinct types of motivation can be identified for this claim. The first is a broadly functionalist one, akin to the functionalist motivation for state-oriented extended mind. The idea is that the computational profile of the process of manipulating the book is broadly similar to that of internal processes responsible for cognition (Wilson 1994, 2004; Clark 1989, 1997, 2008a, 2008b; Rowlands 1999, 2010, Wheeler 2010). Standard accounts of cognition postulate information-bearing structures (roughly, representations) and transformative processes performed on those structures, where these processes have the function of identifying information and making it available either to the cognitive subject or to further processing operations. Thus, for example, David Marr’s canonical account of vision postulates a series of information-bearing structures—retinal image, raw primal sketch, full primal sketch, and so on, combined with operations that successively transform one structure into the next. The overall function of these processes is to identify and make available to the subject information that can be used to solve the task of seeing an object. Similarly, when Otto manipulates his notebook this, in general terms, is also what he seems to be doing: acting on information-bearing structures with a view to making available information that he needs to solve the cognitive task of remembering the location of The Museum of Modern Art. From this suitably abstract computational perspective, it is argued, there does not seem to be a huge amount of difference between internal processes performed by the brain on information-bearing structures and external processes performed by the organism on information-bearing structures. They have the same abstract computational profile and purpose.

Another type of argument draws its inspiration from the phenomenological tradition. Wheeler (2005), for example, draws on the work of Heidegger (1927 [1962]) in defending a version of extended mind. Rowlands (2010), developing certain themes implicit in Husserl and Sartre, defends a model of intentionality as revealing activity: the presenting (revealing or disclosing) of an object as falling under a given mode of presentation. While the activity through which this presentation occurs can be purely internal—i.e., neural or neurocomputational activity—it need not be, and typically is not. Often this internal activity is combined with actions performed by an organism on the world around it. On this view, when Otto manipulates his book, he is engaging in revealing activity: The Museum of Modern Art is revealed, disclosed or presented as being located on East 53rd Street. This revealing activity comprises both activity occurring in Otto’s brain and wider activity performed by Otto on the world. As revealing activity, therefore, the process of remembering occurs partly inside Otto and partly outside him.

Whether computationally or phenomenologically inspired, process-oriented extended mind may fare better with the objections that were leveled at its state-oriented counterpart. The bloat objection seems to have less purchase on process-oriented extended mind. For example, Otto’s act of remembering extends no further than the things he does to and with his notebook. There is no reason for thinking that it extends into things such an encyclopedia or the internet that Otto is not currently manipulating or exploiting.

The original intentionality objection is also, at least partly, deflected. In this amalgamated process, that combines things going on both inside and outside Otto’s skin, there is original intentionality aplenty. Otto has to read what he scans on each page, and his seeing will have original intentionality. He will have to understand what he sees, and this understanding will also have original intentionality. Therefore, the overall process is not at all devoid of original intentionality (Menary 2006, 2007). It can, however, can be objected that this original intentionality is confined to segments of the process that are located exclusively inside Otto’s skin (Adams 2010). A response to this objection might take two forms. One is to accept the claim, and argue that it does not matter. In this vein, one might point to that the fact that it would be extremely implausible to require that every internal part of a cognitive process, understood neuro-physiologically or computationally, must possess original intentionality. A retinal image, for example, might possess original intentionality of a sort. The visual representation into which this image is progressively transformed by constructive operations on the part of the brain would, probably, possess original intentionality. But those constructive operations would not (Rowlands 2010). The other option is to deny the claim. This would require showing that at least some things that are not located in or at the skin possess original intentionality. Rowlands (2006), for example, argues that this is true of what he calls pre-intentional actions or doings. The debate is ongoing, and it is not clear whether there is an answer that would convince both parties.

5.4 The Mark of the Cognitive/Mental

Tied to this lack of definitiveness is the third charge leveled against extended mind: the coupling-constitution confusion. A simple charge of confusion is difficult to sustain. Proponents of extended mind are, in general well aware of the distinction between causal coupling and constitution. In the case of Otto, for example, Clark and Chalmers argue that a sentence should be identified with a belief—rather than the latter being merely coupled with the former—precisely because the sentence has the functional role of a belief. A more plausible form of the objection might be that the arguments provided by proponents of extended mind—whether state- or process-oriented—do not establish what these proponents have taken them to establish. Specifically, they do not establish anything more than the claim that cognitive processes are coupled with external processes rather than that they are constituted by them. Answering both the original intentionality objection and the coupling-constitution objection, therefore, seems to require the ability to identity when a process is, and is not, a cognitive process.

Rupert (2009) argues that the best way to approach this is through the identification of a cognitive system, an identification that will rest heavily on how the sciences of the mind individuate such systems. The most plausible conception of a cognitive system, he argues, counts against extended mind. Another approach argues the need for identification of a mark of the cognitive—a set of necessary, sufficient, or necessary and sufficient, conditions for a process to count as cognitive. Reaction to this suggestion can be divided into three broad camps. First, there are those who think that a mark of the cognitive is not necessary. Just as we can study biology without a mark of the biological, and practice medicine without a criterion of the medical, we can also do cognitive science without a criterion of the cognitive (Allen 2017). Second, there are those who think a criterion of cognition is required, can be identified, and counts against extended mind (Adams 2010). Third, there are those who think a criterion of the cognitive is available and it supports extended mind (Rowlands 2009, 2010).

6. The Scope of Extended Mind

In its earlier incarnations, the scope of extended mind was relatively restricted, it being understood, primarily, as a thesis about cognition. The types of external structure or activity involved in developing the idea of extended mind reflected this focus on cognition. They were predominantly thought of as structures that carried information pertinent to the solution of cognitive tasks that an organism might face, where the organism, through acting on these structures, could transform this information from information merely present in the structures to information that is available to the organism (Rowlands 2010). Accordingly, expansion in the scope of extended mind can, and has, occurred along two (related) dimensions: (1) expansion in scope from cognition to other kinds of mental process, and (2) expansion in the types of external structure involve in these extended mental processes.

Some prominent advocates of extended cognitive states or processes have been skeptical of the idea that consciousness could be extended, often on the grounds that external structures do not possess the kind of informational bandwidth necessary to sustain conscious experience (Clark 2009, Chalmers 2019). Others are more sanguine about this possibility, and extended accounts of experiences (Rowlands 2010) and other conscious states, such as emotions (Krueger 2014; Krueger & Szanto 2016; Carter et al. 2016) have been defended. At the same time, and relatedly, there has been an expansion in the types of external structures thought relevant. In particular, there has been a pronounced social turn in extended mind in recent years, exploring the ways in which social structures and institutions might also, in part, be constitutive of constitute mental processes (De Jaegher et al. 2010, Gallagher 2013, Lyre 2018, and Slors 2019), and the idea that our basic biological cognitive faculties may be transformed by a process of enculturation (Menary 2015) has helped reshape extended mind in recent years. One important example of this social turn pertains to the study of memory, in particular, in the way in which memory is often transactive—involving the combined efforts of two or more people, bonded together as a coupled system (Barnier et al 2008; Sutton 2008, 2010, 2015).

7. Extended Mind and the 4E Mind

Another way of delineating the scope of extended mind is by more precisely identifying its location in an array of anti-Cartesian possibilities. Extended mind supplies one of the “E”s in what has become known as 4E cognition, or the 4E mind more generally in deference to the idea that its scope may be broader than simply cognition (Newen, De Bruin, & Gallagher 2018). The label “4E” is intended to capture the idea that at least some mental processes are embodied, embedded, enacted and/or extended, or some combination thereof.

The clam that mental processes are embodied can mean at least two distinct things (Prinz 2009). On the one hand, it can signify that mental processes depend on possession and use of a body rather than merely a brain (Haugeland 1993, Shapiro 2004). This idea can, itself, fragment into different views, depending on how we understand the idea of dependence. The claim can be understood as causal dependence: (some) mental processes causally depend (for their existence, identity, etc.) on the body and its characteristics. On the other hand, it can be understood as a claim of constitution: (some) processes occurring inside the body, but outside the brain, can partially constitute mental processes. On the other hand, there is another way of understanding the claim that mental processes are embodied, specifically, as the claim that (some) mental processes depend on mental representations that relate to body (Prinz 2009). These representations come in two forms: ones that affect the body, such as motor commands, and ones that represent or respond to the body, such as a perception of a bodily movement. Thus, on this view, a mental process would count as embodied if it involves, for example, a representation located in the motor cortex, even though the motor cortex is intracranial.

Some proponents of extended mind regard their view as antithetical to the claim that mental processes are embodied. For example, Clark (2008a) argues that there is, at the very least, a tension between the two views. His version of extended mind is grounded in a liberal version of functionalism, according to which mental states and processes are individuated by functional roles specified in a fairly abstract way, as general principles linking perception, mental states and processes, and action that does not specify, in any depth, the nature of the mechanisms responsible for this linkage. The claim of embodiment, on the other hand, Clark sees as grounded either in a rejection of functionalism, or in a form of functionalism that is far more chauvinistic, in that it does, in its specification of functional roles, specify at least some of the details of their realizing mechanisms. Others see extended and embodied views of the mind as much more compatible or aligned than this, even as different facets of the same view (for example, Menary 2007, Rowlands 2010).

A mental process is embedded if it functions, perhaps has been designed to function, in tandem with a surrounding, environmental scaffolding, such that without the presence of this scaffolding the process will fail to do what it is supposed to do, or be less likely to achieve what it is supposed to achieve, or do what it is supposed to so in a less than maximally efficient way, etc. The external scaffolding carries information pertinent to the cognitive task that the process is designed to accomplish, and a cognizing organism can, by manipulating or exploiting the structure in an appropriate way, avail itself of this information. Cognition, on this view, still resides in the head. But the net result is that at least some of the difficulty of the cognitive task is offloaded onto the world. The required internal, intra-cranial, processing is not as sophisticated as it would have needed to be if there was no environmental scaffolding around. Think of the difference between doing long division in your head or doing it with a pen and paper (Rumelhart et al. 1986). The external notation is a form of scaffolding that reduces the complexity of the required internal processing. Kirsh and Maglio (1994) label this kind of action—that changes the nature of the cognitive task that must be performed internally—epistemic action.

The claim that some mental processes are embedded is, prima facie, one that belongs on a spectrum of anti-Cartesian ways of conceptualizing the mind. A, perhaps, curious feature of the recent dialectic, however, is that the idea of embedding is often used as a way of devaluing the claims of extended mind. The idea, here, is that the arguments purported to establish that mental processes are extended really only show that such processes are embedded (Adams & Aizawa 2008, Rupert 2004). This objection is a version of the coupling-constitution objection outlined in section 5.2.

A mental process is enacted if it involves, or is constituted by, a dynamic, interactive coupling of processes occurring inside the skin or skull of an organism and processes external to said skin or skull. Enactivism appears in a variety of forms. However, it is plausible to suppose that process-oriented extended mind coincides with at least some of them. In explaining the nature of conscious experience, for example, many forms of enactivism appeal to the ability of the experiencing organism to act on the world around. Abilities, perhaps, need not be extended. But some versions of enactivism also appeal to the exercise of these abilities. A common enactivist way of explaining the sense of phenomenal presence—the sense of being presented with a richly structured, detailed world—does not appeal to a representational structure that replicates this detail. If representations area involved at all, they give us merely the rough gist of the visual situation. The sense of richness and details results from the experiencing organism availing itself of the richness and detail in the world itself (O’Regan & Noë 2001, Noë [ed.] 2002, Noë 2004). By acting on a rich and detailed world, therefore, the organism injects richness and detail into its experience. The organism’s experience of the richness and detail of the world is realized not by a representation but by a sequence of dynamic, coupled interactions with the external scene itself.

Enactivism comes in a variety of forms (Chemero 2009; Hutto & Myin 2012, 2017; Noë 2004). But an emphasis on dynamic, tightly coupled interactions between organism runs through all versions of enactivism and finds clear echoes in at least the process-oriented version of extended mind. Thus, while there are, perhaps, differences of emphasis, it is likely that some versions of enactivism coincide with some versions of extended mind.


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Other Internet Resources


[Editor’s Note: The coauthors of the previous entry are also credited on the new entry since some content in Section 4 is taken from that entry.]

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Mark Rowlands <mrowlands@mail.as.miami.edu>
Joe Lau
Max Deutsch

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