First published Wed Feb 19, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jun 28, 2007

Daoism[1] stands alongside Confucianism as one of the two great religious/philosophical systems of China. Traditionally traced to the mythical Laozi “Old Philosopher,” Philosophical Daoism owes more to “philosopher Zhuang” (Zhuangzi) (4th Century BCE). Daoism is an umbrella that covers a range of similarly motivated doctrines. The term “Daoism” is also associated with assorted naturalistic or mystical religions. Sometimes the term “Lao-Zhuang Philosophy” is used to distinguish the philosophical from the more religious “Huang-Lao” (Yellow Emperor-Laozi) strain of Daoist thought.

Both the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi are composite texts written and rewritten over centuries with varied input from multiple anonymous writers. Each has a distinctive rhetorical style, the Daode Jing terse and poetic, the Zhuangzi prolix, funny, elusive and filled with fantasy dialogues. Both texts flow from reflections on the nature of dao (way) and related concepts that were central to the ethical disputes of Ancient China. The concept of “Daoism” as a theme or group did not exist at the time of the Classical Daoists, but we have some reasons to suspect the communities focusing on the Zhuangzi and Laozi texts were in contact with each other. The texts share some figurative expressions and themes, an ironic detachment from the first order moral issues so hotly debated by the Mohists and Confucians preferring a reflective, metaethical focus on the nature and development of ways. Their metaethics vaguely favored different first-order normative theories (anarchism, pluralism, laissez faire government. The meta-ethical focus and the related less demanding first order ethics mostly distinguishes “Daoists” from other thinkers of the period.

The meta-ethical reflections were by turns skeptical then relativist, here naturalist and there mystical. Daoism per se has no “constant dao.” However, it does have a common spirit. Dao-centered philosophical reflection engendered a distinctive ambivalence in advocacy—manifested in their indirect, non-argumentative style, their use of poetry and parable. In ancient China, the political implication of this Dao-ism was mainly an opposition to authority, government, coercion, and even to normal socialization in values. Daoist “spontaneity” was contrasted with subtle or overt indoctrination in any specific or social dao.

1. Definition of “Daoism”

Definitions of Daoism are controversial because of the complex twists in its development as it played its role in the long history of China. Even the coining of the term creates ambiguity about what counts as ‘Daoism’. Three to seven centuries after they were supposed to have lived, Han dynasty (around 100 BCE) historians identified Laozi and Zhuangzi as Daoists. The historians postulated six schools of classical thought—Confucian, Mohist, Yin-yang, Legalist, Daoist and school of names. They coined the term dao-jia (way-school) or (dao-de jia) (way and virtue school) and came to identify Laozi and Zhuangzi as paradigms of the study of daoway[2]. Other texts were linked by their incorporation of themes from the two classics including the Liehzi, the Baopuzi and the Huinanzi. After it was linked to the interpretation of the Laozi by Wang Bi, the Yijing came to be thought of as a classic of Daoism.

The Qin had brought a sudden end to the institutions that generated the sophisticated classical period of Chinese philosophy. At first, their ideologies, “Legalist” and Huang-Lao thought, dominated an impoverished intellectual life. When the Han Dynasty began trying to reconstruct China’s classical history , its historians coined the term “Daoism,” probably thinking of Huang-Lao content. However, they implicitly fixed its reference by pointing to Laozi and Zhuangzi as exemplars. So an operative definition of philosophical Daoism could be “what Laozi and Zhuangzi taught” leaving details to interpretation. Other early Han writers using their own interpretations, cribbed and copied from the original texts but, under Huang-Lao influence, exhibited little further philosophical reflection. The products of this “recovery” have also come to be thought of as Daoist texts and include the Huinanzi (around 140 BCE) and the Liezi (third Century AD) and the Yijing. The operative definition if we included these texts would, of course, change.

During the early Han, Confucianism became an official orthodoxy. Quasi-supernatural cosmological speculation (five-phase theory and portentology) dominated Han thought and the intellectual lives of Chinese thinkers for four centuries. When the Han declined, the sterile Confucianism lost much of its appeal to intellectuals who turned to Lao-Zhuang for fresh inspiration—but now read through cosmological Confucian lenses. Western scholars identify this movement as Neo-Daoist but since it fixed the enduring forms of a “traditional text” and provided the first systematic commentaries, that cosmological conception has come to dominate traditional Chinese views of Daoism. The Neo-Daoist movement also overlapped and facilitated the introduction and spread of Buddhism in China. Neo-Daoist discourse practices were vehicles for the conceptually alien Buddhist ideas and Daoism probably influenced the emergence of distinctively Chinese forms of Buddhism, particularly Chan (Zen). This development so blended Neo-Daoism and Mahayana Buddhism in the intellectual consciousness that the Neo-Confucians eventually took the two to be essentially similar religious-metaphysical outlooks.

Meantime, “Daoist” religious groups adopted the institutions of Buddhism (Nuns, monks, monasteries etc.) and became linked to martial-arts, to alchemy, and to popular movements (often rebellious or millenarian movements) that emerged in subsequent dynasties. Because of Daoism’s “naturalistic” and anti-authoritarian ethos, its inherent focus on “ways,” the term ‘Daoism’ could encompass virtually any such movement or “local” religion with its familiar natural “Gods.” ‘Daoist’ is a natural characterization of the ideology behind any non-Confucian or anti-conformist strains of thought. The result is that ‘Religious Daoism’ has become a deeply malleable concept. Creel’s famous question “What is Taoism?” (1970) remains as difficult as ever for Daoist religion. We defer to scholars of religion to sort out the conceptual limits of Daoist religion and baldly focus on what philosophical content can be extracted from the classical exemplars: Laozi and Zhuangzi.

This somewhat arbitrary conceptual division leaves ample ambiguity to sort out in interpretation. The two texts, in both style and content, invite lines of elaboration that are congenial to the religious impulse and those that are more philosophical. That is partly because the subject matter of religion and philosophy overlap. We distinguish philosophy from religion better by pointing to philosophy’s disciplinary commitment to reflectively warranted norms guiding its theorizing and its critical assessment of theories. The norms themselves are subject to discursive, norm guided reflection and revision—which gives philosophy the familiar open, “meta” character that underwrites its image as “thinking about thinking.” Relatively religious approaches (even within philosophy) rely on appeals to “higher” transcendent or hyper-human perspectives to guide thinking. This disciplinary difference in the approach to areas of overlap, e.g., metaphysics and ethics, emerges from philosophy’s relatively greater focus on logic and epistemology.

Traditional accounts of Daoism deal with two areas of overlap: metaphysics and ethics. Philosophical interpretations that are hospitable to religious movements include transcendent monism, mysticism, and ethical intuitionism or supernaturalism (identifying right with attitudes of transcendent ethical judges). Absent a Chinese or Daoist logic, the challenge for a more critical philosophical view is showing that Daoists took a reflective, second level, meta-stance in discussing these issues and how (or whether) the more religious conclusions could survive reflection according to the norms of reasoning enshrined in the philosophical high-tide of the classical period of thought. Is there a classical basis for a warranted Chinese skepticism and could the more credulous readings of the text withstand the critical challenge of such a skepticism? The central sections of this article will trace the conceptual basis for a fully philosophical interpretation of the two core texts of Daoism while pointing out along the way where the more religious readings find footing in the texts. The effects of these religious readings will be traced in surveying later Daoist movements and impacts.

Though tradition has treated Laozi and Zhuangzi as the Socrates and Plato of ‘Daoism,’ the use of Lao-Zhuang to identify a strain of thought may have become common only as with Neo-Daoism in the 3rd Century AD. Not only is it true that “Zhuangzi never knew he was a Daoist”, (Graham 1981, 128) he probably also didn’t know anything about the Laozi. However, writers responsible for later chapters of the Zhuangzi established the first connection between the two texts. A large chunk of the “outer” chapters use the character of Laozi as spokesman for a closely related meta-ethical position and occasionally echoes the style and attitudes of the Daode Jingthough it seldom quotes directly from any extant version. Common themes, tropes and modes of expression seem to link the authors of the outer chapters with Daode Jing. One plausible speculation is that anonymous students of the Zhuangzi, working after his death, were “developing” the Zhuangzi text while in contact with the group anonymously composing the Daode Jing. They seemingly shaped each other’s themes, expressions and ideas. See further discussion in Texts and Textual Theory.

The underlying basis for our distinction between the philosophical and religious poles is epistemic. Both species of Daoism start from a common critique of “ordinary” knowing of daoway:guide. From this mildly skeptical or relativist base, philosophical Daoism tends toward pluralism, perspectivalism, skepticism, political equality and freedom. Religious “mysticism” usually is accompanied by a credulous assertion of supernatural epistemic abilities—control of some abstruse or magical way of overcoming skepticism. This is often explained by a supposed Daoist correlate of Confucian cultivation and the sage. It is typically the associated with some intuitive or “superlative” direct access to a single correct daoway:guide. As its special insight cannot be justified to those with “ordinary” perspectives and/or cannot be put into language and argument, it tends to generate the esoteric, hierarchical and authoritarian attitudes familiar in religions as well as the institutions that initiate and cultivate the common human into the idealized adept.

The Confucian-like emphasis on “cultivating” this special epistemic ability, obediently following teachers and traditions contrasts with the philosophical strain’s emphasis on natural spontaneity, freedom and egalitarianism which seems to Confucians like a plea for anarchy. This is because in the context of Ancient China, the assumed role of government is cultivating moral character, that is, instilling the same moral daoway:guide in everyone whether by education, attraction or force. (The gap between the religious and philosophical versions of the political attitudes can be partially closed if it treats the content of the transcendent dao as egalitarian, empty or anarchist—hence available equally to all with no need of hierarchy or training).

Confucianism argues that the shared interest in cultivating a hyper-normal epistemic status means that Confucianism and Daoism are ultimately compatible. Both have at their core a dogmatic asseveration of their “special,” cultivated ability of direct (not mediated by language or reasons) access to the single, correct, dao—which cannot be cast in the form of “fixed” principles. So even if they disagree about the ethical details, they share a similarly anti-skeptical, unreflective authoritarian epistemology. The supposedly shared presupposition is the possibility of mysteriously cultivating an infallible or superhuman intuitive guidance system. The question is: can an asserted commitment to that view survive the philosophical arguments found in two Daoist texts—the worrisome sections that fuel skeptical or relativist interpretations? Insofar as they can answer those arguments in justifying their claims to special access, such tendencies in dogmatic absolutist directions can still count as ‘philosophical’. We draw the line distinguishing philosophy from religion where the claim to special insight rests on simple assertion, unexplained intuition, special pleading, appeal to either authority or “revelation” or naïve supernaturalism.

The domination of Confucianism in Chinese intellectual life has brought with it the wide acceptance of this “friendly” orthodox religious interpretation of Daoism. History does little to settle which line of interpretation is “original” since lines of thought leading in each direction can be found in early classical sources. This difficulty is compounded by the diffidence of the writing styles in both the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi—which is so marked that it is often tempting to suspect the writers intended to be ambiguous, to invite divergent interpretation as an object lesson in the “inconstancy” of any discourse-based dao. Conceivably, therefore, both trends may have drawn “support” from reading the early texts as expressing ideas compatible with their own. See Origins of Daoism.

The plethora of strains of Daoism makes any specific content attributed to philosophical Daoism controversial to others who are equally attracted to the texts and their ideas. Treatments range from interpreting Daoism as a sophisticated metaethical position rooted in analytic studies of language tending toward ethical skepticism and relativism at one end and “praising” Daoism as an anti-logical, deliberately self-contradictory mysticism—a cultural rebuke of Western rationality—at the other. Despite (or because of?) their “Rorschach” quality, the two main texts remain among the most popular in Chinese philosophy. No one doubts their literary qualities and attractive style which, combined with their lighthearted humor, leaves readers with a compelling inkling that these texts are somehow philosophically profound. See the section Philosophical Daoism: A Primer.

This entry will focus on exploring that hint of philosophical depth in Daoism and touch on the familiar religious interpretations mainly for context and contrast. We will look at a range of loosely related philosophical positions and some of the interpretive theory fueling them. The philosophical side of Daoism takes the ru-moConfucianism-Mohism debate about dao as a model of what goes wrong in trying to formulate a “constant dao .” This critique takes the form of metaethics—a study of the nature or metaphysics of daoways as well as dao’s knowability and objectivity as well as the pragmatics of dispute about dao. This strategy generates a distinctive analysis of key normative concepts of Ancient China. See the section Important Daoist Concepts.

Philosophical Daoist interest in daoways:guides is thus distinct from the first-order normative focus of Confucians and Mohists, who certainly used the word dao as often as did the classical Daoist thinkers. We distinguish Daoism here as meta-theorizing rather than direct advocacy of some first-order dao . Often the reflections have (or seem to have) implications for how to choose which first-order dao to follow (or whether to abandon all of them). Meta-reflection constitutes the umbrella that covers this wide range of first-order options and the meta-positions include nihilism, relativism, skepticism, intuitionism, mysticism, primitivism, value contrarianism and naturalist stoicism. Echoes of all these can be found in both texts—often, as we noted, as if the various contributors to the texts were divided on what follows from such a philosophical ascent to meta-critique. The metaethical views also motivate some of the commonly attributed first-order political daos, e.g., daos of suspicion of political authority (anarchism), social convention and traditional mores. The philosophical focus thus construes Daoism as a meta-level challenge to Confucianism, while the religious focus tends to treat it as a sibling—with similar emphasis on cultivation, direct intuition, sages and a prosaic interest only in guilelessly asserting their alternative first-order normative dao.

2. Philosophical Daoism: A Primer

Ancient Chinese thinkers discussed mainly three parts of dao: human (or social) dao, tiannatural dao, and great dao. When I instruct you to put your hand on your partner’s head, I am delivering some human dao. Human dao is typically enshrined in a language—which may include the language of planning. Human daos are normative space-time structures—recommended possible histories. Natural dao (often translated heavenly dao) is akin to what we would consider the constancies of science. It is the ways things reliably (constantly) have happened and will happen. Great dao refers to the entire actual history of everything—whatever has happened, is happening or actually will happen in the universe constitutes the great dao.

Daoists, however, do not formulate these categories explicitly—partly because they may seem to overlap. A form of determinism, for example, would treat tian dao and great dao as identical—the laws of nature make only one world-history possible. Common sense indeterminism would regard many possible world histories as consistent with tian dao. In general, however, it is best to think of Great dao as simply the counterpart of Wittgenstein’s “All that is the case”—the extended actual space-time world. One of the insights of the Zhuangzi, not as clearly reflected in the Laozi, is that human dao is embedded in, part of and consistent with, both great dao and natural dao (tian dao).

Daoist philosophers typically express their doubts about first-order human dao (paradigmatically Confucian and Mohist dao) by considering them in relation to natural dao and/or great dao (the actual dao). This plays on the tendency of rival schools of ancient Chinese moralists to treat tiannature:sky as the authority for their favored human daos. Mature Daoist analysis centers on the insight that while human daos are normative, neither the natural nor the actual dao are. Natural dao and Great dao are “constant” while human dao are inherently changeable and subject to interpretation. This insight is most famously expressed in the first line of the Daode Jingdaoguides that can daoguide are not constant daoguides.”

Given the shared ru-moConfucian-Mohist assumption that normative authority for their competing first-order daos comes from some form of endorsement by tiannature:sky, Daoists aver that nature does not authorize or endorse any particular social dao. This claim has two versions: pluralist and primitivist. Denying that it endorses a particular one is compatible with its allowing either many or none. The nihilistic answer might take the form of an assertion that reality is an amorphous chaos and all daos impose an illusory or unreal social structure on Chaos. This version, however, has no obvious normative implications.

To answer “none” and still treat tiannature:sky as the normative authority generates a dichotomy between human and natural dao. The metaphysical type of human social dao is guiding discourse, so this line of thought motivates Daoist “silence”—the notorious reluctance to use language. The philosophical quietism is also motivational and intentional quietism—essentially an extreme form of stoicism. This treats accepting natural dao as not using guidance or identifying the “highest” guidance with “whatever happens” the quintessential position of Shen Dao. Technically, however, Shen Dao does not formulate a doctrine of determinism (the identity of naturally possible dao and the actual “Great” dao. The appearance of fatalism comes from concluding that we have no moral responsibility—to enact the Great dao in our actions.

The Zhuangzi strain, informed by contact with Chinese philosophy of language, recognized that a blanket anti-language position was self-censuring. The instruction not to follow any dao is itself a dao and thus enjoins against following itself—a prescriptive paradox. The pluralist reading is that all de facto rival practices are natural daos in virtue of their being actual practices. Human daos in general are a part of natural dao. That they “are walked” shows they are, in that sense, compatible with natural constancies. Similarly, all actual rival daos are part of great dao simply in virtue of being followed—as the Zhuangzi says, “daos are made by walking them”.

Both pluralist and primitivist Daoism would reject the Confucian-Mohist conclusion that political authority should be used to bring about a harmony of daos—making everyone follow a single dao. The social world survives as well (or better) when people follow different ways of life. Focus on either tiannature:sky dao or Great dao helps to undermine the sense that it is imperative to master or impose any particular first-order dao. Tiannature dao, like great dao justifies no particular judgment whatever.

The primitivist version of Daoism, however, can religiously take a more assertive form that nature does endorse a particular normative dao, albeit not a human one (particularly one in discourse form). There is a single, constant, correct way of life that cannot be expressed or presented in practices, rules, narratives, maps, examples, songs or any other human or social form of communication and advocacy. It implicitly must be a super-human dao accessed via super-human epistemic capacities—mystical or esoteric dao. Though it is usually expressed as the natural dao, there is no obvious reason why there might not be multiple super-human daos.

A different version of the primitivist interpretive line is that there are fully natural ways but that they require finer or more complex discriminations than normal humans are capable of. Humans could follow them, as it were, by luck or accident, but not reliably via any learnable pattern. If one subtracts the claims to superhuman epistemic capacities, then an interpretive hypothesis would yield a combination of both natural realism and skepticism. Still another possibility would be of naturalistic ways to do something that are humanly accessible—but in different ways to each different human or in each situation. There would be no learnable social formula that could be of any use and no one’s having successfully done it could count as “knowing” it in the sense of being reliably able to do it again or in the sense of being able to teach others. In that case, the interpretation would be both realistic and relativist and mildly skeptical—most of us don’t actually know and, though in principle we could do it on occasions, no one could know a reliable shareable process or content for acquiring that dao.

A contrarian version expresses itself via deliberate flaunting or “reversing” all the norms and attitudes in the conventional dao. Laozi’s is the most famous example of this dao of reversal, though overtones can be found in Zhuangzi’s description of “the perfect” person or ability as one that is so incomprehensible and so irrelevant to our concerns that he appears as the opposite whatever we normally respect. The political consequence is still a government guided by a discourse dao—the systematic reversal of the dominant Confucian dao.

Relativist (pluralist) or skeptical versions need not deny that there are norms for endorsing some daos over others, but would acknowledge that the norms of endorsing a dao constitute a distinct dao that we presuppose in choosing it. This meta-dao, by hypothesis, is also natural in being “actual” so the relativism involved need not be irrealism. Such relativism deserves the ‘Daoist’ appellation on the further ground that it entails that normative authority comes from higher-level dao, not from the Confucian-Mohist tiannature:sky. However, actual nature gives us many candidate daos. It’s conclusion, thus, is not that we should flaunt or violate nature, but that we simply cannot flaunt it. Any of the options actually available to us for guidance are components of both the natural and Great daos. Hence, “follow the natural dao” is empty (tautological) as a normative guide—a dao that does not dao. Whatever dao we choose will be a natural one, in virtue of being one we in fact can choose and “walk”.

The naturalist, mystical, and intuitionist versions similarly draw differently nuanced conclusions from this analysis of the role of daos in nature and actual history. Intuitionism teeters toward the religious strain’s claim of special epistemic access, but could be developed in an egalitarian and even a naturalistic way. Naturalism is inherently more egalitarian but tends, uncritically, to confuse being neutral with rejecting actually existing social dao. Mysticism’s implications are, by definition, unclear. Daoist mysticism tends toward what some call “external mysticism.” It arises from reflections on the context sensitivity and normative complexity of dao rather than from some “inner” experience as of an inexpressible “oneness.” If combined with some doctrine or a particular (discourse or non-discourse) dao, it tends to foster religious claims of superlative “access” to a mystically “correct” penetration of the complexity—though it may still claim that the insight is equally accessible to everyone. This access need not be mystical if it consists simply in giving up any attempt to determine how to guide one’s behavior but even that counts as a dao—but probably contains a prescriptive paradox.

Despite the divergence in these versions of Daoism, all can claim to underwrite a theme of harmony with nature—the pluralist sees the point of such harmony as permissive and tolerant, while the primitivist sees it as a more intolerant rejection or prohibition of any conventional dao.

Metaphysically, Daoism is naturalistic in that any first-order moral dao must be rooted in natural ways. It doesn’t characterize the natural dao as either physical or mental. Like the varieties of metaphysical naturalism that eschew both a commitment to realism or anti-realism, it simply accepts natural dao without a separate theory of whether it is real or not.

3. The Origins of Daoism

Much of the thrust of Daoism, as we have seen, naturally motivates a reaction against the moralistic and elitist inclinations of Confucianism. Confucianism stood for a rigid, detailed, traditional pattern of hierarchical social behavior. Duties were assigned to all of one’s social roles—and a person typically had many such roles, e.g., husband, father, minister, younger brother, teacher, student, etc. One could escape this heavy scheme of obligations mainly in retirement or, paradoxically, the traditional duty to spend three years “in mourning” for the death of one’s father. The withdrawal from society, the antipathy toward ritual roles, traditional “morality,” and any social structures or traditional culture suggests a kind of Daoist “ethos” as an antithesis to Confucianism in China. We can trace the origin of Daoism, accordingly, in two ways. One is attitudinal, the other theoretical. The theoretical mark of Daoism is an interest in the meaning or nature of dao which may inform or encourage Daoist attitudes. In view of the religious strain, however, we have to recognize two attitudes as marks of proto-Daoism in China. The first is the vague reaction against the demanding scheme of traditional Confucian rules. The second is interest in techniques for cultivating the adept to achieve an elevated epistemic status resulting in with some special or transcendent access to a dao that is impenetrable to those who have not had this “cultivation.”

3.1 Attitudinal Daoism I: Anarchism

Traditionally scholars have traced the first “Daoist spirit” back to “proto-Daoist” hermits who crop up sporadically in the Analects, confronting Confucius and his disciples as they traveled to or fled from various rulers. Their approximate message was an early version of Yangist purification by withdrawal from society. Robert Eno[3] argues that Confucius himself had a heavy dose of this “Daoist” attitude and his “political” theory was actually a justification of his staying remote from government—at least until a sage is in power! This attitude tends to be expressed as anti-moral or amoral mainly because it targets a Confucian conception that systematically elides morality and conventional mores. It also seems to include some of the attitudes that led to the agriculturalists with their opposition to the division of labor, the differential social status and ranks to which it gives rise. These, however, seem to involve no meta-theory of dao of the type traced in the Zhuangzi history although they can be seen as early indications of the value of Daoist egalitarianism and impartiality.

Another candidate for this “proto-Daoist” status, Yang Zhu, we know mainly from Mencian attacks. According to Mencius, Yang Zhu derived opposition to society and politics from an ethical egoism (emphasizing “me”). Angus Graham has influentially (and controversially) reconstructed Yang Zhu’s ideas, but they too do not include explicit meta-theorizing about the nature of dao. Yangism mainly proposes a (shocking!) rival first order normative dao—egoism. Yangist echoes surface prominently in the Laozi and in huge chunks of the “outer chapters” of the Zhuangzi. At its core is an arguably Daoist worry that social conventions and structures damage our natural spontaneity and interfere with efficient functioning of our natural powers. Early Chinese moral theory flowed too easily between mores and morality and we may see the lure of Daoist impartiality in the Yangist desire to dispense with relative social mores.

3.2 Attitudinal Daoism II: Authoritative Intuition

Others credited as precursors of Daoism seemed to reflect a version of the moralists’ confidence that they had achieved some non-linguistic or intuitive access to a daoguide that resists “ordinary” formulation. It amounts to direct access to what, for ordinary people, is the product of interpreting a first order dao. Thus it lacks the inherent vagueness of a formulaic dao. The Confucian value of renhumanity is the moralists’ most prominent manifestation of this tendency. Such intuitionism, while cursorily evading interpretive variability, led instead to insoluble conflicts of authority. They disagreed with each other about who else had such access and any attempt to resolve that transmuted into an attempt to formulate or theorize about the intuition, thus threatening to abandon their hard won interpretive constancy. This is because the common formulation of these disputes constitutes a theory or dao of how to cultivate the unerring interpretive access to other dao.

Hal Roth emphasizes this line of thought and follows Graham in linking it to two recently prominent chapters of an early Legalist text, the Guanzi (neiyeinward training and xin shuheart-mind methods). The writers claim to have achieved this direct access to dao and Roth links the “achievement” to evidence of early Chinese interests in meditative practices including breath control, fasting (and notoriously wine and possibly other hallucinogens). Victor Mair, suggests that Yogic techniques, already transmitted from India, played this role. The epistemic commitment both hypotheses impute to their proto-Daoists, however, is that these techniques help achieve incorruptible practical access to the correct normative daoguide. Usually this access was direct and unmediated by language or culture. So they might echo the anarchists rejection of rules or principles but for quite different reasons, i.e., that they can neither formulate nor inferentially defend their intuitively “correct” dao.

The inferred interpretive reliability in this stream of Daoism reflects a kind of impartiality, the irresolvability of rival claims to infallible practical guidance threatens that goal. It can be developed in an egalitarian way (i.e., everyone has such immediate, unerring guidance) that also removes any conflict by inviting a radically subjective relativism or romantic, primitivist optimism.[4] But it is more routinely developed into esoteric and authoritative directions, requiring adepts to subject themselves to the some version of the dogmatic cultivation techniques. Both may, however, share Daoism’s implicit enmity toward the first-order moralists and Daoism may draw from its suspicion of traditional texts and normative precepts.

There can be little doubt that this dogmatic, self-congratulatory trend of “authoritarian intuitionism” existed in classical thinking. One can, however, doubt that it is either a necessary or sufficient distinguisher of Daoism. It finds a more comfortable home in proto-Legalist texts and arguably blends the ingredients of Huang-Lao ruler-worship. It is also quite obviously manifest in authoritarian and intuitionistic Confucianism with its emphasis on cultivation. Confucian interpretations, like religious ones, typically treat Daoists as making Confucian-style, elitist cultivation claims.

Philosophical interpretations are naturally less comfortable taking these authoritarians as forerunners of Daoism and usually require some version of them that pushes them toward relativism or optimistic primitivism. The esoteric or authoritarian developments seem too cavalierly to brush-off the skeptical doubts that generated philosophical reflection on dao and the impulse to seek an impartial resolution. A characteristically religious excuse for coercive indoctrination is available. After “proper cultivation,” the rebellious person would “see” and appreciate their wisdom in thus coercing him. Thus the Huang-Lao tradition could mesh with the authoritarian Confucian and Legalist elites who dominated the Han. With the Mawang Dui discovery (see Texts and Textual Theory) came more evidence of Huang-Lao theory. Just how far back its history extends into the classical period remains controversial. It was highly influential in the Qin and Han, when it seemed to be highly favored by the superstitious rulers. Han historians categorized many of the figures in the Daoist history as students of Huang-Lao.

Many scholars have treated the Mawang Dui discovery as proving the Laozi stems from such authoritarian forerunners of this cult. The arguments are inconclusive, necessarily so since the Laozi’s emergence remains so obscure. In the definitional texts, the Laozi and the Zhuangzi, the epistemic grounds are arguably more skeptical and perspectival than dogmatic. There is little unambiguous appeal to direct mystical experience or insight. In these texts, hypothetical exemplars of such authoritative, superlative knowledge of dao are typically described as being both incomprehensible and irrelevant to us and our practical questions. In any case, the ambiguous style of both texts comports poorly with the implicit authoritarianism of the religious movement and it is very hard to show how philosophically the use of breathing techniques, meditation, proto-yogic practices or hallucinogens could vouchsafe such supernatural epistemic achievements. They do nothing to explain or justify the sophisticated philosophical understanding of dao we can find in these texts.

Ultimately, the philosophical question is whether these assertions of intuitionist access would or would not be refuted by the skeptical arguments that Zhuangzi directed against the Confucians. Given their similarities, it’s difficult to imagine how these religious conclusions could escape his analysis. Modern champions of irrationalist Daoism, of course, would not be disturbed by this inconsistency, of course, since, they allege, that Daoists refuse to think logically. Finally, like the attitudinal Daoist stream, the authoritarian intuition approach deals with the epistemology of access to dao rather than to an analysis of its nature and how insight into that nature can illuminate and correct disputes about first order dao.

3.3 Pre-Laozi Daoist Theory

We have alluded to the earliest known “history of thought” in ancient China comprising Chapter 33 (Tianxiaunder heaven) of the Zhuangzi. It surveys the streams of thought leading from the “ancients” (the Chinese golden age?) to Zhuangzi. After introducing the idealized ancient dao, it implies a “fall,” then lists a series of groups of thinkers, each striving for impartial objectivity, leading eventually to a Laozi group and then to Zhuangzi.

The list takes key thinkers to be motivated by goals of neutrality, universality, freedom from bias and natural “spontaneity” in action. The list starts with a group that includes Mozi (universal, impartial utilitarians), then discusses anti-conventionalists headed by Song Xing, third came Shen Dao’s group (metaphysical anti-knowledge stoics), then Laozi and Zhuangzi. Its last topic however is not Zhuangzi but his friend and frequent philosophical debating companion, Hui Shi, who along with other members of the school of names, is introduced mainly for condemnation as if (contrary to all other evidence) he were irrelevant to the motivation and understanding of Zhuangzi’s thought. Clearly, we can use this history only with some caution. It does serve as a “manifest history of thought” that helps us appreciate the philosophical agenda of the writer. We, however, must blend this internal Daoist history with external information about these groups and their thought to get a plausible explanatory justification for the classic Zhuangzi position.

Initially, it is a surprise to see Mozi listed as a “forerunner” of Daoism since in many respects, passages in the Zhuangzi take the Mohist dispute with Confucianism as a critical target (examples of question-begging rival first-order theories of dao). However, in both our theoretical senses, Daoism could be said to have roots in the anti-Confucian Mozi (5th Century BCE). First, his early challenge to Confucianism initiated higher level philosophical reflections on dao, its role and the kind of thinking it involved. Mozi, for example, theorized that a dao should be constant, not a matter of a special history or arbitrary social convention. He supported his use of a utilitarian standard to evaluate social daos on grounds of the impartiality and constancy of the benefit-harm distinction. He taught this “constant” feature of utilitarianism was evidence that it was tiannature’s standard. He thought of this as an objective fastandard for making shi-feithis-not this distinctions.

Mozi’s challenge to Confucianism focused on his crucial insight that the fact that traditional norms are our own, do not warrant taking them as correct. Mozi thus launched the meta-search for a way impartially to select a first-order dao. He formulates the initial version of the goal of unbiased, constant universality in morality. Both of these results, further, involved important theoretical insights into the concept of dao. The Mohists developed much of the terminology of analysis that other Chinese thinkers, including Mencius and Zhuangzi, adopted. (See Concepts.) Zhuangzi deployed this language with considerable skill in his skeptical undermining of all claims to special moral authority.

However, Mohism did advocate a first order normative dao and followed Confucianism in the assumption that an orderly society needs to follow a single constant dao. Though they developed an account of how to justify a dao and first formulated the standard of dao adequacy (constancy). What they did not notice was that those standards constituted a meta-dao—a dao for selecting and interpreting a first-order dao. This reflects their failure to reflect on the nature of dao, and then to address whether and how such a dao was knowable. They disagreed with Confucianism mainly on the content of the daoguide to be imposed on society by authority while addressing only from their own perspective how that disagreement should be resolved. Theoretical Daoism focused on the insolubility of this ru-moConfucian-Mohist debate.

We know far less of the doctrine of the next figure cited in the development—Song Xing. Our main sources are the Zhuangzi description here and a lengthy attack on Song Xing in the Xunzi . He is said to have specialized in a theory of the xinheart-mind and to have argued that socialization in conventional attitudes injected destructive values into the heart. The qingpre-social yudesires are relatively few and easy to satisfy. Socialization creates a plethora of desires for “social goods” such as status, reputation, and pride. Song Xin suggested that the conventional values, because of their social, comparative nature incite competition and then violence. The way to social order is for people to eliminate these socialize ambitions, which create attitudes of resentment and anger. Hence his slogan that being insulted (conventional value) is no (qingreal) disgrace. The slogan aims to eliminate the violence occasioned by “honor and moral rectitude.” In effect, names do not harm me.

Mozi had also seen different daos as a source of conflict, but advocated unifying the social dao rather than abandoning it. The abandonment theme is developed with some skill in Laozi’s Daode Jing. It has roots in the search for impartiality and universality that also motivated Mozi since it contrasts changeable social values with pre-social or natural ones. The theme, however can have both elitist, dogmatic and supernatural elaborations. We might treat the ability to forget social conditioning (returning to nature) as something only some are capable of, ignore the self-rebutting threat of the attempt, and romanticize the abilities or moral purity that would result from removing socialization.

Zhuangzi built on a related view—that people develop different moral attitudes from different natural upbringings and each feels his own views are obvious and natural. But his version treats all as equally natural, not regarding some as more able than others to avoid being “blinded by socialization.” Zhuangzi also adopts a closely related view of how xinheart-mind is shaped by socialization. So there is a role for Song Xing, along with Mozi in the motivations for Daoist theorizing. However, again we find little hint that Song Xing reflected on the concept of dao itself and how it is involved in this analysis of how society injects attitudes into xinheart-mind.

The first plausible candidate for a theoretical Daoist comes next in the Zhuangzi historical survey. We will pick Shen Dao as the best-known representative of this group of scholars. He is sometimes included in the list of Huang-Lao thinkers and cited as a source of Legalist thinking. We will not attempt here to reconcile this latter with the essentially Daoist view presented in the Zhuangzi history. Shen Dao’s theory (perhaps unwittingly) lays the foundation for Daoism’s rejecting the authority of tiannature:sky in favor of daoguide:way. (In religious language, we can describe this as worshipping daoguide rather than tiannature:sky.) The key insight here is that (like God and Nature) appeal to tiannature:sky is normatively empty. All authority presupposes some daoguide. (God’s moral authority presupposes we accept a dao of “obey God.”) The Later Mohists[5] dialecticians also noticed this problem. They even more clearly argue that the appeal to tiannature:sky could justify the thief as well as the sage.

Here is the Zhuangzi “Tianxia” account of Shen Dao’s group:

For the general public, not cliques; changing and without selfishness; decisive but without any control; responsive to things without dividing in two. Not absorbed with reflection. Not calculating in knowing how. Not choosing among natural kinds and flowing along with them.

They took bonding all the natural kinds together as the key. They said, “tiannature:sky constancies can cover but cannot sustain; Earthly cycles can sustain but cannot cover it. Great daoguide can embrace it but cannot distinguish it.” We know the myriad natural kinds all have both that which is acceptable and that which is unacceptable. So they said, “If you select then you cannot be comprehensive, if you teach you cannot convey all of it. Daoguide does not leave anything out.”

Hence Shen Dao “abandoned knowledge and discarded ‘self’.” He flowed with the inevitable and was indifferent to natural kinds … . He lived together with shi and fei, mixed acceptable and avoidable. He didn’t treat knowing and deliberation as guides, didn’t know front from back. He was indifferent to everything.

If he was pushed he went, if pulled he followed—like a leaf whirling in the stream, like a feather in a wind, like dust on a millstone. He was complete and distinguished (fei) nothing … . So he said, “reach for being like things without knowledge of what to do. Don’t use worthies and sages. Even a clod of earth cannot miss Dao.”

The worthy officials all laughed at him and said, “Shen Dao’s dao does not lead to the conduct of a living man but the tendency of a dead man. It is really very strange… .” (Zhuangzi Ch. 33)

Shen Dao’s conception of great dao reminds us of the actual world among possible worlds—it is the actual history of the universe. Shen Dao avers that there is just one such total history—one actual past and one actual future. The actual is, obviously, natural so the great dao (the natural pattern of behaviors, events and processes) requires no learning, no knowledge, no language or shi-feithis-not this distinctions. “Even a clod of earth cannot miss the great dao.” Shen Dao’s insight undermines all these guiding schemes that claim tiannature’s approval as justification. The crucial implication of his approach is that great dao has no normative force. To say “follow great daoguide” is as trivial as “do what you actually will do.” When we think of dao as the actual course of all nature, it is obvious we will follow it.

This reasoning drives Shen Dao’s slightly different stoicism. His slogan was “abandon knowledge; discard self.” “Abandon knowledge” means do not guide your behavior using prescriptive discourse—a learned daoguide. “Discard self” prescribes the corollary that even Yang Zhu’s dao of self-preservation is not natural. Our death is part of great dao—down to its very moment. Egoistic guidance is a daoguide similarly committed to right-wrong, normative guiding distinctions rooted in a distinction between ‘self’ and ‘other’. It recommends a particular possible future history. So to abandon knowledge is to also discardself’ as a prescriptive term—to give up using ‘self-other’ as a guiding distinction. Yangzhu’s egoism violates Shen Dao’s anti-language naturalism as much as does Confucius’s traditionalism or Mozi’s utilitarianism.

Why does Shen Dao think we should give up guiding ourselves by shared moral prescriptions? His stoic attitude and some of his slogans suggest that like the Stoics, he was a fatalist. However Shen Dao’s argument has no predictive capacity or law-like basis. It is simply logical determinism: “what will be will be.” The account above also has no hint of any concept of free will, but Shen Dao does advocate a parallel to giving up moral responsibility. We should not make shi-feithis-not this judgments. Consequently, he should not be saying that we should follow the great dao, because that would be to shithis:right whatever actually happens. He avoids this inconsistency and thus is not committed to the Stoic view that the natural/actual course of events is rational or good. It simply happens.

However, another inconsistency is rampant in Shen Dao’s theory of great dao. In using the notion of the actual dao to motivate avoiding any prescriptive discourse, Shen Dao is saying to Confucians and Mohists, “if you allege to speak for the nature of things, say nothing!” Nature does not prescribe. What about Shen Dao’s naturalism itself, however? Is it other than “natural” (and part of great dao) that humans use language to coordinate behavior, to order their interactions, to accumulate and transmit knowledge? Further, his injunction against shi-fei judgments is an injunction—a negative prescription. His “slogan” is expressed as a guide, as something we can learn and follow. “Abandon knowledge” amounts to a prescriptive paradox. The concept of knowledge it uses is prescriptive knowledge. In form and intent, it is a prescription—a daoguide. If we obey it, we disobey it. This is our first example of Daoist paradox! Shen Dao’s daoguide is a daoguide that can’t daoguide us.

The Zhuangzi history, where we find this account of Shen Dao’s doctrine, criticizes Shen Dao’s position along these lines. Still, it places Shen Dao in the dialectic just before Laozi, who directly precedes Zhuangzi. Laozi has a different line of reasoning to “abandon knowledge.” He avoids the fatalist implications—and, with it implicitly, the concept of great dao as a guide (though he keeps tiannature’s dao). We can view the Laozi persona as combining Song Xing and Shen Dao. His reason to “abandon knowledge” is that knowledge is a form of social control that instills unnatural desires, stimulates unnatural action thus it constrains and distorts natural spontaneity. The Zhuangzi ordering is theoretically informative, though chronologically inaccurate.

4. Dao and Names: The Laozi or Daode Jing

We will discuss, here, mainly the contributions the Laozi makes to this Daoist dialectic. For a more complete and detailed treatment of the philosophy of the text, see the entry under Laozi.

The Zhuangzi history lists Laozi (along with Guan Yin) between Shen Dao and Zhuangzi. Whatever its actual date and manner of composition, the Laozi is assigned a role in the development of Zhuangzi’s thought that best fits in that slot. The most famous line of Daoist meta-theory of dao opens the Daode Jing.Dao that can be dao-ed is not constant dao.” Though the text betrays no hint of exposure to the School of Names, this famous slogan is duplicated with mingname replacing dao. It thus shifts the focus of meta-discourse about dao from grounding its authority in nature to issues of language and the role of mingwords in dao-ing. Since words are not constant, no dao that can be conveyed using words can be.

What is being denied in saying such dao are not constant? The text does not elaborate on the concept, however the issue in ancient Chinese thought emerges as the crux of the dispute between Mohists and Confucians. Mohists attempted to regiment the debate by insisting on fastandards for interpreting guiding language. They argued tiannature:sky’s standard lies in the distinction between benefit and harm—which was by association a constant standard. The writers of the Confucian Analects inclined toward a notion of an administrator “rectifying names.” A name is rectified when an instruction containing it (a ritual or a law) correctly guides peoples action. “If names are not rectified … people will not know how to move hand or foot” (Analects 13:3). The typical Confucian way of rectifying a name is to set an example—either of correct use of the term or correct action in following a dao that contains the term.

So what is Laozi denying when he is made to say “names that can be named are not constant names?” The skepticism here can be read in two ways. One is there is no correct way to use a name so contrary to Mohism, no standard is “nature’s” constant standard of choice of a dao. The other reading is interpretive—no pattern of correct past use (no social practice) uniquely determines what concrete behavior counts as correct here-now (or in the future). So, as Mozi had argued, tradition cannot determine what is the correct dao, but, the Laozi seems to add, that is so even presupposing a tradition. There is no constant (correct) way to interpret that practice/dao into action.

The negative result may be read in several ways.

  1. It may be pure nihilism—there is no such thing as correct dao.
  2. It may be skepticism—correct dao can never be known;
  3. Or as anti-language—correct dao cannot be put in words or conveyed as guidance to another.

The second and third are compatible with their being a correct or constant dao and the third even with someone’s knowing it. It simply cannot be conveyed. The rest of the text—the very fact that there is more to the text—makes these two readings, particularly the last, the most common ones. However the traditional story of Laozi undermines the argument for placing too much emphasis on the fact that after this opening stanza, he goes on to write a text. It suggests that he writes only because compelled to do so by the keeper of the pass.

Adopting readings 2 or 3 doesn’t remove all paradox from Laozi’s position. Laozi is still left with his variation on Shen Dao’s “abandon knowledge.” The text, however, does develop a different motivation for it. We find few traces of Shen Dao’s fatalistic or stoic reasoning. Laozi’s opposition to knowledge derives more from Song Xing’s insights about how social knowledge shapes our values and desires. We can attribute to the Laozi the next development in Chinese pragmatics of language, how language shapes action.

Laozi draws illustrations using ming (word) pairs—opposites. He draws analogies between naming and cutting or “carving” (hence the symbol of the nameless pusimplicity—uncarved, raw wood). When we learn a way of using a word (e.g. watching teachers “rectify” names) we internalize a community practice of “cutting” stuff and assigning names to the portions. This is how we pick out how to act—what to pick up, put down, go toward and so on. We interpret a dao by dividing things up into types. We learn this in concrete practice as we avoid or pursue the things named. Thus, with the names we acquire a disposition to behavior toward that type—we acquire a socialized value or desire for one of the two discriminants. These acquired desires then shape our weideeming:action.

Much of the further reasoning found in the Laozi follows that of Song Xing. The artificially created desires lead to unnecessary competition and strife. When we see that they are not natural, acquiring socialized desires (e.g. for status, reputation, for rare objects) starts to look ill advised. He hints at places that acquiring the system of names dulls our capacity for appreciation or reaction to nature—“the five colors blind the eye …” (Daode Jing Ch. 12). And most important, acquiring knowledge in this way is losing the natural spontaneity and becoming subject to social control.

The text, accordingly, entices us to free ourselves from this system signified by the slogan wu-weilack-action. We are to set about forgetting all our socialization and return to the state of a newborn babe. The slogan is famously paradoxical and is even formulated in the text in a paradoxical way—“lack acting and yet lack ‘don’t-act’.”

The bulk of the Daode Jing is thus given over to motivating this paradoxical attitude. Its familiar strategy centers on the notion of “reversal.” In passage after passage, advice is given that reverses conventional values (usu. in Confucian-Mohist discourse)—either rejecting the usual positive value term (benevolence, sages, morality, social activism) or motivating valuing the opposite (non-being, water, the female, the lower position etc.).

The result is a fascinating exercise in normative advocacy including Laozi’s famous political theory—which you can find elaborated more fully in the Laozi entry. Clearly, such advocacy is inconsistent with the meta-theory and its purpose must be indirect—perhaps to induce us to “see” one of the three negative positions considered above. Still it gives the text a tone that we referred to above as primitivism—nullifying socialization and cultivating only the “natural” attitudes and actions.

5. Impact of the School of Names

One stark difference between the two main texts of Daoism is the relation to the School of Names. The Laozi, though clearly having a theory of the pragmatics of naming, betrays neither exposure to the doctrines nor the analytical terminology developed by the dialectical Mohists for dealing with theory of language. The Zhuangzi clearly does reveal that exposure. To understand this phase in the development of Daoism, we note briefly what the outstanding linguistic issues were and how they were formulated, then we will look at the implications of Daoist responses—particularly those found in the Zhuangzi.

The focus on mingwords:names grows from recognizing the interpretive problem concerning acting on some guide. The disputes about dao are intimately tied to issues about words—in particular, what is to count as a correct use and what action or objects count as following the guidance.

The early Mohists advocated using a utilitarian standard to determine both the correct application of words to actions and the choice of word order in social guiding discourse. “Which dao should we follow” became “which words shall we use to socialize people and how should we interpret the words of social guiding discourse in guiding our behavior?” In effect, the early Mohist answer to both questions is settled by making allegedly “natural” distinctions between benefit and harm. Thus language content and conventions of interpretation should be governed by the utility principle.

Later Mohists formulated a more “realistic” theory of what counts as the normatively correct way to use names. We should mark the distinctions that underlie names in ways that trace patterns of objective similarity and difference in things. This realism governs the correct ways both to use terms and to interpret them. We rely on utility to determine how we structure terms into strings in guidance—in discourse dao . So, for example, a thief is a man—is governed by the rules of similarity. Still, we allow guidance that includes both the guiding strings “don’t kill men” and “you may kill thieves.”

This realism led the later Mohists to linguistic conclusions that challenged any anti-language attitude—including those expressed by early Daoists. First, the later Mohists argued that in any disagreement about how to distinguish realities with names, there was a right answer. It may, however, be hard to know or prove. So, for example, if we are disputing about whether to use “ox” or “non-ox” of some obscure object, one of the answers will be correct. This undermines both the nihilistic and the anti-language options to understanding Laozi. Second, Mohists argued that any attempt to formulate the anti-language position was self condemning. “All language is bad” must be a “bad” thing to say.

Other figures classified in the School of Names responded to the Mohist realists. Gongsun Long (mentioned sporadically in the Zhuangzi) took himself to be defending Confucian accounts of rectifying names and Hui Shi constructs what looks like a relativist challenge to Later Mohist accounts. We will look only at Hui Shi’s account here because he plays such a significant role in the text of the Zhuangzi .

Hui Shi implicitly addressed the claim that the correct use of words depends on objective patterns of similarity and difference. What we know of his writings (which the Zhuangzi history suggests were prodigious) is mainly a sequence of theses cited at the end of the Zhuangzi history. These focused on propositions about comparative “names”—e.g., large and small. Clearly some things properly termed ‘large’ are objectively smaller than other things properly called ‘small’. A small elephant is considerably larger than a huge ant! So correct naming must not be based on objective distinctions in the world, but on our projections from a point of view or purpose in using them. Similarly, ‘tall’, ‘short’, and time words (e.g., ‘before’ and ‘after’, ‘today’ and ‘tomorrow’) are implausibly attributed to objective distinctions

From this, according to the list of propositions in the Zhuangzi history, Hui Shi apparently concluded that we can cluster things in arbitrary ways. This insight is not taken to be about sets and members, but about divisions into parts and wholes. So we can speak of a great “one” that is a kind of everything concept—nothing lies outside it and of a small “one” which cannot be further distinguished or divided. Objectively there are no distinctions—the cosmos is one, and we should direct the same guiding attitudes toward the whole—“love all things equally.”

6. Mature Daoism: The Zhuangzi

From internal evidence, we would judge Hui Shi to have had much more influence on Zhuangzi than his knowledge of Laozi or of the contents of the Daode Jing as we know it. Hui Shi appears more often in dialogue with Zhuangzi than any other figure and in ways that suggest a long-term philosophical involvement and interaction, like relationship of philosophical friends.[6] And, as we observed, the inner chapters of the Zhuangzi show mastery of the technical terminology and state of the art theories of language in ancient China. Still the tone seems “Daoist” in the senses we’ve identified. Zhuangzi marks the high point of mature Daoist philosophical theory as he finds a better way to answer later Mohist challenges than did Hui Shi.

Zhuangzi finds a “naturalist” position that coherently explains why dao has normative priority over tiannature:sky. The way to avoid the anti-language trap is:

  1. To acknowledge that language is natural, which Zhuangzi does in his beloved image of the “pipes of tiannature:sky.”
  2. To resist concluding that, in being natural, all language is right or permissible.

The first may superficially appear to give in to the Confucians and Mohists—allowing them to claim that tiannature’s endorses their respective social ways. However, its Daoist thrust consists in depriving the absolutists of what they really want—the ability to declare that their opponent violates tiannature:sky or lacks its similar approval. The strategy draws on the correct lesson to be learned from Shen Dao’s notion of great dao—that “follow nature” has no normative significance.

We can only answer normative questions from within dao, not from the perspective of nature or any other authority. The point is that ‘authority’ is a normative concept within some dao so any appeal presupposes a dao of following it. Thus Zhuangzi’s first step does not warrant treating all discourse dao as right or as wrong—or even as equal. We make normative or evaluative judgments only against the background of a presupposed way of justifying and interpreting them. The judgments depend on some discourse dao.

The priority of dao over tiannature:sky underwrites the themes of dependency and relativism that pervade the Zhuangzi and ultimately the skepticism, the open-minded toleration and the political anarchism (or disinterest in political activity or involvement). Yet, while nature is not a standard, Daoism does countenance natural daos. Mohism had presupposed one (a natural impulse to benefit) as had the Confucian intuitionist, Mencius (a natural moral tendency in the heart-mind). Zhuangzi’s accepts there must be some natural or innate guides, but notes:

  1. There are many such natural ways, and
  2. We presuppose further ways when we choose among natural ones as we do again when we cultivate them in one way rather than another.

So the dependence on dao multiplies endlessly. The Zhuangzi hints at this in a famous image, humans live and act in ways as fish live and act in water. We don’t notice in how many ways we depend on ways. Being in a sea of ways is being human. (This insight has inspired many writers to draw a parallel with Heidegger’s Dasein.) We cannot get outside of dao to any more ultimate kind of authority.

These meta-reflections inform relativist (perspectival or pluralist) and skeptical themes in the inner chapters of the Zhuangzi. The style furthers both themes. Rather than speaking with an authorial voice, the text is filled with fantasy conversations between perspectives, including those of millipedes, convicts, musicians and the wind. A Zhuangzi reflective passage is more likely to end with a double rhetorical question (“is it … or isn’t it … ?”) than a strong conclusion.

Does Zhuangzi then have anything to teach us? His is an example of the key lesson—open-minded receptivity to all the different voices of dao—particularly those who have run afoul of human authority or seem least authoritative. Each actual (naturally) existing dao has insights. They may be surprisingly valuable—as viewed from within our different ways. On the flip side, we gain nothing from trying to imagine a perfect or ultimate source of guidance. If there were a perfect man or ideal observer-actor, we probably could not understand him. Would his ways have any relevance for us with our limits? Perfection may well look like its opposite to us.

Laozi may have been tempted to postulate a perfect dao. It would be a dao with no social contribution. So the Zhuangzi differs in this important attitude from the Laozi—we need not try to escape from social life and conventions. Conventions underlie the possibility of communication and are, thus, useful. This gives Zhuangzi’s Daoism less of the primitive thrust of the Daode Jing (the term wu-wei virtually disappears in the inner chapters).

The most dramatic message of the Zhuangzi is a theme that links Daoism to Zen (Chan—the distinctively Daoist influenced branch of Buddhism)—the “mysticism” of losing oneself in activity, particularly the absorption in skilled execution of a highly cultivated way . His most famous example concerns a butcher—hardly a prestige or status profession—who carves beef with the focus and absorption of a virtuoso dancer in an elegantly choreographed performance. The height of human satisfaction comes in achieving and exercising such skills with the focus and commitment that gets us “outside ourselves” and into such an intimate connection with our dao .

Other examples include lute players, cicada catchers, wheelwrights and logicians. Each description has a hint of realism in the recognition we must put in effort to acquire the skills and then to convert them to “second nature.” We come to see them as natural and as ourselves being at one with nature. Yet in the throes of skillful performance, we still can perfect them more and no matter how good we may become at one thing, may be miserable at others—particularly at conveying the skills to others.

Finally politically, Zhuangzi famously prefers fishing to high status and political office. He asks what a turtle would choose if offered the option of being nailed in a place of veneration an honor in some place of worship or staying at the lake and “dragging his tail in the mud.” However this anti-political stance is unlikely to be grounded in simple self-preservation. The openness of Zhuangzi’s pluralism does undermine the justification of political authority that was assumed in ancient China. Confucians and Mohists disagreed bitterly about what dao to follow in a society, but agreed without question that proper order was achieved only when a society followed a single dao . Zhuangzi’s stance suggests that society could function with people following many ways of acting. Nothing requires suppressing or eliminating a dao that works from some point of view.

The Zhuangzi text, as we noted, contains the writings of a range of thinkers loosely allied with these Daoist themes. Large sections lean toward the primitivism of Laozi and others emphasize the relativism, and still others become eclectic and uncritical in their openness. For a more complete account see the entry on Zhuangzi and Texts and Textual Theory below.

7. Neo-Daoism

The establishment of an authoritarian empire and the long-lived but philosophically dogmatic (Confucian) Han dynasty temporarily drained the vibrancy from Chinese philosophical thought. Classical Daoist philosophy was successfully extinguished by the imperial suppression of analytic thought. Confucian authoritarians like Xunzi argued that analysis of names leads to confusion and disorder. The substitution of the Qin ruler’s superstitious search for long life through alchemy and his consequent fostering of Huang-Lao religion combined with suppression of dialectic thought initiated China’s philosophical “Dark Age.” The later substitution of Confucianism as the official orthodoxy during the Han cemented the intellectual stagnation firmly in place. Only Huang-Lao thinking remained as a live influence and archivist of Daoist texts. Its superstitions and cosmologies mingled in the emerging eclectic Han-Confucianism.

The fall of the Han some 400 years later saw the emergence of a modified worldview drawing on the preserved texts which we call Neo-Daoism (See Neo-Daoism). Its most influential writers, Wang Bi and Guo Xiang who wrote commentaries respectively on the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi, were avowed Confucians. Their philosophy reinvested a stoic spirit which they interpreted as the point of their new-Daoism. They expressed their combination of Confucian social activity with their version of Daoist quietism in the enduring slogan “Sage within, king without.” They framed their Daoism as a kind of inner emptiness or non-commitment coupled with a meticulous conformity to one’s actual role in the times—whatever fate might have it. Thus they were Confucians on the outside and Daoists inside. This elaborated, for Neo-Daoists, the concept of wu-wei (non-deeming action).

They buttressed this social stoicism with metaphysical systems focused on the puzzle of “being and non-being.” The drew this topic from one of Laozi’s frequent inclusion of this pair to illustrate his contrast theory of language. Trying to figure what the background of a being and non-being contrast was formed a central issue for their “abstruse studies.” Wang Bi (ca. 300) took non-being to be the background and thus to “give rise to” being. He interpreted the Laozi alongside a Confucianized cosmological divination manual, The Book of Changes (I Ching or Yijing). The Book of Changes with its yin-yang account of change and its generational cosmology thus entered the list of Daoist texts and the Daode Jing was transformed in conventional wisdom into a detached cosmology.

Wang Bi identified dao with non-being while still treating it as the source of all creation—the basic substance (which he associated with the taijiGreat ultimate of the Yijing). While the basic substance is nothing, its “function” is being—thus being depends on non-being, from which it is constantly produced as a kaleidoscopic function of an unchanging, paradoxical reality of nothing. (The ideal Daoist-Confucian person mirrors this cosmology—an expression of being a “Sage within; king without”.)

The second famous Neo-Daoist, Guo Xiang commented on the Zhuangzi . His cosmology developed an interesting twist on that of Wang Bi. Non-being, he argued, did not, after all, exist. It was simply nothing and thus could not create anything. Simply put, there is no non-being—there is only being. And so there is no “giving rise to.” Being always was and comes of itself. It generates and changes itself constantly by the totality the interrelations among its parts. These differences in emphasis partly reflect the differences in the original texts—the Daode Jing’s emphasis on wunon-being-values and the Zhuangzi’s diverse pluralism and sense of freedom from any ultimate cosmic source of guidance.

Pragmatically, the two pictures were not very different. Each still had nothing at the center (Daoist sage) and being (Confucian King) around the edges, but Guo Xiang deemphasized any lines of force from non-being to being and emphasized instead the situation and contextual relations within the realm of being. Both similarly read their cosmologies as ways of viewing things that support and help achieve the shared lifestyle slogan “sage within, king without.”

8. Daoism and Buddhism

Buddhism came to China at a time when the intellectuals were hungry for fresh ideas, but it arrived with massive handicaps. It was saddled with the Indo-European focus on an appearance-reality metaphysics and epistemology, with with approximations to concepts of ‘truth’, sense-data experience, mind as a container of a subjective world populated by counterparts of sensible objects, propositional knowledge, representational belief, a belief-desire psychology together with a logic-informed concept of ‘reason’ as both a human faculty and a property of beliefs and concepts. The highly developed Buddhist arguments had little purchase on Chinese intellectuals and the only available common form of discourse that could “domesticate” this alien system was Neo-Daoist “abstruse learning” which focused on the metaphysical notions of being and non-being. That issue resonated superficially with a Buddhist puzzle about the nature of Nirvana. If Nirvana was the opposite of Samsara (the eternal cycle of rebirth or reincarnation) then was it a state of being or of non-being? Nirvana is the achievement of the Buddha—the expression of Buddha-nature. So the cosmology of this version of Buddhism, like that of the Neo-Daoists, aided achievement of some goal. Realization of the puzzling nature of this state led to Buddhahood.

Meantime, Buddhism came armed with a paradox that would delight thinkers of a Daoist turn of mind—the fabled paradox of desire. Rebirth was caused by desire and Nirvana could be achieved only by the cessation of desire. That meant that in order to achieve Nirvana, one had to cease to want to achieve it. This argument informs the Mahayana notion of a Bodhisattva, who qualifies for Nirvana but voluntarily stays behind in the cycle of rebirth to help the rest of us. Enlightenment could only be achieved all at once. (This conclusion was also a consequence of the Buddhist view that the ego is an illusion.) The Mahayana wing of Buddhism was the more successful in China because this implicit egalitarianism—everyone could be Buddha, just as everyone can be a Daoist or Confucian Sage.

The other Buddhist philosophy that had the greatest appeal in China was Madyamika, which answered the question of the nature of Nirvana or the Buddha nature by not answering it—Neo-Daoist quietism. The realization of this emptiness was a kind of non-realization, a giving up, or an inexpressible, mystical, prajna-knowledge which contrasts with “ordinary” knowledge. This helped blend discussion of dao and Buddha-nature even more and fueled the eventually widespread Confucian bias that they were the same basic religion.

Meantime, the introduction of a more “Western” religious model (monasticism) to China and coincided with the launch of organized “Daoist” religions. Modeled thus in style and progressively in content, Daoist religion, the quasi-religious Neo-Daoist stoical quietism began to blend with Buddhism.

In China, the two dominant theoretical Buddhist sects reflect the cosmological structures of the two Neo-Daoists. Tian-tai is “center dominated” with a single thought (the inexpressible Madyamika Buddha-nature) determining everything. Hua-yan shifts emphasis to the inter-relations of all “dharmas.” It’s a cosmos of interaction that constitutes the expression of Buddha nature.

The most Daoist of Chinese sects is famously the Chan (Japanese ‘Zen’) sect. We can understand its Daoist character by returning to the paradox of desire. Laozi’s analysis says artificial desires are those created by learned distinctions. If we are to eliminate the desire for Nirvana, it must be by “forgetting” the dichotomy of Nirvana-Samsara. This realization is both the inner reality of enlightenment and corresponds to a mystical answer to the being/non-being of Nirvana. It underwrites the Chan/Zen emphasis on practice, the here and now—“every moment Zen”—and the signature “realization” that we are already Buddha. The Buddha nature is your self-nature—again exemplifying the Neo-Daoist “Sage within, King without” spirit.

Daoist simplicity stimulated Chan’s abandonment of Buddhist theory and was accompanied by another traditional Daoist feature—the emphasis on total absorption in practice of a highly cultivated skill. Chinese Zen was dominated by the notion of “sudden enlightenment” which consists of the denial that any process leads anyone closer to the Buddha-nature. You can’t get any closer—you’re just there. Pay attention!

9. Important Daoist Concepts

Some important concepts that have played a role in the doctrines of Daoism are:

9.1 Dao and de: The Ethical Concepts

9.1.1 Dao (Way, Guide, Road) 道

Daoism has a reputation of being impenetrable mainly because of its central concept, dao. Yet surprisingly, the almost universal translation in English uses one of the smallest, simplest, most familiar and least consciously noticed terms of the language—‘way.’ This common translation, ‘way’, is apt in several ways. Dao (Tao) is a pivotal concept of ancient Chinese thought. ‘Way’ is similarly primitive (it resists analytic definition). We can only offer synonyms: e.g., ‘course’, ‘method’, ‘manner’, ‘mode’, ‘style’, ‘means’, ‘practice’, ‘fashion’, ‘technique’ and so on. We discover the circularity when we try to analyze one of the synonyms without recourse to the term ‘way’ with which we began.

The partial synonyms, however, remind us of a second way in which ‘way’ is an apt translation of dao. A way is the answer to a “how” or “what-to-do” question. We typically use talk of ways in advising someone. Ways are deeply practical (i.e., prescriptive or normative).

Dao is also used concretely to refer to a road or path in Chinese, e.g., Queen’s Road. Again, ‘way’ fits this metaphorical role—as in highway and Broadway. In figurative English use they are interchangeable—the road/way to salvation. Roads guide us and facilitate our arrival at a desired destination. They are, as it were, physically real guiding or prescriptive structures.

Though practical, describing something as a dao or a way need not be to recommend it. The Zhuangzi reminds us that thievery has a dao . We can use both dao and ‘way’ mainly to describe—as when a Confucian undertakes to pursue his father’s dao for three years after his death or we say “I saw the way you did that.”

There are interesting differences between dao and ‘way’. Chinese nouns lack pluralization, so dao functions grammatically like a singular or mass term and semantically like a plural. The first tempts translators to render all occurrences as “the way.” One is better advised to treat dao as a collective noun—as the part-whole sum of ways. What we think of as one way would be one part of dao.

We partition dao by modification. So we can talk about, e.g., my-dao, Sage-King’s-dao, natural-dao, past-time’s-dao and so forth. This feature explains why dao appears more metaphysical than ‘way’ and invites the familiar Daoist spatial metaphors like “humans interact in dao as fish do in water” (Zhuangzi Ch. 6). Dao is a little like the water—an expanse constituting the realm in which humans live, work and play. To be human is to be in a realm of ways to guide us. Daoists are more likely to play with these metaphysical metaphors than are Confucians or Mohists—who mainly point to (their favored part of) dao.

Another difference is that while both dao and ‘way’ are almost ineliminable terms in their respective languages, We have hardly noticed the word ‘way’ in philosophy. It’s barely visible in the history of Western philosophy—more like a bit of grammatical filler. Western philosophers have endlessly analyzed and dissected a cluster of terms thought to be central to our thinking, e.g., ‘good’, ‘right’, ‘being’ (to be), ‘know’, ‘believe’, ‘true’, ‘beautiful’, ‘reason’, ‘change’, ‘subject’, ‘mind’, ‘meaning’, ‘refer’, ‘object’, ‘property’, and so forth. Some trends have focused on sub-types and partial counterparts like ‘methods’, ‘modes’, ‘practices’, ‘manners’, ‘plans’ and in some sense even ‘forms’. Yet one looks in vain to find a Western philosopher showering her analytic attention on the more general concept of ‘way’.

Dao, by contrast, was the center of Chinese philosophical discussion. It occupies the position at the center of thought that in Western philosophy is filled by terms like ‘being’ or ‘truth’. The centrality tempts interpreters to identify dao with the central concepts of the Western philosophical agenda, but that is to lose the important difference between the two traditions. Metaphysics and epistemology dominated early Western philosophy while ethics, politics and philosophy of education/psychology dominated Chinese thought. Although it’s insightful to say humans live in dao as fish do in water, the insight is lost if we simply treat dao as being or some pantheistic spiritual realm. Dao remains essentially a concept of guidance, a prescriptive or normative term. In the late Classical period, dao paired with devirtuosity to form the Chinese term for ‘ethics’ “dao-de.” Dao is the pivot of Chinese philosophy—but it still translates as ‘way’, not ‘being’.

A third difference is that unlike ‘way’, dao may be used as a verb. The best known example is the famous first line of the Daode Jing. Literally “dao can be dao not constant dao.” For the dao in the middle of the three daos in the passage, roughly one out of three translators uses ‘speak’, another third use ‘tell’ and the rest use near synonyms such as ‘expressed’, “defined in words”, or ‘stated’. In a famous Confucian example of this use, Confucius criticizes dao-ing the people with laws rather than dao-ing them with ritual. (This verbal sense is now often marked by a graphic variation daoto direct).

Throughout classical texts, we find that daos are spoken, heard, forgotten, transmitted, learned, studied, understood and misunderstood, distorted, mastered, and performed with pleasure. Different countries and historical periods have different dao. Footprints of the linguistic component of the concept of dao are scattered through all kinds of modern Chinese compound words. ‘Preach’ is jiang-dao—speak a dao. To know is to know a dao. The character dao is part of compounds translated as ‘doctrine’, ‘truth’, ‘principle’, ‘law’ and of course, ‘morality’ or ‘ethics’, ‘reason’, ‘religion’, ‘philosophy’, ‘orthodoxy’, ‘thank’, ‘apologize’, ‘tell’, ‘explain’, ‘inform’ and so on.

Is ‘speak’ the right way to translate these verbal uses of dao? It is in some ways too narrow and in others too broad. We can write, gesture, point, and exemplify as well as speak daos. On the other hand, not all speaking (writing etc.) is dao-ing—particularly not if we think of language as describing, representing, picturing, expressing, defining, or “capturing” some reality. The Chinese verbal use, is more accurately translated normatively as “to guide”, “to recommend, advocate, acknowledge, endorse”, etc. The activity of dao-ing is primarily normative: giving guidance. To dao is to put guidance into language—including body language (e.g. pointing as meaning something in our “form of life.”)

Consider, again, the concrete translation for dao: ‘road’ or ‘path’. A woodsman with an ax daos when he chops bark from the trees as he enters the forest; He is dao-ing when “blazing” the trail. We grasp this concept best if we resist treating roads as simple natural objects—they are, like the woodman’s blazes, akin to texts that we “read” for guidance as we proceed that way. Roads or paths are embodied in a physical reality, but are not simply the reality. They are objectively real normative structures that guide or invite us to “pass this way”.

One feature that dao and speech share is the need for interpretation. But with dao the interpretation takes the form of xingwalk:conduct, not that of a theory or a belief. In this respect, the relevant notion of interpretation is aesthetic. It is the kind of interpretation done when a conductor interprets a score, an actor a character in a play, a soldier his orders in the course of battle. A complete metaphysics of dao requires a distinction between normative way types and interpretive, real-time tokens . Daoist theory does introduces the tokens most dramatically with Shen Dao who focuses on what he calls Great Dao—the actual history of the world past, present and future. That image draws our attention to a purely descriptive way—a way that is not a (normative) way (not a guide).

To talk, however, about a way of interpreting a way, is to remind ourselves of Zhuangzi’s point. That we can never free normative ways from ways of choosing and interpreting them. In selecting it from the alternative “invitations” open to us, and then in interpreting in our actual “walking” we always rely on some higher-order dao to justify our choice and execution of it. We are in a sea of dao.

Besides the Great Dao (the actual history of the universe), we can speak of tiannature:sky daos, which are also descriptive. Daos that advise us to accept or live by our nature, in effect, choose among equally natural daos. Since we have natural ways to reform or compensate for our natures. Any dao we can choose or interpret is natural in the sense that it has for us at the time some physical realization—sound waves or pixels on a computer screen. All daos available for choice or recommendation are natural. If determinism is true, the Great Dao is the only tiannature:sky dao and every available dao for normative choice is a proper part of Great Dao.

9.1.2 De (Virtuosity, Virtue, Power) 德

A Daoist formula for de is “dao within.” It may be the result of innate skill or of careful cultivation and training. Translators most commonly use “virtue” as a translation but hurry to remind us that it is ‘virtue’ in the ancient Greek sense of an excellence. ‘Power’ is an alternative translation that reflects the link between de and successful action or achievement for its possessor. Given our use of an aesthetic conception of interpretation of dao, we may think of one’s de as her ‘virtuosity’. Virtuosity exhibits itself in a performer by making his “interpretation” of the thing performed (a ceremony, chant or ritual) work in the context. Thus de links dao with correct performance. This elegantly blends in the perceived overtones of “power” in the form of the performer’s ability to respond to clues in the context that make the performance “work.” The “powerful” performance achieves the dao’s goal in real time.

9.2 Ming (Name) 名

The character mingnames really includes all words. Grammatically, Chinese common nouns share more features with proper names and one-place predicates (transitive verbs and adjectives) than do familiar Indo-European nouns. Chinese common nouns lack case and gender markings and Chinese grammar requires no grammatical noun-verb agreement. Like mass nouns, Chinese common nouns do not undergo pluralization and can stand alone as noun phrases. For related reasons, Chinese analysis postulated no substance-attribute structure to adjective-noun relations. So the translation ‘name’ is not inept nor is the ancient Chinese theory assumption that all words name the part of reality which the word “picks out”—roughly “naming” what we think of as its denotation or scope. Thus ‘white’ is a name and ‘horse’ is a name. Each names a region or part of the world.

The most familiar statement of a widely shared implicit theory of names in ancient China is expressed beautifully in the Daode Jing. Call it the “contrast theory” of names. It treats all words (norms or values) as “coming with” a complement, converse or opposite. To learn and understand a word is to know what is and what is not picked out by it. In the Daode Jing, the theory lends itself to a linguistic idealist interpretation. Names literally “create” things. This line of interpretation informs the “chaos” interpretation of Daoist metaphysics in which reality is an undifferentiated stuff which humans divide into “things” by the use of mingnames.

An interesting near homonym is mingcommand-fate which was routinely used as a verbal form of mingnames. The familiar practice is to translate it as either ‘command’ (reminding us of the Chinese view that the role of language and names is guiding and coordinating behavior) or as ‘fate’. Another meaning-related near homonym is mingdiscerning:clear.

9.3 Chang (Constant, Eternal) 常

There is less controversy about the meaning of changconstant, but its uses and importance in Chinese thought are not well understood. We can better appreciate the uses of changconstant in ancient Chinese by analogy with causal and reliability theories in epistemology and semantics. Hu Shih speculated that in this use, changconstant resembled a pragmatic conception of ‘true’. He pointed to a related use in the Mozi which advocates that we should changconstant language that promotes [good?] behavior. This quasi-imperative use underlies its role in Daoist relativistic and skeptical analysis. The Daode Jing has the most famous example of its use in the parallel opening couplet where it modifies both dao and mingnames.

Mohist use of the concept is instructive. Tiannature:sky is a paradigm of constancy. The Mohists alluded to its regularity and universality to contrast with the temporary and local authority of social conventions and guidance by authority. They cast their disagreement with Confucians in terms of who offered a constant dao. This seems to bridge three measures of constancy.

  1. A constant dao should apply equally to people of all cultures, times, and levels of social development.
  2. A constant dao should be operationally unambiguous—like measurements operations. Its interpretation into action should not invite variability.
  3. A constant dao should be consistent with natural tendencies; it should reinforce and draws reinforcement from them rather than encounter resistance in practice.

Daoists, as the Laozi famously puts it, suggest that any dao that can dao (guide or be used as a guide) will not be a constant dao. It follows this claim with a parallel claims about mingnames. Any name that can name is an inconstant name. This is arguably offered as the explanation of the inconstancy of dao asserted in the earlier sentence.

9.4 Wei & Wu-wei (Deeming Action & Non-deeming Action) 無為

Laozi’s famous slogan has puzzled interpreters for centuries and has given rise to numerous analyses. The first character is not the main problem. Wu is simply “does not exist.” In this phrase, however, interpreters treat it as a negative prescription: “avoid wei.” The harder problem is to understand wei.

In modern Mandarin, the character has two different tones. The fourth tone reading is usually translated as “for the sake of.” In the second tone reading, the character would normally be translated as ‘to act’. Textbook interpretations say wei means ‘purpose’ as well as ‘action’, so the slogan means “non-purposive action.” The second tone reading, however, has another important use. Some grammar textbooks call it the putative sense—“to deem, regard or interpret.” Wei functions in this sense in Literary Chinese belief ascriptions which focus on the predicate. So a belief that S is P takes the de re form [believer] takes S to be (wei) P. Wei also figures in a related way in knowledge contexts with nominal predicates—“know to deem as (wei) [noun].”

Ancient Chinese has several meaning-related homonyms, including weiis-only, weito be called, and weiartificial. The latter adds a ‘human’ radical to weido:deem. Typical translations of this character include ‘artificial’ or ‘false’. The cluster of concepts correspond to the pivotal Daoist contrast between tian (nature) and ren (the human). Wei is something done by human conceptualizing rather than something “natural.” If we include this content in our explanation of Laozi’s use of wei, we can explain its role more fully than does the theory on acts while lacking ‘purpose’ or deliberation. Little in the Laozi (or earlier Chinese thought) suggests any development of a distinction between voluntary, deliberate, or purposive action and its opposite. To act without wei is to remove the social, conceptual character from our behavior and act on “natural” instinct or intuition. This makes the concept cohere nicely with Laozi’s analysis of names and knowledge as forms of social control.

As we noted, the “inner chapters” of the Zhuangzi rarely mentions the slogan. However, its use in the “outer chapters” invites us to construct a possible Zhuangzi version of the slogan. One tempting view associates wu-wei with the “inner chapter” discussions of skillful behavior that develops into a kind of satisfying and tranquil state of harmony with action that we might describe as “second nature.” In effect one acts while in an aesthetic or performative trance. The most famous expression of this ideal comes in the paean to the butcher who carved oxen with the grace of a dancer. Such behavior requires a focus and absorption that is incompatible with ordinary self-consciousness, purpose and rehearsal of instructions. Besides this loss of a sense of the ego, the experience is credited with creating a unity between the actor and the external world, and with a sense of heightened awareness and tranquility that comes with the masterful practice of an acquired skill. We experience mastery as “becoming one with the activity.” In some sense, our weiing has become [second?] natural!

The wu-wei ideal also informs the Neo-Daoist slogan “Sage within; king without.” It suggests (following Zhuangzi) that Daoist wu-wei may be consistent with being a good Confucian. Being a scholar-official is as much a skill as being a butcher and one may practice it with the same attitude of inner emptiness. As long as one takes the “right” attitude, one may pursue any activity consistent with Daoism. Neo-Daoists conform to Confucian roles without regarding or interpreting them as ultimately right—or as anything else.

With the importation of Indo-European Buddhism from India, wu-wei started to be interpreted via the Western conceptual apparatus contrasting desire or purpose and reason. This shaped the modern Chinese interpretation and probably undermined the ideal. It became the target of attack among “modern” Chinese who regarded Daoist “non-striving” or “purposelessness” as the source of Chinese passivity. The activist 19th century reformer, Kang You-wei (Kang have-wei) took the denial of the slogan as his scholarly name.

9.5 Pusimplicity (Pre-linguistic Purity) 樸

The Daoist “primitivist” ideal as expressed mainly in the Laozi. It metaphorically represents the result of forgetting mingnames and desires (See Wu-wei). Translations include simplicity, “raw” wood, and D. C. Lau’s more elaborate “uncarved block.” The detailed translation more sensitively expresses Laozi’s point in using the metaphor in the context of a view of names as “cutting” things into types and Laozi’s distinctive theory that such socially constructed distinctions (institutions) control us by controlling our desires. When societies adopt names or terms, it does so in order to instill and regulate desires for one of the pair created by the name-induced distinction. Thus Daoist forgetting requires forgetting names and distinctions, but in doing so, frees itself from the socially induced, unnatural desires that cause strife and unhappiness in society (e.g. status, rare objects, fame, authority). Hence: “The Nameless uncarved block thus amounts to freedom from desire.” (Daode Jing 37)

10. Texts and Textual History

Questions of textual theory are the focus of the bulk of modern scholarship. They include these kinds of questions.

  • Existence (did Laozi or Zhuangzi actually exist)
  • Authorship (did they write the texts attributed to them?)
  • Dating (when did they exist or write their texts?)
  • Relations (did Laozi influence Zhuangzi?)

Traditional “fantastic” textual stories dominated explanations of religious Daoism. This effectively replaces philosophical content with mythical narrative and claims of pedigree or status of the founder. This aversion to exposition is compounded with the traditional view that Daoist philosophy defies rational clarification. This philosophical site, accordingly, will give only abbreviated attention to these textual theories.

The traditional story centers on Laozi and the Daode Jing. It credits the text to Laozi who was stopped at the pass while attempting to leave China (to go to India and come to be known as Buddha). The keeper of the pass required him to leave his dao behind so Laozi dashed off 5000-odd quick characters of poetry. Zhuangzi inherited the insights and developed the Daoist outlook in parable form.

Modern text detectives, Chinese and Western, have successfully cast doubt on this traditional view. However, their alternative scenarios, while collectively more plausible than the traditional story, are diverse enough to lead a skeptic to conclude that no one knows the correct textual theories—even if some of them turn out to be true. The time is too remote and the evidence too scarce to warrant using “know” of any detailed textual theory.

Textual theorists themselves tend more toward interpretive skepticism. They argue that textual theory is prior to and more certain than interpretation—which they treat as subjective projection. They would reject textual skepticism as defeatism and as self-defeating for an interpretive theorist.

Current textual thinking tends toward the view that all the classical Chinese texts were being continuously edited and maintained in textual communities over sometimes hundreds of years. This editing and emendation often reflected interaction with other text communities as they worked out alternative answers to shared questions. Clearly such an accretion theory undermines the traditional goal of uncovering the “original” in the sense of the earliest version of the text. Text selection for interpretive and theoretical purposes becomes a more normative issue—which text is best?

Textual theory was further complicated when archeologists unearthed new copies of the Daode Jing. The traditionally dominant text was named after one of the earliest commentators—the Wang Bi version. Most translations deviated only slightly from that traditional version prior to the first archeological discovery in 1973. In that year, two versions of the Daode Jing were unearthed in a Mawang Dui tomb site. The discovery energized textual theorists who reasoned that as the earliest physically extant text, the Mawang Dui must be closer to the original should be treated as authoritative. The discovery was quickly followed by a rash of new translations of the Dedao Jing (the two parts of the text were reversed in the newly discovered manuscripts).

The argument for its authoritative status was weak. The enthusiasm rested on the traditional attachment to an “original” text (earlier in time). In fact, the discovery tended to confirm the evolutionary, multiple-editor view, while this enthusiasm treated textual evolution as if it took place by successive operations on a single physical text item. Like physiological evolution, text evolution more probably operated on a population or “stream” of copies, abridgements and additions.

Wang Bi probably had access to a range of that population in selecting his version. The archeological discovery was of a single instance—a branch of the stream. The historical circumstances of the presumed time of burial further undermined the optimistic assumption that the Mawang Dui was the original. The tomb’s date places the texts after a radical disruption of textual husbandry—in 200 BCE when the Qin “burned books and buried scholars.”

The Qin had set out to destroy traditional learning. The later Han ostensibly cherished and tried to recover textual scholarship. In the succeeding Han, text collection, veneration preservation (and copying) became the norm. The theory that the Mawang Dui was the authoritative text assumes that the destructive political frenzy at the end of classical period had not affected the integrity of transmission that produced the Mawang Dui instances. Then it must insist that in the succeeding period of textual veneration and preservation, radical changes were introduced into the entire population of copies and versions of the text so that all those on which Wang Bi drew on after the Han were corrupted—and in similar ways—from the orthodox Mawang Dui version.

The opposite story is more probable—the sample was a version written with punctuation and interpretive emendation for a member of the superstitious ruling class. Taking it as representing of the whole population of texts at the time is an elementary sampling error.

The Mawang Dui fervor was further undermined in 1993 when another discovery of a still older pair of abridged texts (dating from before 200 BCE) turned out to be more like the traditional text (the order of selection reflected the traditional daode arrangement). Even more notably, it strongly confirmed the gradual accretion view of the text suggesting that the Daode Jing was still in the process of being compiled at that late date. This locates the composition of the Daode Jing and the Zhuangzi almost side-by-side.

Laozi’s existence is widely disputed partly because the traditional story seems impossible for one person to satisfy. That only entails, however, that not all the things in the story are true of him, not that he didn’t exist. On the other hand, there is little positive evidence that he did and there are many alternative stories of how he came to be regarded as the author of the Daode Jing. It is common for theorists to treat ‘Laozi’ as a definite description referring to “whoever wrote the Daode Jing.—”Many thus regard the question of his existence as equivalent to the question of his authorship of at least a part of the text—hence improbable given current textual theory. The issues, however, are also separate. Laozi could have existed and not written any of the text attributed to him. On balance, the existence of Zhuangzi is considerably more probable, though little is known of him that is not from the text bearing his name—many of whose stories are obviously fanciful.

In China today, parts of the traditional theory have been resurrected. Some scholars are arguing for a pre-Confucius date for Laozi on various textual grounds (especially poetic structure). Traditional as well as modern scholarship tends to attribute the first eight “inner” chapters to Zhuangzi and there has been little doubt about his existence. So far, one important implication of modern textual theory has had little effect on popular interpretations. If we inevitably rely on the stories in the Zhuangzifor our knowledge about him, then the known chief intellectual influence on Zhuangzi should be treated as the sophist and linguistic theorist, Hui Shi, not Laozi or the Daode Jing.

Textual theories of the Zhuangzi are more elaborate and consistent. Though they differ in details and identification of parts, text scholars largely converge on attributing the chapters, outside of the eight assigned to Zhuangzi himself, to students of Zhuangzi, to primitivists who are associated with Yang Zhu (Yangists), and to other more eclectic and religious writers associated probably with the production of the other texts associated with Daoism. To be strict, however, despite the prevalence of the opinion, there is nothing resembling a convincing argument that Zhuangzi wrote all eight of the so called “inner chapters.”

Probably the association of the Laozi and Zhuangzi texts began when students of Zhuangzi noticed some shared or reinforcing themes expressed in a contemporary anonymous textual group working on the evolving Daode Jing. Perhaps both groups appreciated the affinity and began to exchange themes, expressions, and related lines of thought. Graham argued that the association of Laozi with the Daode Jing dates from a conspiratorial attempt to gain authority over Confucianism by claiming that the Daode Jing stemmed from Confucius’ teacher who was known in legend as Laozi.

This is a rough table of the state of textual theories of the two defining texts of Daoism. There are four main questions; the table lists, for each question, the traditional story, the range of theories, and the most plausible answer to the question.

  • Existence
    • Traditional story: Laozi and Zhuangzi like teacher-student or prophet-disciple.
    • Range of theories: Zhuangzi inspired the formulation of the myth of Laozi and the attribution.
    • Most plausible answer: Zhuangzi knew only the Confucian story of Laozi. Laozi’s actual existence merely possible.
  • Authorship
    • Traditional story: Laozi wrote the Daode Jing before traveling to India to found Buddhism. Zhuangzi wrote the Zhuangzi.
    • Range of theories: Zhuangzi wrote only chapter two. Daode Jing a product of Huang-Lao ruler-mysticism.
    • Most plausible answer: Both books the product of textual communities who continually edit and add to the text. Zhuangzi wrote at most eight chapters.
  • Dating
    • Traditional story: The Daode Jing was written before Confucius. Zhuangzi inspired to expand on its mystical insight.
    • Range of theories: Daode Jing being edited well into the Han dynasty. Miscellaneous and Outer chapters of the Zhuangzi edited or composed into the Han.
    • Most plausible answer: Both being edited through and beyond the classical period.
  • Relation
    • Traditional story: Laozi prophet/teacher, Zhuangzi disciple/pupil.
    • Range of theories: Zhuangzi formulated his theories first and the chief influence was his sophist friend Hui Shi.
    • Most plausible answer: Textual communities began to borrow from each other after the inner chapters completed.

Other textual theories address the authorship, dating and relations to the two canonical Daoist texts to the later “religious” texts mentioned above. Essentially the upshot is that they borrowed heavily from the two classical texts, often changing the context and failing to understand the philosophical point. The quotations they used were embedded in popular cosmological and religious contexts.


Daoism in Histories of Philosophy

The most influential treatments of Daoism are those that place their discussion in more general accounts of Chinese Philosophy. Some important ones are:

  • Fung, Yu-lan (1952). History of Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    [A classic widely used treatment.]
  • Graham, Angus (1989). Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court.
    [A very influential recent approach. Beginning to be more controversial.]
  • Hansen, Chad (1992). A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.
    [Controversial treatment locating Daoism in ancient Chinese theory of language.]
  • Hsiao, Kung chuan (1979). A History of Chinese Political Thought, Volume I: From the beginnings to the Six Dynasties. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    [Very clear treatment from a traditional political perspective.]
  • Munro, Donald, J. The Concept of Man in Early China. Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1969.
    [Influential treatment locating Daoism in the theory of human nature and conduct.]
  • Needham, Joseph. Science and civilisation in China, vol. 2: History of scientific thought. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1962.
    [Classic treatment viewing Daoism in connection with Chinese science.]
  • Schwartz, Benjamin (1985). The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    [Highly regarded orthodox treatment.]

Focused Treatments

More focused treatments develop sometimes classic and sometimes controversial lines of interpretation of philosophical Daoism. These often disagree with each other so none is definitive but notable contributions include:

  • Alt, Wayne (1991). “Logic and Language in the Chuang-tzu,” Asian Philosophy, 1 (1): 61–76.
  • Chen, Ellen Marie (1969). “Nothingness and the mother principle in early Chinese Taoism,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 9: 391–405.
  • Cook, Scott (1997). “Zhuang Zi and his carving of the Confucian ox,” Philosophy East and West, 47 (4): 521–554.
  • Creel, Hurlee G. (1970). What is Taoism?, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Cua, Antonio S. (1981). “Opposites as complements: reflections on the significance of Tao,” Philosophy East and West, 31 (2): 123–40.
  • Fu, Charles Wei-hsun (1976). “Creative hermeneutics: Taoist metaphysics and Heidegger,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 3: 115–143.
  • Hall, David L. (1978). “Process and anarchy: a Taoist vision of creativity,” Philosophy East and West, 28 (3): 271–85.
  • Hansen, Chad (1983). “A Tao of Tao in Chuang Tzu,” in V. Mair (ed.), Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press, pp. 24–55.
  • Graham, Angus (1967). “The background of the Mencian theory of human nature,” Tsing Hua Journal of Chinese Studies, 6 (1,2). Reprinted in Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • ––– (1983). “Daoist Spontaneity and the Dichotomy of ‘Is’ and ‘Ought’,” in V. Mair (ed.), Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press, pp. 3–23.
  • Kasulis, T. P. (1977). “The absolute and the relative in Taoist philosophy,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 4: 383–94.
  • Kupperman, Joel J. (1989). “Not in so many words: Chuang Tzu’s strategies of communication,” Philosophy East and West, 39 (3): 311–17.
  • Lau, D.C. (1958). “The treatment of opposites in Lao-tzu,” Bulletin of the Society for Oriental and African Studies, 21: 344–60.
  • Roth, Harold D. (1999). Original Tao: Inward Training and the Foundations of Taoist Mysticism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Smullyan, Raymond (1977). The Tao is Silent, New York: Harper and Row.
  • T’ang, Chün-i (1973). “Cosmologies in ancient Chinese philosophy,” Chinese Studies in Philosophy, 5 (1): 4–47.
  • Van Norden, Bryan (1996). “Competing interpretations of the Inner Chapters of the ‘Zhuangzi’,” Philosophy East and West, 46 (2): 247–269
  • Wagner, Rudolph G. (2003). Language, Ontology and Political Philosophy in China: Wang Bi’s Scholarly Exploration of the Dark (Xuanxue), Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Watts, Alan Wilson (1957). “The Philosophy of the Tao,” in The Way of Zen, New York: Pantheon Books, New York. Reprinted Harmondsworth: Penguin Books, 1962, pp. 23–48.
  • ––– (1975). Tao: The Watercourse Way, Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
  • Welch, Holmes (1966). Taoism: The Parting of the Way, Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Wong, David (1984). “Taoism and the Problem of Equal Respect,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 11: 165–183
  • Wu, Kuang-ming (1982). Chuang Tzu: World Philosopher at Play, Scholars Press and Crossroad Publishing Company.
  • Yearley, Lee (1983). “The Perfected Person in the Radical Chuang-tzu,” in V. Mair, (ed.), Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • ––– (1996). “Zhuangzi’s Understanding of Skillfulness and the Ultimate Spiritual State,” in P. Kjellberg and P. Ivanhoe (eds.), Essays on Skepticism, Relativism and Ethics in the Zhuangzi, (Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture), Buffalo: SUNY, pp. 152–182.
  • Ziporyn, Brook (2003). The Penumbra Unbound: The Neo-Taoist Philosophy of Guo Xiang. Albany: SUNY Press.


Collection of articles mainly focus on Zhuangzi. Some of the focused discussions are found in such collections which include:

  • Mair, Victor (ed.) (1983). Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Ames, Roger (ed.) (1998). Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi, (Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture), Buffalo, SUNY.
  • Kjellberg Paul and P. J. Ivanhoe (eds.) (1996). Essays on Skepticism, Relativism and Ethics in the Zhuangzi, (Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture), Buffalo: SUNY.
  • Cook, Scott (ed.) 2003. Hiding the World in the World: Uneven Discourses on the Zhuangzi, (Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture), Albany: SUNY.


Interpretive theories are presented most systematically in translations, but there are too many to list here (and most tend to religious lines of interpretation). Some of the more influential philosophical translations of the key texts include:

  • Carus, Paul (1913). The Canon of Reason and its Virtue, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Chen, Guying (1977). Lao Tzu: Text, Notes, and Comments, Ames and Young (trans.), San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center.
  • Duyvendak, J. J. L. (1954). Tao Te Ching, London: John Murray.
  • Graham, Angus (1969). “Chuang-tzu’s Essay on Seeing Things as Equal,” History of Religions, 7: 137–159.
  • ––– (1981). Chuang tzu: The Inner Chapters, London: Allen & Unwin.
  • ––– (trans.) (1960). The Book of Lieh-tzu, London: John Murray.
  • Henricks, Robert G. (1989). Lao-tzu: Te-Tao Ching: A New Translation Based on the Recently Discovered Ma-wang-tui Manuscripts, New York: Ballantine Books.
  • Lau, D. C. (trans.) (1963). Lao Tzu: Tao Te Ching, Baltimore: Penguin Books.
  • Mair, Victor (trans.) (1990). Tao Te Ching: The Classic Book of Integrity and the Way, New York: Bantam Books.
  • Palmer, Martin with Elizabeth Breuilly (trans.) (1996). The Book of Chuang Tzu, London: Arcana (Penguin).
  • Waley, Arthur (trans.) (1934). The Way and Its Power: A Study of the Tao Te Ching and its Place in Chinese Thought, London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Watson, Burton (1968). The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu, (Records of Civilization: Sources and Studies No. LXXX, Columbia College Program of Translations from the Oriental Classics), New York: Columbia University Press.

Religious Treatments

Religious treatments vastly outnumber the philosophical. Here, we will list only a representative sample.

  • Berling, Judith A. (1979). “Paths of convergence: interactions of inner alchemy, Taoism and Neo-Confucianism,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 6: 123–148.
  • Blofeld, John (1979). Taoism: The Quest for Immortality, London, Boston, Sydney: Mandala Books, Unwin Paperbacks
  • Girardot, Norman J. (1983). Myth and Meaning in Early Taoism: The Theme of chaos (hun-tun), Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Herman, Jonathan R. (1996). I and Tao: Martin Buber’s Encounter with Chuang Tzu, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Kohn, Livia (ed.) (1989). Taoist Meditation and Longevity Techniques. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan/Center for Chinese Studies Publications.
  • Maspero, Henri (trans.) (1981). Taoism and Chinese Religion, Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Puett, Michael J. (2003). “‘Nothing can Overcome Heaven’: The Notion of Spirit in the Zhuangzi,” in S. Cook (ed.), Hiding the World in the World, (Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture), Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Robinet, Isabelle (1979). “Metamorphosis and deliverance from the corpse in Taoism,” History of Religions, 19 (1): 37–70.
  • Saso, Michael (1972). Taoism and the Rite of Cosmic Renewal, Pullman: Washington State University Press.
  • Sivin, N. (1978). “On the word ‘Taoist’ as a source of perplexity, with special reference to the relations of science and religion in traditional China,” History of Religions, 17 (3/4): 303–30.
  • Welch, Holmes and Seidel, Anna (eds.) (1979). Facets of Taoism, New Haven: Yale University Press.

Textual Issues

Discussion of textual issues is a major focus of scholarly activity. Modern textual theories have influenced interpretation particularly of the philosophical content. Some examples include:

  • Graham, Angus (1961). “The Date and Composition of the Lieh-tzu,” Asia Major 8 (2): 139-198.
  • ––– (1979). “How much of the Chuang-tzu Did Chuang-tzu Write?”, (reprinted) in A. Graham, Studies in Chinese philosophy & philosophical literature, Singapore: Institute of East Asian Philosophies, 1986, pp. 283–321.
  • Hansen, Chad (1997). “The Zhuangzi: A Historical Introduction,” in Tsai Chih Chung (ed.), The Dao of Zhuangzi, Garden City, NY: Anchor Books (Doubleday and Co.), pp. 9–22.
  • Hu, Shih (1989). “A Criticism of some recent methods used in Dating Lao Tzu,” Philosophy East and West, 40 (1): 17–33.
  • Liu Xiaogan (1995). Classifying the Zhuangzi Chapters, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan/Center for Chinese Studies.
  • Roth, Harold D. (1992). The Textual History of the Huai Nanzi, Ann Arbor: Association of Asian Studies.
  • ––– (1991). “Who Compiled the Chuang Tzu?,” in Rosemont (ed.), Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts, La Salle: Open Court, pp. 84–95.

Other Internet Resources

General Resources about Chinese Thought

Philosophical Daoism

Copyright © 2007 by
Chad Hansen <chadzi@gmail.com>

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