Decision-Making Capacity

First published Tue Jan 15, 2008; substantive revision Fri Aug 14, 2020

In many Western jurisdictions the law presumes that adult persons, and sometimes children that meet certain criteria, are capable of making their own medical decisions; for example, consenting to a particular medical treatment, or consenting to participate in a research trial. But what exactly does it mean to say that a subject has or lacks the requisite capacity to decide? This question has to do with what is commonly called “decisional capacity”, a central concept in health care law and ethics, and increasingly an independent topic of philosophical inquiry.

Decisional capacity can be defined as the ability of subjects to make their own medical decisions. Somewhat similar questions of capacity arise in other contexts, such as capacity to stand trial in a court of law and the ability to make decisions that relate to personal care and finances. However, the history behind the more general legal notions of capacity to stand trial and capacity to manage one’s life is different and operates somewhat differently in law (Roth, Meisel, & Litz 1977; Zapf & Roesch 2005). For the purposes of this discussion the notion of decisional capacity will be limited to medical contexts only; most notably, those where decisions to consent or to refuse treatment or participation in clinical research are concerned.

This makes sense given that the current notion of decisional capacity in health care arose with, and remains closely tied to, the doctrine of informed consent. Informed consent is both a moral concept and a legal practice that arose in the second half of the twentieth century in response to the widespread paternalism of physicians and clinical researchers. It was only once patients and research subjects began to be involved in making their own decisions that it became clear to many that some sort of fair, formal method was needed for distinguishing between those who can make their own decisions (and so ought to be allowed to) and those who can’t make their own decisions (and so should not be expected to) (Kim 2010: 11–14).

It is fairly obvious that some individuals cannot make their own decisions: persons who are unconscious (temporarily or permanently), individuals with severe brain damage, infants and very small children, those who are born with severe cognitive impairment, and those in the advanced stages of dementia. We do these individuals no favor by pretending that they can decide for themselves. Instead, we must try to look out for these vulnerable individuals in our midst, and to the extent possible, ensure that their perspectives are taken into account in making decisions for them (Silvers & Francis 2009). But these are the “easy” cases. The more difficult task is to develop a fair and consistent notion of decisional capacity that applies to the more subtle cases, the ones in which individuals have some but not all of the mental capacities of ordinary adult agents. It is a moral failure if we say of someone who lacks decisional capacity that she has it, for then we fail to protect someone who genuinely cannot decide for herself. But it is also a serious moral failure to say of someone who has decisional capacity that she lacks it, for we then deprive someone of a very important moral power: the power to direct her own life through making her own decisions (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 40–41; Kim 2010: 1). Those who tackle the issue of capacity face moral danger of various types, and there is no easy way to avoid all moral pitfalls all the time.

Despite the dangers, theoretical questions about decisional capacity remain extremely important because they have huge practical implications. Indeed, it is the combined theoretical and practical nature of decisional capacity that makes it so intellectually compelling to philosophers who write about it. But this is still largely uncultivated philosophical territory. One reason is the highly interdisciplinary and rapidly changing nature of the field. Clinical methods and tests to assess capacity are proliferating even as disagreements remain about whether these instruments track what is truly important. Philosophers have much to contribute, but they must tread carefully if their contributions are to be timely and relevant.

1. Terminology

1.1 “Competence” or “Capacity”?

As defined above the term “decisional capacity” refers to the ability of subjects to make medical decisions; primarily, decisions to consent to or refuse medical intervention. Yet somewhat surprisingly, (at least for those new to the topic) there is a large amount of disagreement over terminology in this area, particularly over whether “decisional capacity” and its shortened version, “capacity” are the right terms to use. The other candidate is “mental competence” or just “competence” for short. Disputes about how (if at all) these terms differ can be very confusing and sadly there is no remedy other than familiarity with the various things people have said.

One potential problem with the term “competence” is that in other areas of law it is used more widely to refer to capacities that go beyond those deemed significant in medical contexts. For example, in criminal law, competence to stand trial usually requires knowing the difference between right and wrong. But such knowledge is not part of competence (or capacity) for medical decisions.

Also relevant is the fact that the law (again in other non-medical areas) often seeks to make global assessments of a person’s decision-making abilities. For example, a global determination of incompetence to manage one’s affairs may lead to one person losing a wide range of personal freedoms. It would typically result in a family member or guardian being appointed to look out for that individual’s finances, living arrangements etc. In short, a great many decisions are now off limits for that individual. But in medical contexts, such global assessments are no longer thought to be appropriate. Instead, the focus is supposed to be on particular decisions (see decision relativity in §5.2). Thus an individual can be deemed capable of making one decision, but not another.

Nonetheless, some version of legal/medical divide is often appealed to as part of explaining the difference between competence and capacity. One common explanation begins by focusing on who makes the determination: a clinician or a judge. It is said that a clinical assessment is a determination of “decisional capacity”, whereas “competence” refers to a legal assessment (Ganzini et al. 2005: S101). Yet despite the popularity of this way of carving things up, the distinction breaks down in practice. On the one hand, clinicians who assess decisional capacity, often make assessments that effectively carry the weight of a legal judgment, even though the courts are not involved (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 11; Kim 2010: 17). Indeed, such assessments typically have legal authority until or unless challenged in a court. On the other hand, these days many judges confronting particular cases of medical decision-making restrict their focus to questions about the ability of the patient to make the decision at hand.

Even so, in some legal jurisdictions, like Britain, the term “capacity” (or “decisional capacity”) is usually taken to be a legal one (Tan & Elphick 2002). On the other hand, in the United States, it is the terminology of “competence” (or “mental competence”) that is often said to carry legal connotations and authority (Buchanan 2004; Berg, Appelbaum, & Grisso 1996). None of this is very helpful, since as soon as we switch jurisdictions or engage in comparative work, terms change.

One well-known text in this area solves the problem by developing a new hybrid term. In their book, Deciding for Others, Allen Buchanan and Dan Brock write that, “competence is competence for some task, competence to do something” (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 84; emphasis in original). They then specify their own focus, which is “competence to make a decision” (Ibid). This leads to a lengthy discussion of what the authors call “decision-making competence” and its standards, as well as the specific “decision-making capacities” that are said to underlie what they call “decisional competence”. According to this strategy, the introduction of a new term—“decisional competence” is the proposed solution. Unfortunately, this stipulative solution arguably compounds rather than simplifies the problem, since it is more common to speak of “decisional capacity” than “decisional competence”.

Thomas Grisso and Paul Appelbaum, in their landmark study, Competence to Consent to Treatment, adopt yet a further approach. They explain:

…we talk of “decision-making capacities” when we refer to the abilities related to decisions. We use the term “competence”, however, to denote the state in which a patient’s decision-making capacities are sufficiently intact for their decisions to be honored (and conversely for incompetence) regardless of who makes the determination. (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 11)

In general, within the narrower realm of medical decision-making (which we take to include decisions to participate in clinical research) the two terms are roughly interchangeable or should be. For this reason, many writers adopt the policy of using the terms interchangeably while signaling recognition that this breaks with certain conventions. This usually is done by adding a minor proviso or caveat at the beginning of a discussion to that effect (Charland 2002: 37 note 1; Checkland 2001: 53, note 2; National Bioethics Advisory Commission 1998: Ch 1, note 4). The strategy has the virtue of avoiding the cumbersome repeated substitution of one term for the other in or across discussions where both are used. But it can also inadvertently perpetuate confusion of just the sort it is meant to obviate. For the rest of this entry the terms will be used interchangeably.

Ultimately, what is most important is for readers to be aware of all this terminological confusion and tread carefully. The rule of thumb remains: caveat emptor.

1.2 Descriptive vs. Prescriptive

Whatever term one settles on, it is also important to be aware that these terms can be, and often are used in both descriptive as well as prescriptive or normative senses. As one commentator explains:

a psychiatrist may give expert testimony, in his capacity as a trained observer, about a person’s competence seen as a factual matter, and the judge may or may not give this testimony practical effect in deciding how we ought to treat that person. (Freedman 1981: 55)

In this example, the first claim addresses the issue whether the individual is decisionally capable. The second claim addresses the issue whether the individual should be considered decisionally capable, i.e., whether she ought to be allowed to make her own decisions and have these honored. In many contexts, if a person is thought to have capacity (to factually possess certain relevant mental abilities) the normative implications simply follow as a matter of course. But as the example above reminds us, this is not always the case. In some contexts, for example in courts, the person who determines the facts about ability may not be the same person who issues the normative conclusion.

The distinction is particularly important to keep in mind in light of the fact that there are ongoing debates about what capacity is—debates that occur at various theoretical levels. At the first and most abstract level, we may be interested in clarifying our concept or theory of decision-making capacity. To do this we may ask what exactly it is that we are trying to do when we sort people into competent and incompetent. Asking such foundational questions may help us get clearer about the work we need a concept or theory of capacity to do. Closely related to debates about concept/theory are debates about standards. At this level we ask: what sorts of things should someone who has capacity in our defined sense be able to do? What specific abilities are the right ones to consider in light of the work the concept does? The most commonly accepted standards are outlined in §4 below. As we will see, some theorists believe that this list of standards is incomplete, in the sense that someone could satisfy these standards and yet fail to satisfy our basic concept of capacity. Finally, there are specific tests or instruments developed to determine whether or not (and to what extent) a particular individual satisfies the standards (Buchanan & Brock 1989). Confusion enters in because both empirical and normative claims can and do occur at all of these levels. Suppose, for example, that you examine A using a particular instrument, and then declare on that basis that A has the capacity to make decision X. And suppose I reject your claim, i.e., I refuse to give normative force to your descriptive claim. There may be several different reasons for this. I may doubt that you used the instrument properly. Or I may doubt that the instrument, even when used properly, is a good measure of whether someone meets the appropriate standards. Finally, I may simply think that the operative theory or concept underlying the standards is incomplete—that to truly determine capacity in a way that would license the normative conclusions, we need to consider more than just the articulated standards.

2. Moral Origins

The origins of our contemporary concept of decisional capacity lie in a varied configuration of historical developments in health care law and ethics that accompany the rise of the doctrine of informed consent. According to the most well developed and widely accepted account of this doctrine, the moral purpose of requiring informed consent in certain contexts is to promote and protect the autonomy of patients and research subjects (Faden & Beauchamp 1986). It is commonly observed that respect for autonomy

flows from the recognition that all persons have unconditional worth, each having the capacity to determine his or her own moral destiny. (Beauchamp & Childress 2001: 63–4).

To respect autonomy means that,

we have a fundamental obligation to ensure that patients have the right to choose, as well as the right to accept or decline information. (Beauchamp & Childress 2001: 63)

Of course, the obligation to allow people to choose is only an obligation where the individuals in question can meaningfully be said to choose for themselves. Thus the need to define decisional capacity enters as soon as we try to define the scope of this obligation.

Typically, in order to be deemed legally and ethically valid an individual’s consent must be properly informed and free of external coercion (Faden & Beauchamp 1986). Given that in most medical contexts there is a huge asymmetry in possession of knowledge, disclosure is usually required to ensure that the subject is informed, and is often listed as a requirement. Against this backdrop decisional capacity is often thought of as a fourth requirement of validity. Thus many health care professionals think of informed consent in terms of a four-part checklist:

  1. Subject must have decisional-capacity.
  2. All relevant information must be disclosed to the subject.
  3. The subject must understand what has been conveyed.
  4. The subject makes a voluntary choice either accepting or refusing what has been offered or proposed.

Philosophers might naturally suppose that moral theorizing about informed consent would lead to and shape a theory of decisional capacity. After all, if the point of informed consent is to enable and promote autonomous decision-making, one might naturally suppose that the task is to distinguish those who can actually make autonomous decisions from those who cannot. This, in turn, would require a more detailed account of what goes into an autonomous decision. However, this is not what one finds in the literature, and for good reason. To begin with, to take such ideas seriously one would have to have an independent theory of autonomous decision-making that was concrete enough to guide practice, i.e., the development of tests and instruments. But philosophical theories of autonomy are, at least currently, far too abstract for this purpose. Moreover they are typically far too demanding (i.e., they appear to count far too many decisions as non-autonomous).[1] So, interestingly, although many philosophers and bioethicists continue to equate decisional capacity and the capacity for autonomous decision-making, it is really not true that our current notion of decisional capacity has been derived from the notion of autonomous decision-making. Instead, the current notion of decisional capacity has been built from the ground up, largely (though not entirely) independently of philosophical theory. And this means that it is an open question whether a competent decision is an autonomous decision.

3. Moral Caution: What Follows from Incapacity?

Although the topic of this entry is primarily the nature of decision-making capacity, it is worth pausing briefly to comment on what morally follows from a declaration of incapacity. If a patient is deemed incapable of making a particular decision, then someone else (usually a family member) will be designated to make it for her. If the patient was refusing what others take to be beneficial treatment, then a finding of incompetence means that the treatment could be forced on the patient if a surrogate deems this best. However, while it is true that when a person is incompetent to make a decision, this means that the final authority for decisions will lie elsewhere, this doesn’t automatically mean that the patient’s current wishes, values, preferences etc. are of no importance or that they need not be considered in making decisions for the patient. Many incompetent patients clearly have strong desires that should be accommodated, at least when doing so will not otherwise cause problems. Given the strong link between well-being and what a person cares about, it is imperative for caretakers to at least consider what the patient currently wants.

Second, although it is possible to force treatment on a patient if she is deemed to lack capacity, this does not mean that it is always advisable to do so. There are many downsides to coercive treatment that need to be considered. Treatment might not be effective if the patient is uncooperative. It may also be important in the case of chronic mental illnesses to maintain trust with a patient who will likely need care again in the future. It may be that once these facts are taken into account, a treatment that seemed clearly beneficial will not be so.

A slightly different point concerns globally incompetent patients. Despite the emphasis in the field on treating DMC as decision-relative, there are, of course, some patients who because of more extreme impairments are unable to make all or almost all of their own medical decisions. In the case of globally incompetent patients who once were competent and who wrote advance directives, it is usually assumed that the directive comes into force once the patient reaches this state (Appelbaum 2007; Krohm & Summers 2002). However, this simple assumption has been powerfully challenged. For example, Jaworska (1999) has argued that many patients with mid-stage Alzheimer’s dementia retain the capacity to value (they remain, in her words, “valuers”), even though increasing confusion and forgetfulness about facts may mean that they no longer count as competent to make their own treatment decisions (because they fail understanding and reasoning). Jaworska argues that although such patients lack decision-making capacity, they are not yet at the point where their advance directives have the greatest authority. Their currently held values are still much more relevant to decisions made for them. In short, Jaworska draws attention to the fact that various significant capacities of persons can come apart. We usually value decision-making capacities like understanding and reasoning because these enable us to pursue our valued ends. But Jaworska underscores the fact that a person may continue to have currently valued ends even when she has lost the abilities needed for pursuing them effectively. In these cases, rather than revert to an advanced directive, Jaworska thinks we should (within reason) aim to help such patients pursue the ends they are no longer able to pursue on their own.

4. Elements of Capacity

Despite the fact that aspects of the concept of decisional capacity remain unspecified and undeveloped, it is possible to identify some shared elements that all or almost all theorists agree must be part of the picture. Four sub-capacities are most prominent. These are (1) Choice, (2) Understanding, (3) Appreciation, and (4) Reasoning. Some theorists have also suggested the need for something like (5) Value or Ability to Value (discussed in §6.1) and still others have posited the need for (6) Authenticity (also discussed in §6.1). Below is a presentation of the most basic and agreed upon elements and an explanation of how these have come to be understood in practice.

4.1 Choice

Choice is short for “the ability to express or communicate one’s choice”, and it is the simplest and least mental element of capacity. Indeed, its simplicity and obviousness may explain why some authors do not include it. To see that such an ability is necessary one needs only to imagine a case where understanding, appreciation and reasoning are all intact, but where the subject has no way to express or communicate her intended decision. Unless a subject’s preferred choice can be expressed to others in some outward way, it is impossible to know their intended decision. This is not trivial, since some patients—for example stroke victims or some patients with Locked-In Syndrome—can have an active mental life and satisfy the first three conditions but are unable to express anything verbally or through gestures (e.g., blinking the eyes, lifting a finger, etc.). This is why Grisso & Appelbaum (1998: 34–37) include it as one of the elements lack of which compromises capacity.

4.2 Understanding

The most basic mental element is understanding (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 23). Obviously, in order to be capable of consenting to or refusing a given intervention, a subject must have some basic understanding of the facts involved in that decision. Yet this apparently simple requirement can turn out to be rather complex depending on how “understanding” itself is defined (Drane 1985). Basic comprehension and knowledge or cognition of facts is one minimal interpretation (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 37–42). However, most commentators recognize that this level of mental ability is not enough for generating the sort of medical decisions we are concerned with. On the other hand, the standard cannot be set too high lest we rule too many people incompetent (see inclusivity §5.1).

4.3 Appreciation

In addition to understanding in the basic factual sense alluded to above, most writers on capacity agree that subjects must also have some appreciation of the nature and significance of the decision that they are faced with (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 42–52). The facts, and the implications of those facts for the subject’s life, must mean something to the subject. The most minimal way of interpreting this requirement is to see it as requiring that the subject not only grasp information but genuinely believe that it truly applies to him. The appreciation element of capacity is sometimes held to derive from the legal requirement that each subject must have “insight” into the circumstances of a given decision (Glass 1997).

Many theorists stop at this minimal interpretation, but even this requirement is significant, for it rules out certain kinds of patients who are delusional, who can grasp what their doctor is saying to them, but refuse to believe that anything their doctor says is true (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 42–43). In addition, in order to apply this requirement, clinicians must be able to distinguish between cases where patients refuse to believe doctors for doctrinal or cultural reasons—for example a Christian Scientist who believes that despite what her doctor says only prayer can heal—and cases where failure of appreciation results from losing touch with reality (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 45–49). For example, imagine a case in which an elderly demented woman clearly grasps the fact that her surgeons wish to amputate her feet because her feet are gangrenous and they believe that she is in real danger of dying if they do not amputate. But despite being able to state these facts back to her doctors, the woman, who seems confused and disoriented, says things that reveal she does not really believe there is anything seriously wrong with her feet. For example, she talks about what she will do once her feet are all healed. She may fail appreciation and so may not be deemed competent to refuse the treatment (based on a case described in Abernathy 1984).

More robustly, appreciation may be understood as going beyond just acceptance of, or belief in, the facts. Some theorists argue further that appreciation involves being able to

appreciate the nature and meaning of potential alternatives—what it would be like and “feel” like to be in possible future states and to undergo various experiences—and to integrate this appreciation into one’s decision-making. (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 24)

However, there are no easy ways to determine when this deeper kind of appreciation is present. Moreover, contemporary psychology has shown us just how infrequent such appreciation of future scenarios is among most people. Appreciating what a future option will feel like requires what psychologists call “affective forecasting”, and numerous studies have shown that we are, most of us anyway, very poor affective forecasters (Ubel, Loewenstein, Hershey, et al. 2001; Wilson, Wheatley, Meyers, et al. 2000; Gilbert, Gill & Wilson 2002; Gilbert, Pinel, Wilson, et al. 1998; Wilson, Meyers & Gilbert 2001; Wilson & Gilbert 2005; Ubel, Loewenstein, Schwarz, et. al 2005; Ubel, Loewenstein, & Jepson 2005; on the relevance of this to capacity see Halpern & Arnold 2008). But given this, if we were to require such deep appreciation we would again risk ruling too many people incompetent (see inclusivity §5.1).

4.4 Reasoning

Without the mental ability to engage in reasoning and manipulate information rationally, it is impossible for understanding and appreciation to issue in a decision (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 24–25; Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 52–58). Interestingly, however, the concept of reasoning is often left vague in discussions of decisional capacity. Probably this is because insisting on too high and specific a normative standard of reasoning might risk ruling that a majority of subjects lack capacity, which, again, risks ruling too many people incompetent.

Yet normative standards of reasoning sometimes do get mentioned, for example, consistency and the ability to derive conclusions from premises (Freedman 1981). More often reasoning is said to include the ability to weigh risks and benefits and evaluate putative consequences. Again, no specific normative criteria for success are spelled out. Difficult cases must therefore be assessed individually.

Most theorists seem to agree that possessing these four abilities, at least to some degree, is necessary for capacity. The primary issue (explored further in §6) is about whether the four abilities are always sufficient or whether there are cases in which something else, some further abilities or some further feature of the subject’s choice, might be relevant to the assessment of capacity. The three elements most commonly cited by critics are (1) the subject’s emotions, (2) the subject’s values, and (3) the authenticity of a subject’s choice.

5. Five Widely Accepted Assumptions (And a Sixth, More Controversial One)

There are five important assumptions that underlie virtually all contemporary work on decisional capacity and with which anyone interested in the topic must be familiar. For ease of reference we have named them: (1) inclusivity, (2) decision-relativity, (3) all-or-nothing assessment, (4) value neutrality, and (5) independence from diagnosis. These are supported both by ethical theory and by requirements that law imposes on the ethics of informed consent. A sixth assumption, (6) asymmetry, is fairly widely accepted, but continues to be debated.

5.1 Inclusivity

The inclusiveness constraint derives entirely from the needs of practice. No matter what theory of decisional capacity we develop, it must turn out that most ordinary adults count as having capacity most of the time (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 21; Appelbaum 1998). In other words, as a society we are morally committed to imposing minimal restraints on individual choice. Most people are free to make most choices in their lives for themselves, even including self-harming choices. It would therefore be intolerable if our account of decisional capacity in medicine were to differ significantly from that norm, especially given that the doctrine of informed consent arose in the context of a movement aiming to give greater decisional power to patients and research subjects. Thus, it is generally recognized that failure of a theory to be inclusive enough would be sufficient by itself for rejecting an account of decisional capacity.

5.2 Decision Relativity

Decision relativity refers to the now almost universally accepted idea that an individual’s decisional capacity should be assessed relative to a specific decision, at a particular time, in a particular context (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 18–20; Culver & Gert 1990: 620; Zapf & Roesch 2005). The requirement issues from the value placed on freedom to choose, along with the recognition of several facts. First, not all decisions require the same level of mental ability. Understanding all the facts relevant to making decision A might be much easier than understanding all the facts relevant to making decision B. The idea is to allow people to make the most use they can of the mental abilities they have.

It is also important to note that decisional capacity can vary within a single individual over time and in relation to what else is going on. For example, medications can make people drowsy or confused, but between doses when the medication wears off individuals may be perfectly capable of making decisions. Similarly, someone with moderate dementia may become more disoriented in unfamiliar surroundings or in the presence of someone she does not know, and so be less able to focus on a decision. Commitment to maximizing a person’s chance of deciding for herself means that we ought to be sensitive to such factors and should try to assess capacity under the most favorable conditions (Appelbaum 2007).

This emphasis on decision-relativity differs markedly from ideas accepted in an earlier era when decisional capacity was thought to extend globally over time and place, irrespective of context. Indeed, this more global notion continues to be employed in some areas of law. One illustration of the now widespread acceptance of decision relativity in medicine is that certain tests once thought to be perfectly acceptable tests of decisional capacity are no longer deemed to be so. A case in point is the mini-mental state examination (Folstein, Folstein, & McHugh 1975). This is a simple psychometric tool that was developed to help clinicians assess how disoriented (or not) their patients are, by ranking patient responses to familiar questions such as, “Where are you right now?” Some questions also address basic perceptual and mental skills (Can you count back from 100 subtracting 7 at a time?). Although extremely popular and still used as a rough assessment of orientation, it is now thought to be too global and general to serve as assessment of a patient’s mental capacity to make treatment decisions. By law, assessment must now be more “case-specific” and responsive to “situational variations in demands” (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998: 22).

5.3 All-or-Nothing Assessment (Relative to a Particular Decision)

A third assumption that pervades contemporary work on decisional capacity is that for practical purposes, a ruling on capacity must be all-or-nothing: either the patient in question has decisional capacity or she lacks it. Of course, in many contexts there is an obvious sense in which we can speak meaningfully of “degrees” of capacity, for we are indeed measuring abilities that fall along a spectrum. However, in practice we need a judgment of a bivalent type. This is because we need to know who has final decision-making authority and there is no such thing as “sort of” having authority over a decision. If a patient has the capacity to make decision X, then others must honor her choice even if they disagree with it. But if she lacks capacity to make decision X, someone else, a guardian or surrogate will have to decide for her. To avoid potentially endless controversy and ensure the smooth operation of the healthcare system, law and practice need a “yes-or-no” verdict about whether a person can make a particular decision for herself or not (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 27).

5.4 Value Neutrality

What we here call “the value neutrality constraint” is a bit more complex, but its significance makes it important to explain clearly. Value neutrality refers to the idea that we need to leave room for patients to make unusual or unpopular choices (Craigie 2013a: 1). People vary greatly in their values and so, even when confronted with similar situations, make very different kinds of choices. If the freedom to decide for oneself is to be meaningful, we need to ensure that individuals are not deemed to lack decisional capacity to make a choice simply because they are choosing something others disapprove of. The worry is real. In the not-too-distant medical past, doctors often did assume incapacity and would therefore refuse to honor patient wishes whenever a patient rejected what the doctor saw as beneficial treatment (Culver, Ferrell, & Green 1980: 587). Thus it seems important to find a way to distinguish competent though unusual choices from choices that are unusual because incompetent (because arrived at by flawed or inadequate mental processes).

Consider the decision to accept death rather than a certain form of treatment. The desire to die can, of course, be a sign of mental illness in certain cases and so possibly a sign of incapacity (though merely being mentally ill doesn’t make someone incompetent: see §5.5). But it would be hugely problematic to view all refusals of life-sustaining treatment as indicative of either mental illness or decisional incapacity (or both!). Some people refuse life-sustaining transfusion of blood for doctrinal religious reasons (Charland 2001: 137). Others may choose death as a preferable alternative to suffering. For example, a long-term dialysis patient who is not a candidate for transplant may accept death as the only way to escape from an existence she finds unbearable. Such a choice is intelligible even if it is not the choice most dialysis patients make. In both the religious case and the dialysis case the choice appears to reflect values that are not shared by all people. Yet disagreements about values, troubling though they may be, are not generally thought to be indicative of any lack of mental ability. Since death can be chosen by competent individuals as well as incompetent ones, many theorists have argued that we must look to something other than simply what is chosen to distinguish competent choice from incompetent choice.

It is usually assumed that the only way to satisfy the requirement of value neutrality is to draw a sharp distinction between process and outcome (Freedman 1981; Buchanan & Brock, 1989: 50–51; Banner 2013: 1). On this view, capacity has more to do with the nature of the process whereby one arrives at a decision, rather than the content or outcome of the actual decision itself.

Closely associated with this approach is a particular picture of what it is for a decision to be rational. This is sometimes referred to as “internal” rationality, because it makes rationality a matter of the internal relations between beliefs, values and particular choices. It could also be called “instrumental rationality plus”. On this view, there must be internal consistency among the beliefs and values relevant to the decision at hand. In addition, an individual must be able to prioritize among her (decision-relevant) ends, and continue to update this priority ranking as circumstances change and evolve. And it requires (this is the instrumental part) being able to recognize which of the options available will best serve her ends. So consider again refusal of life-saving transfusion based on adherence to religious doctrine. It can be argued that, in such a case, the subject is decisionally capable to refuse the transfusion as long as the decision is rational according to internal reasons that he recognizes as his own, i.e., his choice (refusing transfusion/accepting death) best serves his ends (adherence to God’s commands as his religion interprets these), even if others find the choice puzzling.

However, there remain some theorists who insist that there are cases in which irrationality is also a matter of outcome, of what one chooses. They resist the idea that we should focus exclusively on process when assessing capacity because of worries about particular kinds of cases. Consider the example of a subject who refuses electroconvulsive therapy for a severe depression that has not responded to any other forms of treatment. The patient refuses because of a deep fear of the procedure, even though she consented to it and benefited from it at one point in the past (Culver, Ferrell, & Green 1980; Culver & Gert 2004). In this case, given how harmful the subject’s choice may ultimately be to her, the decision not to accept the treatment seems problematic and, according to Culver & Gert, ought to be challenged. However, in order to say that this patient is not capable of refusing this treatment, it seems that we would be forced to abandon a restricted focus on process. For it is most likely true that the process by which she reaches the decision is beyond reproach from the standpoint of internal rationality. Her current fear of the therapy is so great that she would rather die than undergo the treatment. Even if one thinks this is a re-prioritization of values brought on by her fear (which would be hard to establish), it remains true that currently she is reaching a decision consistent with what she currently cares most about. And that is all that is required by internal rationality. Yet Culver & Gert think such a choice should be grounds for declaring the patient incompetent. They think such a choice is irrational in a broader sense than allowed by internal rationality.

Like other theorists of capacity, Culver & Gert acknowledge the moral importance of avoiding any approach to capacity assessment that results in doctors being able to declare a patient incompetent whenever a patient refuses a recommended treatment. But they think there are ways to avoid this problem without recourse to the strong policy of focusing exclusively on the processes leading up to a decision. They suggest instead that we can appeal to a general notion of how “most reasonable people would judge”.

Although the problems raised by the ECT case are real, many theorists think that the solution offered by Culver & Gert is deeply problematic. Relying on what many people view as rational (in some broad, non-internal sense of rational) or on what many people view as “a significant harm” will not offer sufficient protection for competent adults with unusual values. If our goal is to ensure that mentally intact individuals are free to pursue their own idiosyncratic and at times unpopular values, then we must avoid building into our account of capacity any specific requirements on choice. Culver & Gert may be right that their proposal would allow them to handle religious cases properly, since many people these days recognize the existence of religious diversity and the need to tolerate certain religiously motivated choices, particularly if those choices primarily affect the subject making the choice. But it is not at all clear that their view could handle the dialysis case mentioned earlier. When precisely does the refusal of further life-saving treatment make sense? How much suffering is too much? Deep continuing disagreements about the proper answer to such questions suggests that it would not be safe to build any particular answer into our notion of competence. To do so is to risk allowing majority values to limit the free choice of others in inappropriate ways by ruling too many people incompetent for the wrong reasons.

These days clinicians and others working in clinical settings take it as axiomatic that

clinicians should not conclude that patients lack decision-making capacity just because they make a decision contrary to medical advice. (Ganzini 2005: S101)

Moreover, discussions of capacity assessment tend to assume (contra Culver & Gert) that the only safe way to avoid this problem (the problem of equating disagreement with incapacity) is to focus exclusively on how patients reach a decision. So although philosophers may still see issues to be explored further, for now the clinical realm views these issues as resolved. It is taken for granted that the need to maintain value neutrality is real, and that the way to do this is to adopt an exclusively process-oriented approach to capacity assessment.

5.5 Independence from Diagnosis

Just as it is usually assumed that a patient cannot be declared incompetent simply on the basis of her (perhaps unusual) values, similarly a patient cannot be declared incompetent simply on the basis of her diagnosis. For obvious reasons this is most relevant for patients with mental illnesses or cognitive impairments, where there is a history of assuming that all such patients are globally incompetent (Kim 2010: 11). Historically this resulted in large losses of freedom for many individuals.

Today it is generally assumed that the diagnosis itself does not mean a person is incompetent.[2] Rather, we must look to see if in fact the mental illness (or the cognitive impairment) is undermining decision-making capacity for a particular individual and in relation to a particular decision. Clinicians look for the same features that are supposedly relevant for ordinary patients: understanding, appreciation, and reasoning, as described above (Whiting 2015). This has the result that while some patients with a psychiatric diagnosis or a cognitive impairment are deemed incompetent to make some decisions, many are deemed competent to make at least some decisions and still others may be deemed competent to make all of their own decisions. This has had the result that these patient groups have much greater input into their own treatment than in previous eras. Arguably, it has also helped to decrease somewhat the stigma of mental illness and cognitive impairment.

5.6 Risk and Symmetry

Part of what is involved in reasoning about a particular course of action and reaching a decision is weighing the risks and benefits associated with the likely consequences of proposed options. In health care contexts where consent is at issue, this normally amounts to a decisional problem that is framed in symmetrical terms: either one consents to a given treatment option, or one refuses that same option. This way of framing things seems to assume that both poles of the decision are symmetrical and that mental capacity necessarily remains fixed as one evaluates the two options. Yet this is an assumption that can be philosophically challenged.

It is sometimes argued that consent and refusal to the same proposed intervention should not always be treated symmetrically, by which it is meant that an individual could sometimes be competent to consent to a treatment that she is not competent to refuse. The reasoning is that the risks respectively associated with consenting to or refusing treatment are not always the same. From this it is inferred that the decisions are not the same and that therefore, decisions to consent or refuse the very same treatment should not automatically be treated symmetrically.

To see what is at stake consider a case where a patient is refusing a low risk treatment that is highly beneficial for those with her condition. And suppose as well that the patient will die without it. Of course, it is always true of any patient in any situation that she might make a mistake, i.e., a judgment that does not really serve her interests even as she understands them. But in this case if refusal is a mistake it is a mistake with much worse consequences for the patient. Since in this case the harms associated with mistaken refusal are much greater than the harms associated with mistaken consent, the level of competence required to refuse can legitimately be set higher.

There have been substantial debates over the symmetricality question (Brock 1991; Buller 2001; Cale 1999; Checkland 2001; Skene 1991; Wicclair 1991, 1999; Wilks 1997, 1999). A key feature of the debate is whether or not mental capacity should be considered a fixed mental commodity (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 60). In other words, relative to a particular yes-or-no decision such as the one described above, should we articulate a single threshold (a certain level or degree of understanding, appreciation, etc. that the patient must have) such that any patient above the threshold should be free to either consent or refuse? Or is it better to view such a choice as two different decisions and so articulate two different thresholds, one for acceptance and one for refusal, setting the threshold higher for those patients inclined to refuse?

Those who are skeptical of this approach point out that it is highly counterintuitive to say that mental capacity can vary according to external circumstances. Moreover, as some critics claim,

One point of determining whether a person is competent to make a decision about medical treatment is to allow a competent patient to make any decisions he wants regarding that kind of treatment. (Culver & Gert 1990: 620; Culver & Gert 2004)

In a way, it is true that abilities don’t change simply because the risks of exercising them do. To illustrate with a simple, non-medical analogy, consider a cooking student who has learned to make a perfect omelet and now succeeds in making one nine out of ten attempts. This is her current ability level and it does not change even if the consequences of failure change. In one case, perhaps, failure simply means she has no omelet, but only scrambled eggs, for breakfast, whereas in another case failure to make the omelet properly might cost her admission to chef school. But the odds of failure are the same in each case: 1 in 10. In effect those who favor an asymmetrical requirement think that it is fair to require a higher level of ability (and so a lower chance of failure) when the negative consequences of failure are higher. And this does seem to be about protection rather than ability per se.

However, the moral rationale for the approach appeals to a more general, overarching rationale for assessing capacity in the first place (Buchanan & Brock 1989: 51). The claim is that we assess capacity because we recognize the need to strike a balance between two distinct and potentially conflicting values. On the one hand, as a society we place a very high value on personal autonomy and free choice. But if that was our only societal value we would not bother to assess capacity but would simply honor any choice that a patient made (as long as she could express it). That we don’t do this demonstrates that we also clearly value patient welfare and recognize that as mental capacities become more and more compromised the risk to welfare posed by free choice increases. From the start then, setting thresholds for decision-making capacity is an exercise in trying to strike the right balance between giving people as much freedom as possible while protecting the most vulnerable among us.

The asymmetrical approach to decisions simply extends this basic idea—this desire to balance concern for autonomy and protection of welfare—further. Once we recognize that choosing one way can place welfare at much greater risk than choosing the other way, it makes sense to strike the autonomy-welfare balance differently for each prong of the choice. Since welfare is more at risk in one case than the other, we set the threshold for selecting that option higher (thereby slightly reducing the chance that the subject will be free to make it). But since welfare is not at risk in the other case, the threshold remains low, to maximize the chance that the patient will be free to make that choice if she is inclined to.

6. Are We Measuring the Right Thing?

As indicated earlier, there are two slightly different questions theorists might have in mind when they ask: “Are we measuring the right thing?” On the one hand, one might be asking whether a particular instrument developed to help clinicians assess capacity is empirically valid. Or (closely related), one might be asking whether a particular empirically valid instrument developed in one context, is applicable in a different legal context. On the other hand, one might be asking a deeper question about whether the underlying standards which inspired the development of the instrument, and which the instrument supposedly tracks, are really themselves adequate. In short, the second question challenges the underlying framework itself, asking whether we ought to be considering things that it fails to capture. Here, the first sort of question will be considered briefly before turning to the second.

At this point in time, the most widely used instrument is the MacCAT-T (Grisso, Appelbaum, & Hill-Fotouhi 1997). It reflects the most widely influential theory of competence to date, that of Grisso and Appelbaum (1998). At the core of this theory are the same four abilities mentioned in §4 of this entry: the ability to communicate a choice, the ability to understand, the ability to appreciate, and the ability to reason. However, Grisso and Appelbaum (1998) develop detailed specifications for how these four abilities should be interpreted. We shall call the view of competence defined in terms of these four abilities as interpreted by Grisso and Appelbaum the “four-abilities model”. The MacCAT-T is an instrument designed to help clinicians quickly and efficiently assess competence according to the four-abilities model. Thus to ask if the MacCAT-T is empirically valid is to ask whether it is good at detecting the presence of the four abilities as specified by the model and whether it is good at measuring the degree to which a patient possesses them. A great deal of research has been done on the MacCAT-T, and at this point the general consensus appears to be that the MacCAT-T is empirically valid in this narrow sense.

A slightly different question is about whether the MacCAT-T can be applied in different legal contexts. The legal history in the United States, Canada, and Great Britain has many common roots, and because of this many people assume that the same criteria apply in these different regions. However, it is not always obvious that this is so. In 2005 The Mental Capacity Act (MCA) was passed in England and Wales that, at least on the surface, seems to embrace different criteria from the ones listed above. The MCA criteria are (1) understanding, (2) retaining, (3) using, and (4) weighing and communicating (see Mental Capacity Act in Other Internet Resources). Some researchers have concluded that, for all practical purposes, this is the same model. They take “using” to cover appreciation (since one does not use information one does not fully accept) and “weighing” to cover reasoning (which is often understood as the ability to weigh and compare options). But as of now there is no real consensus. Viewing the two sets of criteria as equivalent is, of course, convenient, since then one can make use of the broader English-language literature on capacity assessment without worries about whether it strictly applies to one’s own legal context. For example, based on the assumption that the two models are basically equivalent, some researchers in England have conducted empirical studies of capacity in specific populations of patients using the MacCAT-T (Owen, Szmukler, et al. 2009; Owen, Szmukler, et al. 2013).

Of course, the MacCAT-T is only one of many instruments that have been developed to assess capacity (Etchells et al. 1999; S. Welie 2001; Vellinga et al. 2004; Dunn et al. 2006; Kim 2010: 61–65) and all such instruments must be assessed for empirical validity, namely the extent to which they successfully track and measure the properties they claim to track and measure. However, questions of empirical validity, though obviously important, are generally of less interest to philosophers. The more interesting questions arise when we consider the adequacy of the underlying theory a particular instrument is based upon. That means that in the case of the MacCAT-T, the deeper, interesting question is whether the four abilities model as specified by Grisso and Appelbaum captures everything important about decision-making capacity. Since to date the four abilities model has been the most influential model by far, the following discussion focuses on it.

At the origin of any theory of capacity, there lies a set of paradigm examples around which the theory is built and which it must account for. Thus, in the initial instance, a theory is built around a selection of paradigm examples of what capacity and incapacity should be taken to be. The criticisms examined below all appeal to cases that the critics take to be obvious examples of incapacity, but which the four abilities model seems to classify as cases of capacity. Most theorists seem to agree that possessing the four abilities, at least to some degree, is necessary for capacity. The primary issue is about whether the four abilities are always sufficient or whether there are cases in which something else, some further abilities or some further feature of the subject’s choice, might be relevant to the assessment of capacity. The three elements most commonly cited by critics are (1) the subject’s emotions, (2) the subject’s values, and (3) the authenticity of a subject’s choice.

6.1 Challenging the Four Abilities Model: Emotions

Emotions obviously play an important role in decision-making, yet the four abilities model does not directly address the role of emotions. A number of critics of the model remain convinced that failure to attend to emotion in capacity assessment is problematic (White 1994; Charland 1998b; Halpern 2011, 2012; Bursztajn et al. 1991; Breden & Vollmann 2004; Hermann et al. 2016).

When they think of emotion, most people think of discrete emotional episodes, for example, particular experiences of anger, sadness or joy. While these are no doubt important, the realm of emotional phenomena is much broader, something that some theorists capture by talking more generally of “affect” or “affective phenomena”. In addition to particular episodes of emotion, people have emotional dispositions, moods and longer-term emotionally shaped outlooks. For example, someone who is depressed experiences much more than just a single discrete episode of sadness. To be depressed is to view many things through a dark emotional lens that can shape how a person views her life, what she cares about, and what she sees as worth pursuing.

There are now a number of published studies that report that depressed patients are often decisionally capable and compare well with matched controls (Appelbaum & Grisso 1995; Vollmann et al. 2003; Appelbaum, Grisso, et al. 1999). However, what is being reported is that these patients did well when assessed using instruments like the MacCAT-T which is based on the four abilities model. Because the authors of the studies have faith in that model they clearly intend their results to license normative conclusions. However, critics worry that negative emotional outlooks can lead depressed patients to weigh risks and benefits differently (Elliot 1997; Rudnick 2002). Since such patients do not care as much about themselves or their own lives, they may not care about risks in the same way they would if not depressed. Such patients are cognitively intact: they understand the relevant facts and grasp that the facts apply to them. But depressed affect may still (so it is argued) undermine their ability to decide. More recently it has been suggested that those who assess the capacity of persons with severe depression may need to consider their ability to project themselves into the future as this may relate to hope or loss of hope that may impact on decision-making (Halpern 2012; Meynen 2011; Owen, Freyenhagen, et al. 2015; Owen, Martin, & Gergel 2018). Some theorists have argued that affect and emotion play a central role in many other mental disorders, even those not necessarily thought of as disorders of affect. On that basis they have argued that the problems outlined here—problems related to the fact that the four-abilities model ignores emotion—may also arise with these patients. Examples include addiction (Charland 2011), patients with OCD (Ruissen 2015; Ruissen et al. 2016), and patients with anorexia nervosa (Charland, Hope, et al. 2013; Charland 2015).

Certainly it is true that emotional influences on decision-making can be profound. Our cultural bias (no doubt elicited by the previous example) is to think of emotions as making decisions worse (Charland, 1998a: 359). But this is to overlook the very real ways that emotion—even strong emotion—can improve decision-making. Moreover, although it is not often acknowledged, it is only because we are creatures with affective capacities that we care about things. A creature completely devoid of emotion or affect would presumably not care about anything and so would have no basis for making decisions (Charland 1998a,b).

Still, the difficulty of focusing on emotions in the current context is that we do not have a principled way of distinguishing between the good influences of emotion on decision-making and the bad influences. Moreover we need a way to draw this distinction that is independent of our opinion about the goodness or badness of the choices being made. Most of us tend to see the influence of emotion as bad when we think the decision reached is bad, and vice versa. But value neutrality and the related commitment to a process-based approach rule this out. Finally, some theorists have recently voiced worries about what might happen if emotionality were included in capacity assessments in the wrong way. Including emotionality might be good for some patients, e.g., those with depression, but might result in too much loss of freedom for autistic persons or other neurodiverse people whose emotional responses are different from the norm but who arguably are quite able to make decisions for themselves (Mackenzie & Watts 2011a,b).

6.2 Challenging the Four Abilities Model: Values & Authenticity

Many of the same theorists who invoke emotion also point to the fact that the four abilities model ignores patient values (Charland 2002). However, in some cases where, intuitively, patients appear to lack capacity, it is precisely their pursuit of unusual and self-destructive values that seems to be problematic. Addicts pursuing their drug of choice (Levy 2016) or anorexia patients pursuing extreme thinness are cases in point. Might there yet be a way to appeal to values in an assessment of capacity?

The adequacy of the four abilities model was challenged along these lines by Tan, Hope, Stewart and colleagues in a series of articles exploring the results of a small empirical study of patients with anorexia nervosa (Tan, Hope, & Stewart 2003a,b; Tan, Stewart, Fitzpatrick, & Hope 2006a,b; Tan, Stewart, & Hope 2009). Ten young women with the illness were interviewed at length about their own understanding of their illness, why they pursued extreme weight loss, how they felt about treatment and what might lead them to refuse treatment. In addition, the women were all assessed for decision-making capacity using the MacCAT-T. They all scored very well on the MacCAT-T, demonstrating high levels of understanding and reasoning ability, with scores basically equivalent to healthy controls (Tan, Stewart, et al. 2006a: 270). By the typical, purely cognitive criteria of capacity assessment, they were all (or mostly all, depending on how much emphasis one places on appreciation) competent.[3] Yet most of them also clearly intended to keep trying to lose weight. The extremely high value they placed on being thin led them to downplay other values that had once been more central to them. As they explained to interviewers, thinness was more important to them than family, friends, education, work, and even life itself. In the words of one participant,

Although I didn’t mind dying, I really didn’t want to, it’s just I wanted to lose weight, that was the main thing. (Tan, Hope, & Stewart 2003a: 702)

Intuitively, at least for many people, these young women, diagnosed with a serious mental disorder and pursuing thinness at the expense of health and life, lack the ability to make their own decisions. For some theorists, indeed, such cases are paradigm cases of incapacity, the kinds of cases a theory ought to be able to account for. However, the cognitively focused four-abilities model cannot account for these cases because the young women, though pursuing self-destructive behavior, are cognitively intact. Indeed, it is not uncommon for patients with severe anorexia to count as having capacity by the usual criteria (Elzakkers et al. 2016). The only unusual thing about their decisions seems to be what they decide to pursue and the values that lie behind this. Is there, then, a way to appeal to the values such patients express as part of explaining why they lack capacity? The traditional understanding of value neutrality (§5.4 above) suggests we can’t. But Tan and others (Tan, Hope, & Stewart 2003a,b; Tan, Stewart, et al. 2006a) suggest that the key is to recognize that these values (unlike, for example, the unusual values of the Jehovah’s Witness) are caused by the mental disorder itself (For a similar point in relation to addiction see Charland 2002, 2011). The values in question are “pathological values”.

Although this seems promising at first, a number of problems remain. To start with, this view appeals to the idea that anorexia is the source or cause of these values. Even if that were so, we would need to know more before we could leverage that into an explanation of incapacity. We need a way of explaining how these values undermine or are bad-for decision-making.

Some critics of Tan et al. come very close to just asserting that since the anorexic values in question do not undermine the usual four abilities, the values in question clearly should not be taken as evidence of incapacity (Whiting 2009). This is too simplistic, however, for it begs the question of whether there might be further abilities, in addition to the traditional four, that matter. However, it is also true that Tan et al. have not yet given a fully satisfactory account. Even if the values driving decision-making are a product of mental illness, this doesn’t by itself license the conclusion that these values are problematic. An additional link between the values in question and decision-making is needed and it is not yet clear whether one can be provided.

A second worry is that such an approach (one that appeals to pathological values) risks giving up one feature of the current framework prized by many psychiatrists, namely the refusal to use diagnosis as a basis for determinations of capacity (§5.5 above). If anorexia causes problematic values and if this is sufficient to render patients incompetent, then since all patients with anorexia have such values, we will in effect be saying that all such patients lack the capacity to refuse treatment.

Finally, it is controversial whether or not we can really say that anorexia causes these values, even though it is clear that anorexia correlates with the existence of them. Like most mental disorders, anorexia nervosa is defined in terms of its symptoms rather than an underlying cause. Namely, the disorder is defined in terms of the strong desires for extreme thinness we have been discussing, as well as the behavioral consequences of these desires. And these desires in turn reflect the value these patients place on extreme thinness. It is thus not explanatorily helpful or illuminating in any way to say that these desires are caused by anorexia, for this amounts to saying (unhelpfully) that strong desires for extreme thinness are caused by strong desires for extreme thinness or that valuing extreme thinness causes the valuing of extreme thinness.

The issue here is not about whether anorexia is really an illness (undoubtedly it is, and a very serious one at that). Rather, the point is about our current resources for explanation. Individuals can agree that (a) anorexia is a devastating condition and be puzzled by (b) the fact that such individuals typically count as having decision-making capacity, and yet also remain puzzled about (c) how precisely to explain incapacity in these cases in a way consistent with the general values described earlier (§5.1–5.5).

A slightly different point about values and decision-making capacity has been made more recently, also in the context of trying to understand patients with anorexia. After extensive and careful analysis of the ways individual patients talk about and describe their illness, Hope et al. (2011, 2013) have raised doubts about whether or not we can trust a patient’s own description of her mental states, because patients appear to use different words for the same experience at different times. This is extremely important because, given the existing framework, everything turns on whether or not patients have false beliefs (thereby failing either the understanding requirement or the appreciation requirement). But unusual values are (on the standard approach) allowed to stand. However, the research of Hope et al. suggests that the line between beliefs and values can actually be deeply obscure for patients as well as clinicians.

Hope et al. (2013) have argued that individuals with anorexia are in the grip of affective states that shape how they see the world. Yet, although the world presents to them as one way, they may at another more reflective level, reject the appearances. Thus an individual may have a strong feeling or emotional sense that she is fat. But even though these feelings incline her to accept the proposition that she is fat she may not in fact believe at a higher level that she is fat. She may know quite well that she is dangerously thin. An analogy here with optical illusions is helpful. The experience of seeing a stick in water as bent is incredibly powerful, but we may nonetheless know it is not bent. However, the mental state that is most authoritative when it comes to reporting our beliefs may not be the same as the mental state that is most motivationally powerful. When it comes time to make choices about treatment, the salience of the affective phenomena and the relative lack of salience of the dangers of self-starvation may lead a person to refuse treatment.

Here is where the puzzle for capacity assessment arises. In a very real sense, the refusal is based on a mental state with a certain propositional content that is false. So, under the traditional analysis, it seems we should count the patient as lacking capacity. But in another sense, since her reflective self does not accept that content (she does not strictly speaking believe it) she has no false beliefs (Hope et al. 2013: 30). And she is credible in reporting this. So, again following the traditional analysis, it seems we should count the patient as having capacity.

She will, of course, be called upon to justify her decision and it may not be clear to her how to describe her mental states. We do not typically report affective experiences in the same way we report beliefs. The only logical argument she could possibly offer would be: I would prefer to risk death than to put on weight (Hope et al. 2013: 30). And this looks like a preference. On the classic analysis she is competent because her refusing treatment logically follows, given her preferences. But as Hope et al. say:

But this preference is not one she clearly held before discussion with her physician. It was constructed to create a rational argument for refusing treatment that can satisfy her physician. (Hope et al. 2013: 30)

If these descriptions of what happens with anorexia patients are correct, it seems plausible to suppose such patients should not (normatively speaking) be counted as having decision-making capacity. They are, on this picture, subject to the emotional equivalent of a powerful illusion, and they are unable to resist the illusion when it comes to choice. However, many problems remain about how to properly distinguish cases of capacity and incapacity. The description offered by Hope et al. is extremely important for what it calls to our attention, but it still leaves most of the core issues unresolved.

Finally, a slightly different (but related) challenge to the four-abilities model is made using the notion of authenticity. Building on the idea introduced by Tan, Stewart, Fitzpatrick, and Hope (2006a) that certain values are caused by mental disorder and suspect in virtue of this, these critics raise the worry that the values driving decisions may not be authentic values of the patient. If authenticity is, in turn, thought of as part of autonomy, then it might be thought that inauthentic values undermine capacity (though see discussion of autonomy and capacity §2). So the question then becomes: can we require that the values driving a treatment decision be authentic, and if not may we declare the person incompetent?

Kim (2016) has recently defended a mild form of authenticity requirement that he calls “the ability to value”. The terminology can be misleading because it is not about whether one is able to value something as opposed to nothing, but about whether one is able to bring one’s own authentic values to bear on decision-making (Hawkins 2016). There are two questions raised by Kim that correspond neatly to the two requirements he sketches for the ability to value: first, are the values driving a particular treatment decision really the patient’s own values, or is the patient acting out of character? Second, if the values seem inauthentic, can we demonstrate that the new problematic values arose with the onset of mental disorder or after some illness related event (for example, a depressed person who stopped taking meds three weeks ago, and started wanting to die shortly thereafter)? The second question is analogous to the second question that arises in assessing appreciation, where we have to determine whether or not a patient’s failure to believe that the facts are true of her is caused by a mental problem of some sort (e.g., dementia induced confusion or ICU psychosis). If appreciation fails because of religious or cultural beliefs, this is not a sign of incapacity. Kim is clear that he intends this requirement to be applied very carefully, and that impairment in this domain is not sufficient for a determination of incapacity, though he is vague about what precisely it can contribute to such a decision.

One problem with this view arises if one considers the fact that some individuals with mental disorder identify with their illness (Erler & Hope 2014). Tan, Hope, and Stewart (2003b) explore the ways that many young women with anorexia see their illness as an essential part of who they are. Yet it is these same values that are influencing their treatment decisions. If we wish to find a way of explaining the deep intuition that these women lack decision-making capacity, then if we do so through appeals to authenticity, we will most likely have to give up on the idea that individuals are themselves the final authority about which values or features of themselves are the authentic ones.

Appeals to authenticity also face problems related to our ability to distinguish truly inauthentic values from new but still authentic ones. Not all new values are inauthentic, for it is possible for a person to autonomously change her mind. Moreover, sometimes illness gives us experiences that seem highly relevant to our choices. Having once experienced illness we may be inclined to make decisions we would never have expected ourselves to make before we were ill. The decisions are not caused by our illness, but rather reflect what we have learned from illness. As such they should not count against capacity. But to ensure this doesn’t happen we need reliable ways of distinguishing cases that can, in fact, be very hard to distinguish from the outside. [Also, insofar as we are looking for suspicious changes in values as signs of inauthenticity, this will not help in many cases of anorexia nervosa, where the patients in question typically acquire the illness at a very young age before they have developed characteristic values distinguishable from the values of the illness.]

Kim’s awareness of the dangers of confusing real value changes with pathologically induced changes leads him to emphasize the need for extreme caution in this area. Indeed, one problem with Kim’s approach is that his understandable caution means that in many cases where intuitively a patient may lack capacity, we will still not be able to rule the patient incompetent (Hawkins 2016). In short, the original range of ethical constraints on capacity assessment continues to make it difficult to capture all and only the cases that seem intuitively to be cases of genuine incapacity, and Kim’s solution, though perhaps capturing a few more cases than other views, is still restrained in ways that leave us with some highly counterintuitive cases.

7. A Different Kind of Challenge: Voluntarism

Informed consent requires that a patient be able to make a meaningful decision for herself. But this is just the pre-requisite. If the individual has capacity then he or she must be given all relevant information, and then he or she must make a free or voluntary decision. Voluntariness is complicated terrain, and most of the discussion of voluntariness in informed consent has focused on the sorts of illegitimate behaviors by other people that can undermine voluntariness: force, coercion (threats) and undue inducement (Hawkins & Emanuel 2005).

However, a more neglected question (at least in the literature on informed consent) is the question of whether factors internal to the person can undermine voluntariness. If so, what are these factors and how do we identify them? If such factors exist, then they may most usefully be discussed in connection with decisional capacity as opposed to external topics like coercion. This is because questions about internal psychological barriers bring us back once more to questions about the particular abilities of the individual patient or subject, and because if there are problems here, their presence and extent are most likely to be assessed by clinicians. Arguably, just as failure to grasp the facts of the situation can make a choice meaningless, something like addiction—which in certain contexts almost guarantees that the person will choose in a particular way—may also thereby make choice meaningless (Charland 2002, 2011).

In the early days of psychiatry, it was widely recognized that there could be lesions of the will, just as there could be lesions of the understanding and affective capacities. Towards the end of the nineteenth century the French philosopher-psychologist Theodule Ribot published a highly influential book on the topic, entitled Les maladies de la volenté—later translated as Diseases of the Will (Ribot 1883). Ribot argued that the capacity for voluntary choice could sometimes be compromised, perverted, or even virtually obliterated, by disease, and that the various impairments that resulted deserved to be scientifically studied and classified. While it is no longer popular to speak of “diseases of the will” contemporary clinicians and researchers do recognize that human will and agency can be impaired or even depleted (Baumeister et al. 1998) in various ways by diseases of many sorts. But there is still little understanding of what such deficits mean for the doctrine of informed consent.

Those contemporary theorists who think we need to acknowledge the possibility of genuine psychological barriers to voluntariness tend to ask questions about the decision-making ability of patients with addiction (Charland 2002, 2011) or obsessive-compulsive disorder (Ruissen 2015; Ruissen et al. 2016).

Unfortunately, the literature has paid little attention to the distinction made above between internal psychological barriers and external barriers. For example, Appelbaum, Lidz, and Klitzman (2009) set out to chart the domain of voluntariness, but ended up focusing exclusively on external factors such as coercion and undue inducement. They are explicit that since the law has traditionally treated voluntariness in an external fashion—as the absence of force, coercion or undue inducement—they have sought to explain only these kinds of phenomena. However, this begs the ethical question of whether there really might be internal barriers to meaningful choice and if so, whether the law ought to recognize them even if it currently doesn’t. Other theorists such as Laura Weiss Roberts (2002a,b) have explored a wider range of factors that might affect voluntariness, but with the result that far too much is included (as opposed to too much being excluded, as above). Approaches like hers fail to make crucial distinctions between strong, though understandable, feelings a person might have in response to a situation (but which need not undermine the voluntariness of a choice) and more plausible threats to voluntariness such as addiction. The difficulty is precisely to distinguish genuine impediments to voluntary choice from the many and varied internal factors that can influence choice, and/or lead to imprudent or unwise choices. Much work remains to be done here.

8. Increasing Relevance and Significant Public Misperceptions

The literature on decision-making capacity has grown exponentially over the last decade, though interestingly most of the explosion is in the clinical and research literature and has a decidedly empirical bent. Although new topics continue to be introduced, it is clear that outside philosophy much is assumed as settled that would not look settled to a philosophical eye. Thus it will be interesting to see how things develop over the next decade.

In addition, decision-making capacity is becoming more and more relevant as certain types of ethical questions become hot topics of public debate. For example, decisional-capacity is obviously of great importance in relation to medical-assistance-in-dying laws (MAID),[4] and yet the public often fails to understand what is actually meant by decisional-capacity as well as how variable the practices of assessing capacity really are (Kim, Appelbaum, et al. 2011; Seyfried, Ryan, & Kim 2013). This is particularly important since one of the most divisive issues currently concerns whether those with mental illness or cognitive impairment should be candidates for assisted dying (Stewart, Peisah, & Draper 2011; Broome & de Cates 2015; Price 2015; Schuklenk & van de Vathorst 2015; Appelbaum 2016; Charland, Lemmens, & Wada 2016; Doernberg, Peteet, & Kim 2016; Kim & Lemmens 2016; Blikshavn, Husum, & Magelssen 2017). As this entry makes clear, some of the most difficult questions about decisional capacity arise specifically in the case of mental illness, making it even harder to determine whether MAID for the mentally ill is a policy that could be implemented appropriately, where “appropriate” here just means an implementation that strikes just the right balance between protecting the truly vulnerable, on the one hand, and promoting freedom for those who can meaningfully exercise it, on the other.


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The authors would like to thank Kyoko Wada, Scot Kim, Trudo Lemmens, and an anonymous referee for very helpful advice and comments on earlier drafts of this revision. Of course, we take responsibility for the content of the entry, and any mistakes are ours.

Copyright © 2020 by
Jennifer Hawkins <>
Louis C. Charland

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