First published Wed Sep 16, 2009; substantive revision Wed May 4, 2022

This entry focuses on clinical delusions. Although the nature of delusions is controversial, delusions are often characterised as unusual beliefs that appear in the context of mental distress. Indeed, clinical delusions are a symptom of psychiatric disorders such as dementia and schizophrenia, and they also characterize delusional disorders. They can be associated with depression and obsessive compulsive disorder as well. The following case descriptions include an instance of erotomania, the delusion that we are loved by a person of higher status; an instance of Cotard delusion, the delusion that we are dead or disembodied; and a delusion of persecution, the belief that someone intends to cause us harm.

She realized he was empty without her and was pursuing her, but enemies were preventing them from uniting. The enemies included a number of people: people in her family, her classmates, neighbours and many other persons who were plotting to keep them apart. She knew that her conclusions were accurate because he would send messages to her proving his love. These messages would often present themselves as the license plates on cars of a certain state, the color purple and other indications that she received from the environment that proved to her that he loved her. (Jordan et al. 2006, p. 787)

She repeatedly stated that she was dead and was adamant that she had died two weeks prior to the assessment (i.e. around the time of her admission on 19/11/2004). She was extremely distressed and tearful as she related these beliefs, and was very anxious to learn whether or not the hospital she was in, was ‘heaven’. When asked how she thought she had died, LU replied ‘I don’t know how. Now I know that I had a flu and came here on 19th November. Maybe I died of the flu.’ Interestingly, LU also reported that she felt ‘a bit strange towards my boyfriend. I cannot kiss him, it feels strange – although I know that he loves me.’ (McKay and Cipolotti 2007, p. 353)

The Alien Beings were from outer space, and of all the people in the world, only I was aware of them. The Alien Beings soon took over my body and removed me from it. They took me to a faraway place of beaches and sunlight and placed an Alien in my body to act like me. […] I also saw that the Aliens were starting to take over other people as well, removing them from their bodies and putting Aliens in their place. Of course, the other people were unaware of what was happening; I was the only person in the world who had the power to know it. At this point I determined that the Aliens were involved in a huge conspiracy against the world (Payne 1992, pp. 726).

The category of delusions is not homogeneous. Some delusions have highly implausible content (as in the case of Cotard delusion). Other highly implausible delusions include mirrored self misidentification (the delusion that the person in the mirror is not our own reflection but a stranger), and the Capgras delusion (the delusion that our spouse or relative has been replaced by an impostor). Some other delusions can have plausible contents and can even be true. We can have the delusion that we are an uncomprehended genius, that our spouse is unfaithful, or that our neighbor is a terrorist, and these may happen to be true beliefs. What makes all the above examples instances of delusion is that they resist counterevidence and are not easily given up in the face of challenges.

Typically, delusions are reported sincerely and with conviction, although behavior is not always perfectly consistent with the content of the delusions and the conviction in the delusional belief can fluctuate. Another common feature of delusions is that they threaten wellbeing. Experiencing a delusion can be a source of distress, and compromise good functioning. For instance, if as a result of a delusion of persecution, we believe that we are followed by malevolent others, we may live in a state of great anxiety and fear for our life and the life of our loved ones. The delusion may be the reason why we interrupt our studies, give up our job, stop communicating with our family, and so on. That said, some delusions can be meaningful and empowering, at least temporarily, and gaining insight into the delusional nature of the belief can cause depression.

The following first-personal account of delusions illustrates the pervasive effects that delusions can have on people’s lives:

I increasingly heard voices (which I’d always called “loud thoughts” or “impulses with words”) commanding me to take destructive action. I concluded that other people were putting these “loud thoughts” in my head and controlling my behavior in an effort to ruin my life. I smelled blood and decaying matter where no blood or decaying matter could be found (for example, in the classrooms at school). I had difficulty concentrating, I fantasized excessively, and I had trouble sleeping and eating. (Bockes 1985, p. 488)

This entry can only address some of the philosophical debates centered on delusions. Section 1 provides an overview of the philosophical significance of delusions. Section 2 introduces the issues surrounding the controversial definition of delusions, and explains some of the common distinctions between types of delusions. Section 3 discusses the most prominent theoretical approaches to the nature and formation of delusions and the conceptual questions emerging from such approaches. Section 4 reviews some of the most discussed themes in the philosophical literature on delusions: whether delusions are irrational; whether they are beliefs; and to what extent they overlap with cases of non-clinical beliefs such as self-deception and beliefs in conspiracy theories.

The examination of the issues above culminates in the attempt to understand what makes delusions pathological, if indeed they are pathological, and how they differ from other beliefs that are considered unusual or irrational.

1. The Philosophical Significance of Delusion

In recent years, delusions have attracted the attention of philosophers in at least three distinct areas. Here is a summary of the general issues that have been addressed and some examples of specific debates for each of these areas.

1.1 Delusions in the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of psychology

In the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of psychology, the study of delusions raises conceptual questions about intentionality, rationality, agency, and self-knowledge. Moreover, it invites us to reconsider how perception, cognition, affect, and intentional behavior interact. There have been various attempts to understand the cognitive processes responsible for the formation of delusions, based on the assumption, widely shared in cognitive neuropsychology, that understanding such processes can lead to the formulation of more empirically sound theories of neurotypical cognition (see Marshall and Halligan 1996, pp. 5–6; Langdon and Coltheart 2000, pp. 185–6). Understanding how delusions come about, whether they are responses to unusual experiences, and whether a reasoning deficit is responsible for their development can shed light on standard processes of belief formation. One basic question is what comes first, perceptual experience or belief (see Campbell 2001). Are delusions frames of mind that, once adopted, alter our way of seeing the world? Or do they emerge as explanations for our unusual perceptual experiences? Does having delusions signal a breakdown of rationality, and if so, what makes us irrational when we sincerely report a delusional belief?

Another debated issue is whether delusions should be characterized as beliefs at all, given that they share features with acts of imagination (Currie 2000), desires (Egan 2009), acceptances (Frankish 2009), and perceptual states (Hohwy and Rajan 2012). Can delusions qualify as beliefs when they are inconsistent with other things that we believe? And when they fail to be responsive to the evidence available to us? Bayne and Pacherie 2005, Bortolotti 2009 and 2012, and Miyazono 2018 have offered defenses of the doxastic nature of delusions, whereas other authors have emphasised the differences between delusions and typical instances of belief. An interesting position defended by Schwitzgebel 2012 is that delusions are in-between states, because they match the dispositional profile of beliefs only in part. Schwitzgebel’s position has been challenged by philosophers who argue that delusions play a belief-role in explaining and predicting intentional action (see Bortolotti 2012; Bayne and Hattiangadi 2013). More recently, the doxastic nature of delusions has been further called into question by authors emphasising the experiential or social nature of delusions (see for instance, Feyaerts et al. 2021; Bell, Raihani and Wilkinson 2020; Miyazono and Salice 2021). The nature of delusions is still a hotly debated issue.

Another strand of investigation in this area is whether the presence of delusions signals a failure of self knowledge. There are several apparent manifestations of poor knowledge of the self in delusions (see Kircher and David 2003; Amador and David 1998). When we are attributed delusions of passivity, we may not recognize a movement as our own, and thus have a distorted sense of our personal boundaries; in thought insertion, we come to believe that there is a thought in our head that has been placed there by a third party (e.g., Stephens and Graham 2000). Sometimes we act or feel in a way that is incompatible with the content of our delusions, or are unable to endorse the content of our delusion with reasons that are regarded by others as good reasons (e.g., Gallagher 2009; Bortolotti and Broome 2008, 2009; Fernández 2010). Finally, the presence of delusions may make it difficult for us to remember our experienced past accurately and to plan for the future, because we are unreliable autobiographers (e.g., Gerrans 2009, 2014).

1.2 Delusions in the philosophy of psychiatry

In addition to the literature on the etiology of delusions and their status as beliefs, there is also a growing literature in the philosophy of psychiatry on other aspects of the nature of delusions and on the impact of delusions on people’s wellbeing. This literature aims at addressing the conceptualization of delusional experience and delusional belief in the wider context of psychiatric research and clinical practice. General debates in the philosophy of psychiatry are often applied to delusions more specifically, such as whether delusions are natural kinds (e.g., Samuels 2009), and whether they are pathological beliefs (e.g., Fulford 2004; Bortolotti 2020).

For authors who claim that delusions are pathological, there are at least six possible (non-exclusive) answers to what makes delusions pathological:

  1. Delusions are pathological because they present themselves as what they are not. They resemble beliefs but do not share some of the core features of beliefs such as action guidance, and are irrational to a higher degree than, or in a qualitatively different way from, irrational beliefs (for a discussion of aspects of this view, see Currie and Jureidini 2001 and Frankish 2009).

  2. Delusions are pathological because they are signs that we inhabit a fictional, non-actual reality and no longer share some fundamental beliefs and practices with the people around us (for distinct versions of this view, see Stephens and Graham 2004 and 2006; Sass 1994; Gallagher 2009; Rhodes and Gipps 2008).

  3. Delusions are pathological because they are puzzling and unsettling. They defy folk-psychological expectations. This also makes it difficult for an interpreter to rationalize and understand our behavior when we report delusions (versions of this idea are explored in Campbell 2001 and Murphy 2012).

  4. Delusions are pathological because (differently from many nondelusional and yet irrational beliefs) they negatively affect our wellbeing impairing functioning and causing social isolation and withdrawal (see Garety and Freeman 1999 for a multidimensional account of delusions; Bolton 2008 for a harm-related account of mental illness in general; Pierre 2020 for differences between beliefs in conspiracy theories and delusions).

  5. Delusions are pathological because they have forensic implications, that is, implications for judgements about whether we can be held legally accountable for our actions. Hohwy and Rajan 2012 argue that delusions are attributed to us when others notice significant impairments in our decision-making and autonomy. Miyazono 2015 claims that our responsibility-grounding capacities are compromised when we have delusions.

  6. Delusions are pathological because of their etiology. Differently from other beliefs, they are produced by mechanisms that are dysfunctional or defective. For instance, their formation process may be characterized by perceptual aberrations or cognitive deficits (McKay and Dennett 2009; Coltheart et al. 2010).

The challenge for (i) is to account for the difference in kind between the irrationality of common beliefs that are ungrounded and resistant to change (such as superstitious beliefs or beliefs in alien abduction) and the irrationality of delusions. There is abundance of evidence that delusional phenomena are widespread in the normal population, which suggests that a sharp dichotomy between the normal and the pathological would be at best a simplification (see Maher 1974, Johns and van Os 2001, Bentall 2003, 2018, and Sullivan-Bissett 2020).

Accounts in (ii) and (iii) may be plausible for some delusions that appear to defy commonsense and are accompanied by a certain type of heightened experience, but do not apply equally well to more mundane delusions such as delusions of jealousy or persecution. Moreover, it is not always obvious that a delusion makes our behavior particularly difficult to explain or predict. In some cases, delusions can help make sense of previous adversities or unusual experiences, and even give meaning to our lives (Gunn and Bortolotti 2018, Ritunnano and Bortolotti 2021).

The view described in (iv) is very attractive because it captures the distinction between delusions and other irrational beliefs in terms of the effects on other aspects of our psychological and social life. However, using the notions of wellbeing and harm in accounts of delusions can be problematic. For some people, living with the delusion may be preferable to living without the delusion: ceasing to believe that I am a famous TV broadcaster after many years, and starting to accept that I have been mentally unwell instead, can cause low self esteem leading me to depression and suicidal thoughts (see the literature on the insight paradox, e.g. Belvederi Murri et al. 2016). Indeed, in the philosophical and psychiatric literature there have been recent explorations of the idea that some delusions are adaptive in some sense, psychologically, biologically, and even epistemically (McKay and Dennett 2009, Fineberg and Corlett 2016, Bortolotti 2016, Ritunnano, Humpston and Broome 2021).

Challenges for a forensic account of delusions in (v) lie in the heterogeneity of the behavior exhibited by those who experience delusions. Although some delusions are accompanied by severe failures of autonomous decision-making and give rise to actions for which the agent is not held accountable, it is not obvious that these cases are generalisable. Does the mere presence of delusions indicate lack of autonomy or responsibility? Broome et al. (2010) and Bortolotti et al. (2014) discuss case studies raising pressing issues about the role of delusions in criminal action. Further, recent literature on whether people with delusions can be vulnerable to epistemic injustice, suggests that the presence of delusions does not undermine agency (Sanati and Kyratsous 2015).

The etiological answer to the question why delusions are pathological in (vi) needs to be better explored. So far, the consensus seems to be that reasoning biases affect neurotypical reasoning, and are not present only in people with delusions. Perceptual anomalies can explain the formation of some delusions, but are not always a core factor in the formation of all delusions. A problem with hypothesis evaluation may be at the origin of all delusions, but there is no agreement as to whether the problem is a permanent deficit or a mere performance error. Thus, it is not clear whether etiological considerations can support a categorical distinction between pathological and non-pathological beliefs. The theory that delusions are due to a disruption of prediction-error signals may be able to vindicate this approach, although it is not clear what the link would be between such a disruption and the pathological nature of the beliefs adopted as a result of it.

1.3 Moral psychology and neuroethics

Moral psychology and neuroethics investigate the implications of the debates on the nature of delusions for the way in which our rights and responsibilities are affected by having delusions. Does having delusions undermine our capacity to consent to treatment or to participate in decision making?

It is also important to understand whether we can be regarded as morally responsible for our actions if we engage in morally problematic behaviour or commit acts of violence or other crimes that are motivated by our delusions. As a consequence of the failures of rationality and self knowledge that characterize some delusions, we may appear as if we are ‘in two minds’, and we may not always present ourselves as unified agents with a coherent set of beliefs and preferences (e.g., Kennett and Matthews 2009). As a result, we may be judged to be (locally or temporally) unable to exercise our capacity for autonomous thought and action.

Another important question concerns the possibility that we are vulnerable to epistemic injustice when we report unusual beliefs that are regarded as delusional and symptomatic of mental distress. Epistemic injustice occurs when our contribution to knowledge is dismissed due to negative stereotypes associated with aspects of our identity (e.g., “Women are bad at maths” or “Black people have lower IQ than white people”). In the case of delusions, a risk is that other people come to dismiss our contribution to a conversation or come to consider us as lacking authority or credibility based on the fact that some of our beliefs are delusional (Sanati and Kyratsous 2015). But the presence of delusions does not necessarily speak against our overall capacity to produce and share knowledge, so dismissing our contribution due to our having some delusional beliefs may be unfair.

2. The Nature of Delusion

How are delusions defined?

2.1 Defining delusion

Definitions of delusions are based on the behavior we exhibit when experiencing a delusion rather than on the underlying mechanisms responsible for our behavior. The behavior associated with having delusions is often described in epistemic terms, using concepts such as belief, truth, rationality, evidence, and justification. For instance, delusions may be defined as beliefs held with conviction in spite of having little empirical support (where the epistemic concepts are in italics). According to the Glossary in the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM-IV 2000, p. 765 and DSM-5 2013, p. 819), delusions are false beliefs based on incorrect inference about external reality that persist despite evidence to the contrary:

Delusion. A false belief based on incorrect inference about external reality that is firmly sustained despite what almost everyone else believes and despite what constitutes incontrovertible and obvious proof or evidence to the contrary. The belief is not one ordinarily accepted by other members of the person’s culture or subculture (e.g., it is not an article of religious faith). When a false belief involves a value judgment, it is regarded as a delusion only when the judgment is so extreme as to defy credibility.

Philosophers interested in the nature of delusions have raised a number of questions about the DSM definition. According to the challenges, the DSM definition of delusions cannot capture what is distinctive about delusions, and does not tell us what makes them pathological.

Delusions are generally accepted to be beliefs which (a) are held with great conviction; (b) defy rational counter-argument; (c) and would be dismissed as false or bizarre by members of the same socio-cultural group. A more precise definition is probably impossible since delusions are contextually dependent, multiply determined and multidimensional. Exemplars of the delusion category that fulfil all the usual definitional attributes are easy to find, so it would be premature to abandon the construct entirely. Equally, in everyday practice there are patients we regard as deluded whose beliefs in isolation may not meet standard delusional criteria. In this way a delusion is more like a syndrome than a symptom. (Gilleen and David 2005, pp. 5–6)

Counterexamples are easily found to the DSM definition of delusion: there are delusions that do not satisfy all of the proposed criteria, and there are irrational beliefs that do, even though they are not commonly regarded as delusional. In the passage below, Coltheart summarizes the main problems with the DSM definition:

1. Couldn’t a true belief be a delusion, as long as the believer had no good reason for holding the belief? 2. Do delusions really have to be beliefs – might they not instead be imaginings that are mistaken for beliefs by the imaginer? 3. Must all delusions be based on inference? 4. Aren’t there delusions that are not about external reality? ‘I have no bodily organs’ or ‘my thoughts are not mine but are inserted into my mind by others’ are beliefs expressed by some people with schizophrenia, yet are not about external reality; aren’t these nevertheless still delusional beliefs? 5. Couldn’t a belief held by all members of one’s community still be delusional? (Coltheart 2007, p. 1043)

The Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders has been updated through the years and although no changes appear in the Glossary, some interesting shifts can be noted in the description of delusions which appear in the section on schizophrenia (compare DSM-IV, p. 275 and DSM-IV-TR p. 299 with DSM-5, p. 87). The new description seems to take into account some of the issues identified by Coltheart and others. For instance, in the DSM-5 delusions are described not as false, but as “fixed beliefs that are not amenable to change in light of conflicting evidence”. Leaving the details aside, some general comments apply to the style of the DSM definitions and descriptions of delusions. In so far as delusions are defined and described as irrational beliefs, it is difficult for them to be uniquely identified because their epistemic ‘faults’ are shared with other symptoms of psychiatric disorders, and with non-pathological beliefs. But definitions such as the ones in the DSM cannot probably be expected to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for the phenomena they aim to define. At best, they can prove diagnostically useful and guide further research by conveniently delimiting an area of investigation worth pursuing.

A widespread critique of the DSM definition is that not enough weight is given to the consequences of having the delusion for our wellbeing. Some other definitions of delusion make explicit reference to “disrupted functioning” (e.g., McKay et al. 2005a, p. 315). Freeman 2008 (pp. 24–26) highlights the multi-dimensional nature of delusions and lists among the main characteristics of delusions not just that delusions are unfounded, firmly held, and resistant to change, but also that they are preoccupying and distressing, and that they interfere with the social dimension of our lives.

2.2 Types of delusion

2.2.1 Functional versus organic

Delusions used to be divided into functional and organic. Now the distinction is regarded by most obsolete, at least in its original characterization. A delusion was called ‘organic’ if it was the result of brain damage (usually due to injuries affecting the right cerebral hemisphere). A delusion was called ‘functional’ if it had no known organic cause and was explained primarily via psychodynamic or motivational factors. It has become more and more obvious with the development of neuropsychiatry that the two categories overlap. Today, the received view is that there is a biological basis for all types of delusions, but that in some cases it has not been identified with precision yet. Some studies have reported very little difference between the phenomenology and symptomatology of delusions that were once divided into organic and functional (Johnstone et al. 1988).

2.2.2 Monothematic versus polythematic

When we have persecutory delusions, we believe that we are treated with hostility, and that harm is coming our way. When we have delusions of mirrored-self misidentification, we usually preserve the capacity to recognize images in the mirror as reflections, but do not recognize our own face reflected in the mirror. So, we come to think that there is a person in the mirror, a stranger who looks very much like we do. In either case, the delusion is resistant to counterevidence and can have pervasive effects on our lives. One of the differences is that persecutory delusions are polythematic whereas delusions of mirrored-self misidentification are monothematic.

Polythematic delusions extend to more than one theme, where the themes can be interrelated. Delusions of persecution are very common polythematic delusions. We may believe to be surrounded by alien forces controlling our actions, where the alien forces are slowly taking over people’s bodies including our own. In that case, we have delusions of persecution and delusions of alien control. Typically, these delusions are interrelated and are manifest in the interpretation of most events occurring in our lives. Other examples of delusions that can be polythematic are the belief that we are geniuses but are misunderstood and underestimated by others (grandeur), and the belief that we are secretly loved by a famous or powerful person (erotomania).

Delusions of mirrored-self misidentification, instead, are monothematic. Apart from the content of delusion itself, we may report no other unusual belief. Thus, when we systematically fail to recognize our image in the mirror and come to think that there is a person identical to us on the other side, and we have no other unusual belief, we have a monothematic delusion. Other examples of delusions that are usually monothematic and are discussed in the philosophical literature are Capgras and Cotard. The Capgras delusion involves the belief that a dear one (a close relative or the spouse) has been replaced by an impostor. The Cotard delusion involves the belief that we are disembodied or dead.

2.2.3 Circumscribed versus elaborated

Monothematic delusions tend to be circumscribed whereas polythematic delusions tend to be elaborated (see Davies and Coltheart 2000 for a more detailed explanation and some examples). The distinction between circumscribed and elaborated delusions is relevant to the level of integration between our delusions and our other intentional states and to the extent to which our endorsement of the delusion is manifested in verbal reports and observable behavior. Delusions might be more or less circumscribed. A delusion is circumscribed if it does not lead to the formation of other intentional states whose content is significantly related to the content of the delusion, nor does it have pervasive effects on behavior. For instance, a man with Capgras who believes that his wife has been substituted by an impostor but shows no preoccupation for his wife and does not go and look for her, appears to have a circumscribed delusion. A delusion can be elaborated, if we form other beliefs that revolve around the theme of the delusion. For instance, a woman with Capgras can develop paranoid thoughts related to the content of her delusion, along the lines that the person impersonating her husband has evil intentions and will cause her harm when the occasion presents itself.

2.2.4 Primary versus secondary

Depending on whether the delusion has some understandable origin and we can defend it with arguments, it can be described as primary or secondary. The traditional way of distinguishing primary from secondary delusions relied on the notion that primary delusions ‘arise out of nowhere’ (Jaspers 1963). This traditional characterization of the distinction is problematic, because it is difficult to establish whether there are antecedents of the delusion, and for other methodological and clinical reasons (e.g., Miller and Karoni 1996, p. 489). A delusion may arise out of our previous adverse experience that is not known to other, and some studies show that even very unusual beliefs can be made sense of in the context of our lives (Gunn and Larkin 2020).

New readings of the distinction between primary and secondary have been provided in the philosophical literature on delusions, where distinctions are made between people who can endorse the content of their delusions with reasons, and people who cannot (e.g. Bortolotti and Broome 2008 talk about authored and un-authored delusions; Aimola Davies and Davies 2009 distinguish between pathologies of belief and pathological beliefs on similar lines).

3. Theoretical Approaches to Delusion

There are several theoretical approaches to delusion formation which attempt to explain the surface features of delusions by reference to unusual experiences, reasoning biases, neuropsychological deficits, motivational factors, and prediction errors, but the task of describing the behavioral manifestations of delusions, and reconstructing their etiology is made difficult by the variation observed both in the form and in the content of delusions. When the distinction between functional and organic delusion was still widely accepted, functional delusions were primarily explained on the basis of psychodynamic factors, whereas organic delusions mostly received a neurobiological explanation. At the present stage of empirical investigation in the formation of delusional states, the received view is that all delusions are due to neuropsychological deficits, which might include motivational factors.

3.1 Neuropsychological and psychodynamic accounts of delusion

According to psychodynamic accounts, no neurobiological deficits are needed in the explanation of how delusions are formed. Rather, delusions are caused by motivational factors. For instance, delusions of persecution would be developed in order to protect us from low self-esteem and depression, and would be due to the attribution of negative events to some malevolent other rather than to ourselves. The delusion would be part of a defense mechanism. Other delusions, such as Capgras, have also received a psychodynamic interpretation: a young woman believes that her father has been replaced by a stranger looking just like him in order to make her sexual desire for him less socially objectionable. In this way, the delusion would have the function to reduce anxiety and sense of guilt. Psychodynamic accounts of the Capgras delusion have been strongly criticized on the basis of recent findings about the type of brain damage that characterizes Capgras, affecting the face recognition system. For delusions that are supposed to play a defensive or self-enhancing role (e.g., persecution, anosognosia, and erotomania), psychodynamic accounts or hybrid accounts featuring a combination of neurobiological and motivational factors are very popular.

Neuropsychological accounts of delusions offer very satisfactory accounts of some delusions, as one can often identify with some precision the damaged region of the brain and the causal link between the damage and its psychological manifestations, culminating with the formation of the delusion. Neuropsychological accounts of other delusions – once regarded as ‘functional’ – are also being developed and explored. For some delusions, hybrid accounts have been proposed, where a combination of different factors (including motivation) significantly contribute to the formation of the delusion (e.g. McKay et al. 2007). One such case seems to be the Reverse Othello Syndrome, the delusion that a romantic partner is still faithful to us when this is no longer the case. The belief can be regarded as a defense against the suffering that the acknowledgement of the infidelity of our partner would cause (see example in Butler 2000 as cited and discussed by McKay et al. 2005a, p. 313).

3.2 One-factor, two-factor, and prediction-error theories of delusion formation

According to popular neuropsychological accounts, delusions are the result of an unusual perceptual experience (Maher 1974); an unusual experience accompanied by reasoning biases (Garety and Freeman 1999; Garety et al. 2001; McKay 2012); a breakdown of certain aspects of perception and cognition including a deficit in hypothesis or belief evaluation (Langdon and Coltheart 2000, Coltheart et al. 2010); or a failure of predictive coding (Fletcher and Frith 2009; Corlett et al. 2010).

For some one-factor theorists (Maher 1974), the delusion is a reasonable hypothesis given the strangeness of the experience, or the strange experience is in a sensory modality or at a processing stage where further reality testing is not available (Hohwy and Rosenberg 2005). But other one-factor theorists (e.g. Gerrans 2002a) argue that, although it may be reasonable at first to articulate a delusional hypothesis to explain unusual experience, it is not rational to maintain the delusional hypothesis in the face of counterevidence. Recent defences of the one-factor theory have emphasised that cognitive features in people who develop delusional beliefs are within the normal range and there is no need to postulate any reasoning deficit to explain delusion formation (Sullivan-Bissett 2018, 2020).

For two-factor theorists (Davies et al. 2001; Stone and Young 1997), the delusion is formed in order to explain a puzzling experience or a failed prediction, but the presence of the experience or the failed prediction is not sufficient for the formation of the delusion. The mechanism responsible for the formulation of the delusional hypothesis must be affected by reasoning biases or reasoning deficits. Developments of this theory have been offered by Aimola Davies and Davies 2009, by Coltheart et al. 2010, by McKay 2012, and by Davies and Egan 2013.

In the two-factor theory framework, an unusual event is responsible for the formation of the delusion. The young woman who thinks that her father has been replaced by an impostor would form this belief because she has reduced autonomic response to familiar faces (factor 1), and this affects her capacity to recognize the face of the man in front of her as her father’s face, even if she can judge that the face is identical (or virtually identical) to that of her father. But this unusual event (due to a reduction of autonomic response) is not the only factor responsible for the formation of the Capgras delusion. In order to explain why the thought that a dear one has been replaced by an impostor is adopted as a plausible explanation of the unusual event, a factor 2 is required, and this can be deficit at the level of hypothesis evaluation (Coltheart 2007), or the presence of exaggerated attributional or data-gathering biases, such as the tendency to ‘jump to conclusion’ on the basis of limited evidence (Garety and Freeman 1999). In a more recent version of the two-factor model, the problem is no longer identified with the adoption of the delusional belief, which is described as the best explanation for the unusual event. Rather, the problem lies with failing to give up the delusional belief in the face of overwhelming counterevidence after its adoption (Coltheart et al. 2010).

In another version of the two-factor theory (McKay 2012), the young woman adopts the impostor hypothesis because she suffers from a neuropsychological impairment responsible for the unusual event (factor 1) resulting in the anomalous experience. But the unusual event is not the only factor responsible for the formation of the delusion. The young woman also has a bias towards explanatory adequacy (factor 2) which leads her to accept a hypothesis that matches her unusual experience even when such hypothesis has a low prior probability and conflicts with some of her existing beliefs. The Capgras delusion is adopted because the delusional hypothesis explains (‘fits’) the data, that is, the absence of a feeling of familiarity towards a face that should be well-known.

According to a delusion formation theory inspired by predictive coding, we form expectations about our experience in line with a general model of how the world is. Greater attention is paid to those events which defy expectations, as they might require a revision of our model of the world, the one we have adopted up to that point. The discrepancy between what we expect and the information we take in is an important part of the way learning occurs. When our expectations are not met, a prediction error is coded, and our model of the world is updated accordingly. A prediction-error signal is disrupted when events invested of special significance (in psychosis this may be due to dopamine dysregulation) cause us to update our current beliefs about reality, which happen to be correct. The woman who sees her father and does not get the usual autonomic response experiences an unexpected event which gives rise to a prediction error. The reaction to the signal is an attempt to explain the unexpected event (‘This is not my father!’). This results in the formation of a delusion (Corlett et al. 2007) where the formation of the delusion is principally an “error of learning” (Fine and Corlett 2016).

Some hybrid explanations of delusion formation have been proposed (see e.g. Galbraith 2014), for instance combining insights from the two-factor theory and the predictive coding account (e.g., Miyazono and McKay 2019).

3.3 Bottom-up versus top-down theories of delusion

Another distinction, introduced and developed in the philosophical literature on delusions, is between bottom-up and top-down theories, where these labels are meant to refer to the direction of the causal relation between experience and belief in the formation of the delusion. Bottom-up theorists argue that the direction of causal explanation is from the experience to the belief. Top-down theorists argue that the direction of causal explanation is from the belief to the experience. Notice that not everybody finds the distinction useful. For instance, Hohwy and Rosenberg (2005) and Hohwy (2004) argue that the distinction loses its appeal in the framework proposed by prediction-error theorists given that delusion formation involves both bottom-up and top-down processes. Our prior expectations affect the way in which the perceptual signals are processed and give rise to unusual experiences. Then, the unusual experiences go through reality testing and are subject to further interpretation, after which they become a central factor in the formation of the delusional belief.

For bottom-up theorists, delusions involve modifications of the belief system that are caused by ‘strange experiences’ due to organic malfunction (Bayne and Pacherie 2004a; Davies et al. 2001). For instance, I experience people watching me with suspicion or hostility, and as a result I form the hypothesis that they intend to cause me harm; or something does not feel right when I see my sister’s face, and as a result I come to believe that the person I am looking at is not really my sister but an impostor.

The proximal cause of the delusional belief is a certain highly unusual experience (Bayne and Pacherie 2004a, p. 2).

What would top-down theorists say about the same examples? I believe that people want to harm me, and as a result I perceive them as looking at me malevolently; or I believe that someone looking almost identical to my sister has replaced her, and as a result the person claiming to be my sister doesn’t look to me as my sister does. The top-down thesis about delusion formation has been proposed especially for monothematic delusions such as Capgras (Campbell 2001; Eilan 2000) and for delusions of passivity, when people report that there are external influences on their thoughts and actions (Sass 1994; Graham and Stephens 1994; Stephens and Graham 2000).

[D]elusion is a matter of top-down disturbance in some fundamental beliefs of the subject, which may consequently affect experiences and actions (Campbell 2001, p. 89).

Both bottom-up and top-down theories face challenges: whereas top-down theorists need to account for where the belief comes from, and why it is so successful in affecting perceptual experiences, bottom-up theorists are pressed to explain why people tend to endorse a bizarre hypothesis to explain their unusual experiences, given that hypotheses with higher probability should be available to them.

Within the bottom-up camp, further divisions apply. For some, it is correct to say that the delusional belief explains the experience. Others claim that the delusional belief is an endorsement of the experience. According to the explanationist account (Maher 1999; Stone and Young 1997), the content of experience is vaguer than the content of the delusion, and the delusion plays the role of one potential explanation for the experience. For instance, in the Capgras delusion, the young woman’s experience would be that of someone looking very much like her father but not being her father. The delusion would be an explanation of the fact that the man looks like her father, but his face feels strange to her: the man must be an impostor. In persecution, the experience would be that of people behaving with hostility towards us, and the delusion would be an explanation why they behave with hostility: they intend to cause us harm. This account leaves it open that the same experience could be explained differently (i.e., without any appeal to the delusional hypothesis).

According to the rival account, the endorsement account (Bayne and Pacherie 2004a; Pacherie et al. 2006; Bongiorno 2019), the content of the experience is already as conceptually rich as the content of the delusion. The delusion is not an explanation of the experience, but an endorsement of it, a way of taking the experience at face value: the content of the experience is taken as veridical and believed. In Capgras, the young woman’s experience is that of a man looking very much like her father but being an impostor, and when the experience is endorsed, it becomes the delusional belief that her father has been replaced by an impostor. In persecution, our experience is that of people intending to cause us harm, and when it is endorsed, it becomes the delusional belief that those people intend to cause us harm.

There are further issues relevant to the debate between explanationism and endorsement theory, including whether for the person with the delusion the unusual experience needs to be conscious and whether there needs to be an inferential step between experience and belief (Bongiorno and Bortolotti 2019).

4. Delusions and the Continuity Thesis

This section focuses on four debates that have animated the philosophical literature on delusions in recent years. They can all be seen as attempts to examine the extent to which our delusions are markedly different from other beliefs we have and whether they can be described as pathological in some sense.

4.1 Are delusions irrational?

There is no doubt that the definitions of delusions in DSM-IV and DSM-5 characterise delusions as irrational beliefs. However, in the philosophical literature on delusions, the status of delusions as irrational beliefs does not go unchallenged. Are delusions really irrational? If so, in what way?

In a number of influential papers Brendan Maher (1974, 1988, 1999, 2003) argues that delusions are not ill-formed beliefs, and that there is nothing irrational in the relationship between the evidence supporting the delusional hypothesis and the formation of such a hypothesis. According to Maher, the unusual nature of the delusion is due to the unusual nature of the experiences on the basis of which the delusion is formed. By reference to Maher’s model, Blaney (1999) describes delusions as ‘false but reasonable’. Some difficulties have been identified with this strategy. A first difficulty is that there seem to be people who suffer from the same type of brain damage, and plausibly have the same experience, as the people who develop the delusion, but do not accept any delusional hypotheses. How can these people avoid forming a delusion? One possible answer is that those who have unusual experiences and do not form the delusion have hypothesis-evaluation mechanisms that work efficiently, and thus end up rejecting hypotheses with low probability and plausibility. But those who have unusual experiences and do form the delusion are instead affected by an additional problem, maybe a deficit at the level of hypothesis evaluation, which can be conceived as a failure of rationality.

On Maher’s view, […] [i]t follows that anyone who has suffered neuropsychological damage that reduces the affective response to faces should exhibit the Capgras delusion; anyone with a right hemisphere lesion that paralyzes the left limbs and leaves the subject with a sense that the limbs are alien should deny ownership of the limbs; anyone with a loss of the ability to interact fluently with mirrors should exhibit mirrored-self misidentification, and so on. However, these predictions from Maher’s theory are clearly falsified by examples from the neuropsychological literature (Davies et al. 2001, p. 144).

Another difficulty with Maher’s original account of delusions as ‘false but reasonable’ is that, even if the unusual nature of the experience were to satisfactorily explain the acceptance of the delusional hypothesis and the formation of the delusion, this would not be sufficient to guarantee that the behavior associated with having delusions is overall rational. An explanation is needed for why delusions are maintained in the face of counterevidence once the delusional hypothesis has been formed and endorsed (see Gerrans 2002a). One aspect of the notion of rationality for beliefs is that we are disposed to revise or abandon beliefs that seem to be in conflict with the acquired evidence. The “incorrigibility” of delusions speaks in favor of their being held irrationally.

So, one argument for the view that delusions are irrational comes from an examination of the relationship between the content of the delusion and the available evidence. Resistance to revising or abandoning the delusion in the face of powerful counterevidence or counterargument is a sign of irrationality: when we have delusions, we may ignore relevant evidence or attempt to defend our delusional beliefs from apparent objections with obvious confabulations. Often these attempts are deeply perplexing, and the reasons offered for believing the content of our delusions do not appear as be good reasons to others: in one of the examples of delusions offered at the start of this entry, a woman incorrectly believed that a man was in love with her and her evidence for that claim was that he was sending her secret love messages hidden in the license plates on cars of a certain state. However, the notion that delusions fail to be responsive to evidence has also been challenged: for instance, Flores 2021 convincingly argues that when we have delusions we have the capacity to respond to evidence that has a bearing on the content of the delusions, but other factors contribute to the fact that we resist counterevidence, such as motivational factors.

One reason why maintaining delusional beliefs may be seen as irrational is that the content of the delusions is often in tension with the content of our other beliefs, or with our behavior (Gerrans 2000, p. 114 and Young 2000, p. 49) . That is, when a delusion is introduced and maintained within our belief system, it creates inconsistencies and does not always drive the actions we would expect given its content. Here are some examples. In the course of the same interview, a woman may claim that her husband died four years earlier and was cremated and that her husband is a patient in the same hospital where she is (Breen et al. 2000, p. 91). In Capgras delusion, people may worry about the disappearance of their loved one, but also be cooperative and even flirtatious with the alleged impostor (see Lucchelli and Spinnler 2007). This suggests that delusions do not always give rise to appropriate action (Bleuler 1950; Sass 2001), although they must be reported either spontaneously or after questioning, or they could not be diagnosed as delusions. How can our apparent strong conviction in the content of the delusion be squared with our failure to act on it? One hypothesis is that the content of the delusion is not genuinely believed. Another hypothesis is that we genuinely believe the content of the delusion but do not convert it into action, because we fail to acquire or maintain the motivation to act on the delusion. This would be consistent with negative symptoms of schizophrenia, as Bortolotti and Broome 2012 argue.

One should not be too impressed by evidence of ‘behavioural inertia’, however, as there are also many examples in the literature of delusions driving action. Affected by perceptual delusional bicephaly, the delusion that one has two heads, a man who believed that the second head belonged to his wife’s gynecologist attempted to attack it with an axe. When the attack failed he attempted it to shoot it down and as a result he was hospitalized with gunshot wounds (Ames 1984). Cases of Cotard delusion have been reported where people stop eating and bathing themselves as a consequence of believing that they are dead (Young and Leafhead 1996).

Relevant to the question whether delusions are rational, the empirical literature suggests that our reasoning performance when we have delusions reflects data-gathering and attribution biases. For instance, it has been argued that people with delusions ‘jump to conclusions’; need less evidence to be convinced that a hypothesis is true (Garety 1991; Huq et al. 1988; Garety and Freeman 1999); and are more hasty in their decisions (Moritz and Woodward 2005; Fine et al. 2007). Other biases have also been noted: people with delusions of persecution tend to attribute the responsibility of negative events to other people (e.g., McKay et al. 2005b) whereas in the Cotard delusion there seems to be a tendency to attribute the responsibility of negative events to oneself (Young and Leafhead 1996; Gerrans 2000; McKay and Cipolotti 2007). People with delusions seem to be worse than controls at inhibiting the evidence of their senses when it conflicts with other things they know (Langdon et al. 2008b) and have an accentuated need for closure which comprises a desire for clarity and structure (see Kruglanski 1989, p. 14). These data are not by themselves sufficient to support the view that delusions are irrational, but show that we can deviate from statistically normal reasoning performance when we have delusions.

A recent debate relevant to the rationality of delusions concerns the step from unusual events to delusional beliefs. (This is primarily an issue that emerged among two-factor theorists, so the language used below is acceptable to them, but the problem can be reformulated in terms that are friendly to prediction-error theorists.) Coltheart et al. 2010 argue that the step from unusual data to belief is an instance of abductive inference, as those who end up endorsing a delusional belief need to select an explanatory hypothesis for their unusual data from a range of relevant hypotheses. Coltheart and colleagues use the Bayesian model of abductive inference which invites us to ask two questions: Which hypothesis better explains the data? Which hypothesis is the most plausible given what we already know? In the case of delusions, they argue, it is reasonable to adopt the delusional hypothesis given the data, and the good fit between hypothesis and data swamps general considerations about the overall implausibility of the hypothesis. What may not be reasonable is the fact that people with delusions hang onto their delusions even when they keep gathering evidence against it, that is, the delusional belief is not correctly updated in the light of new information. The authors argue that the information undermining the delusional hypothesis does not present itself as disconfirming evidence to the person with the delusion. Thus, the new evidence is interpreted in the light of the delusion and confabulation is used to fill the gaps. The behaviour of the person with the delusion is not very different from that of an obstinate scientist refusing to see that the new data undermines the support for the theory she is deeply committed to.

McKay 2012 offers some criticism of the account by Coltheart and colleagues, and raises the following points among others: (1) it is not a perfectly rational response to adopt the delusional hypothesis as an explanation for the unusual data, unless the probability of the delusional hypothesis before the unusual data is gathered is very high, and this is implausible given the content of some delusional hypotheses (“my wife has been replaced by an almost identical impostor”); (2) factor two as described by Coltheart and colleagues (i.e., a failure to update a belief in the light of conflicting evidence) cannot precede factor one or be acquired at the same time as factor one, because such a form of conservatism would prevent the person from adopting the delusional hypothesis in the first place. McKay’s positive account is that factor two is not a bias towards conservatism (which causes new data conflicting with the delusional hypothesis to be discounted), but a bias towards explanatory adequacy (which causes the delusional hypothesis to be adopted and maintained because it fits the abnormal data so well). McKay also argues that his account is compatible with prediction-error theories of delusion formation:

An excess of prediction error signal is what underpins the bias towards explanatory adequacy. Prediction error signals are triggered by discrepancies between the data expected and the data encountered. Such signals render salient the unexpected data and initiate a revision of beliefs to accommodate these data. If there is an excess of prediction error signal, inappropriately heightened salience is attached to the data, and belief revision is excessively accommodatory – biased towards explanatory adequacy. (McKay 2012, p. 18)

The debate is reviewed by Davies and Egan 2013 who helpfully focus on the distinction between the adoption and the maintenance of the delusional hypothesis and argue that there is no need to postulate an additional reason why we hang on to our delusions (either a bias towards conservatism or empirical adequacy). Once the delusional hypothesis is adopted as an explanation for or an endorsement of the unusual data, it is correct from a Bayesian point of view that it will not be updated or revised due to a conflict with previous beliefs. New evidence would be necessary to prompt an update or a revision. That said, a critical evaluation of the maintenance of the delusional hypothesis can still be made because the delusional belief was formed as prepotent doxastic response to unusual data and thus it is likely to be compartmentalised. As Davies and Egan themselves acknowledge, the application of idealised models of inference such as Bayesianism is somehow limited in the examination of actual belief systems. Even when no pathology is present, biases affecting the adoption and evaluation of hypotheses are going to be the (statistical) norm, which makes it difficult to uniquely identify the problem with the adoption and the persistence of delusional beliefs.

Although delusions can be irrational to a higher degree than normal beliefs, as they may be less consistent with our other beliefs and behavior and more resistant to counterevidence, they do not seem to be irrational in a qualitatively different way from nondelusional beliefs. This would suggest that there are elements of continuity between delusions and irrational beliefs, although (as we shall see in the next section) there exist sophisticated philosophical arguments challenging the continuity claim.

4.2 Are delusions beliefs?

According to the doxastic conception of delusions (dominant among psychologists and psychiatrists), delusions are belief states – it is an important diagnostic features of delusions that they can lead to action and that they can be reported with conviction, and thus that they behave as typical beliefs. (See the entry on belief.) But there is an increasingly influential view in philosophy warning that the doxastic characterization of delusions would lead to an oversimplification of the phenomenon. Although some of the alternative accounts of delusions (e.g., experiential, phenomenological, and metarepresentational) are critical towards standard doxastic conceptions, they do not necessarily deny that the phenomenon of delusions involves the formation of beliefs. Rather, the central idea seems to be that, even if we report false or irrational beliefs when we experience delusions, paying attention only to our first-order cognitive states and to the doxastic dimension of our mental life can lead to a partial and incorrect view of the phenomenon of delusions (see also Radden 2010).

Some authors emphasize the experiential and phenomenological character of delusions over the doxastic one (e.g., Sass 1994; Gold and Hohwy 2000; Feyaerts et al. 2021), and others conceive of delusions not as mere representations of our experienced reality, but as attitudes towards representations (e.g., Currie 2000; Currie and Jureidini 2001; Stephens and Graham 2006). Gallagher 2009 argues that an explanation of the delusion as a mere cognitive error would be inadequate, and introduces the terminology of delusional realities, modes of experience which involve shifts in familiarity and sense of reality and encompass cognition, bodily changes, affect, social and environmental factors.

Most of the authors who deny belief status to delusions have a negative and a positive thesis. The positive thesis is an alternative account of what delusions are. For instance, one might argue that delusions are acts of imagination mistakenly taken by a person to have belief status (Currie and Ravenscroft 2002) or empty speech acts with no intentional import (Berrios 1991). The negative thesis is an account of why delusions are not beliefs. Beliefs have certain characteristics, that is, they are formed and revised on the basis of evidence, they are consistent with other beliefs, they are action guiding in the relevant circumstances. If delusions do not share these characteristics, then they are not beliefs.

Let us list some of the arguments for the negative thesis:

  1. Beliefs are integrated with other beliefs. If delusions are not integrated with our beliefs, then they are not beliefs.
  2. Beliefs are responsive to evidence. If delusions are not responsive to evidence, then they are not beliefs.
  3. Beliefs guide action. If delusions do not guide action, then they are not beliefs.

These arguments are central to the debate about the doxastic nature of delusions (Bortolotti 2009). For instance, Currie and Jureidini 2001 (p. 161) argue that delusions are more plausibly imaginings than beliefs, because delusions ‘fail, sometimes spectacularly, to be integrated with what the subject really does believe’, whereas there is no requirement that imaginings are consistent with beliefs. Berrios 1991 argues that delusions cannot be beliefs for us, because we do not regard them as the most probable explanations for our unusual experience. Berrios reaches the extraordinary conclusions that delusions are not even intentional states, but utterances without meaning, “empty speech acts”.

Assessing arguments in (1) to (3) requires assessing empirical and conceptual claims. Let’s consider (1), the ‘bad integration’ objection to the belief status of delusions. In order to see whether the conclusion is convincing, an empirical claim about delusions needs to be examined first: Do delusions really fail to integrate with our beliefs? Then, a conceptual claim needs assessing, the claim that not being integrated with our beliefs prevents delusions from being beliefs themselves. In many cases, the alleged ‘fault’ of delusions is exaggerated (e.g., delusions sometimes integrate well with our beliefs), but it would be plausible to claim that delusions exhibit that feature (bad integration) to a higher degree than nondelusional beliefs.

The most common versions of anti-doxastic arguments seem to rely on an idealization of belief states, and impose constraints on delusions that not even typical beliefs would meet. The assumption seems to be that beliefs are essentially rational, and that delusions are not beliefs because they are not rational. But the abundant psychological evidence on familiar irrationality tells us that nondelusional beliefs are often irrational in exactly the same way as delusions can be, although to a lesser degree. It is sufficient to think about hypocrisy, about prejudiced and superstitious beliefs, and about the many biases that affect belief updating in normal cognition to realize that the same kinds of irrationality that we find in delusions are also common in many nondelusional beliefs (e.g., Nisbett and Ross 1980; more recently Bentall 2018). A general worry is that the very notion of belief is not theoretically useful if the criteria for what counts as a belief become too loose.

Independent of any given answer to the question whether delusions are beliefs, two conceptions of delusions divide the philosophical scene. One highlights the discontinuity between delusions and beliefs, and between neurotypical and neurodivergent cognition, with various consequences for what counts as pathological, but also for the availability of therapeutic options, such as cognitive behavioral therapy, for conditions characterised by delusions. The other view insists that there is continuity between delusions and beliefs, and attempts to gather data both suggesting that people with delusions reason in much the same way as people without, and that delusion-like ideas are widespread in the nonclinical population. Some studies have gathered a vast amount of empirical data about the temporal variations in delusions in context of psychopathologies, and the presence of delusion-like beliefs in the nonclinical population (e.g., Bentall 2003).

4.3 Do delusions overlap with self-deception or beliefs in conspiracy theories?

There is no consensus on whether delusions overlap with instances of belief that are frequent in the nonclinical population, such as self deception or beliefs in conspiracy theories. Philosophers who ask such questions may be interested in supporting or challenging the continuity theory; mapping reasons why delusions should (or should not) be regarded as pathological; or wanting to clarify the distinctiveness of the phenomenon of clinical delusions.

Self deception has been traditionally characterized as driven by motivational factors whereas delusions are now primarily accounted in neuropsychological terms. Although theories of delusion formation involve reference to perceptual and cognitive impairments, as we saw, motivational factors play an important role in the explanation of some delusions, e.g. by partially determining the specific content of the reported delusional state. Thus, one plausible view is that self-deception and delusion are distinct phenomena that may overlap in some circumstances (for further analysis, see Bayne and Fernàndez 2008). There are three arguments for the view that delusions and self-deception overlap.

The first view about the relationship between delusions and self-deception is that, when they overlap, they do so because they both involve a motivationally biased treatment of evidence. If a motivationally biased treatment of evidence is the key feature of self-deception (as for deflationists such as Mele 2001 and 2008), then when we have delusions we can be said to be self-deceived if we treat the evidence at our disposal or search for evidence in a motivationally biased way. This does not seem to be generally the case with delusions, but can apply to some cases of delusions. Some delusions of misidentification (at least according to neuropsychological accounts) do not seem to be akin to self-deception, given that there is no fundamental role for motivational biases in the explanation of how we come to hold or retain the delusion. A different analysis might be appropriate for delusions of jealousy or persecution.

The second view is that (some) delusions are extreme cases of self-deception and that they have a protective and adaptive function (see Hirstein 2005). An example is offered by Ramachandran, who discusses anosognosia, the denial of illness, and somatoparaphrenia, the delusion that a part of one’s body belongs to someone else. Ramachandran 1996 reports the case of a woman (FD) who suffered from a right hemisphere stroke which left her with left hemiplegia. FD could not move without a wheelchair and could not move her left arm. But when she was asked whether she could walk and she could engage in activities which require both hands (such as clapping), she claimed that she could. Ramachandran advances the hypothesis that behaviors giving rise to confabulations and delusions are an exaggeration of normal defense mechanisms that have an adaptive function, as they allow us to create a coherent system of beliefs and to behave in a stable manner. In the neurotypical case, the left hemisphere produces confabulatory explanations aimed at preserving the status quo (‘I’m not ill’; ‘My arm can move’), but the right hemisphere detects an anomaly between the hypotheses generated by the left hemisphere and reality. So, it forces a revision of the belief system. In patients such as FD, the discrepancy detector no longer works. It is very plausible that delusions in anosognosia involve motivational aspects. But whether these delusions are an exaggerated form of self-deception depends on the preferred theoretical characterization of self-deception.

The third view about the potential overlap of delusions and self-deception is that the very existence of delusions (which shows that doxastic conflict is possible) can help us vindicate the traditional account of self-deception. According to this view, we have two contradictory beliefs, but we are aware of only one of them, because we are motivated to remain unaware of the other (McKay et al. 2005a, p. 314). This account derives from Donald Davidson’s theory of self-deception (e.g. Davidson 1982 and 1985b). When I deceive myself, I believe a true proposition but act in such a way as to causing myself to believe the negation of that proposition. Neil Levy argues that the conditions for self-deception set by the traditional approach are not necessary for self-deception, but that the case of FD described by Ramachandran (1996) is living proof that a person can, at the same time, believe that her arm is paralyzed, and believe that she can move her arm. Moreover, it is the belief that her arm is paralyzed that causes her to acquire the belief that her arm is not. This is Levy’s analysis of the typical person with anosognosia Levy 2008 (p. 234):

  1. FD believes that her limb is healthy.
  2. Nevertheless she also has the simultaneous belief (or strong suspicion) that her limb is significantly impaired and she is profoundly disturbed by this belief (suspicion).
  3. Condition (1) is satisfied because condition (2) is satisfied; that is, FD is motivated to form the belief that her limb is healthy because she has the concurrent belief (suspicion) that it is significantly impaired and she is disturbed by this belief (suspicion).

If this analysis is correct, at least one case of delusion (e.g., anosognosia) involves doxastic conflict. The most controversial aspect of this analysis concerns condition (2). Is the belief that her limb is impaired truly available to FD? One could argue that, given that FD probably has a deficit in the discrepancy detector of the right hemisphere of the brain, she has no awareness of the impairment she denies (see also Hirstein 2005). But Levy’s reply is that availability comes in degrees. He suggests that, given that people with paralysis and anosognosia often avoid tasks that would require mobility when costs for failure are high, and given that they can acknowledge some difficulties in movement (and say ‘I have arthritis’ or ‘My left arm has always been weaker’), it is plausible that they have some awareness of their impairment – although they may lack a fully formed and conscious belief about it.

The debate about the differences between delusion and self-deception has centred on whether delusions (just like ordinary instances of self-deception) are explicable from a folk-psychological point of view (Bortolotti and Mameli 2012; Murphy 2012, 2013). Murphy argues that delusions are diagnosed when folk psychology runs out of resources for understanding what we seem to report as a genuine belief. By contrast, self-deception does not challenge our folk-psychological generalisations, because our beliefs are expected to be influenced by our desires at least on some occasions (e.g., when stakes are high). Bortolotti and Mameli maintain that the gap between self-deception and motivated delusions (such as anosognosia) is narrower than the gap between self-deception and apparently nonmotivated delusions, but even in the latter case folk psychology can account for the delusional belief as an explanation (imperfect as it may be) of the delusional experience.

In recent commentaries on the spread of conspiracy theories during a crisis, comparisons between beliefs in conspiracy theories and delusions have been ubiquitous (Bortolotti et al. 2021). For instance, people have argued that what makes beliefs in flat Earth and climate denial problematic is not their failing to represent reality accurately, but their rigidity and incorrigibility, which they see as a typical feature of delusional beliefs. The comparison has been made on the basis of three criteria: (a) how the beliefs manifest (e.g., implausibility and unshakeability); (b) how the beliefs are formed (e.g., faulty monitoring of ideas); and (c) how the beliefs affect wellbeing and good functioning.

Let’s consider the criteria in turn. With respect to surface features, both clinical delusions and beliefs in conspiracy theories appear implausible to those who do not endorse them, and in some circumstances quite unusual and bizarre as well. It is their alleged epistemic irrationality, though, that seems to play the central role in the comparison. It is commonly assumed that clinical delusions and beliefs in conspiracy theories are neither well supported by evidence nor responsive to counterevidence. As we saw, there is a variation in these features when they are applied to delusions, and similarly when they are applied to beliefs in conspiracy theories. In the case of delusions, the unusual experience we have may be considered prima facie evidence for the delusional hypothesis; and in the case of conspiracy theories, if we belong to a group that has been marginalised and excluded, then our previous experience with the authorities may legitimise our mistrusting them as sources of information (Levy 2019).

With respect to how the beliefs are formed, there is no consensus. Some argue that the same models used to describe delusion formation can be invoked in the description of how beliefs in conspiracy theories emerge. For instance, for two-factor theorists, there is a first factor which is unusual experience in the case of delusion and epistemic mistrust in the case of beliefs in conspiracy theories. Then, there is a common second factor which comprises some reasoning biases and motivational factors (e.g., Pierre 2020). The first factor would explain the theme of the delusion or conspiracy. The second factor would explain why the belief is endorsed and maintained despite its prima facie implausibility. For researchers working within a predictive coding account, paranoia predicts difficulty in updating beliefs across the clinical-nonclinical divide, which suggests that some of the same mechanisms may be responsible for how people respond to uncertainties (Reed et al. 2020). Other researchers though deny that there is overlap in etiology, and point to the fact that no cognitive dysfunction needs to be postulated to explain the formation of beliefs in conspiracy theories (e.g., Oliver and Wood 2014).

Finally, with respect to the downstream effects of endorsing delusional beliefs and beliefs in conspiracy theories, differences are marked. Whereas delusions are often characterised by disruption in psychological functioning and social withdrawal and isolation, beliefs in conspiracy theories can be seen as cementing some relationships in well-defined social groups and as being protective against anxiety and stress. A closer examination may shed some doubt on the differences though. Some delusions can be adaptive in the short-term and some beliefs in conspiracy theories can be harmful in the long term.

In sum, the views summarized here show that it can be very difficult to justify clear-cut distinctions between delusion and self-deception, and between delusions and beliefs in conspiracy theories. It is diagnostically and scientifically useful to maintain a distinction between symptoms of clinical conditions and manifestations of everyday irrationality, but the elements of genuine overlap should also be acknowledged.


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