Descartes’ Ontological Argument

First published Mon Jun 18, 2001; substantive revision Fri Feb 14, 2020

Descartes’ ontological (or a priori) argument is both one of the most fascinating and poorly understood aspects of his philosophy. Fascination with the argument stems from the effort to prove God’s existence from simple but powerful premises. Existence is derived immediately from the clear and distinct idea of a supremely perfect being. Ironically, the simplicity of the argument has also produced several misreadings, exacerbated in part by Descartes’ tendency to formulate it in different ways.

The main statement of the argument appears in the Fifth Meditation. This comes on the heels of an earlier causal argument for God’s existence in the Third Meditation, raising questions about the order and relation between these two distinct proofs. Descartes repeats the ontological argument in a few other central texts including the Principles of Philosophy. He also defends it in the First, Second, and Fifth Replies against scathing objections by some of the leading intellectuals of his day.

Descartes was not the first philosopher to formulate an ontological argument. An earlier version of the argument had been vigorously defended by St. Anselm in the eleventh century, and then criticized by a monk named Gaunilo (Anselm’s contemporary) and later by St. Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas’ critique was regarded as so devastating that the ontological argument died out for several centuries. It thus came as a surprise to Descartes’ contemporaries that he should attempt to resurrect it. Although he claims not to be familiar with Anselm’s version of the proof, Descartes appears to craft his own argument so as to block traditional objections.

Despite similarities, Descartes’ version of the argument differs from Anselm’s in important ways. The latter’s version is thought to proceed from the meaning of the word “God,” by definition, God is a being a greater than which cannot be conceived. Descartes’ argument, in contrast, is grounded in two central tenets of his philosophy — the theory of innate ideas and the doctrine of clear and distinct perception. He purports to rely not on an arbitrary definition of God but rather on an innate idea whose content is “given.” Descartes’ version is also extremely simple. God’s existence is inferred directly from the fact that necessary existence is contained in the clear and distinct idea of a supremely perfect being. Indeed, on some occasions he suggests that the so-called ontological “argument” is not a formal proof at all but a self-evident axiom grasped intuitively by a mind free of philosophical prejudice.

Descartes often compares the ontological argument to a geometric demonstration, arguing that necessary existence cannot be excluded from idea of God anymore than the fact that its angles equal two right angles, for example, can be excluded from the idea of a triangle. The analogy underscores once again the argument’s supreme simplicity. God’s existence is purported to be as obvious and self-evident as the most basic mathematical truth. It also attempts to show how the “logic” of the demonstration is rooted in our ordinary reasoning practices.

In the same context, Descartes also characterizes the ontological argument as a proof from the “essence” or “nature” of God, arguing that necessary existence cannot be separated from the essence of a supremely perfect being without contradiction. In casting the argument in these terms, he is implicitly relying on a traditional medieval distinction between a thing’s essence and its existence. According to this tradition, one can determine what something is (i.e. its essence), independently of knowing whether it exists. This distinction appears useful to Descartes’ aims, some have thought, because it allows him to specify God’s essence without begging the question of his existence.

1. The Simplicity of the “Argument”

One of the hallmarks of Descartes’ version of the ontological argument is its simplicity. Indeed, it reads more like the report of an intuition than a formal proof. Descartes underscores the simplicity of his demonstration by comparing it to the way we ordinarily establish very basic truths in arithmetic and geometry, such as that the number two is even or that the sum of the angles of a triangle is equal to the sum of two right angles. We intuit such truths directly by inspecting our clear and distinct ideas of the number two and of a triangle. So, likewise, we are able to attain knowledge of God’s existence simply by apprehending that necessary existence is included in the clear and distinct idea of a supremely perfect being. As Descartes writes in the Fifth Meditation:

[1] But if the mere fact that I can produce from my thought the idea of something entails that everything which I clearly and distinctly perceive to belong to that thing really does belong to it, is not this a possible basis for another argument to prove the existence of God? Certainly, the idea of God, or a supremely perfect being, is one that I find within me just as surely as the idea of any shape or number. And my understanding that it belongs to his nature that he always exists is no less clear and distinct than is the case when I prove of any shape or number that some property belongs to its nature (AT 7:65; CSM 2:45).

One is easily misled by the analogy between the ontological argument and a geometric demonstration, and by the language of “proof” in this passage and others like it. Descartes does not conceive of the ontological argument on the model of an Euclidean or axiomatic proof, in which theorems are derived from epistemically prior axioms and definitions. On the contrary, he is drawing our attention to another method of establishing truths that informs our ordinary practices and is non-discursive. This method employs intuition or, what is the same for Descartes, clear and distinct perception. It consists in unveiling the contents of our clear and distinct ideas. The basis for this method is the rule for truth, which was previously established in the Fourth Meditation. According to the version of this rule invoked in the Fifth Meditation, whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive to be contained in the idea of something is true of that thing. So if I clearly and distinctly perceive that necessary existence pertains to the idea of a supremely perfect being, then such a being truly exists.

Although Descartes maintains that God’s existence is ultimately known through intuition, he is not averse to presenting formal versions of the ontological argument. He never forgets that he is writing for a seventeenth-century audience, steeped in scholastic logic, that would have expected to be engaged at the level of the Aristotelian syllogism. Descartes satisfies such expectations, presenting not one but at least two separate versions of the ontological argument. These proofs, however, are stunningly brief and betray his true intentions. One version of the argument simply codifies the psychological process by which one intuits God’s existence, in the manner described above:

Version A:
  1. Whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive to be contained in the idea of something is true of that thing.
  2. I clearly and distinctly perceive that necessary existence is contained in the idea of God.
  3. Therefore, God exists.

The rule for truth appears here in the guise of the first premise, but it is more naturally read as a statement of Descartes’ own alternative method of “demonstration” via clear and distinct perception or intuition. In effect, the first “premise” is designed to instruct the meditator on how to apply this method, the same role that the analogy with a geometric demonstration serves in passage [1].

When presenting this version of the argument in the First Replies, Descartes sets aside this first premise and focuses our attention on the second. In so doing, he is indicating the relative unimportance of the proof itself. Having learned how to apply Descartes’ alternative method of reasoning, one need only perceive that necessary existence pertains to the idea of a supremely perfect being. Once one attains this perception, formal arguments are no longer required; God’s existence will be self-evident (Second Replies, Fifth Postulate; AT 7:163–4; CSM 2:115).

Descartes sometimes uses traditional arguments as heuristic devices, not merely to appease a scholastically trained audience but to help induce clear and distinct perceptions. This is evident for example in the version of the ontological argument standardly associated with his name:

Version B:
  1. I have an idea of supremely perfect being, i.e. a being having all perfections.
  2. Necessary existence is a perfection.
  3. Therefore, a supremely perfect being exists.

While this set of sentences has the surface structure of a formal argument, its persuasive force lies at a different level. A meditator who is having trouble perceiving that necessary existence is contained in the idea of a supreme perfect being can attain this perception indirectly by first recognizing that this idea includes every perfection. Indeed, the idea of a supremely perfect being just is the idea of a being having all perfections. To attempt to exclude any or all perfections from the idea of a supremely being, Descartes observes, involves one in a contradiction and is akin to conceiving a mountain without a valley (or, better, an up-slope without a down-slope). Having formed this perception, one need only intuit that necessary existence is itself a perfection. It will then be clear that necessary existence is one of the attributes included in the idea of a supremely perfect being.

While such considerations might suffice to induce the requisite clear and distinct perception in the meditator, Descartes is aiming a deeper point, namely that there is a conceptual link between necessary existence and each of the other divine perfections. It is important to recall that in the Third Meditation, in the midst of the causal argument for the existence of God, the meditator already discovered many of these perfections — omnipotence, omniscience, immutability, eternality, simplicity, etc. Because our mind is finite, we normally think of the divine perfections separately and “hence may not immediately notice the necessity of their being joined together” (First Replies, AT 7:119; CSM 2:85). But if we attend carefully to “whether existence belongs to a supremely perfect being, and what sort of existence it is” we shall discover that we cannot conceive any one of the other attributes while excluding necessary existence from it (ibid.).

To illustrate this point Descartes appeals to divine omnipotence. He thinks that we cannot conceive an omnipotent being except as existing. Descartes’ illustration presupposes the traditional, medieval understanding of “necessary existence.” When speaking of this divine attribute, he sometimes uses the term “existence” simpliciter as shorthand. But in his more careful pronouncements he always insists on the phrase “necessary and eternal existence,” which resonates with tradition. Medieval, scholastic philosophers often spoke of God as the sole “necessary being,” by which they meant a being who depends only on himself for his existence. This is the notion of “aseity” or self-existence (a se esse). Since such a being does not depend on anything else for its existence, he has neither a beginning nor an end, but is eternal. Returning to the discussion in the First Replies, one can see how omnipotence is linked conceptually to necessary existence in this traditional sense. An omnipotent or all-powerful being does not depend ontologically on anything (for if it did then it would not be omnipotent). It exists by its own power:

[2] when we attend to immense power of this being, we shall be unable to think of its existence as possible without also recognizing that it can exist by its own power; and we shall infer from this that this being does really exist and has existed from eternity, since it is quite evident by the natural light that what can exist by its own power always exists. So we shall come to understand that necessary existence is contained in the idea of a supremely perfect being …. (ibid.)

Some readers have thought that Descartes offers yet a third version of the ontological argument in this passage (Wilson, 1978, 174–76), but whether or not that was his intention is unimportant, since his primary aim, as indicated in the last line, is to enable his meditator to intuit that necessary existence is included in the idea of God. Since there is a conceptual link between the divine attributes, a clear and distinct perception of one provides a cognitive route to any of the others.

Although Descartes sometimes uses formal versions of the ontological argument to achieve his aims, he consistently affirms that God’s existence is ultimately known through clear and distinct perception. The formal versions of the argument are merely heuristic devices, to be jettisoned once one has attained the requisite intuition of a supremely perfect being. Descartes stresses this point explicitly in the Fifth Meditation, immediately after presenting the two versions of the argument considered above:

[3] whatever method of proof I use, I am always brought back to the fact that it is only what I clearly and distinctly perceive that completely convinces me. Some of the things I clearly and distinctly perceive are obvious to everyone, while others are discovered only by those who look more closely and investigate more carefully; but once they have been discovered, the latter are judged to be just as certain as the former. In the case of a right-angled triangle, for example, the fact that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the square on the other two sides is not so readily apparent as the fact that the hypotenuse subtends the largest angle; but once one has seen it, one believes it just as strongly. But as regards God, if I were not overwhelmed by philosophical prejudices, and if the images of things perceived by the senses did not besiege my thought on every side, I would certainly acknowledge him sooner and more easily than anything else. For what is more manifest than the fact that the supreme being exists, or that God, to whose essence alone existence belongs, exists? (AT 7:68–69; CSM 2:47)

Here Descartes develops his earlier analogy between the (so-called) ontological argument and a geometric demonstration. He suggests that there are some meditators for whom God’s existence is immediately manifest; for them God’s existence is akin to an axiom or definition in geometry, such as that the hypotenuse of a right triangle subtends its largest angle. But other meditators, whose minds are confused and mired in sensory images, must work much harder, and might even require a proof to attain the requisite clear and distinct perception. For them, God’s existence is akin to the Pythagorean Theorem. The important point is that both kinds of meditators ultimately attain knowledge of God’s existence by clearly and distinctly perceiving that necessary existence is contained in the idea of supremely perfect being. Once one has achieved this perception, God’s existence will be manifest or, as Descartes says elsewhere, “self-evident” (per se notam) (Second Replies, Fifth Postulate; AT 7: 164; CSM 2:115).

Descartes’ contemporaries would have been surprised by this last remark. While reviewing an earlier version of the ontological argument, Aquinas had rejected the claim that God’s existence is self-evident, at least with respect to us. He argued that what is self-evident cannot be denied without contradiction, but God’s existence can be denied. Indeed, the proverbial fool says in his heart “There is no God” (Psalm 53.1).

When confronted with this criticism by a contemporary objector, Descartes tries to find common ground: “St. Thomas asks whether existence is self-evident as far as we are concerned, that is, whether it is obvious to everyone; and he answers, correctly, that it is not” (First Replies, AT 7:115; CSM 2:82). Descartes interprets Aquinas to be claiming that God’s existence is not self-evident to everyone, which is something with which he can agree. Descartes does not hold that God’s existence is immediately self-evident, or self-evident to everyone, but that it can become self-evident to some careful and industrious meditators.

2. The Distinction between Essence and Existence

In the Fifth Meditation and elsewhere Descartes says that God’s existence follows from the fact that existence is contained in the “true and immutable essence, nature, or form” of a supremely perfect being, just as it follows from the essence of a triangle that its angles equal two right angles. This way of putting the a priori argument has puzzled commentators and has led to a lively debate about the ontological status of Cartesian essences and the objects which are purported to “have” them. Some commentators have thought that Descartes is committed to a species of Platonic realism. According to this view, some objects that fall short of actual existence nevertheless subsist as abstract, logical entities outside the mind and beyond the physical world (Kenny, 1968; Wilson, 1978). Another commentator places Cartesian essences in God (Schmaltz 1991), while two recent revisionist interpretations (Chappell, 1997; Nolan, 1997) read Descartes as a conceptualist who takes essences to be ideas in human minds.

Descartes’ reference to “essences” raises another important issue more directly related to the ontological argument. In claiming that necessary existence cannot be excluded from the essence of God, Descartes is drawing on the traditional medieval distinction between essence and existence. According to this distinction, one can say what something is (i.e. its essence), prior to knowing whether it exists. So, for example, one can define what a horse is — enumerating all of its essential properties — before knowing whether there are any horses in the world. The only exception to this distinction was thought to be God himself, whose essence just is to exist. It is easy to see how this traditional distinction could be exploited by a defender of the ontological argument. Existence is included in the essence of a supremely perfect being, but not in the essence of any finite thing. Thus it follows solely from the essence of the former that such a being actually exists. At times, Descartes appears to support this interpretation of the ontological argument. In the Fifth Replies, for example, he writes that “the existence of a triangle should not be compared with the existence of God, since the relation between existence and essence is manifestly quite different in the case of God from what it is in the case of the triangle. God is his own existence, but this is not true of the triangle” (AT 7:383; CSM 2:263). But Descartes’ complete view is subtler and more sophisticated than these remarks first suggest. Understanding this view requires a more careful investigation of the distinction between essence and existence as it appears in medieval sources. Although one often speaks of the “traditional” distinction, the exact nature of the relation between essence and existence in finite things was the subject of a fierce debate among medieval philosophers. Seeing where Descartes’ position fits within this debate will provide a deeper understanding of his version of the ontological argument.

The distinction between essence and existence can be traced back as far as Boethius in the fifth century. It was later developed by Islamic thinkers such as Avicenna. But the issue did not become a major philosophical problem until it was taken up by Aquinas in the thirteenth century. The issue arose not as part of an effort to establish God’s existence on a priori grounds (as mentioned above, Aquinas was one of the staunchest critics of the ontological argument), but out of concern to distinguish God from finite spiritual entities such as angels. Like many scholastic philosophers, Aquinas believed that God is perfectly simple and that created beings, in contrast, have a composite character that accounts for their finitude and imperfection. Earthly creatures are composites of matter and form (the doctrine of hylomorphism), but since purely spiritual beings are immaterial, Aquinas located their composite character in the distinction between essence and existence.

Some of the details of Aquinas’ account will emerge from our discussion below. The primary interest of his theory for our purposes, however, is that it led to a lively debate among his successors both as to how to interpret the master and about the true nature of the relation between essence and existence in created things. This debate produced three main positions:

  1. The Theory of Real Distinction
  2. The Intermediate Position
  3. The Theory of Rational Distinction

Proponents of the first view conceived the distinction between essence and existence as obtaining between two separate things. In the eyes of many Thomists, this view was considered to be quite radical, especially as an interpretation of Aquinas’ original position. The latter is sometimes expressed by saying that essence and existence are “principles of being” rather than beings themselves. One problem then with the theory of real distinction, at least as espoused by many of Aquinas’ followers, was that it reified essence and existence, treating them as real beings in addition to the created entity that they compose.

The theory of real distinction was also considered objectionable for philosophical reasons. Following Aquinas, many participants in the debate urged that essence and existence are related to each other as potency and act, so that existence can be said to “actualize” essence. On the theory of real distinction, this view leads to an infinite regress. If an essence becomes actual only in virtue of something else — viz. existence — being superadded to it, then what gives existence its reality, and so on ad infinitum? (Wippel, 1982, 393f).

In response to these difficulties some scholastic philosophers developed a position at the polar extreme from the theory of real distinction. This was the view that there is merely a rational distinction or a “distinction of reason” between essence and existence in created beings. As the term suggests, this theory held that essence and existence of a creature are identical in reality and distinguished only within our thought by means of reason. Needless to say, proponents of this theory were forced to distinguish purely spiritual entities from God on grounds other than real composition.

Giving up the doctrine of real composition seemed too much for another group of thinkers who were also critical of the theory of real distinction. This led to the development of a number of intermediate positions, including Duns Scotus’ curious notion of a formal distinction and the view that essence and existence are modally distinct such that existence constitutes a mode of a thing’s essence.

Like Francisco Suárez, his most immediate scholastic predecessor, Descartes sides with the proponents of a rational distinction between essence and existence. His position is unique, however, insofar as it springs from a more general theory of “attributes”. Articulating this theory in an important passage in the Principles of Philosophy, Descartes claims that there is merely a distinction of reason between a substance and any one of its attributes or between any two attributes of a single substance (1:62, AT 8A:30; CSM 1:214). For Descartes’ purposes, the most significant instance of a rational distinction is that which obtains between a substance and its essence — or what he sometimes refers to as its “principal attribute” (1:53, AT 8A:25; CSM 1:210). Since thought and extension constitute the essence of mind and body, respectively, a mind is merely rationally distinct from its thinking and a body is merely rationally distinct from its extension (1:63, AT 8A:31; CSM 1:215). But Descartes insists that a rational distinction also obtains between any two attributes of a substance. Since existence qualifies as an attribute in this technical sense, the essence and existence of a substance are also distinct merely by reason (1:56, AT 8A:26; CSM 1:211). Descartes reaffirms this conclusion in a letter intended to elucidate his account of the relation between essence and existence:

[4]… existence, duration, size, number and all universals are not, it seems to me, modes in the strict sense …. They are referred to by a broader term and called attributes … because we do indeed understand the essence of a thing in one way when we consider it in abstraction from whether it exists or not, and in a different way when we consider it as existing; but the thing itself cannot be outside our thought without its existence …. Accordingly I say that shape and other similar modes are strictly speaking modally distinct from the substance whose modes they are; but there is a lesser distinction between the other attributes …. I call it a rational distinction …. (To an unknown correspondent, AT 4:349; CSMK 3:280)

Indications are given here as to how a rational distinction is produced in our thought. Descartes explains that we regard a single thing in different abstract ways. Case in point, we can regard a thing as existing, or we can abstract from its existence and attend to its other aspects. In so doing, we have distinguished the existence of a substance from its essence within our thought. Like scholastic proponents of the theory of rational distinction, however, Descartes is keen to emphasize that this distinction is purely conceptual. Indeed, he goes on to explain that the essence and existence of a substance are “in no way distinct” outside thought (AT 4:350; CSMK 3:280). In reality they are identical.

While borrowing much from scholasticism, Descartes’ account is distinguished by its scope of application. He extends the theory of rational distinction from created substances to God. In general, the essence and the existence of a substance are merely rationally distinct, and hence identical in reality.

This result appears to wreak havoc on Descartes’ ontological argument. One of the most important objections to the argument is that if it were valid, one could proliferate such arguments for all sorts of things, including beings whose existence is merely contingent. By supposing that there is merely a rational distinction between essence and existence abroad in all things, Descartes seems to confirm this objection. In general, a substance is to be identified with its existence, whether it is God or a finite created thing.

The problem with this objection, in this instance, is that it assumes that Descartes locates the difference between God and creatures in the relation each of these things bears to its existence. This is not the case. In a few important passages, Descartes affirms that existence is contained in the clear and distinct idea of every single thing, but he also insists that there are different grades of existence:

[5] Existence is contained in the idea or concept of every single thing, since we cannot conceive of anything except as existing. Possible or contingent existence is contained in the concept of a limited thing, whereas necessary and perfect existence is contained in the concept of a supremely perfect being (Axiom 10, Second Replies; AT 7:166; CSM 2:117).

In light of this passage and others like it, we can refine the theory of rational distinction. What one should say, strictly speaking, is that God is merely rationally distinct from his necessary existence, while every finite created thing is merely rationally distinct from its possible or contingent existence. The distinction between possible or contingent existence on the one hand, and necessary existence on the other, allows Descartes to account for the theological difference between God and his creatures.

Now, when Descartes says that a substance (be it finite or infinite) is merely rationally distinct from its existence, he always means an actually existing substance. So how are we to understand the claim that a finite substance is merely rationally distinct from its possible existence? What is meant by “possible (or contingent) existence”? It is tempting to suppose that this term means non-actual existence. But as we saw already with the case of necessary existence, Descartes does not intend these terms in their logical or modal senses. If “necessary existence” means ontologically independent existence, then “possible existence” means something like dependent existence. After all, Descartes contrasts possible existence not with actual existence but with necessary existence in the traditional sense. This account is also suggested by the term “contingent.” Created things are contingent in the sense that they depend for their existence on God, the sole independent being.

This result explains why Descartes believes that we cannot proliferate ontological arguments for created substances. It is not that the relation between essence and existence is any different in God than it is in finite things. In both cases there is merely a rational distinction. The difference is in the grade of existence that attaches to each. Whereas the concept of an independent being entails that such a being exists, the concept of a finite thing entails only that it has dependent existence.

Looking back at the problematic passage cited above from the Fifth Replies, it becomes clear that Descartes intended something along these lines even there. He says that “the existence of a triangle should not be compared with the existence of God”, reinforcing the point that it is the kind of existence involved that makes God unique. And just before this statement, he writes, “in the case of God necessary existence…applies to him alone and forms a part of his essence as it does of no other thing”. Later he adds: “I do not … deny that possible existence is a perfection in the idea of a triangle, just as necessary existence is perfection in the idea of God” (AT 7:383; CSM 2:263). Descartes’ final position then is that essence and existence are identical in all things. What distinguishes God from creatures is his grade of existence. We can produce an ontological argument for God, and not for finite substances, because the idea of a supremely perfect being uniquely contains necessary — or ontologically independent — existence.

3. Objections and Replies

Because of its simplicity, Descartes’ version of the ontological argument is commonly thought to be cruder and more obviously fallacious than the one put forward by Anselm in the eleventh century. But when the complete apparatus of the Cartesian system is brought forth, the argument proves itself to be quite resilient, at least on its own terms. Indeed, Descartes’ version is superior to his predecessor’s insofar as it is grounded in a theory of innate ideas and the doctrine of clear and distinct perception. These two doctrines inoculate Descartes from the charge made against Anselm, for example, that the ontological argument attempts to define God into existence by arbitrarily building existence into the concept of a supremely perfect being. In the Third Meditation, the meditator discovers that her idea of God is not a fiction that she has conveniently invented but something native to the mind. As we shall see below, these two doctrines provide the resources for answering other objections as well.

Given our earlier discussion concerning the non-logical status of the ontological argument, it may seem surprising that Descartes would take objections to it seriously. He should be able to dismiss most objections in one neat trick by insisting on the non-logical nature of the demonstration. This is especially true of the objection that the ontological argument begs the question. If God’s existence is ultimately self-evident and known by a simple intuition of the mind, then there are no questions to be begged. Unfortunately, not all of the objections to the ontological argument can be dismissed so handily, for the simple reason that they do not all depend on the assumption that we are dealing with a formal proof.

Although it is often overlooked, many of the best known criticisms of the ontological argument were put to Descartes by official objectors to the Meditations. He in turn responded to these objections — sometimes in lengthy replies — though many contemporary readers have found his responses opaque and unsatisfying. We can better understand his replies and, in some cases, improve upon them by appealing to discussions from previous sections.

One classical objection to the ontological argument, which was first leveled by Gaunilo against Anselm’s version of the proof, is that it makes an illicit logical leap from the mental world of concepts to the real world of things. The claim is that even if we were to concede that necessary existence is inseparable from the idea of God (in Kant’s terms, even if necessary existence were analytic of the concept “God”), nothing follows from this about what does or does not exist in the actual world. Johannes Caterus, the author of the First Set of Objections to the Meditations, puts the point as follows:

[6] Even if it is granted that a supremely perfect being carries the implication of existence in virtue of its very title, it still does not follow that the existence in question is anything actual in the real world; all that follows is that the concept of existence is inseparably linked to the concept of a supreme being. So you cannot infer that the existence of God is anything actual unless you suppose that the supreme being actually exists; for then it will actually contain all perfections, including the perfection of real existence (AT 7:99; CSM 2:72).

To meet this challenge, Descartes must explain how he “bridges” the inferential gap between thought and reality. The principle of clear and distinct perception is intended to do just that. According to this principle, for which he argues in the Fourth Meditation, whatever one clearly and distinctly perceives or understands is true — true not just of ideas but of things in the real world represented by those ideas. Thus, Descartes’ commitment to the principle of clear and distinct perception allows him to elude another objection that had haunted Anselm’s version of the argument.

The previous objection is related to another difficulty raised by Caterus. In order to illustrate that the inference from the mental to the extra-mental commits a logical error, critics have observed that if such inferences were legitimate then we could proliferate ontological arguments for supremely perfect islands, existing lions, and all sorts of things which either do not exist or whose existence is contingent and thus should not follow a priori from their concept. The trick is simply to build existence into the concept. So, while existence does not follow from the concept of lion as such, it does follow from the concept of an “existing lion.”

Descartes’ actual reply to this objection, which he took very seriously, is highly complex and couched in terms of a theory of “true and immutable natures.” We can simplify matters by focusing on its key elements. One of his first moves is to introduce a point that we discussed earlier (see passage [5] in section 2), namely that existence is contained in the idea of every thing that we clearly and distinctly perceive: possible (or dependent) existence is contained in our clear and distinct idea of every finite thing and necessary (or independent) existence is uniquely contained in the idea of God (AT 7:117; CSM 2:83). So for Descartes one does not have to build existence into the idea of something if that idea is clear and distinct; existence is already included in every clear and distinct idea. But it does not follow that the thing represented by such an idea actually exists, except in the case of God. We cannot produce ontological arguments for finite things for the simple reason that the clear and distinct ideas of them contain merely dependent existence. Actual existence is demanded only by the idea of God, which uniquely contains independent existence.

A natural rejoinder to this reply would be to ask about the idea of a lion having not possible but wholly necessary existence. If Descartes’ method of reasoning were valid, it would seem to follow from this idea that such a creature exists. This formulation of the objection requires Descartes’ second and deeper point, which is only hinted at in his official reply. This is that the idea of a lion — let alone the idea of a lion having necessary existence — is hopelessly obscure and confused. As Descartes says, the nature of a lion is “not transparently clear to us” (Axiom 10, Second Replies; AT 7:117; CSM 2:84). Since this idea is not clear and distinct, the method of demonstration employed in the ontological argument does not apply to it. Recall that the geometrical method of demonstration is grounded in the principle of clear and distinct perception and consists in drawing out the contents of our clear and distinct ideas. If an idea is not clear and distinct then we cannot draw any conclusions from it about things outside thought.

The key difference then between the idea of God on the one hand and the idea of a necessarily existing lion is that the former can be clearly and distinctly perceived. For Descartes, it is just a brute fact that certain ideas can be clearly and distinctly perceived and others cannot. Some critics have charged him with dogmatism in this regard. Why should Descartes be allowed to legislate the scope of our clear and distinct perceptions? Perhaps we can clearly and distinctly perceive something that he could not.

Descartes cannot be saved entirely from this charge, but two important points can be made in his defense. First, he has principled reasons for thinking that everyone has the same set of innate or clear and distinct ideas. When the meditator first proved God’s existence in the Third Meditation, she also established that God is supremely good and hence no deceiver. One consequence of God’s perfect benevolence is that he implanted the same set of innate ideas in all finite minds. Thus, Descartes feels justified in concluding that the limits of his capacity for clear and distinct perception will be shared by everyone.

Second, when responding to objections to the ontological argument such as the ones considered above, Descartes typically does more than insist dogmatically on a unique set of clear and distinct ideas. He also tries to dispel the confusion which he thinks is at the root of the objection. Since the ontological argument ultimately reduces to an axiom, the source of an objection according to Descartes’ diagnosis is the failure of the objector to perceive this axiom clearly and distinctly. Thus, Descartes devotes the bulk of his efforts to trying to remove those philosophical prejudices which are hindering his objector from intuiting the axiom. These efforts are not always obvious, however. Descartes is good at maintaining the pretense of answering criticisms to a formal proof. But his replies to Caterus’ objections to the ontological argument are best read as an extended effort to dispel prejudice and confusion, so as to enable his reader to intuit God’s existence for himself.

Let us return for a moment to the objection that the ontological argument slides illicitly from the mental to the extramental realm. We have seen how Descartes responds to it, but it is related to another objection that has come to be associated with Leibniz. Leibniz claims that Descartes’ version of the ontological argument is incomplete. It shows merely that if God’s existence is possible or non-contradictory, then God exists. But it fails to demonstrate the antecedent of this conditional (Robert Adams 1998, 135). To reinforce this objection, it is sometimes observed that the divine perfections (omnipotence, omniscience, benevolence, eternality, etc.) might be inconsistent with one another. This objection is related to the previous one in that the point in both cases is that Descartes’ argument restricts us to claims about the concept of God and lacks existential import. In order to redress this issue himself, Leibniz formulates a different version of the ontological argument (see Adams 1998, 141f).

Descartes was dead long before Leibniz articulated this criticism but it was familiar to him from the Second Set of Objectors (Marin Mersenne et al.) (AT 7:127; CSM 2:91). He replies by appealing once again to the principle of clear and distinct perception, which states that if something is contained in the clear and distinct idea of something then it is not only possible but also true of that thing in reality. (Descartes might have said that if something is conceivable then it is possible, and a being having all perfections is conceivable, but he has an even stronger principle at his disposal in the rule for truth.) In effect, Descartes thinks he has already satisfied Mersenne and Leibniz’s extra condition. But Mersenne’s version of the objection goes further, urging that in order to know with certainty that God’s nature is possible, one must have an adequate idea that encompasses all of the divine attributes and the relations between them (ibid.) — something that Descartes denies that we have. Descartes responds to this criticism as follows:

[7] For as far as our concepts are concerned there is no impossibility in the nature of God; on the contrary, all the attributes which we include in the concept of the divine nature are so interconnected that it seems to us to be self-contradictory that any one of them should not belong to God (AT 7:151; CSM 2:107).

It is difficult to see how this statement on its own addresses Mersenne’s criticism, but here again we can gain a better grip on what Descartes has in mind by appealing to our earlier discussion in section 2. We noted there that on Descartes’ view there is merely a rational distinction between a substance and each of its attributes, and between any two attributes of a single substance. He also maintains that God has only attributes and no modes or accidental properties. This implies that there is merely a rational distinction between all of the divine perfections, something that he expressly affirms in his correspondence (see, e.g., AT 4:349; CSMK 3:280). In the Third Meditation he also notes that “the unity, simplicity, or the inseparability of all the divine attributes of God is one of the most important of the perfections which I understand him to have” (AT 7:50; CSM 2:34). So not only is there no inconsistency between the divine perfections, but we understand that one of the most important perfections is simplicity (contra Curley 2005), which is just to say that in God there is no distinction between his attributes: God’s omnipotence just is his omniscience, which just is his benevolence, etc. The very distinction between the divine attributes is confined to our thought or reason. This then is what he means by saying in passage [7] that the divine attributes are “interconnected,” which echoes a remark in the Third Meditation passage concerning “the interconnection and inseparability of the perfections” (ibid.). Descartes’ responses probably would not have satisfied Leibniz and Mersenne, but we can appreciate how they have a fundamental basis in his philosophical system.

Perhaps the most famous objection to the ontological argument is that existence is not a property or predicate. Popularized by Kant, this objection enjoys the status of a slogan known by every undergraduate philosophy major worth her salt. In claiming that existence is included in the idea of a supremely perfect being, along with all the other divine attributes, Descartes’ version of the argument appears to succumb to this objection.

It is not obvious of course that existence is not a predicate. To convince us of this point, Kant observes that there is no intrinsic difference between the concept of a hundred real thalers (coins common in Kant’s time) and the concept of a hundred possible thalers. Whenever we think of anything, we regard it as existing, even if the thing in question does not actually exist. Thus, existence does not add anything to the concept of a thing. What then is existence if not a predicate? Kant’s answer is that existence is “merely the positing of a thing” or “the copula of a judgment,” the point being that when we say “God exists” we are simply affirming that there is an object answering to the concept of God. We are not ascribing any new predicates to God, but merely judging that there is a subject, with all its predicates, in the world (CPR:B626–27).

Kant’s formulation of the objection was later refined by Bertrand Russell in his famous theory of descriptions. He argues that existential statements such as “God exists” are misleading as to their logical form. While serving grammatically as a predicate, the term “exists” in this sentence has a much different logical function, which is revealed only by analysis. Properly analyzed, “God exists” means “there is one (and only one) x such that ‘x is omnipotent, omniscient, etc.’ is true.” Russell thinks this translation shows that, appearances to the contrary, the statement “God exists” is not ascribing existence to a subject, but asserting that a certain description (in single quotes) applies to something in reality. Russell’s view is reflected in the standard modern logical treatment of existence as a quantifier rather than a predicate.

It is widely believed that Descartes did not have a response to this objection, indeed that he blithely assumed that existence is a property without ever considering the matter carefully. But this is not the case. The seventeenth-century empiricist Pierre Gassendi confronted Descartes with this criticism in the Fifth Set of Objections (and deserves credit for being the first to enunciate it): “existence is not a perfection either in God or in anything else; it is that without which no perfections can be present” (AT 7:323; CSM 2:224). As with most of his replies to Gassendi (whom he regarded as a loathsome materialist and quibbler), Descartes responded somewhat curtly. But it is clear from the discussion in section 2 that he had the resources for addressing this objection in a systematic manner.

Before examining how Descartes might defend himself, it is important to note that the question at issue is typically framed in non-Cartesian terms and thus often misses its target. Both Kant and Russell for example are interested in the logical issue of whether existence is a predicate. Descartes, in contrast, was not a logician and disparaged the standard subject-predicate logic inherited from Aristotle. Although, as discussed above, he sometimes presents formal versions of the ontological arguments as heuristic devices, Descartes thought that God’s existence is ultimately known through intuition. This intuitive process is psychological in character. It is not a matter of assigning predicates to subjects but of determining whether the idea of a supremely perfect being can be clearly and distinctly perceived while excluding necessary existence from it through a purely intellectual operation. To be sure, Descartes was interested in the ontological question of whether existence is a “property” of substances. For him, however, the analogues of properties are clear and distinct ideas and ways of regarding them, not predicates.

Having said that, Descartes’ best strategy for answering the ontological version of the objection is to concede it, or at least certain aspects of it. Descartes explicitly affirms Kant’s point that existence does not add anything to the idea of something (provided that the terms “idea” and “concept” are regarded as psychological items). Once again we should recall passage [4] from the Second Replies: “Existence is contained in the idea or concept of every single thing, since we cannot conceive of anything except as existing” (Axiom 10, AT 7:166; CSM 2:117). So, Descartes agrees with Kant that there is no conceptual difference between conceiving of a given substance as actually existing and conceiving it as merely possible. In the first instance one is attending to the existence that is contained in every clear and distinct idea, and in the other instance one is ignoring the thing’s existence without actively excluding it. He would, however, stress another conceptual difference that Kant and other critics do not address, namely that between the two grades of existence — contingent and necessary. The clear and distinct ideas of all finite things contain merely contingent or dependent existence, whereas the clear and distinct idea of God uniquely contains necessary or wholly independent existence (ibid.). As discussed previously, the ontological argument hinges on this distinction.

Another intuition underlying the claim that existence is not a property is that there is more intimate connection between an individual and its existence than the traditional one between a substance and a property, especially if the property in question is conceived as something accidental. If existence were accidental, then a thing could be without its existence, which seems absurd. It seems no less absurd to say that existence is a property among other properties (accidental or essential), for how can a thing even have properties if it does not exist? Descartes shares this intuition. He does not think that existence is a property in the traditional sense or is even distinct from the substance that is said to bear it. Recall the view discussed in section 2 that there is merely a rational distinction between a substance and its existence, or between the essence and existence of a substance. This means that the distinction between a substance and its existence is confined to thought or reason. Human beings, in their efforts to understand things using their finite intellects, draw distinctions in thought that do not obtain in reality. In reality, a substance (whether created or divine) just is its existence.

The purpose of this defense of Descartes is not to render a verdict as whether he has the correct account of existence, but to show that he has a rather sophisticated and systematic treatment of what has been one of the great bugbears in the history of philosophy. He does not make the ad hoc assumption that existence is an attribute in order to serve the needs of the ontological argument. Indeed, on Descartes’ view, existence is not a property in the traditional sense, nor can one conceive of something without regarding it as existing. Descartes’ critics might not be convinced by his account of existence, but then they have the burden of providing a better account. The focus of the debate will then be shifted to the question of who has the correct ontology, rather than whether the ontological argument is sound.


Primary Texts

  • Adam, Charles, and Paul Tannery, 1964–1976. Oeuvres de Descartes, vols. I-XII, revised edition. Paris: J. Vrin/C.N.R.S. [references to this work (abbreviated as AT) are by volume and page, separated by a colon.]
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