Divine Simplicity

First published Mon Mar 20, 2006; substantive revision Fri Oct 20, 2023

According to the classical theism of Augustine, Anselm, Aquinas and their adherents, God is radically unlike creatures and cannot be adequately understood in ways appropriate to them. God is simple in that God transcends every form of complexity and composition familiar to the discursive intellect. One consequence is that the simple God lacks parts. This lack is not a deficiency but a positive feature. God is ontologically superior to every partite entity, and his partlessness is an index thereof. Broadly construed, ‘part’ covers not only spatial and temporal parts (if any) but also metaphysical ‘parts’ or ontological constituents. To say that God lacks metaphysical parts is to say inter alia that God is free of matter-form composition, potency-act composition, and existence-essence composition. There is also no real distinction between God as subject of his attributes and his attributes. God is thus in some sense identical to each of his attributes, which implies that each attribute is identical to every other one. God is omniscient, then, not in virtue of instantiating or exemplifying omniscience — which would imply a real distinction between God and the property of omniscience — but by being omniscience. And the same holds for each of the divine omni-attributes: God is what he has as Augustine puts it in The City of God, XI, 10. As identical to each of his attributes, God is identical to his nature. And since his nature or essence is identical to his existence, God is identical to his existence. This is the doctrine of divine simplicity (DDS). But how are we to understand ‘identity’ in this context? Is it an equivalence relation governed by the Indiscernibility of Identicals? Or is it some ‘looser’ form of sameness? These are important questions but ones that cannot be addressed in this entry except in passing.

DDS is represented not only in classical Christian theology, but also in Jewish, Greek, and Islamic thought. Moses Maimonides, for example, held that in God, “whose existence is not due to any cause … existence and essence are perfectly identical.” (The Guide for the Perplexed, Part One, LVII). DDS is to be understood as an affirmation of God’s absolute transcendence of creatures. God is not only radically non-anthropomorphic, but radically unlike creatures in general, not only in respect of the properties he possesses, but also in his manner of possessing them. It is not just that God has properties no creature has; the properties he has he has in a way different from the way any creature has any of its properties. God has his properties by being them. Some explain DDS by saying that God has no properties; this gloss, however, carries the unfortunate suggestion that God is a bare particular. It is better to put the point in a positive way by saying that God has properties, not by instantiating or exemplifying them, but by being them. Unique in his mode of property-possession, God is also unique in his mode of existence and in his modal status. He is not just one necessary being among others. His metaphysical necessity, unlike that of other necessary beings, is grounded in his simplicity. The actually infinite set of natural numbers is presumably a necessary being, along with each of its members, but neither set nor members are necessary in virtue of being ontologically simple. So while one may say that the simple God exists in all metaphysically possible worlds, that is no account of his unique mode of necessity, which is grounded in his simplicity. God is necessary because he is simple and not because he exists in all metaphysically possible worlds. And while one may say that the simple God is or exists, God is not an existent among existents or a being among beings, but Being (esse) itself in its prime instance and in this respect is different from every other being (ens). Unique in all these ways, God is uniquely unique. He is not unique as one of a kind, but unique in transcending the distinction between kind and member of a kind. God is unique in his very mode of uniqueness. The simple God, we could say, differs not only in his attributes, but also in his very ontological structure, from any and all created beings.

1. Motivation

What could motivate such a strange and seemingly incoherent doctrine? One central consideration in its favor derives from the Anselmian definition of God as maximally perfect, as that than which no greater can be conceived. A God who was less than maximally perfect would not be an absolute reality and an appropriate object of worship. A God who was less than ultimate and absolute would be an idol. Now an absolute reality must be a se, from itself, and so not dependent on anything distinct from itself either for its nature or for its existence. If God had properties in the way creatures have them, however, he would be distinct from them and so dependent on them. This is the case whether one thinks of a property of x as a constituent of x, or as an entity external to x to which x is tied by the asymmetrical relation (or nonrelational tie) of instantiation. If the properties of x are constituents or ontological (proper) parts of x, then x will depend on them in the same way that any whole composed of parts depends on its parts. But if x is tied to its properties by the asymmetrical relation of instantiation, it is still the case that x will depend on them: if x is F in virtue of x’s instantiation of F-ness, then F-ness is a logically prior condition of x’s being F. In sum, the divine aseity would seem to require that God be rather than have his attributes.

One can also arrive at the simplicity doctrine via the divine necessity. As maximally perfect, as that than which no greater can be conceived, God must be a metaphysically necessary being, one that cannot not exist. A necessary being is one whose possibility entails its existence, and whose nonexistence entails its impossibility. But what could be the ground of this necessity of existence if not the identity in God of essence and existence, possibility and actuality? Saying that God exists in all metaphysically possible worlds does not provide a ground, but merely a graphic Leibnizian representation, of the notion of necessary being. The possible worlds representation also does not distinguish the necessity of God from that of an abstract object such as the set of even primes. God is not just another necessary being among necessary beings; he is uniquely necessary as the source and ground of everything distinct from himself, including all non-divine necessary beings. Indeed, God is uniquely unique, i.e., unique in his mode of uniqueness, in that he is not one of a kind, or necessarily one of a kind, but unique in transcending the kind-instance difference altogether. A divine being cannot possess contingent modal status: if God exists, then he is necessary, and if he does not exist, then he is impossible. So if God exists, then there is a very tight connection between the divine nature and the divine existence. The simplicity doctrine in its traditional and strongest form assays this ‘tightness’ as identity. The divine simplicity thus grounds the divine necessity. God is necessary because he is simple. It is easy to see that the divine simplicity also grounds God’s possession of essential properties. God has his attributes essentially because he is identical to his attributes. Nothing is more essential to a thing than something to which it is identical.

A third motivation for DDS lies in the fact that it provides a solution to the ancient Euthyphro dilemma first presented by Plato in his eponymous dialog. Does God command the good because it is good, and forbid the bad because it is bad, or is the good good and the bad bad because God commands/forbids it? If the former, God’s willing would be subject to an external standard logically antecedent to God to the detriment of the divine sovereignty. If the latter, the content of morality would be arbitrary because subject to God’s free will. On DDS, however, the dilemma is a false alternative. If God is goodness itself in its prime instance, then he is not subject to a standard; he is the standard. And if God, being simple, just is his willing, then he cannot will anything other than the good and the appearance of arbitrarity vanishes. See Feser (2009, 129) who draws on Stump (2003).

Note that while the traditional approach to divine simplicity is in terms of identity, this approach is open to what Dolezal (2011, 136–144) calls the “harmonist challenge” according to which, on one variation, that of Immink (1987), the divine attributes are not identical but necessarily equivalent. Dolezal also counts Swinburne (1994) among the harmonists. Harmonism will not be discussed further in this entry. See Dolezal (2011) for competent critique of harmonism and for an overall excellent defense of DDS.

Besides perfection and necessity, immateriality, eternity, and immutability also seem to point to simplicity as their ground. Because God is simple, he cannot have parts and so cannot have material or temporal parts. And because God is simple, he cannot harbor any unrealized potentialities, and so must be immutable. The centrality of DDS to medieval philosophical theology is shown by its position in the order of topics in Aquinas’ Summa Theologica. It occurs as Question 3 right after Question 2 on the existence of God.

Finally, the triune nature of the God of classical Christian theism may also be taken as motivating DDS within Christian theology, and this despite the initial suspicion that Trinity is incompatible with divine simplicity. According to Wedgeworth (2019, 62), “Athanasius of Alexandria consistently used the doctrine of divine simplicity to argue that the Son’s eternal Generation from the Father proved his absolute deity ….” To pursue this further lies beyond the scope of this entry.

2. The Question of Coherence

The very notion of an ontologically simple being will be dismissed by many as self-evidently incoherent. Among theists, there are those who will argue that DDS does not cohere with some other theistic commitment such as the doctrine of the Trinity. The main concern of this article is not with such intramural coherence questions, but with the question of whether or not DDS is coherent at all. This broad coherence question is not whether the doctrine is true, or even possibly true; the question is whether it is possible for us to think it without obvious contradictions and category mistakes. Ultimately, the broad coherence question concerns the sort of general metaphysical framework that would allow DDS to be discussed as a live option as opposed to being dismissed as incoherent from the outset.

A central threat to coherence is the question of how a thing could be identical to its properties. Alvin Plantinga (1980, 47) maintains that if God is identical to his properties, then he is a property, and they are a single property, in which case God is a single property. Given that properties are abstract entities, and abstracta are causally inert, then God is abstract and causally inert — which is of course inconsistent with the core tenet of classical theism according to which God is the personal creator and sustainer of every contingent being. No abstract object is either a person or a causal agent. No abstract object can be omniscient, or indeed know anything at all. More fundamentally, no abstract entity can be identical to any concrete entity. God as person and creator is concrete. Abstracta and concreta are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive. Nothing can be both. Objections similar to Plantinga’s have been raised by Richard Gale (1991, 23 ff.), William Hasker (2016, 703) and others.

It is easy to see that Plantinga-style objections will not appear decisive to those who reject his metaphysical framework. Indeed, Plantinga’s accusations of category mistake may strike students of the main medieval proponents of DDS as so many misunderstandings based on a foisting of a foreign framework on their ideas. Plantinga, along with many other philosophers, thinks of individuals and properties as belonging to disjoint categories connected by an external relation of exemplification. Individuals are causally efficacious concreta whereas properties are causally impotent abstracta. Such an approach to ontology renders the divine simplicity inconceivable from the outset. For if God is a concrete individual and his nature (conceived perhaps as the conjunction of his omni-attributes) is an abstract property, then the general ontology rules out any identity or sameness of God and his nature. Any such identity or sameness would violate the separateness of the two categories. To identify an unexemplifiable concretum with an exemplifiable abstractum would amount to a category mistake. At most, a Plantinga-style approach allows for God’s exemplification of his nature where the (first-level) exemplification relation, unlike the identity relation, is asymmetrical and irreflexive and so enforces the non-identity of its relata. In short, if God exemplifies his nature, then God must be distinct from his nature, just as Socrates must be distinct from his nature. God’s nature is then something he has, by exemplification, not, pace Augustine, something he is by some form of identity or sameness.

3. Constituent Versus Nonconstituent Ontology

Since a Plantinga-type approach to ontology rules out DDS from the outset, no sophisticated adherent of the doctrine will adopt such an approach. The DDS defender will embrace an ontology that accommodates an ontologically simple being. Indeed, as Nicholas Wolterstorff (1991) notes, classical proponents of DDS such as Aquinas had a radically different ontological style, one that allowed for the coherent conceivability of DDS. They did not think of individuals as related to their properties as to abstracta external to them, but as having properties as ontological constituents. They, and some atheist contemporaries as well, think in terms of a “constituent ontology” as opposed to what Wolterstorff calls a “relation ontology” or what might be called a “nonconstituent ontology”. Bundle theories are contemporary examples of constituent ontology. If properties are assayed as tropes and a concrete particular as a bundle of tropes, then these tropes or abstract particulars are parts of concrete particulars when suitably bundled. Properties so assayed are brought from Plato’s heaven to earth. The togetherness or compresence of tropes in a trope bundle is not formal identity but a kind of contingent sameness. Thus a redness trope and a sweetness trope in an apple are not identical but contingently compresent as parts of the same whole. A model such as this allows for an extrapolation to a necessary compresence of the divine attributes in the case of God. Aquinas, the greatest of the medieval proponents of DDS, is of course an Aristotelian, not a trope theorist. But he too is a constituent ontologist. Form and matter, act and potency, and essence and existence are constituents of primary substances. Essence and existence in sublunary substances such as Socrates are really distinct but inseparably together. Their unity is contingent. This model permits an extrapolation to the case of a being in which essence and existence are necessarily together or compresent. Constituent ontology, as murky as it must remain on a sketch such as this, at least provides a framework in which DDS is somewhat intelligible as opposed to a Plantinga-style framework on which DDS remains wholly unintelligible. The arguments for DDS amount to arguments against the nonconstituent ontological framework.

Adopting a constituent ontology will not, by itself, bring DDS into the clear. Suppose properties (whether assayed as universals or as tropes) are ontological parts of the ordinary (thick) particulars that have them and that this having is understood quasi-mereologically as a kind of part-whole relation rather than as an exemplification relation that spans the abstract-concrete divide. This would still leave us with the puzzle of how a whole could be identical to one of its proper parts, and the related puzzle of how two distinct proper parts could be identical to each other. Construing properties as parts of the things that have them does not, by itself, show how there could be a simple being. But if properties are parts, then at least Plantinga’s dismissal of DDS on the ground that nothing concrete can be identical to anything abstract can itself be dismissed.

What is needed to render DDS coherent is a particular version of constituent ontology according to which a thing’s nature is a unitary concrete item and a constituent of the thing. In the case of material beings, the nature will be together with some individuating constituent such as signate or designated matter (materia signata). Material beings are individuated and diversified by their signate matter. Thus Socrates and Plato, though the same in nature, differ numerically in virtue of their different portions of materia signata. Matter makes them individuals, and matter makes them numerically diverse individuals. God, however, being immaterial, is not individuated by anything distinct from his nature, and so can be said to be a self-individuating nature. As self-individuating, there is no real distinction between God and his nature. In Thomist terms, in God nature and suppositum are identical.(ST I, q. 3, art. 3) The divine nature is not an abstract object related across an ontological chasm to a concrete individual;the divine nature is a self-individuating concrete unitary nature. For Plantinga, the nature of a thing is a conjunctive property the conjuncts of which are those properties the thing exemplifies in every possible world in which it exists. On this approach, the divine nature is ‘cobbled together’ or constructed out of God’s essential properties. But then the divine nature is logically and ontologically posterior to those properties. Clearly, no defender of DDS will think of natures in this way. He will think of the divine nature as logically and ontologically prior to the properties, and of the properties as manifestations of that unitary nature, a nature the radical unity of which cannot be made sense of on Plantinga’s approach. None of this is spectacularly clear, and plenty of questions remain; but it is not obviously incoherent as DDS would be on the approach of Plantinga. And our question, you will recall, is concerned solely with coherence.

3.1 God and His Nature

One can see from the foregoing that Plantinga-type objections are not compelling. The reason, again, is that DDS cannot be made sense of within a nonconstituent ontology. It can be made sense of, assuming it can be made sense of, only within a constituent ontology, the style of ontology presupposed by its main defender, Aquinas. A nonconstituent ontologist like Plantinga may be represented as arguing by Modus Ponens: If God exemplifies his nature, then he is distinct from it; God exemplifies his nature; ergo, God is distinct from his nature, and DDS is false. But the constituent ontologist is justified in switching to Modus Tollens: If God exemplifies his nature, then he is distinct from it; God is not distinct from his nature; ergo, God does not exemplify his nature but has his nature by being identical with it.

We have just seen how God can be identical to his nature where “can be” is elliptical for “can be conceived without obvious incoherence.” But there are two other problems that also pose a serious threat to the coherence of DDS. One concerns how God can be identical to his existence, the other how the divine attributes can be identical to each other.

3.2 God and His Existence

Taking the first question first, on a Plantinga-style approach, it makes no sense to say that God is identical either to existence or to his existence. For Plantinga, existence is a first-level property that everything exemplifies. Given that “exemplifies” picks out a two-term irreflexive and asymmetrical relation, God cannot be identical with existence. Nor can God be identical to his existence. The latter is presumably a state of affairs, an abstract object, and no concretum can be identical with an abstractum on pain of violating the separateness of the concrete and abstract realms. There are, however, plenty of reasons (Vallicella 2002, Ch. 2) to reject the view that existence is a first-level property and the ontological schemes that entail it. One intuition that many share is that existence is not one of an individual’s properties, but that in virtue of which it has any properties in the first place: it is more like the unity or cohesion of an individual’s properties (Vallicella 2002, Ch. 6).

Another route to the identity of God with his existence is via the divine necessity. Although it is true to say that a contingent being is one that exists in some, but not all, metaphysically possible worlds, that is not what makes a contingent being contingent. What makes a contingent being contingent is the real distinction in it between essence and existence. What makes an absolutely necessary being necessary, then, is the lack of such a distinction. God, who has his necessity from himself and not from another, is therefore identical to his existence. One can say, if one likes, that God exists in all metaphysically possible worlds, but that is true only because in God essence and existence are the same. The divine simplicity is the ground of the divine necessity. Given the way our minds work, we cannot think of God without distinguishing between essence and existence; but that is our affair and not God’s. In reality, God is his existence.

3.3 The Identity of the Divine Attributes

The foregoing may explain how it is conceivable without obvious incoherence that God and his nature and God and his existence be identical, but how does it answer the second question? How does it explain the conceivability without obvious incoherence of the identity of the divine attributes with each other? If each attribute is identical to God, then each attribute is identical to each other by the Transitivity of Identity. For example, if God = omniscience, and God = omnipotence, then omniscience = omnipotence. But how could each attribute be identical to God? If we can understand how each attribute can be identical to God, then we can understand how every attribute can be identical to every other one.

We have already seen how, if we embrace a constituent approach to ontology, the divine nature can be coherently conceived as identical to God. Being immaterial, there is nothing in God to distinguish him from his nature. So he is identical to his nature. The divine nature is, or can be thought of as, a property. So there is at least one property that is self-instantiating: it has itself as its sole instance, and indeed as its sole possible instance. If this is coherently conceivable, then the same will be true of perfect knowledge, perfect power, and so on: if instantiated, these attributes are self-instantiated in every possible world and by the same thing in every possible world (Vallicella 1992). Thus not only is the divine nature identical to an individual, each divine perfection is identical to an individual, namely God, whence it follows that each perfection is identical to every other one.

A structurally similar approach is suggested by Christopher Hughes. Think of first-level properties as David Lewis (1986, 50 ff.) does: as sets of actual and possible individuals. Then the property of being red will be the set of all actual and possible red individuals and the property of being perfectly powerful will be the set consisting of all actual and possible perfectly powerful individuals. But there is only one such individual, God. Only God is perfectly powerful and only God can be perfectly powerful. So perfect power = {God}. As Hughes (1989, 65) notes, Quine holds that a singleton and its member are identical. If so, then perfect power = {God} = God. It should be added that if we have already abandoned nonconstituent ontology with its rigid bifurcation of the concrete and the abstract according to which the two realms are disjoint, then we no longer have a reason to argue that a concrete individual and its singleton must be distinct on the ground that the former is concrete while the latter is abstract. Constituent ontology allows for a sort of ‘coalescence’ of the concrete and the abstract, the particular and the universal. Indeed, such a coalescence is what we find in the simple God who is in some sense both concrete and abstract in that he is a nature that is its own suppositum.

Thus there appears to be justification for the move from perfect power = {God} to perfect power = God. And similarly for perfect knowledge, etc. In this way one can render coherent the notion that the perfections constitutive of the divine nature are identical with one another. For if each is identical to God, then each is identical to every other one.

3.4 God and Mann: DDS and Property-Instances

William Mann cites a couple of difficulties that arise if the divine attributes are said to be identical to each other. The first is that if God = wisdom, and God = life, then wisdom = life. But wisdom and life are not even extensionally equivalent, let alone identical. If Tom is alive, it doesn’t follow that Tom is wise (Mann 2015, 23). The second difficulty is that if God is wisdom, and Socrates is wise by participating in wisdom, then Socrates is wise by participating in God. But this smacks of heresy. No creature participates in God (Mann 2015, 23). The problem arises if the divine attributes are thought to be universals.

Enter property instances. It is one thing to say that God is wisdom, quite another to say that God is God’s wisdom. God’s wisdom is an example of a property instance. And similarly for the other divine attributes. God is not identical to life; God is identical to his life. Suppose we say that God = God’s wisdom, and God = God’s life. It would then follow that God’s wisdom = God’s life, but not that God = wisdom or that wisdom = life. So if we construe identity with properties as identity with property instances, then we can evade both of the above difficulties. Mann’s idea, then, is that the identity claims made within DDS should be taken as Deity-instance identities (e.g., God is his omniscience) and as instance-instance identities (e.g., God’s omniscience is God’s omnipotence), but not as Deity-property identities (e.g., God is omniscience) or as property-property identities (e.g., omniscience is omnipotence). Support for Mann’s approach is readily available in the texts of the doctor angelicus (Mann 2015, 24). Aquinas says things like, Deus est sua bonitas, “God is his goodness.”

But what exactly is a property instance? If the concrete individual Socrates instantiates the abstract universal property wisdom, then two further putative items come into consideration. One is the (Chisholmian-Plantingian as opposed to Bergmannian-Armstrongian) state of affairs, Socrates’ being wise. Such items are abstract, i.e., not in space or time. The other is the property instance, the wisdom of Socrates. Mann rightly holds that they are distinct. All abstract states of affairs exist, but only some of them obtain or are actual. By contrast, all property instances are actual: they cannot exist without being actual. The wisdom of Socrates is a particular, an unrepeatable item, just as Socrates is, and the wisdom of Socrates is concrete (in space and/or time) just as Socrates is. If we admit property instances into our ontology, then the above two difficulties can be circumvented. Or so Mann maintains.

But then other problems loom. One is this. If the F-ness of God = God, if, for example, the wisdom of God = God, then God is a property instance. But God is a person. How could a person be a property instance? From the frying pan into the fire? How could the stupendous and super-eminent reality of God be reduced to something as ontologically flimsy as a property instance? The problem displayed as an inconsistent triad: (a) God is a property instance; (b) God is a person; (c) No person is a property instance.

Mann solves the triad by denying (c) (2015, 37). Some persons are property instances. Indeed, Mann argues that every person is a property instance because everything is a property instance. (2015, 38) God is a person and therefore a property instance. If you object that persons are concrete while property instances are abstract, Mann’s response is that both are concrete (2015, 37). To be concrete is to be in space and/or time (2015, 37). Socrates is concrete in this sense, but so is his being sunburned.

If you object that persons are substances and thus independent items while property instances are not substances but dependent on substances, Mann’s response will be that the point holds for accidental property instances but not for essential property instances. Socrates may lose his wisdom but he cannot lose his humanity. Now all of God’s properties are essential: God is essentially omniscient, omnipotent, etc. So it seems to Mann that “the omniscience of God is not any more dependent on God than God is on the omniscience of God: should either cease to be, the other would also.” (2015, 37) This is scarcely compelling: x can depend on y even if both are necessary beings. Both the set whose sole member is the number 7 and the number 7 itself are necessary beings, but the set depends on its member both for its existence and its necessity, and not vice versa. Closer to home, Aquinas held that some necessary beings have their necessity from another while one has its necessity in itself. I should think that the omniscience of God is dependent on God, and not vice versa. Mann’s view, however, is not unreasonable. Intuitions vary.

Mann’s argument for the thesis that everything is a property instance involves the notion of a rich property. The rich property of an individual x is a conjunctive property the conjuncts of which are all and only the essential and accidental properties, some of them temporally indexed, instantiated by x throughout x’s career (2015, 38). Mann tells us that for anything whatsoever there is a corresponding rich property. From this he concludes that “everything is a property instance of some rich property or other” (38). It follows that every person is a property instance. The argument seems to be this: (a) For every concrete individual x, there is a corresponding rich property R. Therefore, (b) for every concrete individual x, x is a property instance of some rich property or other. Therefore, (c) For every concrete individual x, if x is a person, then x is a property instance.

Vallicella (2016, 379) argues that the move from (a) to (b) smacks of a non sequitur absent some auxiliary premise. Let it be granted arguendo that for each concrete individual x there is a corresponding rich property R. And let it be granted that there are property instances. So, in addition to Socrates and wisdom, there is the wisdom of Socrates. Recall that this property instance is not to be confused with the abstract state of affairs, Socrates’ being wise. From what has been granted it follows that for each x there is the rich property instance, the R-ness of x. But how is it supposed to follow that everything is a property instance? Everything instantiates properties, and in this sense everything is an instance of properties; but this is not to say that everything is a property instance. Socrates instantiates a rich property, and so is an instance of a property, but it doesn’t follow that Socrates is a property instance. Something seems to be missing in Mann’s argument.

There is of course no chance that Mann is confusing being an instance of a property with being a property instance. If a instantiates F-ness, then a is an instance of the property F-ness; but a is not a property instance as philosophers use this phrase: the F-ness of a is a property instance. So what do we have to add to Mann’s argument for it to generate the conclusion that every concrete individual is a property instance? How do we validate the inferential move from (a) to (b)? Let ‘Rs’ stand for Socrates’ rich property. We have to add the claim that there is nothing one could point to that could distinguish Socrates from the property instance generated when Socrates instantiates Rs. Rich property instances are a special case of property instances. Socrates cannot be identical to his wisdom because he can exist even if his wisdom does not exist. And he cannot be identical to his humanity because there is more to Socrates that his humanity, even though he cannot exist without it. But since Socrates’ rich property instance includes all his property instances, why can’t Socrates be identical to this rich property instance? And so Mann’s thought seems to be that there is nothing that could distinguish Socrates from his rich property instance. So they are identical. And likewise for every other individual. But it is arguable that it is a mistake to hold that every person is a property instance. Here (Vallicella 2016 379–380) is one argument.

Rich Properties and Haecceity Properties. Socrates can exist without his rich property; ergo, he can exist without his rich property instance; ergo, Socrates cannot be a rich property instance or any property instance. The truth of the initial premise is fallout from the definition of ‘rich property.’ The R of x is a conjunctive property each conjunct of which is a property of x. Thus Socrates’ rich property includes (has as a conjunct) the property of being married to Xanthippe. But Socrates might not have had that property, whence it follows that he might not have had R. (If R has C as a conjunct, then necessarily R has C as a conjunct, which implies that R cannot be what it is without having exactly the conjuncts it in fact has. An analog of mereological essentialism holds for conjunctive properties.) And because Socrates might not have had R, he might not have had the property instance of R. So Socrates cannot be identical to this property instance. What Mann needs is not a rich property, but an haecceity property: one that individuates Socrates across every possible world in which he exists. His rich property, by contrast, individuates him in only the actual world. In different worlds, Socrates has different rich properties. And in different worlds, Socrates has different rich property instances. It follows that Socrates cannot be identical to, or even necessarily equivalent to, any rich property instance. An haecceity property, however, is a property Socrates has in every world in which he exists, and which he alone has in every world in which he exists. Now if there are such haecceity properties as identity-with-Socrates, then perhaps we can say that Socrates is identical to a property instance, namely, the identity-with-Socrates of Socrates. Unfortunately, there are powerful arguments for rejecting haecceity properties (Vallicella 2002, 99–104). So we ought to conclude that concrete individuals cannot be identified with property instances, whence follows the perhaps obvious proposition that no person is a property instance, not God, not me, not Socrates.

3.5 God and McCann: DDS and Concrete States of Affairs

To conceptualize a simple God it seems we must assign him to some familiar category or other. But how is this possible if, as DDS implies, God is utterly sui generis and unique in his very mode of uniqueness? It might not be possible at all, in which case silence might be the most appropriate response. But let’s not give up just yet. Vallicella (1992) suggests that God is assimilable to a self-exemplifying property, a Platonic Form. Hughes goes nominalist with his idea that God is something like a singleton set. Mann assimilates God to a property instance or trope. Hugh McCann, rejecting Mann’s view, proposes that we think of God as a concrete state of affairs. Such are to be distinguished from abstract states of affairs. Contrast Booth’s assassinating Lincoln with Booth assassinating Lincoln. Both are states of affairs, but only the former is concrete in the sense of causally active/passive. Whereas the former is an act (act-token), the latter is an act-type. The former was causally efficacious; the latter is disbarred from causal efficacy by its ontological category. McCann’s proposal, then, is that God be thought of as a concrete state of affairs along the lines of Michaelangelo’s creating of the Sistine Chapel’s ceiling.

Thus is concretion secured, but whither simplicity? A concrete state of affairs such as Socrates’ being pale is a complex both the subject and the property constituent of which are necessary for its identity. Property instance or tropes, by contrast, are simples: the paleness trope in Socrates, though it cannot ‘migrate’ to Plato, does not have Socrates as a constituent and so is not tied to the philosopher for its identity. Now McCann is well aware that the ontological complexity of concrete states of affairs does not comport well with divine simplicity. But he thinks it is the best we can do.

Although McCann doesn’t say it, it seems to follow from his whole approach that God cannot be a member of any extant ontological category: he cannot be a universal or a set or a trope … or a concrete state of affairs. Indeed, if he is absolutely sovereign, then God must somehow be the creative source of the ontological categories themselves, how many they are and what they are, and not merely the source of the natures (essences) of the members of categories. God must transcend all categories. Taken to the limit, absolute sovereignty would seem to imply absolute transcendence— and absolute ineffability. Clearly, this is what the simplicity doctrine culminates in and is meant to preserve. So there is a tension here if not a contradiction: it cannot be true both that God is beyond all ontological categories and is a member of the category of concrete states of affairs. But if we are to have any conception of God at all, we must force him into some extant category or other, and for McCann the category of concrete state of affairs is the best we can do. One walks a tightrope when one attempts to avoid negative theology with its “nothing can be said positively about God.” Citing various texts of Aquinas, Eleonore Stump (2016, 195–198) shows that radical agnosticism about the divine nature is unwarranted. To know what God is not, one must have some knowledge of what God is. The claim that God is not a body, for example, rests on such affirmations as that God is the prime mover and is purely actual.

4. Preserving Divine Transcendence While Avoiding Negative Theology

So far we have explored how God can be (i) identical to his nature, (ii) identical to his existence, and (iii) such that his omni-attributes are identical to one another. But a very serious problem remains, a problem that arises when we consider properties in some sense shared by God and creatures. It is obvious that the divine perfections cannot be shared with creatures: only God is perfectly powerful, wise, good, and so on. Socrates is at best imperfectly powerful, wise, good, and so on. But there must be some properties that God and creatures share if God is not to be a wholly other than creatures and out of all relation to them. These shared properties, however, pose a threat to DDS as we shall see in a moment. The problem in a nutshell is to reconcile the divine transcendence, of which DDS is an expression, with the need for some commensurability between God and creatures. The problem, in other words, is to find a way of preserving transcendence while avoiding a self-vitiating negative theology according to which nothing can be positively affirmed of God, not even that he exists.

God is powerful, but so is Socrates. The use of ‘powerful’ in ‘God is powerful’ and ‘Socrates is powerful’ is not equivocal. That God is perfectly powerful while Socrates is imperfectly powerful does not alter the fact that both are powerful. Whether a thing is perfectly powerful or imperfectly powerful, it is powerful. There is a difference in degree of power, but the difference in degree seems to presuppose (and thus entail) a sameness in respect of being powerful. Now if God and Socrates are both powerful, then God has a property with which he is not identical, namely, the property of being powerful, and this contradicts DDS. For if God is identical with the property of being powerful, then he cannot share this property with Socrates. The argument, then, is this:

  1. Necessarily, for any x, if x is perfectly (maximally) F, then x is F.

From (1) together with the premise that God is perfectly powerful, it follows that

  1. God is powerful.

But among creatures we also find agents of varying degrees of power, so it is also true that

  1. Socrates is powerful.

It follows from (2) and (3) that

  1. There are properties that God and creatures share.

If x and y share a property P, then P is distinct from both x and y. Therefore,

  1. There are properties of God with which God is not identical, which implies that DDS is false.

4.1 Proposal One: Sameness of Predicate No Guarantee of Sameness of Property

Graham Oppy (2003) suggests a way to defeat the foregoing argument. Oppy (in effect) rejects the inference from (2) and (3) to (4). Given the truth of ‘God is powerful’ and ‘Socrates is powerful,’ it does not follow that there is a property expressed by the predicate ‘powerful’ that is shared by God and Socrates. On Oppy’s approach, both sentences are true, and the predicate ‘powerful’ has the same sense in both sentences. There is no equivocation and no analogy either. It is just that there is no one property that is expressed by the predicate in its two occurrences. If this right, then there is no warrant for (4) and the above argument against DDS collapses.

Oppy is not denying that many predicates express properties; he is denying that all do. Taking a page from David Armstrong (1978), he is saying that predicates and their senses provide no sure guidance as to what properties (Armstrongian immanent universals) the world contains. It follows that the ontological structure of the truth-maker of a true sentence cannot be read off from the syntactic structure of the sentence of which it is the truth-maker. Therefore, the fact that our two sentences (3) and (4) have the form a is F does not warrant the conclusion that the respective truth-makers have the structure: particular-exemplifying-same universal. Oppy writes:

That two sentences of the form ‘a is red’ and ‘b is red’ are both true does not entail that there is some universal that plays a role in making both of these sentences true; it is possible that none of the universals that play a role in making true the sentence ‘a is red’ have any role in making true the sentence ‘b is red.’ (This point is supported by those lines of thought which suggest that, from a scientific standpoint, ‘redness’ constitutes a highly gerrymandered and heterogeneous ‘kind.’) (Oppy 2003, p. 15)

The idea is essentially this. Suppose that something is an H if and only if it is either an F or a G. One can easily see that if a is H and b is H, it does not follow that there is some one property that they share. For it might be that a is H in virtue of a’s exemplifying F-ness and b is H in virtue of b’s exemplifying G-ness. Applied to Socrates and the simple God: Socrates is powerful in virtue of exemplifying P1 while God is powerful in virtue of exemplifying P2. Thus there is no one property, the property of being powerful, that both exemplify. So (4) above is false, and the argument against DDS collapses. Since a full defense of Oppy’s defense of DDS is beyond the scope of the present entry, we shall focus on a second way of defusing the objection.

4.2 Proposal Two: ‘Perfect’ as an Alienans Adjective

The above argument against DDS requires the assumption that if x is perfectly F, then x is F. This is highly plausible but not quite obvious, since as Barry Miller (1996, Ch. 5) argues, ‘perfect’ might be an alienans adjective. An alienans adjective is one that shifts, alters, alienates, the sense of the noun that it modifies. Thus ‘decoy’ in ‘decoy duck’ is an alienans adjective: from the fact that a thing is a decoy duck one cannot infer that it is a duck in the way in which one can infer from the fact that a thing is a male duck that it is a duck. So if ‘perfectly’ in ‘perfectly powerful’ is an alienans adjective, then God can be perfectly powerful without being powerful, and the above objection to DDS collapses.

At first glance, this may appear to be a senseless suggestion. Power is an attribute that admits of degrees. Perfect power is therefore quite naturally viewed as the maximal degree of power. So viewed, perfect power is generically identical with any submaximal degree of power. According to Miller, however, there is an important distinction between a limit simpliciter and a limit case. A limit simpliciter differs merely in degree from that of which it is the limit simpliciter, whereas a limit case differs absolutely from that of which it is the limit case. Thus the limit simpliciter of an F is an F, while the limit case of an F is not an F. What Miller argues is that the divine perfections are limit cases, not limits simpliciter, of such properties as power and knowledge. As such, they have nothing generically in common with the corresponding attributes in creatures.

To appreciate the limit simpliciter/limit case distinction, consider the speed of moving bodies. It has an upper limit, the speed of light. This is a limit simpliciter. But the lower limit, namely the speed 0 km/sec, is a limit case and not a limit simpliciter. Whereas the upper limit simpliciter is a speed, the lower limit case is not a speed. A particle moving at 0 km/sec is not moving. For a second example, consider the series: 3-place predicable, 2-place predicable, 1-place predicable. Since a predicable (e.g., “___ is wise”) must have at least one place to be a predicable, a 1-place predicable is a limit simpliciter of the ordered series of predicables. Although talk of zero-place predicables comes naturally, as when we speak of a proposition as a zero-place predicable, a zero-place predicable is no more a predicable than negative growth is growth. “Zero-place” is an alienans adjective like “negative” in “negative growth.” So a zero-place predicable is not a limit simpliciter of the series in question, but a limit case of this series: it is not a member of the series of which it is the limit case. It nevertheless stands in some relation to the members of the series inasmuch as they and the way they are ordered point to the limit case (Miller 1996, p. 8).

The idea, then, is that God’s power is not the maximum, or limit simpliciter, of an ordered series of instances of power, but the limit case of power. This implies that God’s power is not an instance of power any more than a zero-place predicable is a predicable. No doubt this will surprise the perfect-being theologians, but, in mitigation, it can be said that God’s power, though not an instance of power, is that to which the ordered series of power-instances points, and is therefore something to which the members of that series stand in a definite relation.

Miller’s approach allows us to reject the premise of the above argument. The premise stated in effect that anything that is perfectly powerful is powerful. But if Miller is right, and God’s power is not the limit simpliciter of an ordered series of instances of power, and thus itself an instance of power, but is instead a limit case of power, then what is perfectly powerful need not be an instance of power.

4.3 Dolezal’s Mysterian Move

God is the absolute. An absolute cannot lack anything nor does it have any need to develop itself: it is, eternally, all that it can be. This implies that there is no act-potency distinction in God, no unrealized powers or potentialities. In the classical phrase, God is actus purus, pure act, wholly actual. James Dolezal puts it very well when he writes, “The consideration of God as ipsum esse subsistens and actus purus is crucial for any confession of God’s absolute existence” (Dolezal 2011, 214).

But to uphold the divine absoluteness, it is also necessary that God be libertarianly free in his production of creatures. He must be free either to create or not to create. For suppose that the divine nature is such that God must create. Then God would depend on the created world to be himself and to be fully actual. He would need what is other than himself to be himself. This entanglement with the relative would compromise the divine absoluteness. God would need the world as much as the world needs God. Each would require the other to be what it is. But then God would not be absolute (Dolezal, 210) Therefore, God must be free to either create or not create

So God must be both simple and free to be absolute. But it is very difficult to understand how a simple being could be free in the unconditional ‘could have done otherwise’ sense. If God is simple, then he is pure act, as was explained at the beginning of this entry. It follows that God is devoid of unrealized powers, potentialities, or de re possibilities. To act freely, however is to act in such a way that one (unconditionally) could have done otherwise, which implies unrealized possibilities of divine action. Now Dolezal’s view is that it is not only difficult to reconcile simplicity and (libertarian) freedom, but impossible for us, at least in our present state. “Though we discover strong reasons for confessing both simplicity and freedom in God, we cannot form an isomorphically adequate notion of how this is the case” (210). In footnote 55 on the same page, Dolezal brings up wave-particle duality: light behaves both like a particle and like a wave. We have good reason to believe that it is both despite the difficulty or impossibility of understanding how it could be both. On the basis of the quotation and the footnote it seems fair to Dolezal to pin the label ‘mysterian’ on him, at least with respect to the simplicity-freedom problem which is only one sub-problem within the divine simplicity constellation of problems. God is both simple and free, and he must be both to be God; it is a mystery, however, how he could be both.

If we have good reason to believe that p is true, and good reason to believe that q is true, then we have good reason to believe that p and q are logically consistent (with each other) despite an absence of understanding as to how they could be mutually consistent. What is actual is possible whether or not one can render intelligible how it is possible. For example, motion is actual, hence possible, despite one’s inability in the teeth of Zenonian considerations to understand how it is possible. Many similar examples could be given.

And so a mysterian move suggests itself: We are justified in maintaining both that God is simple and that God is free despite the fact that after protracted effort we cannot make logical sense of this conjunction. If we have good arguments for both limbs of what appears to be a logically contradictory dyad, it could be that the contradiction is merely apparent. The fact that the conjunction — God is simple and God is free — appears to us, and perhaps even necessarily appears to us, to be or rather entail an explicit logical contradiction is not a compelling reason to reject the conjunction. It is a reason, perhaps even a good reason, but not a rationally compelling one. For it may be that our cognitive architecture saddles us with irremediable cognitive limitations that make it impossible for us to understand how God could be both simple and libertarianly free. The mysterian is not a dialetheist: the mysterian does not claim that there are true contradictions. Like the rest of us, the mysterian eschews them like the plague. The mysterian point is rather that a proposition’s non-episodic and chronic seeming to be a contradiction does not suffice for its rejection. For it may well be that certain truths are inaccessible to us due to our mental limitations and defects, and that among these truths are some that appear to us only in the guise of contradictions, and must so appear in this life. The religious mysterian can bolster the point by referencing the Fall. Sin, after all, may be expected to have noetic consequences. Of course, Dolezal’s mysterian move cannot be reasonably made unless the extant attempts to reconcile simplicity and freedom are failures. That they are failures is not difficult to believe. So mysterianism is up and running despite its own problems. What might these be?

First, if a (conjunctive) proposition’s seeming, after careful and repeated scrutiny, to be or entail an explicit logical contradiction is not sufficient, or at least good enough, evidence of its being a contradiction, what would be? To put it another way, one’s inability to explain how it could be true both that p and that q does seem to be pretty good (non-demonstrative) evidence that p and q are not both true. Now it was noted above that the actual is possible whether or not one can explain how it is possible. Granted, but if one cannot explain the ‘how,’ doubt is cast on the actuality. The tables can be turned. How adjudicate between these opposing lines of argument: A: Because X is actual, X is possible, whether or not anyone can explain how it is possible! B: Because no one can explain how it is possible, it is not possible, and therefore not actual!

Second, if all extant attempts to reconcile simplicity and freedom fail, it does not follow that there isn’t a solution right over the horizon. How can a mysterian rule out the possibility of a future solution? The mysterian seems committed to saying that it is impossible (at least in this life) that there be a solution. How can he be sure of this?

Third, if a proposition appears under careful scrutiny to be or entail a contradiction, then is there even a proposition before the mind? If you require for x’s salvation that x believe that God is one and God is three, what exactly are you demanding that x believe? Before x can affirm a proposition as true x must understand it, but how can x affirm as true a proposition that appears necessarily false? Such a ‘proposition’ is arguably not a proposition at all. God is simple but free appears to be in like case. As a matter of pure logic, there are of course necessarily false propositions: take the members of a contradictory pair of propositions and conjoin them, e.g., snow is white & snow is not white. This necessarily false proposition is arguably not a possible object of belief because of our charitable tendency to re-interpret blatant contradictions in some innocuous way. When our hermeneutical charity is thwarted, however, we suspend belief, not in a proposition, but in a putative proposition’s being a proposition, or in a verbal formula’s expressing a proposition.

4.4 Stump’s Quantum Metaphysics

Like Dolezal, Eleonore Stump thinks of God as self-subsistent Being (esse). If God is absolutely simple, and not just simple in the uncontroversial sense of lacking material parts, then God must be self-subsistent Being. God is at once both Being and something that is. He has to be both. If he were Being (esse) but not a being (id quod est), he could not enter into causal relations. He could not do anything such as create the world, intervene in its operations, or interact with human persons. Such a God would be “religiously pernicious” (Stump 2016, 199). Indeed, if God were Being but not a being, then one could not sensibly maintain that God exists. For if Being is other than every being, then Being is not. (It is instructive to note that Martin Heidegger, the famous critic of onto-theology, who holds to the “ontological difference” of Being (Sein) from every being (Seiendes) ends up assimilating Being to Nothing (Nichts).) On the other hand, if God were a being among beings who merely has Being but is not (identically) Being, then he would not be absolutely transcendent, worthy of worship, or ineffable. Such a God would be “comfortingly familiar” but “discomfitingly anthropomorphic” (Miller 1996, 3). It is not clear that DDS is susceptible of a satisfactory articulation acceptable to most theists. There is no reason to be sanguine. But if such could be achieved then we would have a via media between the Scylla of negative theology according to which nothing can be truly said or known about God and the Charybdis of an anthropomorphic theology according to which “… God’s properties are merely human ones, albeit extended to the maximum degree possible” (Miller, 1996, 3).

The problem, of course, is to explain how God can be both Being (esse) and something that is (ens). This is unintelligible to the discursive intellect. Either Being is other than beings or it is not. If Being is other than beings, then Being cannot itself be. That would imply that God, who must be Being itself to be absolute, cannot be. If, on the other hand, Being just is beings taken collectively, then God could only be a being among beings and not the absolute reality. To the discursive intellect the notion of self-subsistent Being is contradictory. For the idea here is that Being itself is a being, a very special being no doubt, but nonetheless a being, something that is. One response to the contradiction is simply to deny divine simplicity. That is a reasonable response, no doubt. But might it not also be reasonable to admit that there are things that human reason cannot understand, and that one of these things is the divine nature? “Human reason can see that human reason cannot comprehend the quid est of God.” (Stump 2016, 205)

On one reading of Stump, she, like Dolezal, makes a mysterian move, and she, like Dolezal (2011, 210, fn 55), invokes wave-particle duality. We cannot understand how light can be both a wave phenomenon and also particulate in nature, and yet it is both:

What kind of thing is it which has to be understood both as a wave and as a particle? We do not know. That is, we do not know the quid est of light. […] Analogously, we can ask: What kind of thing is it which can be both esse and id quod est? We do not know. The idea of simplicity is that at the ultimate metaphysical foundation of reality is something that has to be understood as esse —but also as id quod est. We do not know what this kind of thing is either. (Stump 2016, 202)

4.5 Hasker contra Dolezal and Stump

If the defender of DDS is driven to mysterianism, many will consider this a desperate jump from the frying pan into the fire. Dolezal, for example, holds that God must be both simple and libertarianly free to be absolute despite the apparent contradiction. How God can be both simple and free must remain a mystery. William Hasker balks: “This won’t do, of course” (2016, 19). His “of course” is of course a bit of bluster, but one feels his pain. “The argument Dolezal has given quite straightforwardly entails that the doctrine of divine simplicity is false …” (2016, 19). This is not an unreasonable thing to say, but is it compelling? Does it force a rational person to abandon DDS? Is it so compelling that DDS can be dismissed as a mistake, a correctable error in reasoning that one falls into due, perhaps, to inattention to certain obvious truths? Not quite.

Hasker takes the apparent contradiction to be real. But can he exclude the possibility that the contradiction is merely apparent? His view comports well with the notion that God is a being among beings. But for those who hold that the divine transcendence requires that God transcend beings in his mode of existence, his mode of property-possession, his mode of necessity, and his mode of uniqueness, it may seem more likely that the apparent contradictions that arise when we think about God reflect our structural inability to think of him as anything other than a very special being among beings.

For Stump, God is esse and God is also id quod est. These claims, though apparently contradictory, must both be affirmed. The apparent contradiction arises because of a “deficiency in our mode of speaking” (Stump 2016, 207). She presumably means that this deficiency is in this life irremediable and ineluctable. In reality, however, there is no contradiction; the laws of logic apply to God, “and not just anything can be correctly affirmed of God” (2016, 207).

Hasker is unimpressed:

… we do not, strictly speaking, have here a coherent view of God’s nature … . What we have, rather, is a set of mutually incompatible propositions, each of which has something to be said in its favor, but at least one of which must be false. (Hasker 2016, 23, fn 52)

Stump could agree with Hasker that she does not present us with “a coherent view of God’s nature,” but then that is precisely what her position implies cannot be had. Our mode of speaking about God is necessarily defective and inaccurate. If we could speak accurately, then …

… we would know the true nature of God. We would know the quid est of God. But this is precisely what we do not know. So although, on Aquinas’s view, we can have considerable positive knowledge of God, the modes of speaking about God retain their inaccuracy in anything having to do with the quiddity of God. (Stump 2016, 207)

The issue that divides Hasker and Stump and the parties they represent is perhaps impossible to resolve. Hasker demands a “coherent view of God’s nature,” one that satisfies and can be seen to satisfy the exigencies of the discursive intellect. Hasker demands that God fit within the discursive framework, which implies that he have properties the way creatures do, exist the way creatures do, and so on. Stump could reasonably claim that Hasker is making an inappropriate demand, one that does not respect the divine transcendence.

5. The Truthmaker Defense

Proponents of DDS affirm such sentences as ‘God is his omniscience’ and‘God is his omnipotence.’ If the singular terms ‘his omniscience’ and ‘his omnipotence’ in such sentences are taken to refer to properties, then such sentences assert the identity of God and a property, an exemplifiable entity. This is unacceptable for the reasons rehearsed in section 2 above. Briefly, God is an individual and not a property. If, however, the singular terms in question could be taken to refer to individuals, then this particular objection to the coherence of DDS would collapse. Clearly, if ‘God’ and ‘his omniscience’ both refer to an individual, God, then the coherence of ‘God is his omniscience’ will be beyond question.

Enter the truthmaker defense. The truthmaker defense hinges on a theory of predication that Bergmann and Brower (2006) put as follows:

P*: The truth of all true predications, or at least of all true predications of the form ‘a is F,’ is to be explained in terms of truthmakers.

P* is to be understood by contrast to a theory of predication according to which every true predication of the form ‘a is F’ is to be explained in terms of an individual’s exemplifying of a property. Now consider the essential predication, ‘God is omniscient.’ Given that a truthmaker of a truth t is an entity whose existence broadly logically necessitates the truth of t, God himself is plausibly viewed as the truthmaker of ‘God is omniscient’ and like essential predications. For in every possible world in which God exists, these essential predications (or the propositions they express) are true. In the case of essential as opposed to accidental predications, truthmakers need not be taken to be concrete states of affairs, and so need not be taken as involving exemplifiable entities. Socrates himself is not plausibly taken to be the truthmaker of the accidental ‘Socrates is wise’ (or the proposition it expresses) because there are possible worlds in which Socrates exists but the predication is not true; Socrates is, however, plausibly taken to be the truthmaker of the essential ‘Socrates is human.’

Now ‘God’s omniscience’ and ‘Socrates’ humanity’ are abstract nominalizations of ‘God is omniscient’ and ‘Socrates is human,’ respectively. So given that God and Socrates are the truthmakers of the respective essential predications, the nominalizations can be taken to refer, not to properties, but to these very same truthmakers. Accordingly, to say that God is identical to his omniscience is just to say that God is identical to the truthmaker of ‘God is omniscient.’ And that amounts to saying that God is identical to God. In this way one avoids the absurdity of saying that God is identical to a property. What God is identical to is not the property of omniscience but the referent of ‘God’s omniscience,’ which turns out to be God himself. And similarly for the rest of God’s intrinsic and essential attributes.

6. Is Divine Simplicity Compatible with Creaturely Freedom and God’s Contingent Knowledge?

Suppose a creaturely agent freely performs an action A. He files his tax return, say, by the April 15th deadline. Suppose that the freedom involved is not the compatibilist “freedom of the turnspit” (to borrow Kant’s phrase) but the robust freedom that implies both that the agent is the unsourced source of the action and that the agent could have done otherwise. The performance of A makes true a number of contingent propositions, all of them known by God in his omniscience. Now if subject S knows that proposition p, and p is contingent, then it would seem that S’s knowing that p is or involves an accidental (as opposed to essential) intrinsic state of S. If God is omniscient, then he knows every (non-indexical) truth, including every contingent truth. It seems to follow that God has at least as many accidental intrinsic states as there are contingent truths. But this contradicts DDS according to which there is nothing intrinsic to God that is distinct from God.

Consider the mental state God is in when he knows that Tom freely files his tax return on April 14th, 2014. This divine mental state is an intrinsic state God is in contingently. If God were identical to this state, then he could not be a se. For if God were identical to the state, then God would be dependent on something – Tom’s libertarianly free action – that is external to God and beyond his control. Now anything that compromises the divine aseity will compromise the divine simplicity, the latter being an entailment of the former. So it seems that an omniscient God cannot be simple if there are free creaturely agents and God knows what they do and leave undone. There is also the problem that if the divine mental state in question were identical to God, then the truth God knows when he knows that Tom files on April 14th would be necessarily true.

The problem is expressible as an aporetic pentad:

  1. Every free agent is a libertarianly-free (L-free) agent.
  2. God is ontologically simple (where simplicity is an entailment of aseity and vice versa): there is nothing intrinsic to God that is distinct from God.
  3. There are contingent items of divine all-knowledge that do not (wholly) depend on divine creation, but do (partially) depend on creaturely freedom.
  4. Necessarily, if God knows some truth t, then (i) there an item intrinsic to God such as a mental act or a belief state (ii) whereby God knows t.
  5. God exists necessarily.

Each limb of the above pentad has a strong, though not irresistible, claim on a classical theist’s acceptance. As for (1), if God is L-free, as he must be on classical theism, then it is reasonable to maintain that every free agent is L-free. For if ‘could have done otherwise’ is an essential ingredient in the analysis of ‘Agent A freely performs action X,’ then it is highly plausible to maintain that this is so whether the agent is God or Socrates. Otherwise, ‘free’ will means something different in the two cases. Furthermore, if man is made in the image and likeness of God, then it is surely arguable if not obvious that part of what this means is that man is a spiritual being who is libertarianly free just as God is. If a man is a deterministic system, then one wonders in what sense man is in the image of God.

As for (2), some reasons were given earlier for thinking that a theism that understands itself must uphold God’s ontological simplicity inasmuch as it is implied by the divine aseity. An example of (3) is Oswald’s shooting of Kennedy. The act was freely performed by Oswald, and the proposition that records it is a contingent truth known by God in his omniscience.

The plausibility of (4) may be appreciated as follows. Whatever else knowledge is, it is plausibly regarded as a species of true belief. A belief is an intrinsic state of a subject. Moreover, to unpack the second clause of (3), beliefs are individuated by their contents: beliefs or believings with different contents are different beliefs. It cannot be that one and the same act of believing has different contents at different times or in different possible worlds.

(5), if not obvious on its own, could be taken as an entailment of (2). If in God essence and existence are one, then God cannot not exist.

But although each limb of the pentad is plausibly maintained and is typically maintained by theists who uphold DDS, they cannot all be true. Any four limbs, taken together, entail the negation of the remaining one.

To illustrate, let us consider how the limbs of the pentad, excepting (2), entail the negation of (2). Being omniscient, God knows that Oswald freely chose to kill Kennedy. But Oswald’s L-freedom precludes us from saying that God’s knowledge of this contingent fact depends solely on the divine will. For it also depends on Oswald’s L-free authorship of his evil deed, an authorship that God cannot prevent or override once he has created L-free agents. But this is inconsistent with the divine aseity. For to say that God is a se is to say that God is not dependent on anything distinct from himself for his existence or intrinsic properties or states. But, by (4), God is in the state of knowing that Oswald freely chose to kill Kennedy, and his being in this state depends on something outside of God’s control, namely, Oswald’s L-free choice. In this way the divine aseity is compromised, and with it the divine simplicity.

It seems, then, that our aporetic pentad is an inconsistent pentad. The defender of DDS cannot deny either the divine simplicity or the divine necessity, which is an entailment of simplicity. But an upholder of the divine simplicity has the option of denying (1) and maintaining that, while God is L-free, creaturely agents are free only in a compatibilist sense (‘C-free’). If creaturely agents are C-free, but not L-free, then Oswald could not have done otherwise, and it is possible for the upholder of divine simplicity to say that that Oswald’s C-free choice is no more a threat to the divine aseity than the fact that God knows the contingent truth that creaturely agents exist. The latter is not a threat to the divine aseity because the existence of creaturely agents derives from God in a way that Oswald’s L-free choice does not derive from God.

A second and perhaps better response would be to reject (4) in one of the ways canvassed by W. M. Grant (2012). Here are two ways that appear promising. On what Grant calls the Belief Model, God’s knowledge is a species of true belief, but God’s beliefs are not intrinsic states of God. They are not mental acts or episodes. Beliefs are relational. To have a belief is to be related to a proposition, where propositions are not contents of belief states, but abstract entities that exist independently of the subjects who believe them. For God to believe that Oswald killed Kennedy is for God to stand in a relation to a proposition without it being the case that there is anything intrinsic to God that grounds his standing in the belief relation to the Oswald proposition as opposed to any other proposition. Believing, at least in the case of God, is an external relation, not an internal relation grounded in an intrinsic feature of the believer. Various objections can be brought against this Belief Model of divine cognition, but if they can be turned aside, then (4) falls and the pentad is solved.

A second way to reject (4) is by adopting what Grant calls an Immediate Cognition Model of divine knowing. Accordingly, God’s knowledge is not mediated by propositions or anything else, but is directly of contingent realities. God’s knowledge of Socrates has as an essential constituent Socrates himself, warts and all. On this externalist model, as on the Belief Model, there nothing internal to God and intrinsic to him in virtue of which he possesses contingent knowledge, and thus nothing contingent in him to compromise his simplicity.

One ought to ask, however, whether either model preserves the divine aseity which is a main motive for the divine simplicity (Brower 2009). If the simple God’s knowing of Socrates includes the man himself in his bodily reality, this would seem to make God dependent on something other than himself. Brower thinks the problem can be defused by observing that God is the cause of the contingent entities on which his contingent knowledge depends. Grant (2012, 267), however, thinks that neither externalist model poses a problem for aseity whether or not God causes the contingent objects he knows. If God exists from himself, then he is a se. But the existence of a thing is intrinsic to it, not relational. So it suffices for the divine aseity that God not depend on anything else for what he is intrinsically. That God’s knowing of Socrates depends on Socrates is not to the point: this knowing is purely relational and not intrinsic to God.

7. The Modal Collapse Objection to DDS

7.1 Introduction to the Problem

This final section elaborates a problem posed but not pursued in the preceding section: the problem of reconciling the simplicity of God with the contingency of creatures and the states of affairs into which they enter. If the simple God knows that Tom files his income taxes on April 14th, how do we avoid the conclusion that Tom and his filing are modally necessary? In the last few years, numerous articles have appeared pressing, and responding to, the claim that the commitments of DDS entail the collapse of modal distinctions. One way to present the problem of modal collapse is as a tension between two commitments of classical Christian theism. The one commitment is to DDS. The other is to the contingency of creatures. Simplicity of God and contingency of creatures form a dyad the logical consistency of which is in question. Call it the problematic dyad. The gist of the modal collapse argument (MCA) is that DDS entails the absolute metaphysical necessity of creatures. If God is simple, then he is of course also absolutely necessary (not possibly nonexistent) and this for the reason that, on DDS, essence and existence in God are one. It also seems to follow from the divine simplicity that any creative action that God performs, he necessarily performs, and this for the reason that the simple God is pure act harboring no unrealized potentialities. (Indeed, he harbors no realized potentialities either since, as actus purus, he harbors no potentialities at all.) Given that God created our universe U, it follows that he could not have failed to create some universe and indeed the very one he did create, namely U. Bear in mind that the validity of the MCA requires the auxiliary premise that, given divine omnipotence, divine creation cannot fail to succeed. Thus there cannot be anything indeterministic about it: it cannot be that the divine creative act is absolutely necessary while the effect of that act, U, is modally contingent. (The truth of this auxiliary premise is questioned by some, as we shall see.) Therefore, U cannot not exist given that God has created it, whence it follows that U and everything in it exists of absolute metaphysical necessity just as God does. But then the first classical commitment, DDS, collides with the second, the contingency of creatures, and the distinction between necessity and contingency collapses. Both God and the universe end up being absolutely necessary. If MCA succeeds, then modal collapse is upon us, the problematic dyad is inconsistent, and one of the classical commitments must be rejected, either the simplicity of God or the contingency of creatures. If, on the other hand, MCA fails, then the dyad is presumably consistent and both commitments may be upheld.

7.2 Terminology and Terrain

To begin, some terminology and a rough map of the aporetic terrain. Terminological regimentation in excess of that already provided in this entry is necessary to bring MCA into proper focus, especially given the need to accommodate Islamic Neoplatonist responses to the problem. A traditional theist is one whose definition of ‘God’ includes omniscience, omnipotence, omnibenevolence, necessary existence, and being the creator of every concrete item distinct from itself, but does not include or exclude DDS. Traditional theists thus divide into those who accept, and those who reject DDS. A traditional theist who accepts DDS may be termed a classical theist. Classical theists divide into those who accept and those who reject the modal contingency of concrete creatures. An item is modally contingent just in case both its existence and its nonexistence are broadly logically possible. The modally contingent is not the same as the existentially dependent. For creatures are existentially dependent on God but need not be modally contingent. So-called abstract objects (the denizens of the Platonic menagerie such as numbers and mathematical sets) are modally necessary beings and yet they are plausibly taken to be creatures in the sense that if, per impossibile, God did not exist, then they would not exist either. They depend on God for their existence despite their modal necessity. They exist in every (metaphysically or broadly logically) possible world and they depend on God for their existence in every such possible world. The modally contingent and that which is existentially dependent on God are therefore notionally or conceptually distinct. A concrete creature is any creature that is not abstract, in the way ‘abstract’ is (mis)used by contemporary analytic philosophers to cover the inhabitants of the Platonic menagerie.

The classical theists who accept both DDS and the modal contingency of concrete creatures further divide into those who maintain that the MCA can be successfully answered by showing that the limbs of the problematic dyad mentioned above are logically consistent, and those who maintain that the MCA cannot be successfully answered but that, nevertheless, both the simplicity limb and the contingency limb are to be accepted. Among those for whom the MCA can be successfully rebutted we find Greeley (2019), Nemes (2020), Schmid (2022), and Waldrop (2022) et al. Among those who for whom the MCA cannot be successfully rebutted but who nevertheless embrace both limbs of the problematic dyad we find the mysterian Dolezal (2011). See section 4.3 above.

The classical theists who accept DDS but reject the modal contingency of concrete creatures turn aside the MCA by rejecting the contingency limb of the problematic dyad. Among them we find both Christian and non-Christian classical theists. An Islamic Neoplatonist theist is a classical theist who upholds DDS but does not uphold the modal contingency of concrete creatures. Such a non-Christian classical theist takes an emanationist approach to divine creation. On emanationism, as we find it in Ibn Sina (Avicenna), for example, God eternally and necessarily brings into existence things wholly distinct from himself and in such a way that the things created share in the modal necessity of the Creator and his creative will despite the existential dependence of the creatures upon the Creator. (Andani, 2022, 11) More on the Islamic Neoplatonist view below. There are also Christian classical theists who accept DDS but reject the modal contingency of concrete creatures, affirming instead their hypothetical necessity. (Pedersen and Lilley 2022) Both types of classical theist who accept DDS but reject the modal contingency of concrete creatures exploit the putative distinction between absolute (unconditional) and hypothetical (conditional) necessity. God alone exists of absolute metaphysical necessity in se; creatures are necessary ab alio, from another, namely, from God. This hypothetical necessity holds for both abstract and concrete creatures.

Finally, we have those traditional theists who reject DDS but accept the modal contingency of creatures. Among them we find Moreland and Craig (2003), Plantinga (1980), and Hasker (2016).

The assumption thus far is that the MCA is a (genuine) problem for classical theists who accept the modal contingency of concrete creatures in the sense that the MCA does not arise from some easily detectable fallacy, confusion, or misuse of language. Tomaszewski (2019), however, alleges that the MCA in all variants succumbs to one or more modal fallacies. This charge has not held up well under scrutiny. Waldrop (2022) shows convincingly that at least three variants of the MCA are free of logical error, the variants of Moreland and Craig (2003), Leftow (2015), and Mullins (2016).

7.3 Solutions to the Problem of Modal Collapse

(0) Reject theism. One might argue as follows.

  1. Nothing could count as God that is not simple.
  2. Divine simplicity is logically contradictory.
  3. Whatever is logically contradictory cannot exist.
  4. Therefore, God does not exist.

Solution by dissolution.

(1) Accept traditional theism but reject DDS. Many if not most Christian theists, Protestants especially, will simply deny the divine simplicity. Alvin Plantinga, for example, is a Christian theist who rejects DDS. (Plantinga, 1980) He is followed in this by many others (Moreland and Craig 2003, Hasker 2016).

(2) Accept DDS, but reject the commitment to the modal contingency of concrete creatures, either in a Christian way (Pedersen and Lilley 2022) or in an Islamic way (Andani 2022). The Islamic way is further specified in (5) below.

(3) Accept both limbs of the problematic dyad, despite their apparent inconsistency, either by (a) holding that there are true contradictions or, less drastically, by (b) holding that while there are no true contradictions, we in our present state are prevented by our cognitive architecture from understanding how the limbs of the problematic dyad could both be true. Both of these options may be dubbed mysterian. The first could be called extreme, the second moderate. The mysterianism of Dolezal (2011, 210) seems to be of the moderate type. (See section 4.3 above.) It must remain a mystery in this life how it could be true both that God is simple and that concrete creatures are modally contingent. And yet both are true without violation of the law of non-contradiction.

(4) Accept DDS, but hold that “the only necessity or possibility applicable to God is not de re but de dicto.” (Miller 1996, 13) The problem arises if we think that the modal contingency of concrete creatures requires that God have the ability to do otherwise than what he has done. But if the only modality applicable to God is de dicto, then it is false to say of God (de deo) that he could have done otherwise, and the problem is supposedly avoided.

(5) Accept DDS, but hold that creatures are really distinct from divine creating and thus can have a different modal status from that of the divine acts whereby they are created. Nathan Greeley writes,

… to say that God’s activity of knowing and willing exist necessarily is not to say that created objects of his knowing and willing must also exist necessarily. As long as these created objects are considered really distinct from the acts by which they are known and willed, then the objects in themselves, need not have the same modal status as these acts. […] God, one can then say, necessarily knows and necessarily wills in an absolute manner, but at least some of the particular objects of his knowledge are contingent. (Greeley 2019, 237)

The idea here is that what God necessarily creates, and thus could not have failed to create, can nevertheless be contingent, i.e., possibly nonexistent. How might this be true? Here is one way. Suppose that God’s creating of a thing simultaneously releases it into ontological independence. The divine creative act makes the thing exist, but once it exists, it exists on its own, ‘by its own power’ without divine assistance. In other words, when God creates a thing, he creates it in such a way that its existence, moment by moment, does not depend on God’s ongoing creative sustenance after the initial creative action. It continues by ‘existential intertia.’ If this is the nature of creation, then the created entity could very well be contingent despite the creative act’s being necessary. For the created entity to exist in the first place it would be necessary that God create it, but after he does so the entity exists contingently. On this scheme, there is creatio originans (originating creation), but no creatio continuans (continuing creation). This allows what is originally caused to exist to be contingent.

Unfortunately, this understanding of creation is foreign to classical theism. On classical theism, creation is both originating and continuing. In addition, classical theism need not insist on the reality of the originating-continuing distinction. For even if the world (the created realm) has an infinite past and always existed, it could nonetheless have creaturely status. If that were the case, then there would be no real distinction between originating and continuing creation. If, on the other hand, the world had a beginning in time, then, on classical theism, it still needs to be kept in being moment by moment. The stratagem proposed by Greeley above does not appear to allow the proponent of divine simplicity to evade the conclusion that, if the simple God creates, then the product of his creative act necessarily exists.

(6) Accept both DDS and the modal contingency of creatures, but reject what Steven Nemes calls the difference principle (DP) according to which “A difference in the effect presupposes a difference in the cause.” (Nemes 2020, 109) If the created and ongoingly sustained universe U is contingent, then U might never have existed, and at any given time t at which U exists it might not have existed at t. (God could, so to speak, ‘pull the plug’ on the world at any time.) By DP, the difference in the effect (U’s existing versus U’s not existing) presupposes and thus entails a difference in the cause, namely, God. So on the DP, had God not created U, then there would have had to have been a difference in the cause (God’s actually creating U versus God’s possibly not creating U). But then God would not be actus purus, pure actuality bare of all potency. “It is clear, therefore, that the difference principle is at the heart of the argument from modal collapse.” (Nemes 2020, 110) Therefore, to uphold both DDS and the modal contingency of concrete creatures, the DP must be rejected. Accordingly, there is no difference within the simple God between his creating U1 and his creating the numerically different U2, and no difference between either and God’s creating nothing at all. The difference between some U existing and no U existing on the current proposal reflects no difference in the divine cause. It is all the same to God whether a universe exists or no universe exists. If God is identical to his creating of something, and God is identical to his creating of nothing, then God’s creating of something is identical to God’s creating of nothing. That is, had God not created our universe U, he would not have been any different than he is is given that he has created U. God + U = God. God − U = God.

The most obvious objection to this attempt at turning aside the MCA is that it is merely ad hoc. If in every other conceivable case of agent causation the DP holds, then to deny its application in the case of divine agent causation has no motivation except to avoid the difficulty that MCA presents. But this allegation of ‘ad-hoc-ness’ is not decisive since Nemes and Co. are free to assert that the divine case is sui generis. Furthermore, if one can bring oneself to accept both DDS and the contingency of concrete creatures, then why balk at the rejection of DP? Everyone ought to admit that DDS is a ‘hard saying’ despite the good, though not absolutely compelling, arguments for it. There are good reasons to accept both limbs of the problematic dyad, DDS and the modal contingency of concrete creatures. If the only way to uphold both is by rejecting DP, then so be it and one must ‘bite the bullet.’ But then divine agent causation is so unlike ordinary agent causation that we lose our grip on the former: it threatens to peter out into unintelligibility. So it looks as if the acceptors and the rejectors of the DP are in a stand-off. Suppose the following are individually plausible but collectively inconsistent: DDS, DP, and the modal contingency of concrete creatures. Suppose further that there are no true contradictions. Then one of the propositions must be rejected. Some theists will reject DDS; some will reject DP; some will reject the modal contingency of concrete creatures. We now turn to a solution via rejection of the third proposition.

(7) Accept DDS but deny the modal contingency of creatures by holding an emanationist view of creation along Avicennian lines according to which God must create, so that whatever is created is necessary, but not necessary in the way that God is necessary. (Andani 2022) On this approach, the original modal collapse problem is solved by rejection of the second limb of the problematic dyad, namely, the modal contingency of concrete creatures. But a kind of modal difference is preserved in that the divine necessity is held to be absolute whereas the necessity of concrete creatures is held to be from another, namely, from God who alone is absolutely necessary. The key idea here is that all creatures are modally necessary, not just the abstract ones. (Andani 2022, 15)

We have already noted that a classical theist can easily allow for a difference between the divine necessity and the necessity of some creatures, namely, those that are co-eternal with God. Eternal objects other than God such as numbers possess necessary existence through another. What classical Christian theists cannot say, however, given their commitment to the creation of the material world ex nihilo, is that all creatures possess necessary existence through another. For if they said that, then the modal contingency of concrete creatures would go by the boards, and it would then not be the case that God might not have created a material universe. Not being emanationists, classical Christian theists uphold the possibility that God not create any material beings at all. Islamic neoplatonists, however, being emanationists, do not adhere to creatio ex nihilo but to creatio ex deo . This allows them to lump together “metaphysically necessary beings” and “actual necessary beings: temporal material substances.” (Andani 2022, 13) Among the latter we find such concrete items as cats and tables. These are temporal material substances in Aristotle’s sense of prote ousiai. Because their existence is necessitated by God, they are necessary from another, unlike God who is not caused by another and is therefore necessary in himself. “Although God and His creation are logically necessary and exist across all possible worlds, they retain different modal categories within Ibn Sina’s [Avicenna’s] modal framework.” (Andani 2022, 15) Thus “… there is no real modal collapse for the Islamic philosopher working within the broader Islamic Neoplatonic tradition.” (Andani 2022, 13, emphasis in original) To further spell it out, there are three classes of necessary beings, where a necessary being is one that exists in all broadly logically possible worlds, namely, God who exists a se, eternal beings other than God that depend for their existence on God and thus exist ab alio, and thirdly “temporal existents actualized and necessary through another” which also exist ab alio.(Andani 2022, 30)

And so the Islamic Neoplatonist accepts the modal collapse that most Christian classical theists fear by positively affirming that everything is necessary in the ‘possible worlds’ sense. But “there is no real modal collapse for the Islamic philosopher” (Andani 2022, 13) because absolute necessity is understood as ontological independence and contingency is understood as ontological (existential) dependence. There is no collapse because of the deep difference between two modes of existence, existence a se and existence ab alio. Thus God and Socrates differ in the way they exist. The essence of Socrates, considered in and of itself, may or may not exist. It is “possible in itself.” Since this essence, so considered, may or may not exist, if it does come to exist in actuality, it must have a cause or causes of its coming to exist in actuality. These causes necessitate its existence. “Therefore, the possible in itself — when it actually exists — has the modal status of ‘necessary existence through another’ (wajib al-wujud li-ghayrihi) and [is therefore] dependent upon a distinct cause for its existence.” (Andani 2022, 10.)

7.4 Concluding Aporetic Postscript

None of the above responses to the modal collapse objection to divine simplicity is without problems. And so it is fitting that we end on an aporetic note. If there is a way beyond the impasse it will have to involve a deeper dive into the metaphysics of divine action in its relation to the metaphysics of modality. How are to to understand divine creation? Does God create out of nothing? Out of himself? Out of pre-given possibilities? The MCA’s main value is as a concrete point of entry into this constellation of difficult questions.

What holds for MCA holds also for all the problems surrounding DDS detailed above. This final subsection therefore serves as a fitting conclusion to the entire entry.


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Other Internet Resources

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