Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Ancient, Medieval and Renaissance Theories of the Emotions

1. Aristotle

Aristotle’s preferred term for the emotions was pathos [pl. pathē], which makes the emotions largely passive states, located within a general metaphysical landscape contrasting active and passive, form and matter, and actuality and potentiality. The pathē are first and foremost responses found in the embodied animal to the outside world, very much like perceptions. They can thus be associated broadly with matter insofar as they represent capacities or potentialities that need to be actualized by external causes, which also explains how they are directed at objects. Of course, the pathē are not pure potentialities. They are actualized in the experience of an occurrent emotion, and even the mere capacity to experience pathē requires a determinate form, a soul. Moreover, the pathē have close connections to action, and Aristotle treated them as movements of a sort. For all these reasons, the pathē can be attributed to the soul insofar as the soul informs a body. Yet since their causes lie outside of the animal who experiences them, the question arises whether and to what extent we can control them.

That is a question addressed in several different ways by the most important Aristotelean texts on the pathē available to later ancient and medieval authors: the Nicomachean Ethics and Rhetoric. Each work presents lists of emotions, although where the Nichomachean Ethics serves up 11, the Rhetoric dishes out a full 14. They differ too in their aims and tenor: the Nichomachean Ethics is concerned with the place of the pathē within the economy of acting according to our habits and desires as moderated by reason, whereas the Rhetoric concerns the arousal and management of pathē in the context of producing persuasion. In both cases, however, the pathē are treated as susceptible to rational influence and voluntary action, although not directly subject to choice.

The Nichomachean Ethics characterizes pathē as the “feelings accompanied by pleasure or pain,” listing appetite, anger, fear, confidence, envy, joy, love, hatred, longing, emulation, and pity as examples (1105b21). Nonetheless, it will be easiest, as well as consistent with the bulk of Aristotle’s analyses, to treat pathos as more or less equivalent to desire, or appetite in the broad sense. (The Rhetoric makes the identification explicit, e.g., at 1378a31. The pathē form one of the three main categories found in the soul, distinguished from faculties, on the one hand, and states [hexeis], on the other. They are, however, very closely associated with the latter. States constitute the virtues [aretea] or vices of the non-rational part of the soul, which can, however, either conform to or violate right reason. They do so through their connections with actions. The pathē, along with the appetites, motivate action (even to the point of provoking bodily changes such as internal temperature, color and expression). The dispositions to feel them in certain ways are, in turn, shaped by our habits of action, and states may be understood as the dispositions to feel particular kinds of pathē on certain occasions. States are, in fact, “the things in virtue of which we stand well or badly with reference to the passions [pathē]” (1105b26).

The pathē are not themselves virtues or vices. But states are, and that means that the pathē are morally significant. More generally, because emotional experience is intrinsic to any life, any account of the good life must give them their due. Now, certain pathē (spite, envy) are always bad. But despite characterizing the human good as a life exercising “activity of the soul in conformity with excellence [or virtue]” (1098a16), and despite counting reason (but not feeling pathē) as a distinctively human activity, Aristotle took the excellence of the excellent human to consist partly in experiencing pathē in the right way, to the right extent, and on the right occasions. Indeed, the cultivation of character is largely a matter of cultivating the disposition for appropriate experience of the pathē, which is as important as developing our abilities for deliberative reason. The appropriate emotional dispositions may, in fact, be even more crucial to the good life, since our capacity to feel the passions seems intrinsic, while our ability to reason develops with maturity and can be crucially affected by our emotional dispositions. In any case, the truly excellent person will not only reason well about what to do in particular situations, but will feel the appropriate desires and pathē in those situations. For this reason, the intellectual virtue for deliberating about what to do, phroneasis, is distinguished from the other practical intellectual virtue of technea in part by its involvement with pathē.

This comfortable relation between the emotions and reason, however, hits some snags when Aristotle turned to the distinctive ways in which we can fail to act well. For example, the akratic, or weak-willed person, recognizes what should be done without actually doing it. Aristotle’s solution to this puzzling, if common, phenomenon, was to lay the blame at the feet of some pathos, particularly the pathē of either anger or pleasure. Here these pathē might seem to oppose reason. Aristotle, however, appears to have thought of them more as exercising a cognitive interference that disrupts our completion of the practical syllogism than as an external force overturning our otherwise smoothly operating reason. (For this reason, the pathē seem to have cognitive aspects themselves; see Kraut 2005). In contrast, the enkratic person feels the same disruptive pathos, but does not give way to them in action. The enkratic is thus superior to the akratic, but still not as admirable as the person who feels the pathē as the virtuous person would, that is, in accord with the dictates of right reason. So Aristotle’s ethical works treat the pathē both as susceptible to reason and as integral to the good life, even as they allow that the emotions can impair our reason.

The risk of emotional disruption of our reason and the management of the emotions are topics explored much further in the Rhetoric. That Aristotle would even consider the topic is noteworthy, for it suggests that techniques for producing belief, among which appeals to emotion are prominent, need not be relegated to sophistry, but make a proper subject for philosophy. Things seem a bit less rosy, however, when we turn to the three distinct sources of persuasion Aristotle admitted: trust in the character of the speaker, the passions of the audience, and the “proof, or apparent proof, provided by the words of the speech [logos] itself” (1356a4). The first and last seem sources that are themselves reasons – either reasons for holding it probable that the speaker’s conclusions are true, or reasons for the conclusion itself. But arousing the audience’s passions seems another matter altogether. Indeed, Aristotle here characterized the pathē as “all those feelings that so change men as to affect their judgments, and that are also attended by pain and pleasure” (1378a21), for which he produces the example of anger, exactly the interfering pathos held responsible for many cases of akrasia. But despite the acknowledged risk that the pathē can be used for sophistic ends, warping our beliefs and decisions and producing commitments on indefensible grounds, Aristotle did not hold that all emotional appeals must do so. The problem with sophistic rhetoric is that it makes its emotional pitch in ways independent of the subject under discussion, perhaps even distracting from the subject at hand (e.g., by invoking anger at Al Qaeda, while considering the merits of invading Iraq). Presumably, however, a particular subject may have characteristics that themselves provoke certain emotions, indeed that should provoke certain emotions, and appropriate rhetoric will highlight those features without ever leaving the subject at hand. In this respect, the arousing of emotions might even count as a kind of salience argument for the beliefs so produced (e.g., anger at particular outrageous events can serve as a reason for believing that a politician should be impeached).

More generally, the pathē pervade our lives; our judgments are always affected by our emotions and moods, not just in perverse and pernicious cases. In this respect, any rhetorician attempting to produce belief must take account of the emotional state of her audience. This is true whatever her motives might be. Aristotle considered the true to be inherently, but not overridingly persuasive, and so even the rhetorician most sincerely devoted to the truth will need to consider how to manage the emotions of her audience so that it will be amenable to belief in truth. Doing so will require not only some assessment of the character of the audience, but also a great deal of insight into the nature and causes of the pathē, and Aristotle devoted much of Book II of the Rhetoric to a kind of taxonomy and physiognomy of the emotions (thereby inaugurating what was to become a popular sport). Aristotle’s list is copious, listing some 14 passions. Each receives an analysis of its causes (qualities) and objects (persons) – which together provide a complex intentional content for the emotion. Aristotle also described the mental conditions under which a pathos is felt, that is the relations between the person feeling it and that which provides its content. But the list so produced is slightly odd, comprising anger, calm, friendship, enmity, fear, confidence, shame, shamelessness, kindness, unkindness, pity, indignation, envy, and emulation. Presumably, Aristotle thought that these were the pathē most likely to be of use to the rhetorician (even if one ought not raise envy or shamelessness in an audience), but there seems little other rhyme or reason to the selection, and no reason to think that it is comprehensive (especially since it excludes pathē enumerated in the Nicomachean Ethics). One notable organizing feature is Aristotle’s assumption that the pathē fall into contrasting pairs, although it may be a bit of a stretch to see the contrast between, e.g., envy and emulation, or to take certain candidates, e.g., calm, as a full-fledged pathos. Also interesting is Aristotle’s discussion of how the general psychology of the emotions will map onto different types of character, ages, and fortunes, again a topic he might have considered particularly useful for the rhetorician.

So Aristotle’s assessment of the pathē is mixed: they can be cultivated by reason and figure in the good life; they can also disrupt our reason and action, and be used for nefarious ends. Indeed, by rendering our judgments unstable and prone to conflict, the emotions may pose a basic threat to human social life. But whether happy or dangerous, Aristotle certainly thought that the emotions are a fixture of human life that cannot be ignored. Ethics cultivates them in developing character; rhetoric manages them to produce belief. To these techniques, we might also add the psychological discipline accomplished by poetry, particularly tragedy. The notion of katharsis, or “discharge” of the unpleasant emotions of pity and fear may be the most famous part of Aristotle’s Poetics, although the text mentions it only in passing. It did not, in fact, have much influence on literature and aesthetic theory through the seventeenth century (although the Poetics was an important model in other respects, especially for considering how emotional responses could be directed at different kinds of characters). However, starting in the eighteenth century, the notion of katharsis gained ground, particularly since it addressed a question of enormous importance to 18th century aesthetics, namely how something like tragedy, which would seem to revolve around situations invoking unpleasant emotions, can nonetheless be enjoyable. The notion of katharsis at least hints at the complex and multivalent emotional states that would be further analyzed by later theorists such as Hume.

2. Stoicism, Cicero and Seneca

Compared with Aristotle’s moderation, the Stoics seem pretty intolerant of the pathē, stressing their cognitive, eudaimonistic, and moral failings, while recommending their elimination. The Stoic evaluation of the passions was extremely influential – and contentious – for later authors, particularly among the seventeenth-century neo-Stoics, as well as among those authors interested in defending the value of the passions. Stoicism’s thoroughgoing naturalism also made it a force to be reckoned with for cutting-edge 17th century philosophers. Since Stoic doctrines were largely transmitted to early modern philosophers through the writings of Cicero and Seneca, it is mainly the views current in late, Roman stoicism that matter for our purposes. But these sources sometimes mixed up specifically Stoic doctrines with views taken from other schools, particularly with skepticism in Cicero’s De Finibus bonorum et malorum.

Like Aristotle, the Stoics also spoke of pathē and located them within the passive, material element of the universe. This feature of the concept was emphasized by Cicero, who in “teaching philosophy to speak Latin,” considered how to translate the Greek term pathos:

I might have rendered this literally, styled them ‘diseases,’ but the word ‘disease’ would not suit all instances; for example, no one speaks of pity, nor yet anger, as a disease, though the Greeks term these pathos. Let us then accept the word ‘emotion’ [perturbatio] the very sound of which seems to denote something vicious and these emotions are not excited by any natural influence. (De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum 255)

Following Cicero, Roman Stoics frequently translated pathos as perturbatio, which came to have a particularly negative ring. Seneca used affectus, while others preferred passio, which explicitly connected the emotions with ‘undergoing,’ or ‘suffering’ (Levi 1964, 14–5, also Meyer 2000, 60). All of these translations, however, emphasized passivity, particularly the psychological passivity of the emotions and the sense in which they are out of our voluntary control, and indeed not a proper part of ourselves.

In its most austere form (which probably borrowed greatly from the Cynics, and came to be associated with Cynicism), Stoic ethics identifies the good life with virtue and both the good life and virtue with self-sufficiency, i.e., that which is intrinsically good, proper to us and fully within our control. The passions, however, are responses to external events, outside of our control, and so antithetical to virtue and happiness. To be prey to the passions is to violate the basic outlines of our nature – indeed of the rational shape of nature as a whole, to which we should submit as law and fate. Such is the lot of most of us, which on Stoic reckoning makes us thoroughly and equally vicious, although for reasons outside of our control. A genuine sage, however, would achieve a state of apatheia, or what Cicero calls tranquillitas, the absence of alien pathē. That state is the virtue and good life to which we all aspire, although only the sage achieves it, and sages are (at best) few and far between.

But our situation may not be quite as hopeless as the emphasis on the ungovernable and alien character of the passions might make it seem. For the Stoics did not simply see the passions as brute reactions to external events, but as cognitive responses, judgments about the nature and value of various (present or future) states of affairs. (For this reason, both Cicero and Seneca held that animals do not experience genuine passions.) To be prey to the passions is to form judgments that overvalue those states of affairs – that are, in effect, false judgments of value and misplaced commitments. And although nobody chooses to make mistakes, our judgments are not completely out of our control. We can practice certain kinds of mental discipline to increase our capacity to judge correctly, decrease our capacity to be overwhelmed by the passions, and in effect, come to gain control of ourselves.

Following the early Stoics, Cicero enumerated and organized the emotions into four basic categories: fear [metus]; pain, distress, sorrow or even sickness [aegritudo]; lust, desire or appetite [libido]; and pleasure or delight [laetitia, translating the Greek headonea]. The basis for this organization is the kinds of things under evaluation and the nature of the judgment. Aegritudo is a (false) evaluation of present things as bad, while libido is an equally flawed evaluation of future, or absent things as good. These evaluations are mistaken, since only virtue is intrinsically good, whereas the things that are the objects of these emotions are themselves “indifferent” (although they may be “preferred” or “dispreferred”). There are a number of subspecies of these broad categories. For instance, Seneca identified anger as a species of desire, desire for revenge. The imposition of an organizing schema on the proliferation of emotions made them more manageable, a feature that would appeal greatly to later authors, and highlighted their evaluative and cognitive content. But the emotions are not solely cognitive; they are soul states, and the Stoics held that the soul was itself a particular tensioning of the material pneuma, part of the “breath,” or “wind” that ran through and gave form to everything in the world. Corresponding to the four categories of emotions would thus be corresponding material states of the pneuma. These states may endure even after we correct our judgments.

Nevertheless, the Stoic view of the emotions was not relentlessly gloomy. Despite the description of the sage as in a state of apatheia, the Stoics also allowed that the sage can experience eupatheia, good feelings. These are affective states, but supposedly different in kind from the genuine passions and without their cognitive, moral, and metaphysical failings. Instead of over-evaluations of and reactions to indifferent, alien features of the external world, eupatheia are cognitively appropriate (and active) judgments directed at the things that are truly important to the good life, particularly at other rational beings. In Cicero’s terminology, the sage replaces ‘appetite’ with ‘wish’ [voluntas], including kindness, generosity, warmth, and affection. Instead of feeling fear or hedonistic pleasure, the sage experiences ‘watchfulness’ [cautio] or joy [gaudium]. No eupatheia, however, correspond to pain. In contrast to the pneumatic aspects of the passions, eupatheia, such as kindness, involve a “moderate and reasonable stretching or expansion of the soul” (Baltzly 2004, sec. 5).

For all its austerity, the Stoic conception of virtue, the good life, and happiness owed a great deal to the notion of a healthy, well-functioning organism, one that lives in accord with its nature and the nature of things. This is not simply metaphorical: important concepts (such as pneuma) were heavily indebted to Hellenistic medical traditions. Even more, Stoic materialism allowed emotional disturbances, vice and unhappiness to be understood equally well as disturbances in the attunement of the body. Nonetheless, the best remedies may be cognitive: indeed, in his Tusculan Disputations, Cicero argued for the therapeutic value of philosophy itself, for its role as the medicine of the soul – a point appreciated by later authors such as Descartes who goes so far as to recommend reading Seneca for treating sadness and a low fever.

3. Hippocratic and Galenist Medicine

Similar views were expressed by Galen in such works as The Best Doctor is also a Philosopher. Galen adopted many Stoic physical, metaphysical, epistemological and ethical views on the pathē. But he also drew off an independent Hippocratic tradition for treating the humours and the physiology of the emotions and produced an influential account of the “spirits.” Whereas most early Stoics adopted a unitary view of the soul, Galen favored Plato’s tri-partite model, for which he assigned various functions to different parts of the body. Reason is located in the brain, emotion (particularly anger) in the heart, and desire in the liver. Each of these organs produces particular spirits, the substance of which was a rarified fluid constituted of blood and pneuma, and which governed specific biological functions (sense perception and movement, blood flow and bodily temperature; and nutrition and metabolism). Galen’s map thus provided a physiological basis for what became a commonplace distinction between ‘angry’ (irascible) emotions directed at overcoming obstacles, and simple ‘desiring’ (concupiscible) emotions (see the discussion of Aquinas below). The humours were also assigned to specific organs. Galen’s approach was strongly teleological, assigning each location a specific function and requiring balance for the proper functioning of the whole. Disease occurs when some crucial function is blocked, which can disturb the balance between the humours. Each humour – physical substances such as bile (or choler), black bile, phlegm, and blood – is distinguished by its determinate qualities (associated with the four elements) of either heat or cold, and either moisture or dryness. For example, blood, which is warm and moist, is produced by the liver, whereas black bile is both cold and dry, and originates in the spleen. Losing the appropriate balance between such humours will produce a specific temperament, which can be diagnosed and treated according to which qualities dominate and the bodily origins of the relevant humours. Temperaments are conditions conceived as both something like personality and something like mood disorders, as well as bodily dispositions to particular illnesses. Particular temperaments are determined by the combinatorial possibilities of imbalanced elemental qualities (Galen enumerates eight in de Temperamentis), but the most famous are those associated with the dominance of a single humor: sanguine, phlegmatic, choleric, or melancholic. Treatment aims to bring the humours, and hence the qualities, back into balance, and can proceed in any number of ways – from diet, to changes of climate, to bloodletting – that will either eliminate superfluous humours, or introduce opposite qualities into the body. Almost all of the many later authors who considered physiological aspects of the emotions owe their basic framework to the Galenic and Stoic traditions.

4. Epicureanism

Although the emotions as such were not a central topic for the Epicureans, the presentation of their views on pleasure and the good life through Diogenes Laertes, Lucretius, and even such critics as Cicero (De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum) were important enough to early modern philosophers that they deserve some mention here. Epicureans’ treatment of specific emotions, such as the fear of death and the gods, or the desire for honor, typically strove to show how they are baseless and destructive of the good life. But such emotions rest on desires that are unnecessary, unnatural, or even empty. Since the only good is pleasure [headonea] and the absence of pain, and both pain and pleasure counted as pathē, the Epicureans did not dismiss passion as such from the good life. Pleasures, however, come in many forms: short-term pleasures, such as slaking a thirst, are “kinetic,” yet it is “static” pleasures that yield the best cost-benefit ratio for the quantity of pleasure and pain over the course of a life. The highest form of static pleasure is the state of ataraxia, freedom from disturbance, trouble, or anxiety, which is the mental equivalent of bodily aponia, absence of pain. Mental ataraxia remains closely tied to aponia, since our mental attitude is largely focused on bodily experiences of pain and pleasure. But mental pleasure is not limited to current bodily experiences; for instance, much static pleasure can be derived by recalling or anticipating various kinetic pleasures. In this respect, the pleasures of the good life are not understood merely negatively.

In the seventeenth-century, Pierre Gassendi, and later Walter Charleton presented the Epicurean view of pleasure as an appealing alternative to Stoic austerity (Kraye 2003, 1293–8). Both, however, had to do some fancy footwork to reconcile the Epicurean denial of immortality with Christian doctrine and to overcome long-lasting prejudices about the hedonistic immorality of Epicureanism. But few others distinguished Epicureanism sharply from Stoicism. One hurdle to recognizing the distinctive character of Epicureanism was that ataraxia was often translated by the Latin tranquillitas, which was also used for the apatheia of the Stoics; then too, Pyrrhonian skeptics such as Sextus Empiricus identified ataraxia with detachment from belief. Still, many early modern philosophers endorsed a version of ‘tranquility’ that understood it to be a matter of long-lasting emotional satisfaction, achieved by fulfilling moderate desires, especially the desire for knowledge. In this respect, they owed a great deal to Epicureanism, even if few acknowledged the debt.

5. Augustine

Augustine introduced many themes that were influential for later Christian writers, even as he borrowed from ancient theories such as neo-Platonism. He typically chooses the Latin passio as his translation of pathē, reserving “perturbations” for derogatory senses of pathē. For as he explains, it would be inappropriate to assign passio any particularly pejorative meaning. Passio was, after all, the term applied to the “Passion” of Christ, which was a kind of suffering, but hardly a vicious, or even morally neutral, kind. (Levi 1964, 14–15.) In general, Augustine did not disparage the emotions as such, despite an increasingly tragic view of the human condition over the course of his career.

Augustine argued – somewhat ironically – that the Stoic condemnation of the passions was more verbal than anything else, for everyone admits that passions can be good. Augustine’s quarrel with the Stoic conception of virtue, vice, and the good life extended beyond terminology, however, for he took the anti-Pelagian stance that the good life is not a do-it-yourself project. The only true earthly happiness lies in the hope of salvation and the eternal life of the blessed, and that requires God’s grace as a free gift. As such, the Stoic emphasis on self-sufficiency and the ideal of apatheia are wrong-headed from the start. Even unhappy passions such as longing, pain, guilt, fear and mourning, have enormous value for us, for “so long as we wear the infirmity of this life, we are rather worse men than better if we have none of these emotions at all” (City of God 14. 9). The most important emotion for the good life is love, and virtue is nothing other than the right kind of love, namely love of God.

In yet another contrast to the Stoics, Augustine found the source of vice and sin in something we might consider internal to our (fallen) nature: namely, our free will, which together with memory and understanding make up the “trinity” of the human mind. Despite borrowing from Seneca, Augustine may have been the first thinker to treat the will [voluntas] as a distinct faculty, which is an essential part of the mind, yet can also oppose its reason. For this reason, Augustine could account for the possibility of akrasia quite handily, without having to import some blindsiding and alien notion of interfering passion. As a separate faculty, the will is active, identified as a “movement of the soul, under no compulsion, either toward getting or not losing something” (On the Two Souls, against the Manicheans 10.14). But on Augustine’s view, the will simply incorporates the passions into its attractive, hedonistic operations, as we can see in his simplification of Cicero’s classification:

Love which strains after the possession of the loved object is desire; and the love which possesses and enjoys that object is joy. The love that shuns what opposes it is fear, while the love that feels that opposition when it happens is grief (City of God 14.7).

The four basic kinds of passion are simply modifications of love, which is both a passion and a form of willing. The proper kind of love is also a virtue, indeed one of the three basic theological virtues, along with hope and faith. Augustine distinguished between love of an object for enjoyment (for its own sake) and love of an object for use, which marks the difference between virtuous and vicious loves. Since the only thing that is good for its own sake is God, only God is the proper object of love as enjoyment. All virtuous loves are secondary to this love: caritas, the will to unite with God. In contrast, misplaced love, particularly self-love, is a different species of passion, a will to the carnal, even a kind of lust (cupiditas, or concupiscentia). But Augustine admits links between the two kinds of love, noting that scripture often uses the same term indifferently (amor or dilectio) for both good and bad loves (City of God 14.7). Both show a strong dash of an erotic drive towards union, although union with quite different sorts of things. Augustine’s neo-Platonic leanings may show here in the thought that what distinguishes caritas from vicious love is whether it is directed toward God or toward the transient. Still, what makes the difference between virtuous and vicious love is not an error of reason, but of will, especially when we turn the love owed to God towards ourselves.

Augustine did entertain sympathy for certain aspects of the ideal of “what the Greeks call apatheia, and what the Latins would call, if their language would allow them, impassibilitas,” calling it “obviously a good and most desirable quality” (City of God 14.9). At the same time, he denied that it was either possible or desirable for humans on earth and held that even the citizens of the city of God experience the full panoply of passions. But the value he assigned to the emotions may be largely instrumental, since even those “affections [that] are well regulated, and according to God’s will” are “peculiar to this life, not to that future life we look for.” In contrast, “when there shall be no sin in a man, then there shall be this apatheia” (City of God 14.9). Augustine understood apatheia, however, to mean only “a freedom from those emotions which are contrary to reason and disturb the mind.” Perfect happiness does not involve the absence of all passions:

It may, indeed, reasonably be maintained that the perfect blessedness we hope for shall be free from all sting of fear or sadness; but who that is not quite lost to truth would say that neither love nor joy shall be experienced there? (City of God 14.9).

Indeed, the beatific vision pictures the saints as enjoying the unalloyed pleasures of fulfilled love, free from all those constraints necessary to keep earthly loves in line (The Literal Meaning of Genesis XII.26.54). In the ideal of the blessed life of the saved, Augustine introduces a new wrinkle in the old game of evaluating the nature and worth of the passions.

6. Aquinas

Perhaps the most recognizable point of reference, whether as model or a source of contention, for early modern philosophers was Aquinas. His treatment of the emotions appears mostly in the Summa Theologicae II-1.22–48, although relevant material can also be found in the ST I. 78.4 and I.80–81 and in de Veritate, q. 26. Aquinas himself assimilated many features of the accounts we’ve already seen in Aristotle, the Stoics, Cicero and Augustine, as well as giving a distinctive spin to the notion of the passions, particularly to those “passions of the soul,” which are the emotions experienced by both humans and animals. These passions are acts, or movements, of the sensitive appetitive power, which are caused by external objects as apprehended by what Aquinas called the “estimative,” or “cogitative” power. Passions of the soul can also be identified with certain bodily changes, including contraction or expansion of the “spirits,” changes in the distribution of bodily temperature, and particularly alterations in the movements of the heart.

In the broadest sense, something is a passion if it involves some sort of receptivity, as in sense-perception or understanding. But Aquinas took passions of the soul to qualify as passions in a stricter sense, involving change in the receptive subject (since receiving some X requires losing its contrary). In the strictest sense, passions involve change for the worse, which leads Aquinas to consider sorrow a more exemplary passion than joy. For these reasons and despite calling them passions of the soul, Aquinas held that passions belong to the soul-body composite, for a body is required for something to undergo change that can constitute corruption. Passions do indeed belong to the soul as well, but ‘accidentally,’ insofar as the soul informs, and is a cause and end of the body (ST II-1.22). Aquinas stressed in a number of places that God and angels have no passions, although they do perform acts of will (rational appetites) comparable to our passions in some respects. On the basis of the strict understanding of the passions, Aquinas could distinguish them both from the will, or rational appetitive faculty, and from any apprehensive faculty (perception or understanding), since neither undergoes the sort of change implicated in the passions. Passions are instead located in the sensitive appetitive faculty; this is a faculty that is passive, since it is moved by external causes (which are not themselves moved thereby), although it may itself also be a mover. Although they belong to an appetitive faculty, passions nonetheless are initiated by acts of an apprehensive faculty, the estimative or cogitative power. This faculty receives information about particulars. But it differs from the faculties of sense-perception insofar as it apprehends non-sensible properties, or intentiones, particularly those that have some value pertinent to the apprehending subject, such as the dangerousness of the wolf to a sheep, or the usefulness of straw to a nesting bird. Quite generally, the faculty presents sensible particulars as either good or evil. Although in animals this “estimative” power is shaped by instinct, and perhaps by experience, it is susceptible to reason in humans, so that Aquinas called it the “cogitative power” and even – somewhat oxymoronically – “particular reason.” Still, he emphasized its corporeal nature, noting that “medical men assign a certain particular organ, namely the middle part of the head” to this faculty (ST I.78.4). Animal passions are determined by what is apprehended by the estimative power, and in the absence of any higher faculties that could overrule this power, inevitably produce behavior. But the human cogitative power is susceptible to reason, and thus so are human passions. For this reason, human passions are subject to moral evaluation; they are good if they are in accord with reason, and are thus “moderate,” evil if they flout it, or are excessive.

Despite his contention that in the strictest sense of the term, passions involve a change for the worse, Aquinas did not think we are necessarily worse off for being passionate creatures. Indeed, Aquinas adopts a broadly teleological framework to explain the passions, supposing that they exist to contribute to proper animal functioning: “as nature does not fail in necessary things, there must needs be as many actions of the sensitive soul as may suffice for the life of a perfect animal” (ST I. 78.4) – that is, as will allow the animal to survive and flourish. Appetites work hand in hand with apprehensive and motive faculties, so that an animal can move around the world, seeking out what is good for it, while shunning what is bad. Each has its particular functional role to play in the larger teleological picture, and we can see why Aquinas stressed that the passions are appetites, or more broadly movements (thereby differing from, e.g., Albertus Magnus, who took passions to be qualities, see Knuuttila 2004, 248). But his teleological framework is not restricted simply to animal ends, or ends of the soul-body composite. For instance, sorrow involves a bodily change for the worse, depressing the spirits and the movements of the heart, prompting uncomfortable shifts in body temperature, and generally impairing the functioning of the body. Despite its costs for the embodied creature, sorrow can nevertheless be quite a good thing, both because it motivates us to avoid sin, and because it is more virtuous to feel sorrow in the face of evil than not. Again, though, Aquinas adopted a basically Aristotelean position: moderate passions are good and functional, but excessive passions are not. Fear and sorrow controlled by reason serve several different ends, but excessive fear or sorrow can be disabling. In general, Aquinas’s conception of the passions is characterized by their place within an economy of receptive apprehensions, motivated actions, and the fulfillment of ends. Many of his analyses of individual passions look from their nature to their causes (including their objects), and thence to their effects – and in the case of sorrow to its remedies. Although he did not deny they exist, Aquinas does not seem much interested in the affective, or phenomenological aspects of emotions (see Knuuttila 2004, 249–52)

Along with his teleological framework, Aquinas adopted a fairly intricate and highly principled classificatory scheme. The most important division is that between concupiscible and irascible passions. This distinction predates Aquinas by a good while – thought to stem from Plato’s Timaeus, it was suggested by Aristotle, used by Cicero, and given a physiological grounding by Galen – but it came to be most closely associated with Aquinas. On his reckoning, the important distinction arises from a difference in objects: the concupiscible passions are directed at good or evil simpliciter, while the irascible passions are directed to good or evil considered as arduous. The irascible passions are thus parasitic on the concupiscible, and come into play only when there seems to be some impediment to the good or evil for which we feel concupiscible passions of love or hatred. As did Plato before him, Aquinas considered such distinctions to be necessary to account for the psychic complexity and conflict that we often experience.

Aquinas borrowed yet other principles from the Aristotelean classification of physical motions to produce a taxonomy of eleven basic kinds of passions. Crossing good and evil with three different kinds of motion describing the movement of the appetite produces six concupiscible passions: love [amor] and hate [odium]; desire [desiderium, concupiscentia] and aversion [fuga]; joy [delectatio, or its internal sub-species, gaudium] and pain [dolor and for internal pain, tristitia]. The specific irascible passions are produced by multiplying the nature of their objects with the direction of the motions with respect to those objects to produce the four passions of hope [spes] and desperation [desperatio], fear [timor] and daring [audacia]. To these, Aquinas added the rather special case of anger [ira], which presupposes a concupiscible passion of pain, and is a resolute appetite to remove the present source of pain. Unlike Aristotle in the Rhetoric, Aquinas denied that anger has a contrary. Although the results might seem a bit baroque, Aquinas obviously put great stock into his taxonomy, considering it superior to both Augustine’s reduction of passions to love and Cicero’s scheme of four primary passions (although he goes to some pains to interpret each view in a sympathetic way).

Aquinas’s evaluation of the emotions was a bit mixed. On the one hand, moderate passions serve the ends of human and animal life. Indeed they help constitute the ends of our lives, since the greatest of human goods, happiness, involves pleasure. On the other hand, Aquinas took passions in the strict sense to involve change for the worse, and more generally, ranked passions with the passive and not fully actualized entities existing on the lower, degraded rungs of his ontological ladder. This is not merely a matter of ontological imperfection. Aquinas stressed that God and the angels have no passions; it is part of their happy condition that their only appetites are the active, rational volitions that belong to their very being. Still, those acts of will are analogous to many of our emotions, e.g., love and anger, however much Aquinas balked at calling them ‘passions.’ He even insisted on occasion that it is appropriate to give a rational appetite and a passion the same name (e.g., ‘love’) on the grounds that they have similar “movements.” So he does seem to have recognized intellectual emotions or affects of some sort more “perfect” than our passions. Moreover, passions proper need not arise only by way of completely external causes; they can arise through volitions, when the volition produces a bodily effect, as when the intellect’s raising something for consideration under a universal prompts a particular appearance in the imagination (see de Veritate q.26). Although Aquinas did not make much out of these cases, they set an important precedent for future discussions.

7. Renaissance and Sixteenth Century Discussions

7.1 Florentine Humanism and Machiavelli

Compared to Aquinas, the writers of Florentine humanism considered the emotions only unsystematically. Marcilio Ficino and Giovanni Pico della Mirandola revitalized neo-Platonic approaches to the emotions, especially through their discussions of “Platonic love.” The Prince and Discourses of Niccoló Machiavelli take a different approach in considering how to characterize humans, particularly geographically specific groups of humans, in terms of their emotional dispositions and the patterns of behavior so motivated. Since he understood actions to be the outcomes of emotions, Machiavelli’s advice to political leaders included a great deal of material on how to manipulate the passions of subjects to keep public order. One technique is to adopt a public persona that can project emotional and character traits, which may be quite different from the ruler’s true private passions. Throughout, Machiavelli stressed that fear provides a particularly reliable motivation, and envy a well-nigh universal one. But for all his seemingly realpolitik public psychology, Machiavelli gave an important, and normatively loaded, role to what he called “glory” [gloria]. Glory may not itself be an emotion – Machiavelli treated it as an achievement at which a ruler should aim – but the desire for something like glory, e.g., ambition, or the emotion for honor, was to become an important element in the list of emotions recognized by figures from Montaigne to Hobbes.

7.2 Juan Luis Vives

Another figure with humanist connections was the lesser-known writer on the emotions Juan Luis Vives. Book Three of his tome De Anima et Vita (1538) treats psychology and education, and includes a seminal discussion of the emotions, combining Galenist medicine with observational material, particularly to show how the humour-laden temperaments can be modified by such features as age, health, climate and circumstance, as well as by thought, judgment and will (see Guerlac 1998). Although he held that uncontrolled emotions can be morally and cognitively disruptive, Vives did not suppose all emotions to be so disruptive, and introduced vocabulary to distinguish such emotions from violent passions. In so doing, he popularized the use of ‘affectus’ or ‘affectiones,’ which he understood most broadly as any modification (or accident), more narrowly as an emotion in general, and in the narrowest sense as a gentle emotion (see Gardiner 1970, 123). Other authors, however, continued to use ‘passion’ and ‘affection’ interchangeably, as did Thomas Wright in The Passions of the Mind in General (1601).

Despite evaluating it differently, Vives shared the Stoic view connecting emotions and cognition. Vives took emotions to arise out of judgments of good and evil. These judgments may not be reasoned or deliberative, but he seemed to think that some judgment-like character had to be attributed to emotions to explain exactly how they came to be directed at objects. In this, he took issue with Aquinas, who took differences in “formal” objects and causes to suffice for distinguishing powers of the soul. But Vives generally refused to draw sharp distinctions between the various powers and faculties of the soul. Instead, he redrew Aquinas’s classification of the emotions, producing a threefold distinction of emotions directed at good, emotions directed at, or concerned with evil [ad malum], and those that act to combat evil (contra malum). This does not eliminate the contrast between concupiscible and the irascible passions, but it does produce a different taxonomy: there are affects directed at good simpliciter (liking, love, reverence), as well as at present good (delight), and at future good (desire, hope). There are affects concerned with evil per se (e.g., dislike, hate), and specifically with present evil (grief) or future evil (fear). There are also affects combating present evil (anger, indignation) and future evil (faith, daring). Moreover, emotions could interact, whether by combining, conflicting, diminishing, or strengthening each other to produce whole trains of emotions, or by falling into a fourth category of “mixed” emotions, compounded out of simpler ones (see Gardiner 1970, 129–130).

In keeping with his medical interests and reliance on Galenist psycho-physiology, Vives also placed a good deal of emphasis on the physiological aspects of emotions. However, unlike many other Renaissance Galenists, Vives did not assign emotions specifically to the heart, but instead emphasized the interplay between emotions, judgments of good and evil, and bodily states. Despite these connections, Vives took it that the proper way to manage and control the affects is by invoking other affects. These views, rather than his peculiar taxonomies, mark his importance for later authors.

7.3 Montaigne

Michel de Montaigne’s Essais are heavily indebted to previous accounts of the emotions and their value. But it is hard to say where exactly Montaigne stood on them. The Essais are far from being a systematic work of philosophy, they are shot through with irony, and they may well reflect Montaigne’s changing views over the many years he worked on them. Nonetheless, certain themes emerge, particularly after the case made for Pyrrhonian skepticism in the “Apology for Raimond Sebond.” There and elsewhere, skeptical means serve roughly Stoic ends. Montaigne spoke approvingly of how his brand of skepticism leads to a kind of “ataraxy:”

a peaceful and sedate condition of life, exempt from the agitations we receive through the impressions of the opinion and knowledge we think we have of things. Whence are born fear, avarice, envy, immoderate desires, ambition, pride, superstition, love of novelty, rebellion, disobedience, obstinancy and most bodily ills (“Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne 1958, 372).

For all this condemnation of a whole host of passions, however, Montaigne often condemned the “harshness” of the Stoics with equal vehemence. And throughout the Essais, he shows a keen interest in the affective components of education and intellectual activity, taking pleasant emotions, particularly “cheerfulness” [esjouissance] to be desirable both in intellectual pursuits and as their achievement. Yet it would be hard to attribute even a eudaimonistic position akin to Aristotle’s to the writer who in “On Moderation” advised moderation even in pursuit of virtue and moderation.

Montaigne’s notion of cheerfulness seems to go hand in hand with the sort of peaceful, retiring life he favored. He was particularly hard on emotions that would disrupt such a life, producing a number of diatribes (e.g., “On Glory”) against the desire for glory, reputation, or honor. In contrast to Machiavelli, Montaigne conceived of glory more as a matter of recognition or reputation than as a normatively inflected achievement. It is transient and irrational, and the desire for it is an “illusion,” although a universal one, tempting even and especially to those who have succeeded in controlling their other passions. With his tongue firmly in his cheek, Montaigne remarked on how often those who have written books despising glory still want the glory of having written the books (“Of not Communicating one’s Glory,” Montaigne 1958, 187). (The irony of this criticism is only increased by its allusion to Cicero, who serves as both example of the desire and source for the comment, see Pro Archia XI,16.)

In place of any general theory, Montaigne’s essays draw from various sources to present a plethora of anecdotal accounts, showing everything from the effects emotions may have on reason and judgment, to their bodily effects, to the continuity between human and animal emotions. But what Montaigne seems most bent on is the sheer diversity of the passions we experience, and in particular, what he called their “inconstancy” – the fleeting and often conflicting nature of the emotions an individual may experience on various occasions (or even on one) (“How we Cry and Laugh for the Same Thing,” Montaigne 1958, 173). The same can be said for our judgment; changes of perspective can generate new and contrasting passions and concomitant judgments (Montaigne 1958, 174). The relativity of judgment is an old Pyrrhonist theme, used to generate the problem of the criterion (by, e.g., Sextus Empiricus). Montaigne’s associate and follower, Pierre Charron uses the relativity of passions to much the same end in his De la Sagesse (1601). Montaigne, however, applied this chestnut here specifically to the individual in order to draw a psychological moral: “… we are wrong to compose a continuous body out of all this succession of feelings.” (“How we Cry and Laugh for the Same Thing,” Montaigne 1958, 174), for “we are all patchwork, and … shapeless and diverse in composition” (“Of the Inconsistency of our Actions,” Montaigne 1958, 244).

But this is not merely patchwork inconstancy. Montaigne also contrasted what is external with a kind of interiority that seems associated with the true self. Intense emotions may not have outward expressions, and perturbations that remain superficial do not touch the true inner core. So too, virtuous actions can have vicious motivations, and vice-versa. But even as Montaigne used this contrast, he played with it, telling us that because “a sound intellect will refuse to judge men simply by their outward actions, we must probe the inside and discover what springs set men in motion,” before adding “but since this is an arduous and hazardous undertaking, I wish fewer people would meddle with it” (“Of the Inconsistency of our Actions,” Montaigne 1958, 244). Difficult though it may be to reach the “inside” directly, we should also note that the interior and exterior are intertwined, a point Montaigne uses in discussing “diversion,” the transformation of painful emotions into pleasanter ones (“Of Diversion”). Diversion can be accomplished simply through the outer expressions of emotion by others. This is one reason why rhetoric can be an effective diversion (much better than argument); indeed, it can change even the passions of the speaker, as outward expression shapes inward affect (Montaigne 1958, 635). It is fortunate that we are susceptible to expressions of emotion, since painful passions are much easier to divert than to subdue. By using diversion to increase cheerfulness, we turn the inconstancy of our emotional natures to our benefit. Although it may be going too far to say that Montaigne celebrated such inconstancy, he did seem to have seen it as a brute and interesting feature of human (and animal) life. Nor did he feel any need to propose an account of the structure of the soul that will impose a neat taxonomy on the messy character of our emotions to explain away their prima facie inconstancy and conflict.

7.4 Justus Lipsius

Montaigne’s work was contemporaneous with the revival movement that came to be known as neo-Stoicism, which adopted ancient (particularly Roman) Stoicism to Christian theology and contemporary concerns. Perhaps the most famous neo-Stoic, one admired greatly by Montaigne, was Justus Lipsius, who espoused neo-Stoic doctrines in both ethics and political works, as well as in other areas of philosophy. His most popular book was On Constancy in Times of Public Troubles [De Constantia in publicis malis], often shortened to On Constancy, first published in 1584, before going through more than 80 editions and translations over the next two centuries. Lipsius adopted a typically Stoic approach to the passions and “affects” [adfectus], identifying them as false opinions that we “must never stop attempting to conquer” (On Constancy 1.2). The desirable state is “constancy,” internal peace and absence of conflict. Lipsius laid particular stress on the role of constancy during times of tumultuous civic and religious change, something he experienced in spades during the course of his career. Perhaps for this reason, he included among the passions to be conquered such “lures” as deception [simulatio], patriotism, and pity [miseratio] for the misfortunes of others. The goal, however, seems to be emotional detachment, not practical disengagement from public affairs. As a companion piece to On Constancy, Lipsius wrote Six Books on Politics or Civil Doctrine [Politicorum sive Civilis doctrinae libri sex] (1589). Whereas the “Letter to the Reader” of the earlier book directed it at the citizenry who endure turmoil, the latter aimed to instruct “those who rule how to govern.” Self-government still plays a crucial role in government, though, and Lipsius recommends a course in Stoic ethics as the best corrective for bad leadership (see Papy 2004). Lipsius’s work was thus part of the burgeoning early modern tendency to locate the passions within issues of command and government.

7.5 Suarez and Late Scholasticism

Cheek to jowl with the revival of ancient philosophies were continuing Scholastic traditions that undertook to treat the emotions systematically. Perhaps the most distinctive and influential writer of this kind was Francesco Suarez, whose compendious works included discussions of the emotions in V.iv-vi of his posthumously published Tractatus de Anima (1621), and a commentary on the emotional theory of Aquinas’s Summa in IV, disputations 1 of his Tractatus quinque ad Primam Secundae D. Thomae Aquinatis. Suarez was no slavish follower of Aquinas, however. He attacked the division between concupiscible and irascible passions, as resting merely on a “conceptual distinction,” rather than marking genuinely different powers and faculties in the soul. For this reason, he took Aquinas’s classification of the emotions into eleven basic kinds to be unfounded, and instead considered several alternate principles of distinction producing radically different classifications, one of which consists merely of six contrasting emotions. Ultimately, however, Suarez considers there to be no more than a conceptual distinction between any passion and any other passion. Suarez’s position may be extreme, and he himself allows that Aquinas’s distinctions may be heuristically useful, but his criticisms of the proliferation of distinct powers in the soul and his drive to unify the account of the soul on the basis of its “intertwining” powers struck a chord with many. Certainly the distinction between the concupiscible and the irascible became less of an article of faith, abandoned even by such synthesizing works as the Summa philosophiae quadripartita (1609) of Eustace of St. Paul (King 2002, 244, 256) – a work that served as one of Descartes’s main sources on scholasticism.

Copyright © 2021 by
Amy M. Schmitter <>

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