## Agendas, States of the World, and Probability Functions

• A finite set of propositions forms an algebra if (i) it contains a tautology and a contradiction, and (ii) it is closed under negation, conjunction, and disjunction.
• Given a set of propositions $$\mathcal{F}$$ a world relative to $$\mathcal{F}$$ is a function $$w : \mathcal{F} \rightarrow \{\mathsf{true}, \mathsf{false}\}$$ such that
• $$w(\top) = \mathsf{true}$$ if $$\top$$ is a tautology; $$w(\bot) = \mathsf{false}$$ if $$\bot$$ is a contradiction;
• $$w(\neg X) = \mathsf{true}$$ iff $$w(X) = \mathsf{false}$$;
• $$w(X \vee Y) = \mathsf{true}$$ iff $$w(X) = \mathsf{true}$$ or $$w(Y) = \mathsf{true}$$;
• $$w(X\ \&\ Y) = \mathsf{true}$$ iff $$w(X) = \mathsf{true}$$ and $$w(Y) = \mathsf{true}$$;
We write $$\mathcal{W}_\mathcal{F}$$ for the set of all worlds relative to $$\mathcal{F}$$.
• A function $$P : \mathcal{F} \rightarrow [0, 1]$$ is a probability function if (i) $$P(\top) = 1$$ and $$P(\bot) = 0$$, and (ii) $$P(X \vee Y) = P(X) + P(Y)$$ whenever $$X$$ and $$Y$$ are mutually exclusive.

## Epistemic Utility Arguments concerning Outright Beliefs

An individual’s belief set $$\mathbf{B}$$ is a subset of their agenda $$\mathcal{F}$$.

An epistemic utility function $$EU$$ for belief sets on agenda $$\mathcal{F}$$ is Jamesian if, for each $$X$$ in $$\mathcal{F}$$, there are $$R_X, W_X \gt 0$$ such that: $EU(\mathbf{B}, w) = \sum_{X \in \mathbf{B}\ \&\ w(X) = \mathsf{true}} R_X - \sum_{X \in \mathbf{B}\ \&\ w(X) = \mathsf{false}} W_X$

A Jamesian epistemic utility function on $$\mathcal{F}$$ has uniform ratio $$t$$ if $$\frac{W_X}{R_X+W_X} = t$$, for all $$X$$ in $$\mathcal{F}$$.

Then the Expectation Theorem for the Lockean Thesis follows from this lemma:

Expectation Lemma for the Lockean Thesis. Suppose $$P$$ is a probability function on $$\mathcal{F}$$, $$X$$ is a proposition in $$\mathcal{X}$$, and $$0 \lt R, W$$. Then:

1. If $$P(X) \gt \frac{W}{R+W}$$, then $$P(X) \times R + P(\neg X) \times (-W) \gt 0$$.
2. If $$P(X) = \frac{W}{R+W}$$, then $$P(X) \times R + P(\neg X) \times (-W) = 0$$.

Dominance Theorem for Almost Lockean Completeness. Suppose $$\mathbf{B}$$ is a belief set and $$0 \leq t \leq 1$$ is a threshold. Then the following are equivalent:

1. Relative to any Jamesian epistemic utility function with uniform ratio $$t$$, $$\mathbf{B}$$ is not strictly dominated;
2. $$\mathbf{B}$$ satisfies Almost Lockean Completeness with threshold $$t$$.

Proof sketch for the Dominance Theorem for Almost Lockean Completeness. First, we define a matrix. Suppose $$\mathcal{F} = \{X_1, \ldots, X_n\}$$ and $$\mathcal{W}_\mathcal{F} = \{w_1, \ldots, w_m\}$$. Then define the following matrix:

$\mathbf{D}_t = \left [ \begin{array}{ccc} d_{11} & \ldots & d_{1n} \\ \ldots & \ldots & \ldots \\ d_{m1} & \ldots & d_{mn} \end{array} \right ]$

so that:

$d_{ij} = \left \{ \begin{array}{rl} 1-t & w_i(X_j) = \mathsf{true}\ &\ X_j \in \mathbf{B} \\ -(1-t) & w_i(X_j) = \mathsf{true}\ &\ X_j \not \in \mathbf{B} \\ -t & w_i(X_j) = \mathsf{false}\ &\ X_j \in \mathbf{B} \\ t & w_i(X_j) = \mathsf{false}\ &\ X_j \not \in \mathbf{B} \end{array} \right.$

Then, second, we note that:

• $$\mathbf{B}$$ is not strictly dominated for any epistemic utility function with uniform ratio $$t$$ iff there is no vector $$\mathbf{x}$$ such that $$\mathbf{x} \geq 0$$ and $$\mathbf{D}_t \cdot \mathbf{x} \lt 0$$.
• $$\mathbf{B}$$ is Almost Lockean Complete with threshold $$t$$ iff there is a vector $$\mathbf{y}$$ such that $$\mathbf{y} \geq 0$$ and $$\mathbf{y} \neq 0$$ and $$\mathbf{y} \cdot \mathbf{D}_t \geq 0$$.

And finally we note the following theorem, known as Farkas’ Lemma, which says that the following are equivalent:

1. There is no vector $$\mathbf{x}$$ such that $$\mathbf{x} \geq 0$$ and $$\mathbf{D}_t \cdot \mathbf{x} \lt 0$$.
2. There is a vector $$\mathbf{y}$$ such that $$\mathbf{y} \geq 0$$ and $$\mathbf{y} \neq 0$$ and $$\mathbf{y} \cdot \mathbf{D}_t \geq 0$$.

QED.

The proof of the Dominance Theorem for Almost Lockean Completeness for Plans proceeds in a similar way.

## Epistemic Utility Arguments concerning Precise Credences

A credence function on $$\mathcal{F}$$ is a function $$C : \mathcal{F} \rightarrow [0, 1]$$.

$$\mathcal{C}_\mathcal{F}$$ is the set of credence functions on $$\mathcal{F}$$.

$$\mathcal{P}_\mathcal{F} \subseteq \mathcal{C}_\mathcal{F}$$ is the set of probabilistic credence functions on $$\mathcal{F}$$.

An epistemic utility function for credence functions on $$\mathcal{F}$$ is a function $$EU : \mathcal{C}_\mathcal{F} \rightarrow [-\infty, 0]$$.

### Probabilism and the Chance-Credence Norms

The Dominance Theorem for Probabilism and the Chance Dominance Theorem for the General Chance-Credence Norm both follow from the same fact about strictly proper epistemic utility functions, so we state that now:

Dominance Lemma for Convex Hulls. Suppose $$EU$$ is continuous and strictly proper. And suppose $$\mathcal{X} \subseteq \mathcal{P}$$. Then:

1. For every $$C$$ that is not in in $$\mathrm{cl}(\mathcal{X}^+)$$, there is $$C^*$$ in $$\mathrm{cl}(\mathcal{X}^+)$$ such that, for all $$P$$ in $$\mathcal{X}$$, $\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} P(w)EU(C, w) \lt \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} P(w)EU(C^*, w)$
2. For every $$C$$ in $$\mathrm{cl}(\mathcal{X}^+)$$ and any $$C^* \neq C$$ there is $$P$$ in $$\mathcal{X}$$ such that, $\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} P(w)EU(C^*, w) \lt \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} P(w)EU(C, w)$

Proof sketch for the Dominance Theorem for Convex Hulls. The trick is to use the epistemic utility function to define something like a measure of distance from any probabilistic credence function to any other credence function. Given $$EU$$ and credence functions $$P$$, $$C$$, where $$P$$ is probabilistic, define $$D_{EU}(P, C)$$ to be the difference between the expected epistemic utility of $$C$$ from the point of view of $$P$$ and the expected epistemic utility of $$P$$ from the point of view of $$P$$: that is,

$D_{EU}(P, C) = \mathrm{Exp}_P(EU(P)) - \mathrm{Exp}_P(EU(C))$

We can then show that, for any set $$\mathcal{X}$$ of probabilistic credence functions, if $$C$$ lies outside $$\mathrm{cl}(\mathcal{X}^+)$$, then the function $$D_{EU}(-, C)$$ takes a minimum value on $$\mathrm{cl}(\mathcal{X}^+)$$. And we can show that, if $$C^*$$ is the credence function at which it takes that minimum value, then, for all $$P$$ in $$\mathcal{X}$$,

$D_{EU}(P, C^*) \lt D_{EU}(P, C)$

And so, unpacking the definition of $$D_{EU}$$,

$\mathrm{Exp}_P(EU(C)) \lt \mathrm{Exp}_P(EU(C^*))$

as required.

Then:

• the Dominance Theorem for Probabilism follows from this if we let $$\mathcal{X}$$ be the set of omniscient credence functions, $$V_w$$ for $$w$$ in $$\mathcal{W}$$, since $$\mathcal{P}$$ is the closed convex hull of that set;
• the Chance Dominance Theorem for the General Chance-Credence Norm follows if we let $$\mathcal{X}$$ be the set of possible chance functions.

### Conditionalization

1. An evidential situation is a function $$\mathcal{E}$$ that takes a possible world $$w$$ and returns the proposition $$\mathcal{E}(w)$$ learned at that possible world in that evidential situation.
2. An updating rule is a function $$R$$ that takes a possible world $$w$$ and returns the credence function $$R_w$$ endorsed by that plan at that world.
3. An updating rule $$R$$ is available at an evidential situation $$\mathcal{E}$$ if, whenever $$\mathcal{E}(w) = \mathcal{E}(w')$$, we have $$R_w = R_{w'}$$.
4. An evidential situation is factive if, for every world $$w$$, $$\mathcal{E}(w)$$ is true at $$w$$.
5. An evidential situation is partitional if $$\{\mathcal{E}(w) : w \in \mathcal{W}\}$$ forms a partition.
6. An updating rule $$R$$ is a conditionalizing rule for prior credence function $$C$$ and evidential situation $$\mathcal{E}$$ if, for every world $$w$$, if $$C(\mathcal{E}(w)) \lt 0$$, then $$R_w(-) = C(- \mid \mathcal{E}(w))$$.

Expectation Theorem for Partitional Plan Conditionalization. Suppose $$EU$$ is strictly proper, $$\mathcal{E}$$ is a factive and partitional evidential situation, and $$C$$ is a probabilistic credence function. Then:

1. For any updating rules $$R, R'$$, if $$R$$ and $$R'$$ are both conditionalizing rules for $$C$$ and $$\mathcal{E}$$, $\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w)EU(R_w, w) = \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w)EU({R'}_w, w)$
2. For any available updating rules $$R, R'$$, if $$R$$ is a conditionalizing rule for $$C$$ and $$\mathcal{E}$$, but $$R'$$ is not, then $\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w)EU(R'_w, w) \lt \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w)EU(R'_w, w)$

Proof sketch for the Expectation Theorem for Partitional Plan Conditionalization. We prove (ii). Since $$\mathcal{E}$$ is partitional, let $$\{\mathcal{E}(w) : w \in \mathcal{W}\} = \{E_1, \ldots, E_n\}$$, write $$R_i$$ for the credence function that $$R$$ recommends at each world at which $$E_i$$ is true and write $$R'_i$$ for the credence function that $$R'$$ recommends at each world at which $$E_i$$ is true. Then, for each $$E_i$$ with $$C(E_i) \gt 0$$, since $$EU$$ is strictly proper and $$R_i$$ is a probabilistic credence function,

$\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} R_i(w)EU(R'_i, w) \leq \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} R_i(w)EU(R_i, w)$

with strict inequality if $$R_i \neq R'_i$$. But $$R_i(-) = C(-\mid E_i)$$, so

$\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w\mid E_i)EU(R'_i, w) \leq \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w \mid E_i)EU(R_i, w)$

again with strict inequality if $$R_i \neq R'_i$$. And so

$\sum_{w \in E_i} C(w)EU(R'_i, w) \leq \sum_{w \in E_i} C(w)EU(R_i, w)$

again with strict inequality if $$R_i \neq R'_i$$. Since $$R_i$$ is conditionalizing and $$R'_i$$ is not, there is some $$E_i$$ such that $$R_i \neq R'_i$$, and so

$\sum_{E_i}\sum_{w \in E_i} C(w)EU(R'_i, w) \lt \sum_{E_i}\sum_{w \in E_i} C(w)EU(R_i, w)$

And so

$\sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w)EU(R'_w, w) \lt \sum_{w \in \mathcal{W}} C(w)EU(R_w, w)$

as required.

Dominance Theorem for Partitional Plan Conditionalization. Suppose $$EU$$ is additive, continuous, and strictly proper, $$\mathcal{E}$$ is a factive and partitional evidential situation, $$C$$ is a probabilistic credence function, and $$R$$ is an available updating plan in $$\mathcal{E}$$. Then:

1. If $$R$$ is not a conditionalizing plan for $$C$$ and $$\mathcal{E}$$, there is a credence function $$C^*$$ and an updating plan $$R^*$$ that is available in $$\mathcal{E}$$ such that, for all $$w$$ in $$\mathcal{W}$$, $EU(C, w) + EU(R_w, w) \lt EU(C^*, w) + EU(R^*_w, w)$
2. If $$R$$ is a conditionalizing plan for $$C$$ and $$\mathcal{E}$$, then there is no credence function $$C^*$$ and updating plan $$R^*$$ that is available in $$\mathcal{E}$$ such that, for all $$w$$ in $$\mathcal{W}$$, $EU(C, w) + EU(R_w, w) \lt EU(C^*, w) + EU(R^*_w, w)$

Proof sketch for the Dominance Theorem for Partitional Plan Conditionalization. We'll sketch the proof of (i). Suppose $$EU(C, w) = \sum_{X \in \mathcal{F}} s(V_w(X), C(X))$$. Then we define a measure of distance from one credence function to another as follows:

• First, given two credences, $$p$$ and $$q$$, define $$d_s(p, q) = (ps(1, p) - (1-p)s(0,p)) - (ps(1, q) - (1-p)s(0,q))$$.
• Second, given two credence functions, $$C, C'$$, define $$D_s(C, C') = \sum_{X \in \mathcal{F}} d_s(C(X), C'(X))$$.

Next, since $$\mathcal{E}$$ is partitional, let $$\{E(w) : w \in \mathcal{W}\} = \{E_1, \ldots, E_n\}$$. Now suppose $$R$$ is an available updating plan in $$\mathcal{E}$$, and write $$R_i$$ for the credence function it endorses at any world at which $$E_i$$ is true. Next, write $$\mathcal{F} = \{X_1, \ldots, X_m\}$$, represent a credence function $$C$$ by the vector $$(C(X_1), \ldots, C(X_m))$$, write $$C \frown C'$$ for the concatenation of $$C$$ and $$C'$$, which is $$(C(X_1), \ldots, C(X_m), C'(X_1), \ldots, C'(X_m))$$, and define

$$\overline{R} = \{V_w \frown R_1 \frown \ldots \frown R_{i-1} \frown V_w \frown R_{i+1} \frown \ldots \frown R_n :$$
$$i = 1, \ldots, n\ \&\ w \in E_i\}$$

Then, if $$R$$ is not a conditionalizing plan for $$C$$,

$C \frown R_1 \frown \ldots \frown R_n \not \in \overline{R}^+$

It then follows that there is a credence function $$C^*$$ and an updating rule $$R^*$$ that is available in $$\mathcal{E}$$ such that

$C^* \frown R^*_1 \frown \ldots \frown R^*_n \in \overline{R}^+$

such that, for all $$i = 1, \ldots, n$$ and all $$w$$ in $$E_i$$,

$$D_s(V_w, C) + D_s(R_1, R_1) + \ldots + D_s(R_{i-1}, R_{i-1})\ +$$
$$D_s(V_w, R_i) + D_s(R_{i+1}, R_{i+1}) + \ldots + D_s(R_n, R_n)\ \gt$$
$$D_s(V_w, C^*) + D_s(R_1, R^*_1) + \ldots + D_s(R_{i-1}, R^*_{i-1})\ +$$
$$D_s(V_w, R^*_i) + D_s(R_{i+1}, R^*_{i+1}) + \ldots + D_s(R_n, R^*_n)$$

But then, since $$D_s(C, C) = 0$$, $$D_s(R_i, R_i) = 0$$, and $$D_s(R_i, R^*_i) \geq 0$$,

$D_s(V_w, C) + D_s(V_w, R_i) \gt D_s(V_w, C^*) + D_s(V_w, R^*_i)$

And so

$EU(C, w) + EU(R_i, w) \lt EU(C^*, w) + EU(R^*_i, w)$

as required.