Feminist History of Philosophy

First published Fri Nov 3, 2000; substantive revision Thu May 20, 2021

The past twenty-five years have seen an explosion of feminist writing on the philosophical canon, a development that has clear parallels in other disciplines like literature and art history. Since most of the writing is, in one way or another, critical of the tradition, a natural question to ask is: Why does the history of philosophy have importance for feminist philosophers? This question assumes that the history of philosophy is of importance for feminists, an assumption that is warranted by the sheer volume of recent feminist writing on the canon. This entry explores the different ways that feminist philosophers are interacting with the Western philosophical tradition.

Feminist philosophers engaged in a project of re-reading and re-forming the philosophical canon have noticed two significant areas of concern. The first is the problem of historical exclusion. Feminist philosophers are faced with a tradition that believes that there are no women philosophers and, if there are any, they are unimportant. Of course, women are not entirely absent from the history of philosophy, and that brings us to the second challenge we face. Canonical philosophers have had plenty to say about women and what we are like. In general terms, we often find that philosophical norms like reason and objectivity are defined in contrast to matter, the irrational or whatever a given philosopher associates with women and the feminine. Our tradition tells us, either implicitly through images and metaphors, or explicitly in so many words, that philosophy itself, and its norms of reason and objectivity, exclude everything that is feminine or associated with women.

In response, feminist philosophers have criticized both the historical exclusion of women from the philosophical tradition, and the negative characterization of women or the feminine in it. Feminist historians of philosophy have argued that the historical record is incomplete because it omits women philosophers, and it is biased because it devalues any women philosophers it forgot to omit. In addition, feminist philosophers have argued that the philosophical tradition is conceptually flawed because of the way that its fundamental norms like reason and objectivity are gendered male.[1] By means of these criticisms, feminist philosophers are enlarging the philosophical canon and re-evaluating its norms, in order to include women in the philosophical “us”.

The following entry contains 4 major sections. Section 1 (“Feminist Criticisms of the Canon as Misogynist”) describes feminist readings of the philosophical canon that challenge its derogatory characterizations of women. These are of three kinds: (a) readings that record the explicit misogyny of great philosophers (like Aristotle's description of a female as a deformed male); (b) readings that argue for gendered interpretations of theoretical concepts (like matter and form in Aristotle); (c) synoptic interpretations of the canon (like the view that, historically, reason and objectivity are gendered male). The third category of feminist criticisms of the canon diagnoses where philosophy as a whole went most deeply wrong, and, in doing so, it constructs a negative canon of philosophy. The negative canon exposes the ways in which the views of canonical philosophers throughout the history of philosophy are explicitly or implicitly misogynist or sexist. Section 2 (“Feminist Revisions of the History of Philosophy”) discusses the response of feminist philosophy to the myths that there are no women philosophers and, in any case, no important ones. One response has been the retrieval of women philosophers for the historical record. A related development is the elevation to the canon of women philosophers like Mary Wollstonecraft, Hannah Arendt and Simone de Beauvoir. Finally, feminist revisions to the history of philosophy and the canon raise important and pressing questions concerning how to weave women philosophers securely into the story of philosophy so that they begin to appear in the philosophical curriculum. Section 3 (“Feminist Appropriation of Canonical Philosophers”) examines the way that feminist philosophers have been engaged in rereading the canon looking for antecedents to feminist philosophy in the work of those philosophers (e.g. Hume) and those theories (e.g. Arisotle's virtue ethics) that are most congenial to current trends in feminism or which provide most fuel for feminist thought. This is to use the canon as other movements have done—as a resource, and as confirmation that a feminist perspective or problem is securely rooted in our philosophical culture. Section 4 (Feminist Methodological Reflections on the History of Philosophy) discusses the methodological issues raised by feminist work on the history of philosophy. Feminists who are critical of traditional methods of reading the history of philosophy have proposed several alternative reading strategies that they argue are better suited to feminist purposes than traditional methods. These writers are particularly skeptical of the appropriation project outlined in section 3 and their skepticism provokes interesting questions about what it is we do when we do the history of philosophy.

1. Feminist Criticisms of the Canon as Misogynist

Women are capable of education, but they are not made for activities which demand a universal faculty such as the more advanced sciences, philosophy and certain forms of artistic production. ... Women regulate their actions not by the demands of universality, but by arbitrary inclinations and opinions.
(Hegel 1973: 263)

The idea that the gender of philosophers is important or even relevant to their work is a thought that runs counter to the self-image of philosophy. So, it is interesting to explore how and why feminist philosophers came to the realization that gender is a useful analytic category to apply to the history of philosophy. We can distinguish two aspects to this process although, in many cases, the two aspects merge into a single project. The first stage of realizing the importance of gender consisted of the cataloguing of the explicit misogyny of most of the canon. The second stage consisted of probing the theories of canonical philosophers in order to uncover the gender bias lurking in their supposedly universal theories. The second stage, the discovery that a philosopher's supposedly universal and objective theories were gender specific, raised the further question of whether or not the theoretical gender bias was intrinsic to the theory or extrinsic to it. Let me illustrate these points with Aristotle.

1.1 Explicit Statements of Misogyny in Philosophical Texts

There is no doubt that Aristotle's texts are misogynist; he thought that women were inferior to men, and he said so explicitly. For example, to cite Cynthia Freeland's catalogue: “Aristotle says that the courage of a man lies in commanding, a woman's lies in obeying; that 'matter yearns for form, as the female for the male and the ugly for the beautiful'; that women have fewer teeth than men; that a female is an incomplete male or 'as it were, a deformity': which contributes only matter and not form to the generation of offspring; that in general 'a woman is perhaps an inferior being'; that female characters in a tragedy will be inappropriate if they are too brave or too clever”(Freeland 1994: 145–46). However dispiriting or annoying this litany is, and whatever problems it presents to a woman studying or teaching Aristotle, it can be argued that Aristotle simply held a mistaken view about women and their capacities (as did most Athenians of his time). But, if this is so, then Aristotle's theories, or most of them, are not tarnished by his statements about women, and we can ignore them, since they are false.

Here Aristotle is the chosen example, but similar feminist critiques are available chronicling the explicit misogyny of other canonical figures like Plato and Kant. Feminist criticisms of Plato's theories stress dialogues (like the Timaeus and Laws) that characterize women as inferior to men rather than the egalitarian Republic. Kant's writings, like Aristotle's, provide the ideal target for feminist criticism because they contain both overt statements of sexism and racism, and a theoretical framework that can be interpreted along gender lines.[2]

1.2 Gendered Interpretations of Philosophical Concepts

If we consider Aristotle's theory of hylomorphism we find a connection between form and being male, and matter and being female. That is, we find that matter and form are gendered notions in Aristotle (Witt 1998). By a gendered notion we mean a notion that is connected either overtly or covertly, either explicitly or metaphorically with gender or sexual difference.[3] Furthermore, matter and form are not equal partners in Aristotle's metaphysics; form is better than matter. And since hylomorphism is the conceptual framework that underlies most of Aristotelian theory from metaphysics and philosophy of mind to biology and literary theory, it looks as if his supposedly universal and objective theories are gendered, and it looks as if his negative characterization of women tarnishes his philosophical theories.

Are Aristotle's theories intrinsically gendered and sexist, so that gender cannot be removed without altering the theories themselves? Several feminist philosophers have developed this thesis. For example, in “Woman Is Not a Rational Animal”, Lynda Lange argues that Aristotle's theory of sex difference is implicated in every piece of Aristotle's metaphysical jargon, and she concludes that “it is not at all clear that it [Aristotle's theory of sex difference] can simply be cut away without any reflection on the status of the rest of the philosophy”(Harding and Hintikka 1983: 2). Elizabeth Spelman has argued that Aristotle's politicized metaphysics is reflected in his theory of soul, which, in turn, is used to justify the subordination of women in the Politics (Spelman 1983). And, finally, Susan Okin has argued that Aristotle's functionalist theory of form was devised by Aristotle in order to legitimate the political status quo in Athens, including slavery and the inequality of women (Okin 1979: ch. 4).

If these scholars are right, then Aristotle's theories are intrinsically biased against women, and it is unlikely that they can have any value for feminists beyond the project of learning about the ways in which the philosophical tradition has devalued women. Alternatively, Charlotte Witt has argued that the suspect gender associations with Aristotelian matter and form are extrinsic to these concepts, and therefore removable from Aristotle's theories without substantially altering them (Witt 1998). The argument that Aristotle's gender associations are not intrinsic to his concepts of matter (female) and form (male) turns on the incompatibility of the position that matter is intrinsically female, and form intrinsically male with the position that every composite substance is a unity of matter and form. If every composite substance is a complex of matter and form, then each would be a hermaphrodite, rather than a male or a female as is the case with animals. Moreover, whatever plausibility gender associations with matter and form might have with regard to animals, is lost entirely when we consider artifacts, like shoes and beds. If intrinsic gender associations with matter and form are incompatible with Aristotle's theory of substance and extrinsic gender associations are compatible with that theory, then the principle of charity dictates that we opt for the consistent interpretation. Recent work on sexism in Aristotle's philosophy focuses on his theory of animal reproduction in the biological writings. To what extent and in what ways is Aristotle's theory of animal generation sexist? (Henry 2007; Nielsen 2008) A related issue concerns how Aristotle's view of sexual difference in the biology is connected to his ideas about sexual difference in the “Politics”. (Deslauriers 2009)

Sometimes, as in the case of Descartes, the feminist argument in favor of a gendered theory is subtle since, unlike Aristotle, he expresses both a personal and a theoretical commitment to equality. Further, his theories are not stated using gendered notions. Yet, some feminists have argued that his theory of mind-body dualism and his abstract characterization of reason resonate with gender implications— on the assumption that women are emotional and bodily creatures (e.g. Scheman 1993; Bordo 1987; Lloyd 1993b, ch. 3).

1.3 Synoptic Interpretations of the Philosophical Canon

The philosophical canon can allow the luster some of its members to be tarnished by feminist criticism, just as it has weathered criticisms from analytic or continental perspectives. The most radical feminist critics, however, have urged that the canon's central philosophical norms and values, like reason and objectivity, are gendered notions. The synoptic approach considers the Western philosophical tradition as a whole, and argues that its core concepts are gendered male. But, if this is so, then the Western philosophical tradition as a whole, and the central concepts that we have inherited from it, requires critical scrutiny by feminists. Moreover, philosophy's self-image as universal and objective, rather than particular and biased, is mistaken.

Feminist synoptic interpretations of the canon take several forms. The first, exemplified by Genevieve Lloyd's Man of Reason, argues that reason and objectivity in the history of philosophy are gendered male.[4] The way that reason and objectivity are gendered male varies as philosophical theory and historical period varies, but the fact that they are gendered is a constant. From Aristotle to Hume, from Plato to Sartre, reason is associated with maleness. Therefore, the notion of reason that we have inherited, whether we are empiricists or existentialists, requires critical scrutiny.

The second form of synoptic interpretation, exemplified by Susan Bordo's The Flight to Objectivity, argues that the modern period in philosophy, and, in particular, the philosophy of Descartes, is the source of our ideals of reason and objectivity that are gendered male. In other words, this story chronicles a turn in philosophy coincident with the rise of modern science, which generated ideals of reason and objectivity that are deeply antagonistic to women and feminism.[5] Cartesian rationalism and the norms of modern science mark a decisive break with a philosophical and cultural tradition that was more accommodating of female characteristics and powers.

It is important to note that Lloyd and Bordo differ not only with regard to the historical story they tell concerning the maleness of reason, but also with regard to the way they understand that maleness. For Lloyd, the maleness of reason is symbolic and metaphorical rather than cultural or psychological. Lloyd does not intend the maleness of reason to refer to either a socially constituted gender category or a psychological orientation shared by males. “This book is not a direct study of gender identity. It seeks rather to contribute to the understanding of how the male-female distinction operates as a symbol in traditional philosophical texts, and of its interactions with explicit philosophical views of reason”.[6] In understanding the maleness of reason as symbolic rather than as psychological or social, Lloyd avoids making a theoretical commitment to any particular psychology of sex differences or any particular account of the social formation of gender identity. What she gains in flexibility, however, she loses in content, since it is difficult to specify exactly what metaphorical maleness is, and how it is related to psychological or social maleness. Other feminists have attempted to develop an account of how male metaphors and symbols undermine philosophical arguments (Rooney 1991).

For Bordo, however, the maleness of Cartesian reason is given both a social meaning and a psychological content. First, the social meaning of maleness: “In the seventeenth century it [the feminine orientation toward the world] was decisively purged from the dominant intellectual culture, through the Cartesian ‘rebirthing’ and restructuring of knowledge and the world as masculine”(Bordo 1987: 100). This social meaning is paired with a psychological consequence: “The ‘great Cartesian anxiety,’ although manifestly expressed in epistemological terms, discloses itself as anxiety over separation from the organic female universe”(Bordo 1987: 5). Cartesian ‘anxiety’ is separation anxiety from mother nature; the rational norms of clarity and distinctness are read as symptoms of this anxiety.[7] Bordo's social-psychological notion of maleness while rich and explicit, provides a large target for critics because it is based on a controversial historical thesis (that the 17th century showed a marked increase in gynophobia) and a disputed psychological theory of the family (Object Relations Theory).

Luce Irigaray takes a radical stance towards the history of philosophy by trying to indicate what is suppressed and hidden in the tradition rather than cataloguing its evident “maleness”. Her work, like Bordo's, makes use of psychoanalytic theory in interpreting texts and, like Lloyd's, it explores the symbolic associations of philosophical images and concepts. However, unlike Bordo and Lloyd, Irigaray uses highly unconventional methods of interpreting canonical philosophical texts in order to uncover the ways in which the feminine or sexual difference is repressed in them. For example, Irigaray uses humor and parody rather than straightforward exegesis, and she points to instabilities (contradictions) in philosophical texts as symptoms of patriarchal thinking. According to Irigaray, patriarchal thinking attempts to achieve universality by repressing sexual difference. But, the presence of contradictions or instabilities in a philosophical text is symptomatic of the failure of patriarchal thinking to contain sexual difference. For example, Irigaray might look at the argument we described above for considering gender associations with form and matter in Aristotle to be extrinsic, rather than intrinsic, to those concepts, and argue that the fact that Aristotle's hylomorphism as a universal theory is incompatible with gender associations is a symptom of patriarchal thinking rather than evidence that the proposed interpretation is mistaken.[8]

Despite their different historical stories, and the different ways that they understand the maleness of reason, each of these panoramic visions of the history of philosophy deliver the same moral, which is that the central norms that inform our philosophical culture today are gendered male.[9] Hence, these synoptic narratives of the philosophical tradition provide historical justifications for feminist philosophers who are critical of our central philosophical norms of reason and objectivity. Does the feminist synoptic critical reading of the history of philosophy justify either the conclusion that traditional conceptions of reason ought to be flat-out rejected by feminists or the conclusion that traditional conceptions of reason ought to be subjected to critical scrutiny?

Even if feminist historical arguments are successful in showing that philosophical norms like reason and objectivity are gendered male, this conclusion does not justify a flat-out rejection of either traditional philosophy or its norms of reason and objectivity (Witt 1993). Recall the distinction introduced above between intrinsically and extrinsically gendered notions. An intrinsically gendered notion is one that necessarily carries implications regarding gender, i.e., if one were to cancel all implications concerning gender, one would be left with a different notion than the original. In contrast, an extrinsically gendered notion typically does carry implications concerning gender, but not necessarily so. If the maleness of reason is extrinsic to the traditional concept of reason, then the historical fact that it was a gendered notion does not justify or require its rejection by feminists. If on the other hand, it can be shown that the maleness of reason is intrinsic to it, it still does not follow that reason ought to be rejected by feminists. For, the idea the reason is intrinsically male-biased would justify a rejection of it only if it ought to be other than it is. So, what needs to be argued is that reason and objectivity would be different, and better, if they were not gendered male, but were gender-neutral, gender-inclusive or female. But, if feminist philosophers develop this argument, which they need to buttress the historical argument, then they are reconceptualizing traditional notions of reason and objectivity rather than rejecting them.

Even though the work that feminist philosophers have done to show the ways in which traditional conceptions of reason and objectivity are associated with maleness falls short of justifying their rejection, their work has been valuable in two respects. First, it has established that gender is associated with the central norms of philosophy, a conclusion that warrants attention from anyone attempting to understand our philosophical tradition. Second, the historical studies raise questions about reason and objectivity that are valuable areas of inquiry for contemporary philosophers.

2. Feminist Revisions of the History of Philosophy

These women are not women on the fringes of philosophy, but philosophers on the fringes of history.
—Mary Ellen Waithe

Feminist canon revision is most distinctive, and most radical, in its retrieval of women philosophers for the historical record, and in its placement of women in the canon of great philosophers. It is a distinctive project because there is no comparable activity undertaken by other contemporary philosophical movements, for whom canon creation has been largely a process of selection from an already established list of male philosophers. It is a radical project because by uncovering a history of women philosophers, it has destroyed the alienating myth that philosophy was, and by implication is or ought to be, a male preserve.

In A History of Women Philosophers Mary Ellen Waithe has documented at least 16 women philosophers in the classical world, 17 women philosophers from 500–1600, and over 30 from 1600–1900.

And, in the recent feminist series Re-reading the Canon seven of the thirty-five canonical philosophers are women: including Mary Wollstonecraft, Hannah Arendt and Simone de Beauvoir. What is crucial to understand is that none of the three is canonical—if by that you mean included in the history of philosophy as it is told in philosophy department curricula, in histories of philosophy, and in scholarly writing. Still, there has been progress.

Consider that The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, published in 1967, which contains articles on over 900 philosophers, did not include an entry for Wollstonecraft, Arendt or de Beauvoir. Moreover, if the index is to be believed, de Beauvoir and Wollstonecraft are not mentioned at all in any article, and Hannah Arendt merits a single mention in an article on “Authority”. Far from being canonical, these women philosophers were scarcely even marginal, warranting perhaps a passing reference in a survey of existentialism or political philosophy, but little more.[10] By 1998, however, The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy had entries for all three, and also many other important women philosophers.

The project of retrieving women philosophers has a paradoxical relationship with contemporary feminist theory, however. On the one hand, it is clearly a feminist project; its originators were interested in establishing that women have been philosophers throughout the history of the discipline despite their routine omission from standard histories and encyclopedias of philosophy. However, the newly-recovered women philosophers suggest that there is little overlap among three groups: women philosophers, feminine philosophers and feminist philosophers. For most of the newly discovered women philosophers were not feminist thinkers nor did they write philosophy in a feminine voice, different from their male counterparts. Indeed, their breadth of philosophical interests is comparable to that of male philosophers although their domain of application sometimes differs. In her introduction to A History of Women Philosophers Mary Ellen Waithe comments “If we except the Pythagorean women, we find little differences in the ways men and women did philosophy. Both have been concerned with ethics, metaphysics, cosmology, epistemology and other areas of philosophic inquiry” (Waithe 1987–1991 Vol. 1: xxi). And another editor, Mary Warnock, comments “In the end, I have not found any clear ‘voice’ shared by women philosophers” (Warnock 1996: xlvii). The women philosophers restored to the tradition by feminist hands are not all proto-feminists nor do they speak in a uniform, and different, voice from their male peers.

Similarly, women philosophers who are candidates for initiation into the philosophical canon—like Mary Wollstonecraft, Hannah Arendt and Simone de Beauvoir—are a diverse crew. According to Elizabeth Young-Bruehl “That Hannah Arendt should have become a provocative subject for feminists is startling” presumably because of Arendt's explicit criticism of feminism. And while Wollstonecraft and de Beauvoir were both feminists, they share neither a common philosophical voice nor common philosophical principles. In The Vindication of the Rights of Women Wollstonecraft argued for the education of women using Enlightenment principles, while Beauvoir's The Second Sex reflects her marxist and existentialist roots.

The diversity of women philosophers raises the question why their recovery or re-valuation is an important project for contemporary feminist theory. What the retrieval of women philosophers, and their inclusion in the philosophical canon has done is to challenge the myth that there are no women in the history of philosophy and the fallback position that if there are any women philosophers, they are unimportant. Lovers of wisdom that we all are, we all benefit from the correction of these mistaken beliefs. Moreover, as feminists, we are interested in correcting the effects of discrimination against women philosophers, who were written out of history, unfairly, because of their gender not their philosophical ideas.

However, what is really at issue is not philosophy's past, but its present; its self-image as male. That self-image is created and maintained in part by a tacit historical justification. It is a damaging self-image for women philosophers today, and for women who aspire to be philosophers. The real significance of uncovering the presence of women in our history, and in placing women in our canon is the effect that has on the way we think about the “us” of philosophy.

The rediscovery of women philosophers raises the following question: How can women philosophers be rewoven into the history of philosophy so that they are an integral part of that history? Lisa Shapiro, considering the case of women philosophers in the early modern period, argues that it is not enough to simply add a woman philosopher or two to the reading list (Shapiro 1994). Rather, according to Shapiro, we need to provide internal reasons for the inclusion of women philosophers rather than relying upon a feminist motivation on the part of the teacher or editor. The history of philosophy is a story and we need to find a plot line that includes new, female characters.

One way to do this is to show how certain women philosophers made significant contributions to the work of male philosophers on central philosophical issues. We could call this the “Best Supporting Actress” approach in that the central cast remains male and the story line of philosophy is undisturbed. It is a good strategy for several reasons: it is relatively easy to accomplish, and it provides an internal anchor for women philosophers. On the other hand, it reinforces the secondary status of women thinkers and if this were the only way of integrating women philosophers, that would be an unfortunate result. The wholly inadequate interpretation of Beauvoir's philosophical thought as a mere application of Jean-Paul Sartre's is a good example of the limitations of this strategy. Not only does is reinforce a secondary, handmaiden role for Beauvoir, but it also promotes a distorted understanding and appreciation of her thought (Simons 1995).

Alternatively, we could find in the work of women philosophers issues that they have developed in a sequential fashion. Shapiro suggests that there are certain philosophical issues concerning women's rationality, nature, and education that women philosophers of the seventeenth century discuss extensively in a sequential, interactive fashion. The thread extends into the following century in the work of Jean-Jacques Rousseau and Wollstonecraft. Since philosophers become canonical as part of a story anchored at one end by contemporary philosophical questions that are thought to be central, the task would be to make these questions ones that we turn to the tradition for help in answering. And, of course, these are precisely the central questions posed and discussed extensively by contemporary feminism. Thus, the idea is that as we pose new kinds of questions to the history of philosophy we will find in women philosophers an important, sequential discussion that we can securely thread into our curricula and textbooks.

At this relatively early stage of the process of including women in the history of philosophy we need all to use all three strategies. There is nothing wrong with a purely external approach. By all means one should include a woman philosopher on a topic just to provide an indication that there are some interesting and important women working on a particular topic. And the strategy of anchoring a woman philosopher's work to a male canonical figure can also be a useful strategy as long as it is done in a manner that preserves the independence and originality of her work. Finally, it is important to ask new questions of the tradition, questions that might allow some women philosophers to play a starring role rather than a walk-on part.

2.1 Early Modern Women Philosophers: A Case Study

From about the mid-1990s, there has been a concerted effort by scholars both to rehabilitate the works of early modern women philosophers and to integrate at least some of these women into the philosophical canon. These efforts illustrate how a range of different feminist approaches to the history of philosophy can be integrated together.

While many contemporary philosophers have little knowledge of the women philosophers of the early modern period, there are in fact good historical records of these women and their works. This fact has made the doxographic task of retrieving these women thinkers a relatively straightforward one, even if labor intensive. O'Neill (1998) catalogs a long list of these women, and her doxographical work has provided a starting point for both expanding the list and interpreting the philosophical works of these women.

It is worth considering the context in which these women were writing and what it suggests about their feminist methodology in the history of philosophy. Though anachronistic, it seems appropriate to characterize at least some of these women, along with some of the their male contemporaries, as engaged in a feminist project. Many of these thinkers were self-consciously countering a recognized misogyny in philosophy but, insofar as they deployed philosophical methods, they would seem to reject the view that the problem was intrinsic to the discipline of philosophy itself. While the so-called querelle des femmes had been going on for centuries, the seventeenth century marked a turning point in the debate over the status of women as better or worse than men in virtue of their form or soul. (See Kelly 1988.) Both women and men thinkers of the period advanced egalitarian arguments. So, for instance, Marie De Gournay, in her “On the Equality of Men and Women,”(1622) deployed a skeptical method to argue for the equality of men and women (De Gournay 2002); Anna Maria van Schurman deployed syllogistic argumentation to argue for women's education both by demonstration and as evidence in her Dissertatio Logica (1638) (van Schurman 1998); in her Serious Proposal to the Ladies for the Advancement of their True and Greatest Interest (1694) Mary Astell applied Descartes's sex-neutral account of the mind (insofar as mind is really distinct from body, rationality is not tied to sex) to argue for women's education (Astell 2002); François Poulain de la Barre in On the Equality of the Two Sexes (1673) also drew on Cartesian principles to argue for the social equality of men and women (Poulain de la Barre 2002) . (Clarke 2013 collects de Gournay, van Schurman and Poulain de la Barre together.) While the methods deployed by these thinkers are different, they all appropriate philosophical methods – skepticism, basic rules of inference, a new metaphysics – different from what was then the dominant Aristotelian paradigm to counter misogynist claims.

Contemporary scholars concerned to reintegrate these women into the philosophical canon have tended to adopt a strategy that does not assume that standard philosophical concepts or the canon itself are gender biased. Rather scholars aim (1) to make long out-of-print texts accessible again; (2) to develop interpretations of these texts that (a) bring out their philosophical content and (b) demonstrate the involvement of these women in the philosophical debates of the period. The bibliographical appendix to this entry can direct readers to some recent editions of writings by early modern women. The remainder of this section sketches out one way in which scholars have pursued the second aim, and suggests some others.

One of the central themes of early modern philosophy is the reconceptualization of causation. Scholastic philosophy largely understood causation on an Aristotelian model, on which all change was to be explained by a constellation of four causes: final, formal, material and efficient causes. Early modern thinking about causation began with a rejection of final and formal causes. Determining final causes involved a speculation that outstripped human understanding, while formal causes were dismissed as occult qualities, simple assertions that things worked without an intelligible explanation of how they did so. Several canonical figures in early modern philosophy – Descartes, Spinoza, Locke, Hume and Kant – are often situated with respect to one another through their views on causation. In recent years, Malebranche, with his account of occasionalist causation, (a view on which neither bodies nor minds have causal power in themselves, and God is the only efficient cause), has been worked into the story. What Malebranche highlights is that understanding the nature of causation was a live philosophical problem: while there was agreement about dismissing final and formal causation, there was much disagreement about what should replace it, and in particular about the nature of efficient causation. Some early modern women thinkers were very much involved in this debate, and they are just as easily incorporated into the philosophical story as Malebranche. For instance, Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia, in her 1643 correspondence with him, questions Descartes about the nature of causation between mind and body. She can be read as insisting that an adequate account of causation must be applicable in all causal contexts. Margaret Cavendish, in her Observations on the Experimental Philosophy, develops a vitalist account of causation wherein motion is not transferred from one body to another, but rather one body comes to be in motion through a self-patterning in harmony with another body around it. (The SEP entry on Margaret Cavendish provides a more detailed summary of Cavendish's account of causation, along with guidance for further reading.) While Cavendish's account of causation did not carry the day, vitalism of one form or another was a dominant strand of thought in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. It is worth noting that vitalism is also a position within contemporary philosophy of biology.

A similar strategy for incorporating women into the philosophical canon can be used with respect to such central topics as the Principle of Sufficient Reason (Emilie du Châtelet), free will (Cavendish, Damaris Masham, du Châtelet), and cosmology (Cavendish, Anne Conway, Masham, Mary Astell, du Châtelet; see Lascano (forthcoming)). The SEP entry on du Châtelet contains a helpful discussion on her position on the Principle of Sufficient Reason, as well as an array of secondary sources. The SEP entries on Cavendish, Masham and du Châtelet provide some detail as to their positions regarding free will.

However, one can also move to incorporate women into our philosophical history by rethinking the questions through which that history is structured. How the questions are framed influences who is taken to have interesting answers on offer. Within the early modern period, questions in epistemology are often about the nature of reason and rationality, and the limits of the human understanding. While women of the period sometimes address these questions theoretically, more often they are concerned with implications of such answers for training the human mind. That is, they are concerned with matters of education, and they directly relate positions on education to positions on the nature of human understanding and rationality. Already mentioned are the works of Anna Maria van Schurman and Mary Astell, but others including Madeleine de Scudéry and Gabrielle Suchon also wrote on education. While education is not today typically taken to be central to philosophy, a little reflection on the history of philosophy can destabilize this contemporary outlook. Descartes's Discourse on Method for Rightly Conducting Reason (1637) is arguably a work about education; John Locke wrote Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) and On the Conduct of the Understanding (1706); and Rousseau's Emile (1762) also concerns education. Equally, education is a central concern of philosophers predating the early modern period (consider Plato in Republic) and after it (consider John Dewey). Reconsidering education as a central question of philosophy can facilitate seeing women thinkers as contributing centrally to philosophical projects.

3. Feminist Appropriation of Canonical Philosophers

Feminist philosophers have also changed the history of philosophy by appropriating its ideas for feminist purposes. From the perspective of negative canon formation, the history of philosophy is a resource only in so far as it describes the theories and thinkers that were most deeply mistaken about women. Other feminist historians of philosophy have found important resources for feminism in canonical philosophers. Indeed, they have found valuable concepts even in the worst offenders of the negative canon, like Aristotle and Descartes.

For example, in The Fragility of Goodness Martha Nussbaum has described the virtues of an Aristotelian ethics with its emphasis on the importance of concrete context, emotion and care for others in an ethical life (Nussbaum 1986). And Marcia Homiak has argued that Aristotle's rational ideal, far from being antithetical to feminists, actually captures some of feminism's deepest ethical insights (Homiak 1993). With regard to Descartes, Margaret Atherton has argued that his concept of reason was interpreted in egalitarian rather than masculinist terms by several women philosophers of the 18th century, and was used in their arguments for equal education for women.[11]

Other feminists have urged the reconsideration of the views of canonical figures, like Hume and Dewey, who have played only a minor role in the negative feminist canon. For example, Annette Baier has argued at length for the value of a Humean perspective in both epistemology and in ethics for feminist theory (Baier 1987; Baier 1993). And, in Pragmatism and Feminism Charlene Seigfried argues for the value of pragmatism for feminism; a position also taken by Richard Rorty (Seigfried 1996; Rorty 1991).

It is interesting to note that some of the very same philosophers who were cast as the villains of the negative canon are also mined by feminist theorists for useful ideas. Indeed, it is likely that every philosopher, from Plato to Nietzsche, who has been condemned to the negative canon also appears in some feminist's positive canon. This is perplexing. After all, if feminists evaluate canonical texts so differently, it raises questions about the coherence of feminist interpretations of texts. Is Aristotle a feminist hero or villain? Are Descartes' ideas dangerous for feminists or useful to them? If feminists have argued both positions, we begin to suspect that there is no such thing as a feminist interpretation of a philosopher. And this might lead us to wonder about the coherence and unity of the project of feminist canon revision.

Why is it that feminist philosophers have reached different, and even sometimes incompatible interpretations of the history of philosophy? The multiple and contrary readings of the philosophical canon by feminists reflects the contested nature of the “us” of contemporary feminism. The fact that feminist interpretations of canonical figures is diverse reflects, and is a part of, on-going debates within feminism over its identity and self-image. Disagreements among feminist historians of philosophy over the value of canonical philosophers, and the appropriate categories to use to interpret them, are, in the final analysis, the result of debate within feminist philosophy over what feminism is, and what is theoretical commitments should be, and what its core values are.

4. Feminist Methodological Reflections on the History of Philosophy

Disagreements over the value of the history of philosophy for feminist theory has stimulated discussion concerning the methods and presuppositions of the study of the history of philosophy itself. Can feminists use the history of philosophy as a resource in the same way that other philosophical movements have done? This question, in turn, inspires us to reflect upon different reading strategies that we might employ in relation to the history of philosophy.

Cynthia Freeland (2000) criticizes the idea that feminists can mine the history of philosophy for useful ideas as other philosophical movements and perspectives have done. She argues that the feminist appropriation/inheritance approach to the history of philosophy is an ideology. Freeland defines an ideology as a theory or viewpoint that is politically oppressive and epistemically flawed. Feminists who view the philosophical canon as a resource to be mined for ideas useful to feminism are engaged in a potentially oppressive activity since the history of philosophy is replete with ideas and theories that are (or might be) oppressive of women today. The epistemic flaw is that the appropriation approach is overly reverential of the tradition and might therefore be insufficiently critical of it. Deference is not an epistemic virtue. Freeland points out that appropriators tend to use standard criteria of historical interpretation like the principle of charity that tries to find consistency in a philosopher's theories or doctrines. Following out this line of thought, it turns out that all standard historians of philosophy might be guilty of this epistemic defect since all of them use standard criteria of historical interpretation. The criticism cuts a wide swath since it requires feminist historians of philosophy to deviate radically from the norms of their discipline since it turns out that the norms themselves might promote deference and oppression. What kind of feminist engagement with the history of philosophy remains possible?

Several reading strategies other than the standard have been advocated. Some feminists advocate a radical departure from the norms of textual interpretation by focusing, and drawing out the “unthought” of a text; its images and metaphors; its omissions and paradoxes. (Deutscher 1997) Others emphasize the importance of questioning the line demarcating a text from its cultural, psychological or material context. (Schott 1997) And yet others advocate for an active philosophical engagement with a text rather than the backward-looking activity of trying to determine the exact meaning of a historical text. (LeDoeuff 1991) These reading strategies, in turn, raise further issues concerning the limits of the history of philosophy and the criteria for adequate interpretation.


Comprehensive Bibliography

Supplementary Document:

Bibliography of Feminist Philosophers Writing about the History of Philosophy
[by Abigail Gosselin, Rosalind Chaplin, Emily Hodges, and Alin Varciu]


  • Alanen, Lilli, and Witt, Charlotte, eds., 2004. Feminist Reflections on the History of Philosophy, Dordrecht/Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Amorós, Celia, 1994. “Cartesianism and Feminism. What Reason Has Forgotten; Reasons for Forgetting,” Hypatia, 9(1):147-163.
  • Antony, Louise, and Witt, Charlotte, eds., 1993. A Mind of One's Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity, Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
  • Astell, Mary, 2002. A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Patricia Springborg (ed.), Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press.
  • Atherton, Margaret, 1993. “Cartesian Reason and Gendered Reason” in Antony and Witt 1993, 19-34.
  • –––, 1994. Women Philosophers of the Early Modern Period, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co.
  • Baier, Annette, 1987. “Hume, the Women's Moral Theorist,” Women and Moral Theory, Eva Feder Kittay and Diana T. Meyers (eds.O), Totowa, NJ: Roman and Littlefield.
  • –––, 1993. “Hume, the Reflective Women's Epistemologist?,” in Antony and Witt 1993, 35-48.
  • Bar On, Bat-Ami (ed.), 1994. Engendering Origins: Critical Feminist Readings in Plato and Aristotle, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 1994. Modern Engendering: Critical Feminist Readings in Modern Western Philosophy, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Bordo, Susan R., 1987. The Flight to Objectivity: Essays on Cartesianism and Culture, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Butler, Judith, 1990. Gender Trouble, London: Routledge 1990.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, 2001. Observations on the Experimental Philosophy, edited by Eileen O’Neill, New York/Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1992. Description of a new world, called the Blazing World, and other writings, edited by Kate Lilley, New York: NYU Press.
  • –––, 2000. Paper Bodies, A Margaret Cavendish Reader, edited by Sylvia Bowerblank and Sara Mendelson, Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press).
  • Clarke, Desmond (ed. and trans.), 2013. The Equality of the Sexes: Three Feminist Texts of the Seventeenth Century, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Conway, Anne, 1996. The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy, edited by Allison Coudert and Taylor Corse, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press).
  • Cornell, Drucilla, 1993. Transformations, New York: Routledge.
  • Descartes, René, 1988. Discourse on the Method for Rightly Conducting Reason, in Oeuvres De Descartes, 11 vols., edited by Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin, 1996. Translation in The Philosophical Writings Of Descartes, Volume 1, translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Deslauriers, Marguerite, 2009. “Sexual Difference in Aristotle's Politics and His Biology,” Classical World, 102(3): 215–231.
  • Deutscher, Penelope, 1997. Yielding Gender: Feminism, Deconstruction and the History of Philosophy, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Dewey, John, 1916. Democracy and Education, London: Macmillan.
  • Du Châtelet, Émilie, 1740. Institutions de physique, Paris: Prault fils.
  • –––, 2009. Selected Philosophical and Scientific Writings, Judith P. Zinsser (ed.), Isabelle Bour and Judith P. Zinsser (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Elisabeth, Princess of Bohemia, 2007. Correspondence between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and René Descartes, trans. L. Shapiro, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Falco, Maria J. (ed.), 1996. Feminist Interpretations of Mary Wollstonecraft, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Freeland, Cynthia, 1994. “Nourishing Speculation: A Feminist Reading of Aristotelian Science,” in Engendering Origins: Critical Feminist Readings in Plato and Aristotle, Bat-Ami Bar On (ed.), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1998. Feminist Interpretations of Aristotle, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • –––, 2000, “Feminism and Ideology in Ancient Philosophy,” Apeiron, 32(4): 365-406.
  • Frye, Marilyn, 1992. The Possibility of Feminist Theory, Freedom,CA: The Crossing Press.
  • Fuss, Diana, 1989. Essentially Speaking, New York: Routledge.
  • Gournay, Marie le Jars de, 2002. An Apology for the Woman Writing and other works, Richard Hillman and Colette Quesnel (ed. and trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Harding, Sandra and Hintikka, Merrill, eds., 1983. Discovering Reality, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • –––, 1986. The Science Question in Feminism, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Hegel, G.W.F., 1973. The Philosophy of Right, T.M. Knox (trans), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hekman, Susan (ed.), 1996. Feminist Interpretatons of Michel Foucault, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Henry, Devin M., 2007. “How Sexist I Aristotle's Developmental Biology?,” Phronesis, 52: 251–269.
  • Holland, Nancy J. (ed.), 1997 Feminist Interpretations of Jacques Derrida, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania University State Press.
  • Homiak, Marcia, 1993. “Feminism and Aristotle's Rational Ideal,” in Antony and Witt 1993, 1-18.
  • Honig, Bonnie (ed.), 1995. Feminist Interpretations of Hannah Arendt, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox, 1985. Reflections on Gender and Science, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Kelly, Joan, 1988. “Early Feminist Theory and the Querelle des Femmes: 1400–1789.” In Women, History, Theory: The Essays of Joan Kelly, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, pp. 65–109.
  • Lascano, Marcy, forthcoming. “Early Modern Women on the Cosmological Argument: A Case Study in Feminist History of Philosophy,” Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women's Philosophical Thought, E. O'Neill and M. Lascano (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer.
  • LeDoeuff, Michele, 1991. Hipparchia's Choice: An Essay Concerning Women, Philosophy, Etc, trans. Trista Selous, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Leon, Celine and Walsh Sylvia (ed.), 1997. Feminist Interpretations of Soren Kierkegaard, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, 1993a. “Maleness, Metaphor, and the ‘Crisis’ of Reason,” in Antony and Witt 1993, 69-84.
  • –––, 1993b. The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy, Minneapolis: The University of Minnesota Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2002. Feminism and History of Philosophy (Oxford Readings in Feminism), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Locke, John, 1693. Some Thoughts Concerning Education and On the Conduct of the Understanding, Ruth Grant and Nathan Tarcov (eds.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996.
  • Masham, Damaris, 1696. A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, London: Awnsham and John Churchil.
  • –––, 2004. The Philosophical Works of Damaris, Lady Masham, introduction by James G. Buickerood, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • Mills, Patricia Jagentowicz (ed.), 1996 Feminist Interpretations of G.W.F.Hegel, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press).
  • Nielsen, Karen, 2008. “The Private Parts of Animals: Aristotle on the Teleology of Sexual Difference,” Phronesis, 53: 373–405.
  • Nussbaum, Martha, 1986. The Fragility of Goodness: Luck and Ethics in Greek Tragedy and Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Okin, Susan Moller, 1979. Women in Western Political Thought, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 1998. “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History,” in Janet Kourany (ed.), Philosophy in a Feminist Voice: Critiques and Reconstructions, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Poulain de la Barre, François, 2002. Three Cartesian Feminist Treatises, eds. and trans. Marcelle Maistre Welch and Vivien Bosley, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Rooney, Phyllis, 1991. “Gendered Reason: Sex, Metaphor and Conceptions of Reason,” Hypatia, 6(2): 77–103.
  • –––, 1994. “Recent Work in Feminist Discussions of Reason,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 31(1): 1-21.
  • Rorty, Richard, 1991. “Feminism and Pragmatism,” Michigan Quarterly Review, 30(2): 231–58
  • Rorty, Richard, Schneewind, J.B., Skinner, Quentin, eds., 1984. Philosophy in History, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1762. Emile, or On Education, trans. Allan Bloom, New York: Basic Books, 1979.
  • Scheman, Naomi, 1993. “Though This Be Method, Yet There Is Madness in It: Paranoia and Liberal Epistemology,” in Antony and Witt 1993, 177-207.
  • Schott, Robin May (ed.), 1997. “The Gender of Enlightenment”. In Feminist Interpretations of Immanuel Kant, University Park: Pennsylvania State Press.
  • Schott, Robin May, 1988. Cognition and Eros: A Critique of the Kantian Paradigm, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State Press.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, 1996. Pragmatism and Feminism, Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press.
  • Shapiro, Lisa, 2004. “Some Thoughts on the Place of Women in Early Modern Philosophy,” in Alanen and Witt 2004, 219-250.
  • Schurman, Anna Maria van, 1998. Whether a Christian Woman Should Be Educated, edited and translated by Joyce Irwin, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Scudéry, Madeleine de, 1644. Les femmes illustres, ou Les harangues héroïques, 2 vols., Paris: Quiney et de Sercy.
  • –––, 2004. Selected Letters, Orations and Rhetorical Dialogues, trans. and eds. Jane Donawerth and Julie Strongson, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2004. The Story of Sappho, Karen Newman (ed. and trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Simons, Margaret A. (ed.), 1995. Feminist Interpretations of Simone de Beauvoir, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Soper, Kate, 1995. What is Nature?: Culture, politics and the non-human, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Spelman, Elizabeth, 1983. “Aristotle and the Politicization of the Soul,” in Harding and Hintikka 1983, 17-30.
  • –––, 1988. Inessential Woman, Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Suchon, Gabrielle, 2010. A Woman Who Defends All Persons of Her Sex, eds. and trans. Domna Stanton and Rebecca Wilkin, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Tuana, Nancy, 1992. Woman and the History of Philosophy, New York: Paragon Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1994. Feminist Interpretations of Plato, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Waithe, Mary Ellen (ed.), 1987–1991. A History of Women Philosophers (Volumes 1–3), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishing.
  • Warnock, Mary (ed.), 1996. Women Philosophers, London: J.M. Dent.
  • Witt, Charlotte, 1993. “Feminist Metaphysics,” in Antony and Witt 1993, 273-288.
  • –––, 1998. “Form, Normativity and Gender in Aristotle: A Feminist Perspective,” in Freeland 1998, 118-137.
  • –––, 2006. “Feminist Interpretations of the Philosophical Canon,” Signs: Journal of Women in Culture and Society, 31(2): 537-552

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The authors note that Section 2.1 of the August 8, 2014 update was written by the new coauthor, Lisa Shapiro, who also contributed some new listings in the Bibliography. The first author, Charlotte Witt, is grateful to Lisa both for her contribution but also for writing the new material in a way that could be easily incorporated into the existing text.

Copyright © 2021 by
Charlotte Witt <cewitt@cisunix.unh.edu>
Lisa Shapiro <lisa.shapiro@mcgill.ca>

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