Ludwik Fleck

First published Mon Mar 19, 2012; substantive revision Fri Oct 8, 2021

In the 1930s, Ludwik Fleck (1896–1961), a Polish-Jewish microbiologist, developed the first system of the historical philosophy and sociology of science. Fleck claimed that cognition is a collective activity, since it is only possible on the basis of a certain body of knowledge acquired from other people. When people begin to exchange ideas, a thought collective arises, bonded by a specific mood, and as a result of a series of understandings and misunderstandings a peculiar thought style is developed. When a thought style becomes sufficiently sophisticated, the collective divides itself into an esoteric circle (professionals) and an exoteric circle (laymen). A thought style consists of the active elements, which shape ways in which members of the collective see and think about the world, and of the passive elements, the sum of which is perceived as an “objective reality”. What we call “facts”, are social constructs: only what is true to culture is true to nature. Thought styles are often incommensurable: what is a fact to the members of a thought collective A sometimes does not exist to the members of a thought collective B, and a thought that is significant and true to the members of A may sometimes be false or meaningless for members of B.

1. Life and Works

Ludwik Fleck was born on July 11, 1896, in Lvov (now Lviv), at that time under the rule of Austria-Hungary, to a family of Jewish craftsman. His medical studies at the John Casimir University were interrupted by military service. He graduated in 1922, when Lvov belonged to the reborn Poland. At the end of his studies he was an assistant of the famous typhus specialist Rudolf Weigl. In 1923 Fleck founded a private laboratory of medical analysis and was in charge of the Lvov Sick Fund and the bacteriological-chemical laboratories of the General Public Hospital.

Although he was only loosely related with any academic environment at that time, Fleck conducted medical research, the results of which he published in about 40 papers, mostly in Polish and in German. In 1927 he published in Polish his first work in the philosophy of medicine: “Some Specific Features of the Medical Way of Thinking”. Two years later he published in German a paper “On the Crisis of ‘Reality’”(1929) inspired mostly by the quantum revolution in physics. Both articles are of a provisional character, but the first one already includes the terms “thought style” and “incommensurability”.

In September 1933 Fleck sent the manuscript of his book Die Analyse einer wissenschaftlichen Tatsache to Moritz Schlick. In March 1934, Schlick replied and expressed his willingness to recommend it for publication under the condition that a specialist on the history of medicine would also review it positively. In 1935, Benno Schwabe finally published the book Entstehung und Entwicklung einer wissenschaftlichen Tatsache: Einführung in die Lehre vom Denkstil und Denkkollektiv (The Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact: An Introduction to the Theory of Thought Style and Thought Collective). It was accompanied by a Polish summary of the main theses of the book (1934) and two important papers: “Scientific Observation and Perception in General” (1935b) and “The Problem of Epistemology” (1936). In Poland the book was criticized by Izydora Dąmbska and Fleck answered her critique in (1938). Fleck’s next Polish philosophical article (1939a) referred, among others, to a book by a psychiatrist and historian of medicine, Tadeusz Bilikiewicz. Bilikiewicz replied with a moderate critique of Fleck’s epistemology. Fleck in turn wrote a paper “Rejoinder to the Comments of Tadeusz Bilikiewicz” (1939b) in which he stated strong anti-realistic theses.

When Lvov was incorporated into the Ukrainian Soviet Republic in 1939, Fleck had been appointed the head of the municipal laboratory of hygiene and bacteriology. On June 30, 1941, Lvov was captured by Germans. Anti-Jewish pogroms began, and Germans also started to murder university professors of Polish origin. Fleck and his wife survived, probably because Rudolf Weigl included him on the list of employees of the Lvov Institute of Research on Typhus and Viruses. In August 1941, Germans resettled Fleck to the Lvov ghetto, where he developed and produced an anti-typhus vaccine from the urine of sick people. He was then relocated with his family to the area of the pharmaceutical company Laokoon and tasked with producing an anti-typhus vaccine for German soldiers. Finally he and his wife and son were deported to the concentration camp in Auschwitz. At first he was forced to do physical labor, but later he was transferred to the camp’s hospital with the assignment to conduct bacteriological tests on prisoners. In December 1943 Fleck was transferred to the concentration camp in Buchenwald. There a group of prisoners—scientists and medical doctors of various nationalities—led by a scientifically illiterate German doctor produced an anti-typhus vaccine.

The Buchenwald concentration camp was liberated in April 1945. One month later Fleck found his wife and son in Lvov, which once again belonged to the Soviet Union. They hastily left for Poland, whose territory—by the decision of the Allies—was moved 200 km to the west. The Communist government in Poland was establishing Maria Curie-Skłodowska University in Lublin, and since Germans murdered many Polish scholars, there was a scarcity of employable professors. In October 1945 Fleck became the head of the Institute of Medical Microbiology at that university, and he became a full professor in 1950. In 1948 he testified in the Nuremberg Trials of German doctors, who conducted criminal experiments on prisoners of concentration camps.

He published two more epistemological papers in Polish: “Problems of the Science of Science” (1946) and “To Look, To See, To Know” (1947). Those texts do not add anything important to the theory which he formulated in the 1930s. He was absorbed by research on a defence mechanism which he discovered in 1942 and named “leucergy”. It was the chief subject of most of his roughly 80 medical papers which he published in those years, mostly in Polish, but also in English and French. In 1952 he became the director of the bacteriology and immunology laboratory of the Institute of Mother and Child in Warsaw. Fleck was honored with many high national distinctions; he had a company car at his disposal, and attended international conferences abroad. In 1954 he became a member of the Polish Academy of Sciences.

When Fleck emigrated with his wife to Israel in 1957, where his only son had been living for many years, he was already very ill with cancer and heart problems. For a few years he was employed in the Institute of Biological Research in Ness Ziona. He then wrote in English his last philosophical paper “Crisis in Science. Towards a Free and More Human Science”, that was rejected by several philosophical journals. Ludwik Fleck died on June 5, 1961, of a second heart attack.

2. Predecessors

In his epistemological works, Fleck combined: (1) experience of a scientist; (2) reflections on the history of medicine; (3) philosophical ideas; and (4) sociological ideas. In the light of his own sociology and philosophy of science, one needs first to ask which thought collectives he belonged to and what thought styles he assimilated.

(1) While working in a private laboratory and hospital Fleck conducted certain medical research, but he remained outside university circles, and his research was rather marginal.

(2) In the interwar period Poland was probably the only country where faculties of medicine had chairs for the philosophy and history of medicine (Löwy 1990). Between 1908 and 1919 Władysław Szumowski taught the history of medicine in Lvov. Fleck also had some professional contact with two philosophers and historians of medicine, Włodzimierz Sieradzki and Witold Ziembicki. He was a friend of Jakób Frostig, a philosophizing psychiatrist. It is worth mentioning a few remarks from Frostig’s Das schizophrene Denken. Phänomenologische Studien zum Problem der widersinnigen Sätze (Leipzig 1929), which can be seen almost without any change among those written by Fleck: “We mean by [the expression ‘social group’] any group of people bound together by a common ‘intention’. Thus the group of mathematicians is a group of a very special, mathematical mentality. (…) one and the same person can (…) belong to several very different human groups. (…) the group’s collective storehouse ever changes and with it the criteria for truth. (…) It is only in relation to the collective stores of the group in question that we can denote a state of affairs as correct or as a personal error” (following Schnelle 1986, p. 9). However, Fleck does not mention any of these scholars in his writings, even though they created the thought style and intellectual mood that, according to his views, were necessary for his sociology and philosophy of science to emerge.

(3) Before World War II, Lvov had a “philosophical branch” of a distinguished mathematical-philosophical school—the Lvov-Warsaw School. Despite the fact that Fleck had connections with this school, he never mentioned either Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz or Leon Chwistek, even though Chwistek’s idea of the multiplicity of reality (in art but also in life and science) has much in common with his theory of thought styles. In his writings Fleck makes a few critical remarks on conventionalists and logical empiricists; however, nothing really supports the claim that he knew their views well. Also, Fleck’s remarks on epistemology of Kant, Mach, Wundt and Uexküll’s are superficial and dispersed—he does not adopt views from them, but only looks for some superficial confirmation of his own claims. Thus, we cannot include Fleck among any esoteric philosophical circles.

(4) In (1935a) Fleck devotes only a few pages to the sociology of knowledge, and, moreover, he refers exclusively to the German translation of Lucien Levy-Bruhl’s book Das Denken der Naturvölker, 1921 and to Wilhelm Jerusalem’s paper of 1929. Clearly he did not know works of the “founders of sociology of knowledge”: Max Scheler and Karl Mannheim. Schnelle (1986) even claims that Fleck had acquired the basic information on the sociology of science from a popular paper published in Polish by Paweł Rybicki. When Fleck mentions the works of Durkheim, Levy Bruhl, Jerusalem or Gumplowicz, he does this superficially; he does not adopt any of their conceptions and is content with a general thesis that “What actually thinks within a person is not the individual himself but his social community” (Gumplowicz; quot. from Fleck 1935a, § II.4). Fleck accuses them of ignoring the results of their research into the beliefs of traditional societies once they turn to scientific thinking, where they hold that “perceptions proper” displace mythical elements, and a traditional conviction on the existence of spirits and daemons is replaced with justified beliefs about “what physically is possible or impossible” (Levy-Bruhl, quot. from Fleck 1935a, § II.4). In contrast, Fleck claims that scientific thinking is an object of sociological examination to the same extent as mythical thinking.

An interesting hypothesis was recently formulated by Eva Hedfors (2006), who critically evaluated Fleck’s competencies in the history of medicine. She claims that the chief role in the development of his thought was played by the interdisciplinary journal Die Naturwissenschaften, where on the turn of the 1920s and 1930s scientists and philosophers carried out a philosophical debate about the relativistic and quantum revolution in physics. According to Hedfors this debate inspired Fleck, who wrote on the “physics of tomorrow”:

At the present time we are so fortunate as to witness the spectacle of the birth, the creation, of a new style of thinking. (…) Sooner or later much will change: the law of causality, the concepts of objectivity and subjectivity. Something else will be demanded from scientific solutions and different problems will be regarded as important. Much that has been proven will be found unproven, and much of what was never proven will turn out to be superfluous (Fleck 1929).

As Fleck—because of the lack of education in this area—could not write about physics, he found corresponding episodes in the history of medicine with which he illustrated theses circulating in the thought collective of physicists who were debating what was happening in their discipline.

3. Thought Collectives

Immanuel Kant made us aware that while we learn about nature from experience, in order to do this we have to know something before experiencing anything. According to Kant, a priori synthetic knowledge is unchangeable and plays an active role in cognition: our picture of the world is formed as much by things in themselves as by our forms of perception and categories of thought, and we will never know whether and how that picture is similar to what exists independently of our cognitive acts. Fleck adopted Kant’s thesis on the active role of cognitive a priori: an empty mind would neither perceive nor think. So, before a mind starts to experience, and on the basis of experience starts to think, it has to be filled with some initial knowledge. But the quantum revolution in physics has shown that there is nothing necessary or unchangeable in a priori forms and categories. A non-Kantian explanation of the origins of cognitive a priori was badly needed.

According to Fleck, the basic phenomenon we have to accept in order to build the edifice of epistemology is the collective mental differentiation of men (1936, II). People perceive and think differently, but those differences concern groups rather than individuals. So we speak of various ways of perceiving and thinking about stars and planets by astronomers, by astrologists, by theologians or by mystics. Those people understand each other very well within their groups: an astronomer understands another astronomer well, and an astrologist another astrologist; but between groups—like between an astrologist and an astronomer—there is usually no understanding.

Cognition is a collective activity. It is confusing just to say that an individual X got to know a phenomenon P: one should say that “X got to know P in the thought style S from the epoch E” (1936, V)—yet the thought style S from the epoch E is a product of a certain thought collective to which X belongs. What to a stubborn metaphysician appears as necessary forms of thinking results from the social nature of cognition:

A truly isolated investigator is impossible (…). An isolated investigator without bias and tradition, without forces of mental society acting upon him, and without the effect of the evolution of that society, would be blind and thoughtless. Thinking is a collective activity (…). Its product is a certain picture, which is visible only to anybody who takes part in this social activity, or a thought which is also clear to the members of the collective only. What we do think and how we do see depends on the thought-collective to which we belong (1935b).

A thought collective is defined by Fleck as a community of persons mutually exchanging ideas or maintaining intellectual interaction (1935a, II.4). Members of that collective not only adopt certain ways of perceiving and thinking, but they also continually transform it—and this transformation does occur not so much “in their heads” as in their interpersonal space. It is easy to observe this phenomenon in everyday life. When a group of people speak about something important, they start to speak about things which would not cross their minds if they were alone and which they would not tell if they were in another group of people. There arises a thought style characteristic for that group. There also arises a certain collective mood which straightens up the ties among the group members and inclines them to act in a certain way.

Some collectives last shortly—even only as long as an individual conversation lasts. When social forces connecting people operate for a long time, there arise thought collectives lasting for many generations. They take forms of religious movements, folk traditions, art or science. Long-lasting collectives create social institutions which enable and regulate the method by which next generations are added to a given collective: educational systems and social rituals accompanying the admission of new members.

All members of small ethnic groups belong to the same thought collective: everybody perceives and thinks in the same way, just like everybody performs the same or very similar actions. Within more developed societies there are many various collectives: religious, artistic, scientific, astrological, and those related to fashion, politics, economy, medicine, quack, sport, etc. When a thought style, developed and employed by a collective, becomes sufficiently sophisticated, the collective breaks into a small esoteric circle—a group of specialists which “are in the know”—and a wide exoteric circle for all those members, who are under the influence of the style, but do not play an active role in its formation. Members of the first group are those “initiated”—priests and theologians in the case of religion; artists and art critics in the case of art; scientists in the case of science etc. The corresponding exoteric circles for those groups are: lay believers; art-lovers; school teachers of physics, chemistry, and biology, and also engineers and all people interested in science.

Exoteric circles have an access to a proper thought style only through esoteric circles—for example through listening to sermons given by priests, or reading popular literature written by scientists. Members of exoteric circles trust the initiated. But specialists and members of esoteric circles are not independent of exoteric circles: this is the “public opinion” which justifies the efforts of specialists and gives them a stimulus to continue their work.

In contemporary societies almost everybody belongs to many thought collectives; e.g. a scientist may be also a member of a certain church, political party, mountain climbing club. An individual usually belongs to distant thought collectives, so that conflicts between thought styles coexisting in him/her do not arise. Most of people belong only to exoteric circles; only few become members of any esoteric circle, sporadically belonging to more than one. Everybody also belongs to a wide “everyday life” collective (which also differs from culture to culture).

Within the esoteric circle Fleck distinguishes the following subgroups: (1) vanguard, “the group of scientists working practically on a given problem”, (2) the main body, “the official community”, and (3) the group of stragglers (1935a, IV,4). In other places he omits stragglers and introduces a distinction between professionals (specialists sensu stricto) and more general specialists (1936, VI).

4. Collective Moods

Members of a thought collective naturally possess a certain bond, some feeling of group solidarity, of being a “comrade”, “coreligionist”, “countryman”, or “colleague”. It is accompanied by the feeling of hostility or contempt to a “stranger”, who worships other gods, is guided by other values, or uses unfamiliar words etc.

The force which maintains the collective and unites its members is derived from the community of the collective mood. This mood produces the readiness for an identically directed perception, evaluation and use of what is perceived, i.e. a common thought-style (1936, V).

These are collective moods which induce members of collectives both to sacrifice themselves for others and to burn dissenters at stakes. They make scientists work for public enlightenment, and at the same time they arouse the feeling of disdain for astrologists or alchemists.

Fleck stresses that there is no thinking which is free from emotions: “There is only agreement or difference between feelings, and the uniform agreement in the emotions of a society is, in its content, called freedom from emotions” (1935a, II.4). Emotions have a social character; they are already hidden in a language employed by a collective. Technical terms not only denote something determined by their definitions, but they also encompass “a certain specific power, being not only a name but also a slogan”, they have “a specific thought-charm”. This is why once the members of an esoteric circle master technical terminology there appears a sense of mission, and joining such a circle itself has “the value of the sacrament of initiation” (1936, V).

If the position of an elite is stronger than the position of the masses, the elite isolates itself and demands obedience from the masses. Such collectives develop dogmatic styles of thinking in which a test of correctness is usually located in some distant past in a more or less mythical master or savior. Collective life acquires a ceremonial character and access to the esoteric circle is well-guarded. Conservatism reigns: there is no place for fundamentally new ideas, and one can only better or worse realize the revealed principles. This is characteristic of most religious collectives.

If the position of the masses is stronger than that of an elite—like in scientific collectives—the elite endeavors after trust and appreciation of the masses, pledging its commitment to serve common good. This collective has a democratic character: the test of correctness is “the recognition by everybody”. Everybody is encouraged to learn, and everybody who meets intellectual standards can become a member of the esoteric circle. “This obligation is also expressed in the democratically equal regard for anybody that acquires knowledge. All research workers, as a matter of principle, are regarded as possessing equal rights” (1935a, IV.5). In principle every man—not only an elite with special privileges—should be able to verify whether a statement is true, to repeat an experiment conducted by somebody else etc.

Here an unsolvable problem arises. General education, necessary for joining a scientific collective, is acquired in schools before maturing, and if this is not achieved an individual is practically doomed to remain outside the scientific collective. In science no transfers from the uneducated general public to the body of general specialists occur. However, a democratic respect for an (imagined) “anybody” grants scientific thought styles an impersonal character which in turn leads to the objectivization of collectively created thought structures. Objective truth expressed clearly and precisely becomes an ideal. Of course, this ideal is to be realized in some distant (maybe even infinite) future. However, even if a researcher herself is removed from the results of her work, a cult of scientific heroes and geniuses devoted to scientific service develops.

Part of a collective mood arises at the point of contact between esoteric and exoteric circles. On the one hand, members of exoteric circles usually trust professionals and they admire them. On the other hand esoteric circles act under pressure of expectations of the masses. When a certain domain lacks support from outside, it does not have significant achievements. Fleck here uses an analogy of sand carried by the wind. A rock sometimes hits its target and sometimes it does not, whereas sand carried by the wind unavoidably accumulates in hollows (1935a, III). So when some social pressure makes enough researchers work long enough on a certain issue and obtain sufficient material support, they finally arrive at more or less satisfying results. A condition of success is not the alleged truth of employed theories but the systematicity of research.

5. Genesis and Development of a Thought Style and of Facts

The democratically equal regard for everybody makes scientists write popular works to familiarize laypersons—as far as it is possible—with a current state of knowledge. They use widely understood common language full of imprecise expressions and metaphors. Since popular texts cannot include complications which a professional meets every day in her work and because an author speaks to the public as an authority, such books and articles have a dogmatic character. Instead of provisions like “it seems that”, “as we tried to prove” often present in scientific papers, in popular works there are expressions like “it is a fact that” or “as science has proven”. This has serious (although not intended) effects on the development of science itself, for those who are to become scientists in future have their first contact with a discipline precisely through popular readings. Thus, what was created by a group of people acquires an impersonal, autonomous character. “Social distance transforms the author from a creator to a discoverer”—and this is how a mythical ideal of knowledge “as representation of reality independent of the subject of cognition” (1936, VI) arises.

One should then start to read textbooks and experiment under the supervision of specialists. This introduction into a domain still has a dogmatic character. An individual’s mind is introduced “into a self-contained world” and acquires a peculiar mystagogy. Finally, some people become fully-fledged members of a thought collective of a scientific discipline—specialists: “the expert is already a specially molded individual who can no longer escape the bonds of tradition and of the collective; otherwise he would not be an expert” (1935a, III).

As a specialist she starts to face certain research problems. She does not face them alone: she is a member of a group, where everybody perceives the world similarly and thinks about it in (almost) the same way. And if an issue is new, then any success is achievable only if the whole group of scholars is engaged. Usually the analyzed phenomena are extremely complicated and diversified—and they require distinguishing, segregation, unification, and simplification, and those are tasks which exceed the capabilities of any single researcher. “Only through organized cooperative research, supported by popular knowledge and continuing over several generations, might a unified picture emerge” (1935a, II.1).

We do not only mean here that there is too much work to do. When phenomena are not sufficiently examined, we lack concepts by means of which we could adequately describe them. And we also cannot begin with gathering facts. Traditionally—and today some still think so—facts were considered to be what is given and accessible through the senses. Modern empiricists claimed that there is nothing in the mind that was not first in the senses. Fleck reversed this maxim: there is nothing in the senses that was not first in the mind. So, in order to perceive we have to learn something before. It is not so that we first see some moving dashes and then we compose a whole of them. Quite the contrary:

We walk around without seeing any points, lines, angles, light or shadows, from which we would have to arrange “what is this” by synthesis or reasoning, but we see at once a house, a memorial in a square, a detachment of soldiers, a bookshop window, a group of children, a lady with a dog, all of them ready forms. (…) We look with our own eyes, but we see with the eyes of the collective body, we see the forms whose sense and range of permissible transpositions is created by the collective body (1947, II).

This set of forms was transferred to an individual in the process of socialization. When we bring a layperson to a laboratory and we ask her to describe a course of scientific experiments, professionals will find out immediately that she is not able to do this. She will surely create a long description and bring up a lot of unimportant or accidental details, but she will not pay attention to what is important from a scientist’s point of view. “If we wanted necessarily to render his experience in words, the most appropriate slogan would be: ‘I search’ or ‘I have a chaos’” (1935b). An expert sees differently than a layperson because she went through a special training during which she was familiarized with many examples—e.g. symptoms of a given disease and at the same time symptoms of other diseases (so with what X is and what X is not). At the same time she was equipped with a certain set of views on what that disease is, on the course of it, on how it is affected by external conditions etc. Thus, if the training process is successful a new member of a collective will directly see the same as what other members see “with their own eyes”. As Fleck states in the last sentence of (1935b), “’To see’ means: to recreate, at a suitable moment, a picture created by the mental collective to which one belongs”.

However, when a specialist starts research on phenomena of a new kind she is in the same situation as a layperson: she does not know what and how to observe. She does not recognize certain forms, she experiences chaos in which it is very hard to grasp anything constant. This is why—as it was mentioned above—scholars cannot start from gathering experimental data. Fleck also stresses that there is no spontaneous creation of concepts (1935a, II.1). This is why a new research starts usually—although not always—from proto-ideas which often are of a religious or philosophical character, which had existed centuries before they acquired a scientific character. For example, long before Copernicus there was a proto-idea of a heliocentric system, before Lavoisier—a proto-idea of chemical elements, before Dalton—a proto-idea of atom, and before Leeuwenhoek—a proto-idea of microbe (1935a, II.2). Proto-ideas are vague, and therefore in the scientific understanding they cannot be considered as true or false. (Even though they were true for the members of corresponding thought collectives). But they can become a point of departure for investigation.

Inquiries cannot be conducted by an isolated researcher, for she would chase her tail endlessly by repeating old formulas. As we have mentioned before, the constitution of a research collective is necessary and it happens when an appropriate mood arises—a mood which unites people and makes them work. In the case of research that was analyzed by Fleck, i.e., the research which led to the discovery of Wassermann’s reaction, the source of an appropriate mood was social pressure—a common demand for effective means for curing syphilis which was considered as an embarrassing and reputation-damaging disease. (Fleck brought forward a controversial claim that the absence of any analogous success in the struggle with tuberculosis was related to a common approach to tuberculosis as “romantic”, which in turn resulted with insufficient social pressure to overcome it.) This made the German government join the process of organizing research teams in that area; an additional reason was to make achievements of German scientists outmatch achievements of other nations. “The mood gave a driving power, and the proto-idea—the direction” (1934).

If a group of people participate in a research program there occurs a peculiar process. Each member of the group reads different texts (both popular and professional), participates in different experiments, and belongs to more or less different thought collectives (both scientific and non-scientific). So, when they start speaking to each other and reading each other’s papers, a series of misunderstandings arises. Ideas circulate within a collective and are enriched by new associations, and therefore the words that are used change their meanings. Sometimes nothing is left of the original meanings intended by those participating in the exchange of ideas. Sometimes the changes stem from a clash of various proto-ideas. And that clash itself is a result of various social factors. Having conducted countless studies and conversations and embarked upon a long journey, the scholars finally create a thought style which nobody intended. And after this has happened, nobody post factum knows when and how that style started to operate and who, specifically, created it.

Thoughts pass from one individual to another, each time a little transformed, for each individual can attach to them somewhat different associations. Strictly speaking, the receiver never understands the thought exactly in the way that the transmitter intended it to be understood. After a series of such encounters, practically nothing is left of the original content. Whose thought is it that continues to circulate? It is one that obviously belongs not to any single individual but to the collective (1935a, II.4).

Of course this process—an important element of which are misunderstandings among researchers—cannot be logically reconstructed.

Together with the mutation of ideas, new forms recognized in sensations occur. First, when observing phenomena of a new kind one reaches for the set of known forms—and starts to recognize that this, what is new, sometimes and under a certain respect resembles what is known, but some other times and under other respects it is different. In this period descriptions of results of experiments are full of comparisons with what one earlier learned to perceive, but also are full of provisions that those comparisons are sometimes unreliable. The unreliability manifests itself in the unrepeatability of initial experiments: something goes differently than before, and we know neither why it was so, nor what to do in order to get the same result next time. This raises concerns and the readiness for change. A researcher acting more or less blindly, searches for some constraints of thought:

The work of the research scientist means that in the complex confusion and chaos which he faces, he must distinguish that which obeys his will from that which arises spontaneously and opposes it. This is the firm ground that he, as representative of the thought collective, continuously seeks (1935a, IV.2).

Changes in the way of seeing cannot—as it was said before—be made by an individual. Descriptions of experiments circulate among scientists, and again as a result of misunderstandings and understandings the traditional forms are (and this fact is not noticed by the participants of that process) restyled, some are rejected, other connected into unique wholes, “and, finally, a new readiness is formed, i.e. the readiness to see a new, specific form” (1935b). Finally, in descriptions published in professional papers comparisons disappear and one states: this and that was observed. (Similarly, after some time of being in contact with the Latin alphabet we directly recognize the letter A despite the enormous variety of shapes it exists in, and at the same time we are not able to say what this recognizing consists in, cf. Fleck 1947, I.)

Thus, it is impossible to see something radically new “simply and immediately”: first the constrains of an old thought style must be removed and a new style must emerge, a collective’s thought mood must change—and this takes time and work with others. In the course of interpersonal exchange concepts evolve and facts evolve together with them. This in turn stimulates creation of new concepts.

Both thinking and facts are changeable, if only because changes in thinking manifest themselves in changed facts. Conversely, fundamentally new facts can be discovered only through new thinking (1935a, II.4).

Sometimes new ideas come from unexpected directions and without any relation to science itself. This is how Fleck explains the discovery of spermatozoon which happened together with the fall of political absolutism and popularization of the idea of individual freedom understood mainly as freedom of personal movement. One could not discover spermatozoon just looking through a microscope. However someone, who thought about a free person, could notice freely moving—so “free”—spermatozoa (1939a). This was the influence of environment which created a restless mood necessary for searching for something new. And a new mode of thinking created in a different domain of life allowed one to perceive, distinguish, and describe it in a way which would stimulate reflections of others—those participating in revolutionary social changes as well.

Before new sensual and thought forms arise, a certain “specific intellectual unrest must arise and a change of the moods of the thought collective” (1935b). If a person makes an important discovery but social moods do not change, she will not find people who take up her ideas and continue research. On the other hand facts are mutually dependent on each other, so “each new fact harmoniously—though even so slightly—changes all earlier facts” (1935a, IV.3). As a result, it sometimes happens that those initial observations from which a certain research began does not belong to the same class of facts as the one emerging from that research. (The research on the variability of bacteria was initiated by observations made in 1906 by Neisser and Massini, which today are regarded as bacteriophage effects.) Sometimes nothing remains of the proto-ideas from which investigations started and which inspired early experimental work. (Like the proto-idea of syphilis blood has nothing to do with contemporary Wassermann’s reaction). And finally there arises the edifice of knowledge which was neither intended nor foreseen by anybody.

In this process there is nothing necessary; various accidental circumstances decide which ideas become a basis for investigation and are disseminated within a collective; which meetings between scientists happen; which research projects acquire social support; which experiments are conducted first etc. Fleck claims that if e.g. Sigle’s idea of protozoa-like structures as the causative agent of syphilis had acquired sufficient support, we would have reached a harmonious system of knowledge different from the current one. The scope of the name “syphilis” would have been somewhat different than it is today, just like the methods of research and therapy would. But when a certain thought style develops and dominates researchers’ minds, alternative ways of development become closed. Summing up this idea Fleck claims that most—and maybe even the whole—content of scientific knowledge is conditioned by historical, psychological and sociological factors and one has to consider them when attempting to explain that content (1935a, II.1).

Of course, a series of misunderstandings is not enough to create a thought style that connects everybody. This is why for the existence of a certain discipline the main body of an esoteric circle is necessary—the group composed of general specialists well prepared to choose among propositions of the vanguard those that are most useful, and to elaborate, employ and harmonize them with each other. I.e. to create from a set of provisional claims present in papers aimed at professionals a system and to pass it on to a next generation of researchers. This occurs when textbooks are created.

(…) a judgment about the existence or non-existence of a phenomenon belongs, in a democratic collective, to a numerous council, not to an individual. The textbook changes the subjective judgment of an author into a proven fact. It will be united with the entire system of science, it will henceforward be recognized and taught, it will become a foundation of further facts and the guiding principle of what will be seen and applied (1936, VI).

The social structure of a scientific thought collective is reflected in types of scientific literature. Papers in scientific journals are written by scientists working practically on a given problem and are aimed at other scientists. More general specialists write textbooks consolidating their esoteric circle and educating its new members. Popular works are directed to exoteric circles.

The victory of a thought style depends on whether it will be possible to have a next generation of its followers, and to prevent influences of other styles. Certain research problems should be propagated, and other should be removed. A certain mental readiness must be created among the adepts of science. When it is achieved, all researchers “will see the new form directly, with their own eyes, as if it were the only one, everlasting truth, independent of the people” (1935b). At the end of his life Fleck summarized this as follows:

Every cognition is a social act (…) for during every lasting exchange of thoughts there appear and grow ideas and standards which are not associated with any individual author. A communal mode of thinking develops which binds all participants, and certainly determines every act of cognition. Therefore, cognition must be considered as a function of three components: it is a relation between the individual subject, the certain object and the given community of thinking (Denkkollektiv), within which the subject acts; it works only when a certain style of thinking (Denkstil), originating in the given community is used (1986).

The victory of a given thought style is never ultimate. Each new experimental discovery and every theoretical idea more or less changes the whole system. Even if at the beginning one sees only what corresponds with the theory, after a while there appear complications and exceptions (Kuhn’s anomalies) which sooner or later leads to revisions of concepts and assumptions. “Mutations” in a thought style, such as contemporary transformations in physics or in bacteriology, constantly occur. Sooner or later we will have to change e.g. the law of conservation of energy (1935a, II.1) and any other concept and claim. In the historical development of science there is nothing determined once and for all, nothing invariant. Both thinking and facts change.

6. Active and Passive Elements of a Thought Style

Fleck defines a thought style as the readiness for directed perception, with corresponding mental and objective assimilation of what has been so perceived, characterized by specific problems of interest, by judgments which the thought collective considers evident and by methods which are applied as a means of cognition (1935a, IV.3). What was collectively developed plays an active role in cognition: shapes modes of perception and the thinking of members of a thought collective. An individual, who has assimilated a certain thought style, becomes passive when conducting standard research: recognizes in environment specific forms and draws specific—those and no other—conclusions from an assimilated theory and results of experimental research.

Cognition therefore means, primarily, to ascertain those results that must follow, given certain preconditions. The preconditions correspond to active linkages and constitute that portion of cognition belonging to the collective. The constrained results correspond to passive linkages and constitute that which is experienced as objective reality. The act of ascertaining is the contribution of the individual (1935a, II.4).

The occurrence of passive elements cannot be explained sociologically. They are, so to speak, results of employing a conceptual measure which resulted from historical and cultural circumstances to the results of experiments—which, as the title of Fleck’s book says, came to existence together with the creation of a new though style and are developed with it.

What Fleck calls active elements of a thought style, Henri Poincaré calls “principles” and sees as “disguised definitions”. Poincaré stresses that there is nothing necessary in definitions—they can be various and they are chosen for pragmatic and aesthetic reasons. Fleck agrees with him to a certain extent. He notices that in the 19th century syphilis was defined in many ways: as a carnal scourge, as a mercury-treated decease, and finally as a set of typical symptoms. And he claims that “(…) if syphilis can be defined in various ways, the definition selected still determines some conclusions. (…) there are some associations which are open to choice (…) and others that are constrained” (1935a, I). For example if one defined syphilis as a “carnal scourge”, then other diseases like gonorrhea, soft chancre, etc. would be cases of syphilis; and when proper experiments had been conducted one stated for example that “sometimes mercury does not cure the carnal scourge but makes it even worse”. Looking at the same experiment those who defined syphilis as a disease which can be treated with mercury would conclude that they are not dealing with syphilis. However, Fleck opposes the conventionalist idea that definitions can be chosen freely. Definitions are born with the birth of a thought style, and their formulation is determined by both historical-cultural conditioning and by the process of exchanging ideas among researchers which was described above. A mature thought style is a system where definitions mutually condition each other and where accepting a certain definition can prevent accepting some other ones.

The distinction between active and passive elements is still not clear. Some examples are obvious: if 16 is assumed—on the basis of some arbitrary convention—as the atomic weight for oxygen, the atomic weight of hydrogen will necessary be 1.008. “This means that the ratio of the two weights is a passive element of knowledge” (1935a, IV.1). However, as an active element of knowledge Fleck indicates also “the mere use of alcohol in preparing extracts”, adding however that “the actual usefulness of such extracts is a passive one and therefore a necessary consequence”. He also writes that the concepts of chemical element and of atom are derived “from collective imagination”, but “the usefulness of these concepts in chemistry (…) is really independent of the individual knower”. The active and passive elements of knowledge are inseparable either historically or logically, and every statement can be divided into active and passive part.

Both kinds of elements can be found in each thought style, and also in mythical and religious thinking. In one place Fleck notices that whereas a myth has little passive elements, the characteristic feature of science is that it attempts to add as many passive elements as it can to its system. Fleck never developed this idea, and this is unfortunate, for this could be his contribution to the solution of the problem of demarcation. There are some places where he makes remarks complementing argumentation developed in the last chapter: “What has previously been classed with the passive elements of knowledge may later join the active ones” (1935a, IV.2). We should regret again that he did not develop the idea which could contribute to understanding the mechanism of those transformations which Kuhn later called “scientific revolutions”. For it suggests that not only pre-scientific proto-ideas, but also passive results obtained within an old scientific thought style can serve as a starting point for constructing a new one.

7. How a Thought Collective Transforms What Is Socially Constructed Into “Reality”?

As explained above, what and how we see and what and how we think depends on a collectively created thought style assimilated through contacts with others. However,

The individual within the collective is never, or hardly ever, conscious of the prevailing thought style, which almost always exerts an absolutely compulsive force upon his thinking and with which it is not possible to be at variance (1935a, II.4).

It is peculiar that those who participate in social creation of a thought style do not sometimes realize it either. After years they do not remember that once they perceived and thought differently, and they recall their research not as a winding road, full of turns, blind steps, successes resulting from compensation of accidental errors, etc. And above all they do not record in their memory those moments when new ideas appeared as a result of misunderstandings between researchers. Fleck compares Wassermann’s texts from different periods and his memories on the road which his team took and which finally led him to the discovery of reaction that now carries his name. This comparison shows that after years Wassermann did not realize how in the past, during collective debates and research, facts and meanings of words, research problems and methods of solving them had changed. “(…) after fifteen years an identification between results and intentions had taken place in Wassermann’s thinking. The meandering process of development (…) had become a straight, goal-directed path” (1935a, III).

Scientists also do not see the changes of facts and concepts that had happened in their discipline. Since they perceive the world differently than their predecessors and they think on the basis of different assumptions, they are not able to understand the meanings of words from old texts. They do not know that in the past one not so much thought differently (for incorrectly) about what they now think about, and perceived differently (for incorrectly) what they perceive, as one thought of and perceived something else. They instinctively understand old books and papers according to their own thought style and consider those texts as steps—although sometimes erroneous—towards this world-view which they possess now.

The next aspect of social nature of cognition is the phenomenon that members of a thought collective mutually reinforce themselves in the conviction that their thought style is true. Members of religious communities under group pressure do not consider their faith as one of many, but as the definite truth; they do not consider the principles of conduct which their faith imposes on them as the principles of one of many ways of living, but as those grasping of the essence of morality etc. Also scientists are convinced that their thought style is at least partially true today, and with time, when they work together, it will get closer and closer to being true. Yet, one may say, the conviction as to the truth of a thought style can break down under the pressure of facts that contradict it, and also as a result of confrontation with those who think differently. The remarks given above quite clearly show that this is not the case. Nonetheless let us summarize Fleck’s views on those matters.

  1. A thought style is included already in meanings of words, and those meanings are considered by members of the collective not as something formed by people but as “objective”. Thus, opposing a system is unthinkable: someone who opposes it is considered to be the one who does not understand meanings of the words used (1935a, IV.5; 1936, VI).

  2. Scientific instruments which embody some results of a thought style, “direct our thinking automatically on to the tracks of that style” (1936, VI).

  3. Forming our cognitive activity, our perception and thinking, “[c]ognition modifies the knower so as to adapt him harmoniously to his acquired knowledge” (1935a, IV.2). Since everybody sees the world in a way imposed by one’s thought style, in every step one notices facts corresponding with that style and does not notice what does not fit active assumptions of it.

  4. Even if facts incoherent with a given thought style are noticed, one ignores them as unimportant. For example, for several decades physicists knew that Mercury had not moved as it should according to Newton’s mechanics, but they failed to mention this fact to the general public. Only today one precisely describes those facts because they confirm a new thought style: the general theory of relativity (1935a, II.3).

  5. Cognitive problems we choose to solve do not come from a neutral reservoir of problems which existed prior to the development of sciences, but we choose those which are born on the ground of a thought style imposed on us—and they are usually successfully solved within its confines. And we do not work with problems which are born within other styles—our collective considers them not worthy of attention or even senseless (1935a, IV.3).

  6. When anomalies can be no longer ignored, one attempts to show that they are not incompatible with one’s thought style (1935a, II.3). (Today we would say one adds to the system various ad hoc hypotheses.)

  7. Sometimes in old texts we find descriptions of results of experiments which we, as the users of another thought style, consider illusions. It happens that somebody sees something what corresponds with prevailing views and other members of a collective confirm his experiences (1935a, II.3).

So it is not possible to compare a theory with “reality in itself”. It is true that those who use a thought style give arguments for their views, but those arguments are of restricted value. Any attempt to legitimize a particular view is inextricably bound to standards developed within a given style, and those who accept those standards accept also the style. So legitimization is actually unnecessary, for it occurs within a collective with more or less similar education and a thought-stylized intellectual constitution. “In science, as in art and in life, only that which is true to culture is true to nature” (1935a, II.3).

One may however insist, that not only reality exists but also other people with other thought styles. Can they not convince us that our thought style is erroneous? No—for every human thinks that those who belong to the same thought collective as she does are “normal” and authoritative, and everybody else is disregarded as more or less “abnormal” (1938). Since everybody’s attention is directed at members of one’s collective, one finds confirmation of one’s own views everywhere. Moreover, the conviction that we have possessed truth is empowered by the circulation of thoughts between esoteric and exoteric circles. Laymen accept a specialist’s opinion as revelation, and when that opinion returns from laypersons to the specialist, she considers it the people’s voice confirming her achievements.

When members of various thought collectives meet, a peculiar phenomenon occurs. One sees passive elements in one’s thought style, but the active ones remain almost unnoticed. However, “any alien thought style appears like a free flight of fancy, because he can see only that which is active and almost arbitrary about it” (1935a, IV.5). Since passive results obtained within another thought style appear to her as erroneous – as they are built on an arbitrary and false basis—she is not able to see their merits and does not understand that people thinking differently successfully use their own world view. This leads us to the phenomenon called “incommensurability”.

8. Incommensurability of Thought Styles and the Problem of Truth

As explained above, when people with different thought styles meet, they do not fully understand each other, and at the same time one person thinks that the other is a fool and heretic. Fleck, using examples from the history of medicine, shows that such a lack of understanding manifests itself not only where a physicist and a metaphysician or astrologer meet, but also when today’s scientists read works of their ancestors from the distant past. (Just like Kuhn Fleck does not think that the history of physics as science started with Galileo and Newton, and the history of scientific chemistry with Lavoisier.) For us the views of medieval scholars seem fantastic, unjustified, useless, so “non-scientific”. But what would happen if they read our “scientific” dissertations? They would probably consider them artificial, arbitrary, meaningless. They understood each other well and together developed their thought styles. Just like our views allow us to deal with necessities of life, “theological” views allowed our ancestors to organize life and gave them an understanding of the sense of life (1935a, IV.5).

On several occasions, especially in (1927) and (1939a), Fleck uses the term “incommensurability” (niewspółmierność) of concepts or ideas. He does not develop this issue. Yet it is easy—by looking through the Kuhnian glasses—to extract from his writings a quite well developed theory of incommensurability of thought styles. Its core is constituted by the claim that in the historical development of science there are no invariants.

(a) The language used to describe what to members of a collective appears as reality changes. Some words disappear, other appear, and even if words remain their meanings change to a greater or lesser extent. Fleck quotes some fragments of writings of a physicist James Clerk Maxwell and a philosopher Henri Bergson on motion and knowledge on motion and he concludes that the words “motion” and “knowledge” have different meanings for them: “it is not as if the word of one of them meant a thing that the other would give a different name, but that a thing to which one of them gave a certain name does not exist at all for the other one” (1936, II). We can find similar examples in writings of “scientists”. Heat in the second half of the 18th century was on the list of chemical elements, and in the 19th century it became the motion of atoms. What Lavoisier or Carnot called “heat”, for Maxwell or Boltzmann did not exist and vice versa. So if they could meet and talk they would not make inconsistent claims about the same phenomenon, but would speak of something different. “It is not possible to express with today’s words the content of a view of a distant epoch since particular notions of this epoch are incommensurable with the ones of today” (1939a).

Obviously, it is not possible to explain to somebody outside of our thought collective the meanings of the concepts we use through verbal definitions, for we define words by other words which she does not understand to the same degree as she does not understand the defined word. It is not possible to define a word ostensively, for that person does not perceive in the world those objects which we perceive as belonging to the scope of the term defined. The only thing we can do is to teach her the basis of our thought style, like we teach our children and the young. The first step sometimes consists in creating a platform of partial understanding with a member of other collective for the price of impoverishing content and some deformations. But this is not argumentation but propaganda (1936, III).

(b) After passing from one thought style to another within “the same” scientific discipline, research problems change. Losses appear along with benefits. For example, when the contemporary concept of syphilis was created one learned very much, but many details of earlier theories were also lost. Earlier researchers did not know many of the details that we know, but knew more about what according to them had a greater value. Later researchers see many problems which their predecessors treated as unimportant or senseless. “This creates specialized valuation and characteristic intolerance, which are features shared by all exclusive communities” (1935a, IV.3). This valuation becomes stronger, for after passing from one thought style to another the research methods and standards for evaluating research results change to a greater or lesser extent.

(c) Previous researchers—looking from the same point to the same direction—did not see what we see, but they saw something we are not able to see. Those people thought and saw differently than we do (1935a, IV.5). Their physical reality does not exist for us, and our physical reality did not exist for them.

This all leads to an extremely anti-realistic standpoint. The thought style creates reality. Nowadays science is not closer to any objective picture of the world than the science of 100 years ago (1946). The only difference is that there are now many more scientists than ever and as a result our picture of the world is richer in details than any prior picture. However, the fact that a certain view seems for us to be true is only a sign of our education and not that of the correspondence to “an independently existing reality” (1938). What members of a collective call truth, from the point of view of sociology of cognition is the up-to-date stage of changes of thought-style (1936, VI) or stylized thought constraint (1935a, IV.3).

Since in the historical development of science there is no constant, unchanging part, since scientific knowledge changes continuously as a whole, then science does not contain any objective picture of the world, and it does not even contain any part of such a picture (1946). Yet contrary to Kuhn, Fleck does not avoid using the term “truth” in reference to scientific statements. And he emphasizes that truth is neither subjective nor relative:

It is always, or almost always, completely determined within a thought style. One can never say that the same thought is true for A and false for B. If A and B belong to the same thought collective, the thought will be either true or false for both. But if they belong to different thought collectives, it will just not be the same thought (1935a, IV.3).

9. Reception

Before World War II there appeared nineteen reviews of Fleck’s book on the genesis and development of a scientific fact, most of them positive; yet only one was published in a philosophical journal, and the rest were published in medical or popular journals and newspapers. After WWII Fleck’s epistemology, in spite of all his efforts, was completely forgotten. Thomas S. Kuhn mentioned his book in the Preface to The Structure of Scientific Revolutions as “an essay that anticipated many of my own ideas” (Kuhn 1962, p. VII); but for at least fifteen years during fierce debates provoked by Kuhn’s book, nobody paid attention to this remark. It was only a paper by Wilhelm Baldamus (1977) and a book by his student Thomas Schnelle (1982) that awakened a broader interest in Fleck’s philosophy and sociology of science. Fleck’s book was republished in the German language in 1980. In 1979 its English translation Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact appeared; and between 1986 and 1990 most of Fleck’s epistemological papers became available in English. Fleck’s book and articles was translated into Italian, Polish, Spain, Swedish, Russian, Ukrainian, Korean, French and Brazilian Portuguese.

Today, in the English speaking world, Fleck is mostly considered to be an unappreciated forerunner of Thomas Kuhn’s theory of scientific revolutions. It is in the German speaking community of philosophers and sociologists of science that Fleck is considered to be a highly original epistemologist, who presents human knowledge in a quite peculiar and explorative way which significantly transcends Kuhn’s theses. In France there is a group of philosophers and historians of medicine—Ilana Löwy and others—who apply Fleck’s ideas in their research. In his famous introduction to the actor-network theory, Bruno Latour named Fleck “the founder of sociology of science” (Latour 2005, p. 112). In 2005 Ludwik Fleck Zentrum was founded in Collegium Helveticum, Zürich, led by Johannes Fehr until 2014; since 2015 the centre is managed by Hartmut von Sass. In Brazil Ludwik Fleck has influenced at least three different “thought collectives”: his theory is applied by historians of science, in teaching and learning science, and in philosophy (Condé 2016). There is a group of Serbian archaeologists who are inspired in their work by Fleck’s epistemology (Milosavljević 2016).


Primary Literature: Fleck’s Epistemological Writings

  • 1927, “O niektórych swoistych cechach myślenia lekarskiego”, Archiwum Historii i Filozofii Medycyny oraz Historii Nauk Przyrodniczych, 6: 55–64. (“Some Specific Features of the Medical Way of Thinking”, in Cognition and Fact. Materials on Ludwik Fleck, R. S. Cohen and Thomas Schnelle (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel 1986, pp. 39–46).
  • 1929, “Zur Krise der ‘Wirklichkeit’”, Die Naturwissenschaften, 17: 425–430. (“On the Crisis of ‘Reality’”, in R. S. Cohen and Th. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 47–58).
  • 1934, “Jak powstał odczyn Bordet-Wassermanna i jak w ogóle powstaje odkrycie naukowe?”, Polska Gazeta Lekarska, 3: 181–182 and 202–205.
  • 1935a, Entstehung und Entwicklung einer wissenschaftlichen Tatsache. Einführung in die Lehre vom Denkstil und Denkkollektiv, Basel: Benno Schwabe und Co.; Lothar Schäfer und Thomas Schnelle (Hrsg. und Vorwort), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1980. (Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact, transl. by Fred Bradley and Thaddeus J. Trenn, Thaddeus J. Trenn and Robert K. Merton (eds.), “Foreword” by Thomas S. Kuhn, Chicago: Chicago University Press 1979).
  • 1935b, “O obserwacji naukowej i postrzeganiu w ogóle”, Przegląd Filozoficzny, 38: 57–76. (“Scientific Observation and Perception in General”, in R. S. Cohen and Th. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 59–78).
  • 1935c, “Zur Frage der Grundlagen der medizinischen Erkenntnis”, Klinische Wochenschrift, 14: 1255–1259. (“On the Questions of the Foundations of Medical Knowledge”, transl. by Thaddeus J. Trenn, The Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 6 (1981): 237–255).
  • 1936, “Zagadnienie teorii poznawania”, Przegląd Filozoficzny, 39: 3–37. (“The Problem of Epistemology”, in R. S. Cohen and Th. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 79–112).
  • 1938, “W sprawie artykułu p. Izydory Dąbskiej w Przeglądzie Filozoficznym”, Przegląd Filozoficzny, 41: 192–195.
  • 1939a, “Nauka a środowisko”, Przegląd Współczesny, no. 8–9: 149–156. (“Science and Social Context”, transl. by I. Löwy, in I. Löwy, 1990, pp. 249–256).
  • 1939b, “Odpowiedź na uwagi Tadeusza Bilikiewicza”, Przegląd Współczesny, no. 8–9: 168–174. (“Rejoinder to the Comments of Tadeusz Bilikiewicz”, transl. by I. Löwy, in I. Löwy, 1990, pp. 267–273).
  • 1946, “Problemy naukoznawstwa”, Życie Nauki. Miesięcznik Naukoznawczy, 1: 322–336 (“Problems of the Science of Science”, in R. S. Cohen and Th. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 113–128).
  • 1947, “Patrzeć, widzieć, wiedzieć”, Problemy, no. 2: 74–84 (“To Look, To See, To Know” in R. S. Cohen and Th. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 129–152).
  • 1986, “Crisis in Science. Towards a Free and More Human Science”, in R. S. Cohen and Th. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 153–158.
  • 2006, Psychosocjologia poznania naukowego, Zdzisław Cackowski and Stefan Symotiuk (eds.), Maria Tuszkiewicz and W. A. Niemirowski and Wojciech Sady (transl.), Lublin: UMCS, 2006. (Fleck’s epistemological writings in Polish originals or translations).
  • 2011, Erfahrung und Tatsache: gesammelte Aufsätze, Lothar Schäfer und Thomas Schnelle (Hrsg.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 2011, Denkstile und Tatsachen: gesammelte Schriften und Zeugnisse, Werner, Sylwia und Zittel, Claus (Hrsg.), Berlin: Suhrkamp.


  • 1983, Genesi e sviluppo di un fatto scientifico : per una teoria dello stile e del collettivodi pensiero, M. Leonardi & Stefano Poggi (trad.). Bologna: Il Mulino.
  • 1986, La génesis y el desarrollo de un hecho cientifico : introducción a la theoría del estilo de pensamiento y del colectivo de pensamiento, Luis Meana & Angel de G. Pablo (trad.), Lothar Schäfer & Thomas Schnelle (prólogo), Madrid: Allanza.
  • 1986, Powstanie i rozwój faktu naukowego : wprowadzenie do nauki o stylu myślowym i kolektywie myślowym, Maria Tuszkiewicz (tłum.), Zdzisław Cackowski (wstęp). Lublin : Wyd. Lubelskie.
  • 1997, Uppkomsten och utvecklingen av ett vetenskapligt faktum : inledning till läran om tankestil och tankekollektiv, Bengt Liliequist (översättning). Stockholm: Östlings.
  • 1999, Bозникновение и розвитие научного факта, Moscov: Idea-Press.
  • 2005, Genèse et développement d’un fait scientifique, Nathalie Jas (Traduction), Ilana Löwy (Prèface), Bruno Latour (Postface). Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2005.
  • 2010, Gênese e desenvolvimento de um fato científico, Mauro L. Condé (prefácio), George Otte e Mariana Camilo de Oliveira (trad.). Belo Horizonte: Fabrefactum. 2010.
  • 2019, Stili di pensiero: La conoscenza scientifica come creazione sociale. Francesco Coniglione (ed.), Mimesis.
  • 2019, Як постає та розвивається науковий факт. Bступ до вчення про мисленнєвий стиль і мисленнєвий колектив, Stefaniya Ptashnyk (Ukrainian translation), Czernowitz: Knyhy XXI.

Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, G., 1984, “Problems in Ludwik Fleck’s Conception of Science”, Methodology and Science, 17: 25–34.
  • Babich, B. E., 2003, “From Fleck’s ‘Denkstil’ to Kuhn’s Paradigm: Conceptual Schemes and Incommensurability”, International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 29(1), 1–39.
  • –––, 2015, “Calling Science Pseudoscience: Fleck’s Archeologies of Fact and Latour’s ‘Biography of Investigation’ in AIDS Denialism and Homeopathy”, 15. International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 17: 99–109.
  • Baldamus, Wilhelm, 1977, “Ludwig Fleck and the Development of the Sociology of Science”, in Human Figurations. Essays for/Aufsätze für Norbert Elias, P. R. Gleichman, J. Goudsblum and H. Korte (eds.), Amsterdam: Amsterdams Sociologisch Tijdschrift, pp. 135–156.
  • –––, 2016, “The Exoteric Paradox: A Contribution to Ludwik Fleck’s Theory of Science”, in M. Erickson & C. Turner (eds.), The Sociology of Wilhelm Baldamus, London: Routledge, pp. 101–120.
  • Belt, Henk van den, 2011, “The Collective Construction of a Scientific Fact: A Re-Examination of the Early Period of the Wassermann Reaction (1906–1912)”, Social Epistemology, 25(4): 311–339.
  • Bloor, David, 1983, Wittgenstein : a Social Theory of Knowledge, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Bonah, Ch., 2002, “‘Experimental Rage’, the Development of Medical Ethics and the Genesis of Scientific Facts. Ludwik Fleck: an Answer to the Crisis of Modern Medicine in Interwar Germany?”, Social History of Medicine, 15: 187–207.
  • Brorson, S. and H. Andersen, 2001, “Stabilizing and Changing Phenomenal Worlds: Ludwik Fleck and Thomas Kuhn on Scientific Literature”, Journal for General Philosophy of Science, 32: 109–129.
  • Cackowski, Zdzisław, 1982, “Ludwik Fleck’s Epistemology”, Dialectics and Humanism, 3: 11–23.
  • Cohen, R. S. and Thomas Schnelle (eds.), 1986, Cognition and Fact. Materials on Ludwik Fleck, (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science, v. 87), Dordrecht: D. Reidel. (Contains complete bibliography of Fleck’s medical and epistemological papers, pp. 445–457.)
  • Condé, Mauro L., 2012, “Science and Language: Ludwik Fleck and Ludwig Wittgenstein”, in Ludwik Fleck: estilos de pensamento na ciência, Condé, M. L. (ed.), Belo Horizonte: Fino Traço.
  • –––, 2016, “Ludwik Fleck’s reception in Brazil: from an anonymous visitor to a renowned thinker”, Transversal: International Journal for the Historiography of Science, 1: 46–51.
  • Egloff, Rainer and Johannes Fehr (eds.), 2011, Vérité Widerstand, Development: At Work with / Arbeiten mit / Travailler avec Ludwik Fleck, (Collegium Helveticum, Heft 12), Zürich: Collegium Helveticum 2011.
  • Fagan, Melinda B., 2009, “Fleck and the Social Constitution of Scientific Objectivity”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 40C: 272–85.
  • Fehr, Johannes, Nathalie Jas, and Ilona Löwy (eds.), 2009, Penser avec Fleck—Investigating a Life Studying Life Sciences (Collegium Helveticum, Heft 7), Zurich: Collegium Helveticum.
  • Fehr, Johannes, 2012, “‘… the art of shaping a democratic reality and being directed by it …’ – philososophy of science in turbulent times”, Studies in East European Thought, 64(1–2): 81–89.
  • Forstner, Christian, 2008, “The Early History of David Bohm’s Quantum Mechanics Through the Perspective of Ludwik Fleck’s Thought-Collectives”, Minerva, 46(2): 215–229.
  • Freudenthal, G. and I. Löwy, 1988, “Ludwik Fleck’s Roles in Society: A Case Study Using Joseph Ben-David’s Paradigm for a Sociology of Knowledge”, Social Studies of Science, 18: 625–651.
  • Ginev, Dimitri (ed.), 2015, Critical Science Studies after Ludwik Fleck, Sofia: St. Kliment Ohridski Univ. Pr.
  • –––, 2015, “Ways and dynamics of reception of Ludwik Fleck’s work in the social sciences”, Social Science Information, 54(2): 192–210.
  • Glück, G., 2005, “Ludwik Fleck’s Ideas in Science: Compared to Similar Concepts of Michael Polanyi with Some Consequences for Teacher Education”, Appraisal: The Journal of the Society for Post-Critical and Personalist Studies, 5: 117–122.
  • Gonzalez, R. J., L. Nader, and C.J. Ou, 1995, “Between Two Poles: Bronislaw Malinowski, Ludwik Fleck, and the Anthropology of Science”, Current Anthropology, 36: 866–869.
  • Graf, Erich Otto, Martin Schmid, and Johannes Fehr (eds.), 2016, Fleck and the hermeneutics of science, Zürich: Collegium Helveticum.
  • Griesecke, Birgit and Erich Otto Graf (eds.), 2008, Ludwik Flecks vergleichende Erkenntnistheorie. Die Debate in Przegląd Filozoficzny 1936–1937, Berlin: Parerga.
  • Grzybowski, Andrzej & Maria Ciesielska, 2014, “Lesser Known Aspects of Ludwik Fleck’s (1896–1961) Heroic Life During World War II”, Journal of Medical Biography, 24(3): 402–408.
  • Hacking, Ian, 1999, The Social Construction of What? Cambridge Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Harwood, J., 1986, “Ludwik Fleck and the Sociology of Knowledge”, Social Studies of Science, 16: 173–187. (Review of L. Fleck, Genesis and Development…; Enstehung und Entwicklung…; L. Fleck, Erfahrung und Tatsache…, Th. Schnelle, Ludwik Fleck: Leben und Denken; Cognition and Fact….)
  • Hedfors, Eva, 2006, “The Reading of Ludwik Fleck: Questions of Sources and Impetus”, Social Epistemology, 20: 131–161.
  • –––, 2007, “The Reading of Scientific Texts: Questions on Interpretation and Evaluation, with Special Reference to the Scientific Writings of Ludwik Fleck”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 38: 136–158.
  • –––, 2008a, “Medical Science in the Light of the Holocaust: Departing from a Post-war Paper by Ludwik Fleck”, Social Studies of Science, 38: 259–283. (See also a comment on Hedfor’s paper by Olga Amsterdamska et. al., Social Studies of Science, 38: 937–944 and Hedfor’s “Reply to a Biased Reading”, Social Studies of Science, 38: 945–950.)
  • Jacobs, S., 2002, “The Genesis of ‘Scientific Community’”, Social Epistemology, 16: 157–168.
  • Janik, A., 2006, “Notes on the Origin of Fleck’s Concept of ‘Denkstill’”, in Cambridge and Vienna: Frank P. Ramsey and the Vienna Circle, M. C. Galavotti (ed.), Vienna Circle Institute Yearbook, 12: 179–188.
  • Jarnicki, Paweł, 2021, “Stimmung/Nastrój as Content of Modern Science: On Musical Metaphors in Ludwik Fleck’s Theory of Thought Styles and Thought Collectives”, Foundations of Science, published online 5 April 2021. doi:10.1007/s10699-021-09792-3
  • Kardela, Henryk, 2011, ‘Ludwik Fleck’s Thought Style Revisited. Where Do Facts in Linguistics Come From?’, in Turning points in the philosophy of language and linguistics, Piotr Stalmaszczyk (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang, pp. 129–146.
  • Kuhn, Thomas S., 1962, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 1979, “Foreword”, in Fleck, L., The Genesis and Development…, pp. VII–XI.
  • Latour, Bruno, 2005, Reassembling the Social : An Introduction to Actor–Network Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Leszczyńska, K., 2009, “Ludwik Fleck: a Forgotten Philosopher”, in J. Fehr, N. Jas, and I. Löwy (eds.), 2009, pp. 23–39.
  • Lindenmann, J., 2001, “Siegel, Schaudinn, Fleck and the Etiology of Syphilis”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 32: 435–455. (See also 33: 751–752.)
  • Löwy, Ilana, 1988, “Ludwik Fleck on the Social Construction of Medical Knowledge”, Sociology of Health and Illness, 10: 133–155.
  • –––, 1990, The Polish School of Philosophy of Medicine: From Tytus Chalubinski (1820–1889) to Ludwik Fleck (1896–1961), Dordrecht, Boston: Kluwer. (The books contains a good selection from the works of the main representatives of the School.)
  • ––– (ed.), 2004, Ludwik Fleck: Epistemology and Biomedical Sciences, in Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, Volume 35C, Number 3.
  • –––, 2008, “Ways of Seeing: Ludwik Fleck and Polish Debates on the Perception of Reality, 1890–1947”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 39: 375–83.
  • –––, 2016, “Fleck the Public Health Expert: Medical Facts, Thought Collectives, and the Scientist’s Responsibility”, Science, Technology, and Human Values, 41(3): 509–533. (Ludwik Fleck, On Medical Experiments on Human Beings, 534–546).
  • –––, 2020, “Typhus in Buchenwald: Can the Story Be Told?”, Ethics in Progress, 11(1): 4–19.
  • Milosavljević, Monika, 2016, “Ludwik Fleck’s concepts slicing through the Gordian Knot of Serbian Archaeology”, Transversal: International Journal for the Historiography of Science, 1: 88–100.
  • Mößner, Nicola, 2011, “Thought styles and paradigms–a comparative study of Ludwik Fleck and Thomas S. Kuhn”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science (Part A), 42(2): 362–371.
  • –––, 2016, “Scientific Images as Circulating Ideas: An Application of Ludwik Fleck’s Theory of Thought Styles”, Journal for General Philosophy of Science, 47: 307–329.
  • Peine, Alexander, 2011, “Challenging Incommensurability: What We Can Learn from Ludwik Fleck for the Analysis of Configurational Innovation”, Minerva, 49(4): 489–508.
  • Rheinberger, Hans-Jörg, 2010, “On the Historicity of Scientific Knowledge: Ludwik Fleck, Gaston Bachelard, Edmund Husserl”, in Science and the Life-World: Essays on Husserl’s ‘Crisis of European Sciences’, D. Hyder and H.-J. Rheinberger (eds.), Stanford: Stanford University Press, pp. 164–76.
  • Reichenbach, Hans, 1938, Experience and Prediction, Chicago, University of Chicago Press.
  • Sady, Wojciech, 2001, “Ludwik Fleck—Thought Collectives and Thought Styles”, in Polish Philosophers of Science and Nature in the 20th Century, Władysław Krajewski (ed.), Amsterdam: Rodopi, pp. 197–205.
  • Schäfer, L., 1993, “On the Scientific Status of Medical Research: Case Study and Interpretation According to Ludwik Fleck”, in Science, Technology and the Art of Medicine, C. Delkeskamp-Hayes and G. Cutler (eds.), Philosophy of Medicine, 44: 23–38. (See also a reply to Schäfer by N. Tsouyopoulos, ibid.: 39–46, and a commentary by R. K. Lie, ibid.: 47–54.)
  • Schnelle, Thomas, 1982, Ludwik Fleck— Leben und Denken : Zur Entstehung und Entwicklung des soziologischen Denkstils in der Wissenschaftsphilosophie, Freiburg: Hochschulverlag.
  • –––, 1986, “Microbiology and Philosophy of Science, Lwów and the German Holocaust: Stations of Life—Ludwik Fleck 1896–1961”, in R. S. Cohen, T. Schnelle (eds.), 1986, pp. 3–36.
  • Sciortino, Luca, 2021, “The Emergence of Objectivity: Fleck, Foucault, Kuhn and Hacking”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science (Part A), 88(1): 128–137.
  • Stuckey, Marc, and Peter Heering, Rachel Mamlok-Naaman, Avi Hofstein, and Ingo Eilks, 2015, “The Philosophical Works of Ludwik Fleck and Their Potential for Teaching and Learning Science”, Science and Education, 24(3): 281–298.
  • Stump, D., 1988, “The Role of Skill in Experimentation: Reading Ludwik Fleck’s Study of the Wassermann Reaction as Example of Ian Hacking’s Experimental Realism”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennal Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 302–308.
  • Symotiuk, Stefan, 1983, “Two Sociologies of Knowledge L. Fleck—T. Bilikiewicz”, Kwartalnik Historii Nauki i Techniki, 3–4: 569–582.
  • Van Den Belt, H. and Gremmen, B., 1990, “Specificity in the Era of Koch and Ehrlich: A Generalized Interpretation of Ludwik Fleck’s ‘Serological’ Thought Style”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 21: 463–479.
  • Van den Belt, H., 2002, “Ludwik Fleck and the Causative Agent of Syphilis: Sociology or Pathology of Science? A Rejoinder to Jean Lindenmann”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 33: 733–750.
  • Verhoeff, Berend, 2014, “Stabilizing Autism: A Fleckian Account of the Rise of a Neurodevelopmental Spectrum Disorder”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 46(1): 65–78.
  • Wettersten, J., 1991, “The Fleck Affair: Fashions v. Heritage”, Inquiry, 34: 475–498.
  • White, K., 1993, “Ludwik Fleck and the Foundations of the Sociology of Medical Knowledge”, Explorations in Knowledge, 10: 1–21.
  • Zittel, Claus, 2012, “Ludwik Fleck and the concept of style in the natural sciences”, Studies in East European Thought, 64(1–2): 53–79.

Other Internet Resources


The author would like to thank Paweł Jarnicki for assistance in preparing the bibliography and Rafał Lizut for translating this entry into English. The editors would like to thank Jason Wu for copy-editing the prose.

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Wojciech Sady <>

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