Generic Generalizations

First published Sun Apr 24, 2016; substantive revision Thu Aug 4, 2022

Generics are statements such as “tigers are striped”, “a duck lays eggs”, “the dodo is extinct”, and “ticks carry Lyme disease”. Generics express generalizations, but unlike quantified statements, generics do not carry information about how many members of the kind or category have the property. For example, if asked “how many ravens are black?” one could reply “all [or some, or most, etc.] ravens are black”, but one cannot felicitously reply with the generic “ravens are black” (Carlson 1977).

Generics have proved quite difficult to analyze semantically. For example, “dogs are mammals” seems to require for its truth that all dogs be mammals. “A tiger is striped” or “ravens are black”, however, are somewhat more forgiving, since they are compatible with the existence of a few stripeless tigers and white albino ravens. “Ducks lay eggs” and “a lion has a mane” are more forgiving still; these generics are true even though it is only the mature members of one sex that possess the relevant properties. Notice, however, that we do not accept “ducks are female”, even though every egg-laying duck is a female duck. Finally, we accept “ticks carry Lyme disease”, even though very few ticks (approximately one percent) actually have the property, while also rejecting “humans are right-handed”, when over ninety percent of humans are right-handed.

As these examples illustrate, generics are not equivalent in meaning to any of the quantifying determiners such as “all”, “some”, or “most”. They also differ in meaning from sentences containing adverbs of quantification (Lewis 1975) such as “generally”, “usually”, or “often”. For example, the generic “books are paperbacks” is false, yet the insertion of any of these adverbs of quantification would render the statement true: “books are generally/usually/often paperbacks”.

1. Generics and Logical Form

In English, generics can be expressed using a variety of syntactic forms: bare plurals (e.g., “tigers are striped”), indefinite singulars (e.g., “a tiger is striped”), and definite singulars (“the tiger is striped”). However, none of these syntactic forms is dedicated to expressing generic claims; each can also be used to express existential and/or specific claims. Further, some generics express what appear to be generalizations over individuals (e.g., “tigers are striped”), while others appear to predicate properties directly of the kind (e.g., “dodos are extinct”). These facts and others give rise to a number of questions concerning the logical forms of generic statements.

1.1 Isolating the Generic Interpretation

Consider the following pairs of sentences:

Tigers are striped.
Tigers are on the front lawn.
A tiger is striped.
A tiger is on the front lawn.
The tiger is striped.
The tiger is on the front lawn.

The sentence pairs above are prima facie syntactically parallel—both are subject-predicate sentences whose subjects consist of the same common noun coupled with the same, or no, article. However, the interpretation of first sentence of each pair is intuitively quite different from the interpretation of the second sentence in the pair. In the second sentences, we are talking about some particular tigers: a group of tigers in (1b), some individual tiger in (2b), and some unique salient or familiar tiger in (3b)—a beloved pet, perhaps. In the first sentences, however, we are saying something general. There is/are no particular tiger or tigers that we are talking about.

The second sentences of the pairs receive what is called an existential interpretation. The hallmark of the existential interpretation of a sentence containing a bare plural or an indefinite singular is that it may be paraphrased with “some” with little or no change in meaning; hence the terminology “existential reading”. The application of the term “existential interpretation” is perhaps less appropriate when applied to the definite singular, but it is intended there to cover interpretation of the definite singular as referring to a unique contextually salient/familiar particular individual, not to a kind.

There are some tests that are helpful in distinguishing these two readings. For example, the existential interpretation is upward entailing, meaning that the statement will always remain true if we replace the subject term with a more inclusive term. Consider our examples above. In (1b), we can replace “tiger” with “animal” salva veritate, but in (1a) we cannot. If “tigers are on the lawn” is true, then “animals are on the lawn” must be true. However, “tigers are striped” is true, yet “animals are striped” is false. (1a) does not entail that animals are striped, but (1b) entails that animals are on the front lawn (Lawler 1973; Laca 1990; Krifka et al. 1995).

Another test concerns whether we can insert an adverb of quantification with minimal change of meaning (Krifka et al. 1995). For example, inserting “usually” in the sentences in (1a) (e.g., “tigers are usually striped”) produces only a small change in meaning, while inserting “usually” in (1b) dramatically alters the meaning of the sentence (e.g., “tigers are usually on the front lawn”). (For generics such as “mosquitoes carry malaria”, the adverb “sometimes” is perhaps better used than “usually” to mark off the generic reading.)

1.2 Stage Level and Individual Level Predicates

Having distinguished two quite different meanings of these seemingly similar sentence pairs, the question arises: what is the basis of these two interpretations? This is of course a matter of debate, but one important thesis is that it is the predicate that determines which of the two readings the subject will receive, particularly in the case of bare plural generics. In his 1977 dissertation, Greg Carlson argued that the distinction between “stage level” and “individual level” predicates is key here, and proposed that stage level predications give rise to existential readings of bare plurals and indefinite singulars, while individual level ones give rise to generic readings. The distinction between the two types of predicates can be drawn intuitively, and also on the basis of linguistic patterns (Milsark 1974; Carlson 1977; Stump 1985). Semantically, individual level predicates express properties that normally are had by items for quite extended periods, often comprising the items’ whole existence. Stage-level predicates, on the other hand, express properties normally had by items for relatively short time intervals. Some examples of both types are as follows:

Individual level predicates
“is tall”; “is intelligent”; “knows French”; “is a mammal”; “is female”; “is a singer”; “loves Bob”; “hates Bob”

Stage level predicates
“is drunk”; “is barking”; “is speaking French”; “is taking an exam”; “is sober”; “is sick”, “is sitting”; “is on the lawn”, “is in the room”.

Clearly the semantic distinction is not hard and fast: a teetotaler may be sober for the entire course of his existence, and the chronically ill may be sick for the entire course of theirs, and Alice in Wonderland is tall at some times but short at others. In the normal course of affairs, individual level predicates express more stable and less temporally intermittent properties than stage level ones do.

The distinction also manifests itself linguistically. Stage level predicates are permissible in the following constructions, while individual level ones are not:

John saw Bill drunk/sober/sick/naked.
John saw Bill speaking French/taking an exam/smoking cigarettes.
John saw Bill on the lawn/in the room.
*John saw Bill intelligent/tall/a mammal/male.
*John saw Bill knowing French/hating Bob.

There-insertion constructions behave similarly:

There are men drunk/sober/sick/naked.
There are men speaking French/taking an exam/smoking cigarettes.
There are men on the lawn/in the room.
*There are men intelligent/tall/mammals/male.
*There are men knowing French/hating Bob.

Stage level predicates can be modified by locatives, while individual level ones cannot:

John is drunk/speaking French/smoking in 1879 Hall.
*John is a mammal/intelligent/male in 1879 Hall.
*John knows French/hates Bob in 1879 Hall.

Carlson noted the difference in syntactic behavior between individual and stage level predicates, and proposed that the distinction between the classes of predicates underlies the distinction between existential and generic readings of bare plurals:

Students are drunk/speaking French/on the lawn. (existential)
Students are intelligent/mammals/tall/male. (generic)
Students know French/hate Bob. (generic)

Stage level predicates appear to give rise to the existential reading of bare plurals, while individual level ones give rise to generic readings. Carlson also took the distinction to underwrite the difference between existential and generic readings of the indefinite singular:

A student is drunk/speaking French/on the lawn. (existential)
A student is intelligent/a mammal/tall/male. (generic)
A student knows French/hates Bob. (generic)

This seems to be correct, though there is more to say about the indefinite singular in this regard. In particular, the indefinite singular receives an existential interpretation even with individual level predicates when the property attributed is “out of the blue”, or to a very unnatural kind. Yael Greenberg (2003) asks us to note the contrast between the following pairs. Both statements involve individual level predicates, and accordingly the bare plural receives a generic interpretation. It is, however, very difficult to interpret the following indefinite singular statements as anything other than existential statements, conveying a remarkable fact about a particular individual:

Famous semanticists sing German arias in the shower.
A famous semanticist sings German arias in the shower.
Tall, left-handed, brown-haired neurologists from France earn more than $150,000 a year.
A tall, left-handed, brown-haired neurologist from France earns more than $150,000 a year.

The contrast between stage level and individual level predicates would thus seem to be insufficient to explain the availability of the generic interpretation of indefinite singular statements.

It should further be noted that the distinction between stage level and individual level predicates cannot explain the two readings of definite singulars. If there is a salient tiger before us, an utterance of “the tiger is intelligent” or “the tiger is male” will easily be interpreted non-generically as pertaining to the particular tiger in question, despite the fact that these are individual level predications. The distinction is not irrelevant here since it is true that stage level predications may reliably give rise to non-generic interpretations, but clearly there is more to story in the case of the definite singular.

1.3 Deriving Generic vs. Existential Interpretations

How exactly might the distinction between stage level and individual level predicates give rise to existential vs. generic readings of bare plurals? The original proposal is due to Greg Carlson (1977), however Carlson himself later came to reject the basics of his account (Carlson 1989). More recent discussion can be found in Diesing (1992), Chierchia (1995), Kratzer (1995), Cohen and Erteschik-Shir (1997, 2002), Kiss (1998), and others.

In Carlson’s original account, he proposed that stage level predicates are lexically represented with existential quantifiers. These quantifiers range over realizations of individuals. Carlson’s metaphysical outlook was as follows: the set of individuals is composed of both objects (by which he meant regular, everyday concrete items) and kinds. Both objects and kinds have realizations. A realization of an object is a temporal slice thereof. A realization of a kind is either an object that belongs to the kind, or a temporal slice of such an object. Kinds are directly denoted by bare plurals, on Carlson’s view—that is, bare plurals are singular referring terms, like names.

Consider now the predicate “is smoking”. This is a stage level predicate; on Carlson’s view only stages (temporal slices) of objects are ever smoking. Natural language, however, does not supply temporal slices as objects of predication, but rather individuals—at least on the surface. To resolve this mismatch, the predicate “is smoking” would have to be lexicalized as

\[ \lambda x \exists y(R(y,x) \mathbin{\&} \textrm{smokes}(y)) \]

R” here means “is a realization of”, in Carlson’s sense. The predicate can be applied to an object, such as John, to yield:

\[ \exists y(R(y, j) \mathbin{\&} \textrm{smokes}(y)) \]

Thus (setting aside tense), “John is smoking” is true iff some realization (i.e., temporal stage) of John is engaged in smoking. The predicate can also be applied to kinds, as in “students are smoking”:

\[ \exists y(R(y, s) \mathbin{\&} \textrm{smokes}(y)) \]

Here “s” picks out the kind student, and the sentence is true iff there are some realizations of the kind that are engaged in smoking. (Recall that the realizations of the kind student include both the particular individual students and the temporal stages of those individual students.) Thus we obtain the existential reading of the bare plural in virtue of the lexical representation of stage level predicates.

Individual level predicates hold of individuals, not stages, and so are directly predicated of their subjects. There is no inherent type mismatch here, and so individual level predicates are lexicalized without any such built-in quantifiers. As a first pass attempt at a semantic formalization, Carlson took all individual level predicates to be directly applicable to kinds, so “Cats like Bob” would have as a logical form simply “\(\textrm{Like}(c, b)\)”. Carlson went on to note that this approach meets with difficulties when faced with sentences such as “Cats like themselves”. “\(\textrm{Like}(c, c)\)” is does not capture the appropriate truth conditions, since it corresponds only to “cats like cats”, and not to “cats like themselves”.

To deal with this, he introduces a monadic predicate operator \(G'\) to take object-level predicates to kind-level predicates. “Cats like themselves” would be formalized as “\(G'(\lambda x (\textrm{Like}(x, x))(c)\)”, which is to be understood as true iff the object level predicate “\(\lambda x (\textrm{Like}(x, x))\)” holds with sufficient regularity of the realizations of the kind. Carlson took no stand on what this sufficient regularity amounts to, other than to say that it is not the job of semantics to tell us when an item satisfies a predicate containing “\(G'\)”, anymore than it is the job of semantics to tell us when an item satisfies any predicate. Semantics tells us that “John is red” is true iff John satisfies “is red”, which in turn holds iff John is red. Semantics does not tell us whether John is red, nor how to go about determining whether John is red. Whether an item has a property is not a question for semantics.

Carlson later came to reject this account of the logical form of generics—in particular, he came to reject the idea that there is a one-place predicate operator such as \(G'\), and instead embraced the idea that any generic operator should instead be two-place (1989). This point is taken up below in the section on the logical form of characterizing generics. First, though, it is helpful to draw a distinction between two different kinds of generics.

1.4 Characterizing Generics and Direct Kind Predications

It is helpful to separate out two categories of generic statements. Our first category includes statements such as “tigers are striped”, “ravens are black”, “a lion has a mane”, and “the leopard has spots”. These statements are naturally thought of as expressing generalizations about individual members of the kind. For example, we might suppose that “tigers are striped” is made true by enough individual tigers possessing stripes. The exact nature of these generalizations is highly controversial.

In our second category, we have statements like “dinosaurs are extinct”, “the dodo is extinct”, “tigers are widespread”, and “the domestic cat is common”, which are often thought to predicate a property directly of the kind in question, rather than expressing generalizations concerning its members. For example, in saying “dinosaurs are extinct”, one says something about the kind dinosaur, namely that that kind of thing is extinct. We may notice that it is not possible to say of an individual dinosaur, Dino, that Dino is extinct, since only a kind can be extinct. Thus, for these generics, Carlson’s original idea—that bare plurals can refer directly to kinds, and thus that (at least some) generics involve predicating properties directly of kinds—remains widely accepted.

Examples of this second category are often referred to as “direct kind predications” while examples of the first are known as “characterizing generics”. (Direct kind predications are also known as D-generics (“D” for “definite”); characterizing generics are also known as I-generics (“I” for “indefinite”) (Krifka 1987).) It should be noted that the indefinite singular form on its standard interpretation cannot be used to express a direct kind predication: statements such as “a dinosaur is extinct” and “a tiger is widespread” are not felicitous. (They can of course be heard as felicitous if they are given a very different interpretation, so that their domain ranges over particular kinds—e.g., “a dinosaur, namely the T. rex, is extinct”—but this is not the relevant interpretation. To see the difference, consider statements involving kinds that do not themselves have salient subkinds, e.g., perhaps “a T. rex is extinct”.)

Much of the work on the semantics of generics has been focused on characterizing generics, since they have proved the most elusive. It is widely accepted that sentences like “dinosaurs are extinct”, “the dodo is extinct”, and “tigers are widespread” are singular statements that predicate properties directly of kinds. For example, “tigers are extinct” predicates the property of being extinct directly of the kind Panthera tigris, and would be true just in case Panthera tigris had the property of being extinct (Krifka et al. 1995). The semantics of characterizing generics have proved much less tractable.

1.5 The Logical Form of Characterizing Generics

For the remainder of this entry, we will be concerned only with characterizing generics, since they have received the most attention, and been the subject of most controversy. Henceforth, we will use the term “generics” to mean specifically characterizing generics. This section discusses the dominant theory of the logical form of characterizing generics, and of necessity involves some technical material.

It is generally agreed nowadays that, contra Carlson’s earliest work, there is a two-place operator, usually termed Gen, which functions as an adverb of quantification (Lewis 1975). Adverbs of quantification include “usually”, “generally”, “typically”, “always”, “sometimes”, and so on. They function to relate one set of conditions containing at least one free variable to another set. Adverbs of quantification are, in Lewis’s sense, unselective, meaning that they bind any number of free variables in the sentence, be they objects, events, or locations. Consider, for example, the following sentence:

When m and n are positive integers, the power \(m^n\) can always be computed by successive multiplication.

Following Lewis (1975), we should understand “always” as relating the material in the when-clause to the material in the main clause in following way:

Always m, n [m and n are positive integers] [the power \(m^n\) can be computed by successive multiplication]

This representation is based on Lewis’s (1975) paper, and is said to be a tripartite structure, consisting of a quantifier Q, a Restrictor R (picking out the domain of Q), and the Scope S, also called the matrix (picking out the properties attributed to Q elements of R). Tripartite structures take the form “Q [R] [S]”. The sentence represented by the tripartite structure is true iff Q Rs satisfy S.

In the above examples (27) and (28), the material from the when-clause is placed in the Restrictor, and the material from the main clause is placed in the Scope. There are two free variables in the Restrictor, namely m and n, and so both are bound by the adverb of quantification “always”, which is naturally understood as a universal quantifier.

Generics are most commonly assimilated to this model (but see Nguyen, 2020). Carlson himself (1989) rejected his original one-place generic operator, on the grounds that it could not capture ambiguities as well as a two-place operator. He considers the following sentence:

Typhoons arise in this part of the Pacific.

This has two distinct generic readings, which can be paraphrased as follows:

Typhoons in general have a common origin in this part of the pacific.
There arise typhoons in this part of the Pacific.

It would be a mistake to take the latter reading to be an existential reading: it does not simply mean that there are some particular typhoons that originated in the relevant location, but rather seems to be saying something general about the relevant location: situations involving that location are—with sufficient regularity—situations involving the arising of typhoons. A dyadic non-selective operator can easily accommodate both readings:

\(\textit{Gen } x [\textrm{Typhoon}(x)] [\textrm{Arises-in-this-part-of-the-pacific}(x)]\)
\(\textit{Gen } s [\textrm{In-this-part-of-the-pacific}(s)] \exists y [\textrm{Typhoon}(y)\ \mathbin{\&}\) \(\textrm{Arises-in}(y, s)]\)

The monadic operator can only yield the first (less natural) interpretation:


Schubert and Pelletier (1987) also offer compelling arguments in favor of a dyadic generic operator.

In keeping with this proposal, a common assumption (Heim 1982; Kamp 1981; Kamp and Reyle 1993; Diesing 1992; Kratzer 1995; and many others) is that indefinites such as bare plurals and indefinite singulars contribute predicates with unbound variables to the logical forms containing them. In the course of syntactic operations, the material in the sentence is divided up into the restrictor and scope (e.g., Diesing 1992). If the sentence contains a quantificational adverb (e.g., “usually”, “always”), then any unbound variables in the restrictor are bound by that quantificational adverb, as in example (28) above. However, if there is no quantificational adverb, the generic operator Gen is introduced to bind those variables. Thus, to take a simple example, the logical form of a sentence like “ravens are black” may be given as follows:

Gen x [Ravens(x)] [Black(x)]

Even theorists who do not agree with the assumption that indefinites contribute just predicates and unbound variables to their logical forms (see, e.g., Chierchia 1998) tend to agree that a tripartite structure nonetheless is the correct analysis for generics. One notable exception is David Liebesman (2011), who argues that characterizing generics are themselves direct kind predications—that, e.g., “tigers have stripes” is best understood as simply the attribution of the predicate “have stripes” to the kind tigers. (See also Cohen 2012; Teichman 2016. Cohen argues that although pragmatic factors lead many generics to ultimately receive reinterpretations involving Gen, generics are always in the first instance kind predications.) It is not clear, however, whether a view such as Liebesman’s is able to account for the full range of semantic data. Recall that sentences such as “cats lick themselves” led Carlson (1977) to introduce a G‘ operator to capture the dominant interpretation, namely that individual cats lick themselves (i.e., their own bodies)—an interpretation which is not captured by the logical form Lick(cats, cats). Similar complications arise for generics involving so-called donkey anaphora, e.g., “lions that see a gazelle chase it”. Without the additional structure provided by an operator, it is not clear how these sentences can be adequately captured (Leslie 2015a).

The term “generic” is sometimes extended to sentences such as “Mary smokes after work”, since these habitual statements share various features with generics, although they do not express generalizations concerning kinds. It is often believed that these statements should be analyzed with Gen (e.g., Lawler 1972; Schubert and Pelletier 1989; Krifka et al. 1995, and many others):

Gen e [Relevant-event-involving-Mary(e) & Occurs-after-work(e)] [Event-of-Mary-smoking(e)]

For the remainder of this entry, the term “habitual” rather than “generic” will be used for these statements.

2. Semantic Analyses of Gen

A great deal of work has been done on the semantics of (characterizing) generics, particularly on bare plural (characterizing) generics. It is easy to see why this is so: “Ducks lay eggs” is a true generic, while “ducks are female” is false, yet it is only the female ducks who ever lay eggs. “Mosquitoes carry the West Nile virus” is true, and “books are paperbacks” is false, yet less than one percent of mosquitoes carry the virus, while over eighty percent of books are paperbacks. How are we to account for these puzzling facts?

It is clear that generics are not equivalent to universal statements, but rather permit exceptions—that is, generics can be true even if some (or sometimes many) members of the kind lack the property in question. Generics also do not mean “most”; it is false that most mosquitoes carry the West Nile virus and true that most books are paperbacks, but our intuitions about the truth/falsity of the corresponding generics are reversed.

As these examples suggest, Gen cannot be analyzed as sharing a meaning with any of the standard quantifiers. One question that comes up immediately is whether Gen can be considered a quantifier in any sense. Carlson (1977) argued informally that it could not, since generics do not tell us how much or how many. He notes that, if asked “how many tigers are striped”, one could reply “most/all/many/some tigers are striped”, but not simply “tigers are striped” (see Leslie (2007) for a more formal argument, which goes by way of the premise that quantifiers exhibit isomorphism invariance, while Gen does not.).

A significant number of theories concerning the meaning of generics have been offered over the years. Most theories have focused primarily on bare plural generics, though some theories are intended to cover indefinite and definite singulars too. We will conclude with some remarks concerning issues specific to indefinite and definite singulars.

2.1 Possible Worlds and Normalcy-Based Approaches

Many accounts of generics are framed in terms of some or other type of quantification over possible worlds (Dahl 1975, Delgrande 1987, Schubert and Pelletier 1989, Asher and Morreau 1995, Krifka et al. 1995, Pelletier and Asher 1997, Greenberg 2003, and others). Often, these possible worlds are employed to capture the intuition that generics tell us something about what is normal for members of a kind (see Nickel 2008, 2016). For example, it is natural to think that a generic such as “tigers are striped” tells us something about normal tigers; the only exceptions to it are those tigers who are albino, and so, one could argue, in some respect out-of-step with the norm for the kind. Similarly, “dogs have four legs” may strike us as true because the only dogs that do not have four legs either have birth defects or have met with misfortune.

Possible worlds are helpful here, because they allow us to consider, say, worlds in which things go as normally as possible for a given tiger, even if life is actually quite abnormal for that tiger. For example, Asher, Morreau, and Pelletier argue that “Ks Φ” is true iff for each individual K, the most normal worlds for that K (according to a contextually determined ordering base), are such that that K Φs (Asher and Morreau 1995; Pelletier and Asher 1997). Glossed in more intuitive terms, the account states that a generic “Ks Φ” is true iff each individual K would have the property Φ if all were to go as normally as possible for that K with respect to the relevant property. Thus, while in actuality some dogs are three legged, one might suppose that, had things gone more normally for each of those dogs with respect to how many legs they have, they would have had four legs.

Pelletier, Asher, and Morreau connect their semantic account of generics to the literature on defeasible validity (McCarthy 1986; Reiter 1987, and others). A set of premises defeasibly or non-monotonically entails a conclusion if the conclusion is likely or reasonable given the premises, yet it is nonetheless possible for the premises to be true and the conclusion false. They argue that there are many defeasibly valid patterns of entailment that involve generics, and that their semantics explains why this is so. For example, if Fido is a dog and dogs have four legs, then the inference that Fido has four legs is held to be defeasibly valid. It is possible that Fido is a three legged dog, but it is still reasonable to suppose that Fido is four legged on the basis of the premises. The reasonableness of this inference is explained on Pelletier, Asher, and Morreau’s semantics—the generic “dogs have four legs” guarantees that, if things go normally for a given dog with respect to its number of legs, then that dog will have four legs. Since we have been given no reason to suppose that Fido is abnormal, one may defeasibly conclude that Fido is four legged.

Indisputably, a large number of true generics of the form “Ks Φ” are such that, if things go normally for a given K, then it has the property Φ. However, there would seem to also be a number of true generics which do not fit this profile: “ducks lay eggs”, “lions have manes”, “mosquitoes carry the West Nile virus”, and “sharks attack swimmers”. The last two generics present a significant difficulty for normalcy-based accounts, since it is surely not normal for a mosquito to carry the virus, nor is it normal for a shark to attack a bather. For generics such as “ducks lay eggs” and “lions have manes”, several theorists have argued that the domain of discourse is restricted so that we are talking about only the female ducks and the male lions respectively, and thus have aimed to rescue normalcy-based approaches from this criticism (e.g., Pelletier and Asher 1997), since perhaps it is abnormal for a given female duck to fail to lay eggs. Pelletier and Asher suggest that a generic can be restricted to a subkind of the kind in question in this way; that is, “ducks lay eggs” means female ducks lay eggs because female ducks constitute a subkind of the kind ducks.

However, on such a proposal, it is difficult to avoid the prediction that “ducks are female” should also be a true generic—why can this generic not be made true by similarly restricting the domain to include only this subkind of ducks? Or conversely, consider “ducks don’t lay eggs”. Certainly one subkind of ducks—namely the male ducks—don’t lay eggs, but this does not seem to suffice to make the generic “ducks don’t lay eggs” true. Asher and Pelletier (2012) offer a development of the normalcy-based account intended to remedy these problems.

Further, a recent experiment examined whether people think that a kind in which a property is had only by one sex (i.e., where domain restriction to a subkind is possible) is a better satisfier of the generic than a kind in which half the members, regardless of sex, have the property (i.e., where no such restriction to a subkind is possible). If generics like “ducks lay eggs” are only accepted because people are implicitly restricting the domain to a subkind whose members generally possess the property, then they should show a preference for one of the possible distributions over the other. However, no such preference was found (Cimpian, Gelman and Brandone 2010). Khemlani, Leslie, and Glucksberg (2012) also report empirical evidence that further suggests that people do not understand these generics to involve domain restriction—in particular, that people are more likely to judge that an arbitrary duck lays eggs than they are to judge that an arbitrary duck is female (but see Lazaridou-Chatzigoga and Stockall (2013) for some evidence in favor of domain restriction). This pattern is difficult to explain if people only accept “ducks lay eggs” because of domain restriction. If one cannot appeal to domain restriction to handle “ducks lay eggs”, then such generics would appear to constitute counterexamples to this sort of approach.

2.2 Relevant Quantification and Situation Semantics

Appeals to domain restriction are not limited to normalcy-based approaches. In light of generics such as “ducks lay eggs”, some theorists have argued that generics involve quantification over relevant individuals (actual or possible), where context determines which individuals are relevant (e.g., Schubert and Pelletier 1987; Declerk 1991; Chierchia 1995). On such views, when we consider a generic such as “ducks lay eggs”, only the mature, fertile female ducks enter into our evaluation of the sentence, because, e.g., they are the only potential egg-layers. The question that arises is how exactly to determine which individuals are relevant. Schubert and Pelletier (1987) offer a detailed discussion of how some of these restrictions arise—e.g., via presupposition, focus, linguistic context, or explicit restriction as appropriate.

Ter Meulen (1986), Gerstner-Link (1988), and Cavedon and Glasbey (1994) offer treatments of generics in the framework of situation semantics (Barwise and Perry 1983). On such views, generics express constraints on situations—e.g., “tigers are striped” expresses the constraint that every situation involving a tiger involves a striped tiger. Constraints are not reducible to the properties of individuals (Cavedon and Glasbey 1994). The interpretation of a generic on these views is relative to a given context (or “channel” as they style it), so as on the above views, generics such as “ducks lay eggs” are evaluated only with respect to the female ducks (Cavedon and Glasbey 1994).

As noted above, there are philosophical and empirical difficulties (Cimpian, Gelman et al. 2010; Leslie 2008; Khemlani et al. 2012) facing any accounts that rely on domain restriction to handle generics such as “ducks lay eggs”. For these accounts to succeed, these difficulties would need to be addressed in more detail.

2.3 The Indexical Approach

Sterken (2015a) has recently argued that relevant quantification alone cannot capture the extent to which generics are context-sensitive. According to Sterken, not only does lexical restriction vary as a function of context, but so does quantificational force. As an illustration, consider the generic “cats are black”. This could be uttered by parents trying to teach their children about cats, or it could be uttered in response to a teacher asking the class what colors cats are. In the first context, the truth of “cats are black” seems to require that all cats be black. In the second context, the truth of “cats are black” seems to require only that some cats are black.

Sterken argues that the best explanation of why the truth conditions of generics vary across context in this way and others is that Gen is an indexical. In terms of logical form, this means that Gen is composed of two free variables: one representing quantificational force and one representing lexical restriction. Like all indexicals, Gen has what Kaplan (1989) calls a character, a function from contexts of utterance to the semantic values. Given a context of utterance, the character of Gen assigns semantic values to the free variables, resulting in the generic expression having as its content a particular generalization. The resulting view is intended to capture the various ways the truth conditions of a generic depend not only on the kind in question and the property being predicated, but also on the wider context of utterance.

The main challenge for the indexical approach is that of specifying the character of Gen. Sterken suggests that the character of Gen is such that the content of a generic utterance depends on what generalization the speaker intends the utterance to express and whether her intention could be recognized by a sufficiently idealized person that is privy to the conversation. If the character of Gen is as described, this seems to explain why generics can be so flexible. However, it also seems to make generics too flexible: some generics (e.g., “tigers don’t have stripes”, “ravens are white”) seem straightforwardly false and some generics seem straightforwardly true (e.g., “triangles have three sides”, “primates aren’t avians”), regardless of the speaker’s intentions (and of anyone’s ability to detect those intentions). Whether such an account can handle such cases remains to be seen. Moreover, the indexical account is supplemented by Sterken with an error theory for generics such as “mosquitoes carry West Nile virus” (2015b), further increasing its flexibility. For critical discussion of the motivation for the error theory, see Almotahari (forthcoming). More generally, the indexical account—unless it is supplemented with a rich metasemantic account of the character of Gen—is not clearly constrained enough to issue in substantive predictions concerning the truth/falsity of generics.

2.4 Stereotypes and Prototypes

A somewhat different approach to the semantics of generics is taken by theorists who suppose that generics express stereotypes or prototypes. On such views, “tigers are striped” would express that the stereotypical or prototypical tiger is striped, and likewise, “sharks attack bathers” would express a belief about the stereotypical or prototypical shark. Geurts (1985) and Declerk (1986) suggest that generics may be interpreted as expressing culturally accepted stereotypes, and Platteau (1980), Nunberg and Pan (1975), and Heyer (1985, 1990) claim that generics express prototypes, in the sense of Rosch (1978). Thus on such views, “tigers are striped” would express the fact that the stereotypical or prototypical tiger is striped.

A general concern with views of this type is that they would seem to make the holding of the relevant sort of false belief sufficient to render the generic true. For example, suppose that people falsely associate sliminess with snakes in the relevant way (e.g., as a culturally held stereotype, or part of the Roschean prototype, etc). This does not make the generic “snakes are slimy” true (Krifka et al. 1995). While it is plausible that people often assert generics on the basis of their prototypical/stereotypical beliefs, it is implausible to think that these beliefs enter into the truth conditions of generics. Stereotypical beliefs can be, and often are, false.

2.5 Probabilitistic Approaches

Cohen (1996, 1999, 2004) argues that generics can be understood in terms of comparative probabilities. There are two different ways for a generic to be true on Cohen’s view. The first way (Absolute) can be illustrated by “tigers are striped”. This is a true generic because (roughly speaking) a randomly chosen tiger is more likely than not to be striped. The second way (Relative) a generic can be true involves comparison with other kinds. For example, on Cohen’s account, “mosquitoes carry the West Nile virus” is true because (again roughly speaking) if we pick a mosquito and another insect at random, the mosquito is more likely than the insect to carry the West Nile virus. Thus on Cohen’s view, generics are made true (or false) by such probabilistic considerations. More precisely, Cohen’s categories are as follows:

Absolute generics
Ks are F” is true iff the probability that an arbitrary K that satisfies some predicate in Alt(F) satisfies “is F” is greater than .5.

Relative Generics
Ks are F” is true iff the probability that an arbitrary K that satisfies some predicate in Alt(F) satisfies “is F” is greater than the probability that an arbitrary member of Alt(K) that satisfies some predicate in Alt(F) satisfies “is F”.

(In the above, Alt(F) is the set of contextually relevant alternatives to the property in question, and Alt(K) is the set of contextually relevant alternative kinds to the kind in question.) As it stands, however, Cohen’s account incorrectly predicts that generics such as “bees are sterile” will be true, since the probability that a given bee is sterile is greater than .5. To deal with such cases, Cohen introduces the homogeneity constraint:

Homogeneity Constraint
The above probability conditions (exceeding .5, or exceeding that of the arbitrary alternative to the kind) should hold in all salient partitions of the kind.

Generics such as “bees are sterile” are now predicted to be false, because there is a salient partition of bees into workers, queens, and drones, and queen bees have a very low probability of being sterile.

However, Cohen’s account may face some counterexamples. For example, humans are more likely to suffer from autism than other mammals, and so “humans are autistic” would seem to be falsely predicted to be a true (relative) generic, and it is hard to see how homogeneity could undermine this prediction (Leslie 2008). This example illustrates that unique possession of a property by a kind is not generally sufficient for the truth of a generic, yet the category of relative generic predicts that, modulo homogeneity, this should suffice.

Conversely, consider “mosquitoes carry West Nile virus”. This is a true relative generic on Cohen’s view. However, suppose that fleas also carried the virus, and did so at a somewhat higher rate than mosquitoes. Suppose further that the flea population swelled to immense proportions, so that fleas outnumbered all other insects. As the flea population increases, there will come a point at which mosquitoes cease to be more likely than the arbitrary insect to carry West Nile virus, and so the generic “mosquitoes carry West Nile virus” would be predicted to become false. It is perhaps natural to think, though, that these are circumstances under which “mosquitoes carry West Nile virus” would remain true—after all, one could still catch the virus from a mosquito! If this is correct, then it suggests that the analysis in terms of relative probability may not be correct (Leslie 2008).

Empirical work also suggests that the homogeneity constraint does not guide people’s understanding of generics. For example, Cimpian, Gelman, and Brandone (2010) found that adults are not at all reluctant to accept a generic that involves a property found only in one salient partition of a kind, contra the predictions of the homogeneity constraint (though this was not the intent behind the experiment).

Nickel (2012) offers a different kind of counterexample to Cohen’s account: cases involving polarization. To illustrate, Nickel asks us to consider a case in which some Dutch sailors are among the best in the world. Moreover, the proportion of Dutch sailors who meet this high standard exceeds the proportion of German sailors and the proportion of French sailors who meet it. Nevertheless, suppose that most Dutch sailors are very poor sailors. Intuitively, the generic “Dutchmen are good sailors” seems false in this case. But Cohen’s account implies that it is true, for the probability that a Dutchmen is a good sailor is higher than the probability that someone from a relevant alternative country is a good sailor, and the homogeneity constraint is satisfied.

3. Indefinite, Definite, and Bare Singular Generics

The above discussion was primarily centered on accounts of bare plural generics, which have received the most discussion in the literature. Singular generics introduce their own sets of complications.

3.1 Indefinite Singular Generics and Normativity

Unlike bare plurals, singular generics can easily be infelicitous. For example, it is perfectly fine to say (36) or (37):

A madrigal is polyphonic
A football hero is popular

But not (38):

*A madrigal is popular

(Notice, however, that the plural version of (38) “madrigals are popular” is perfectly felicitous (though perhaps false, unfortunately).)

Lawler (1973) notes that indefinite singulars are only felicitous when they express properties that are somehow “necessary”, “essential” or “inherent” to the kind. Burton-Roberts (1977) argues that indefinite singulars carry a special normative force, while Krifka et al. (1995) take a different tact, arguing that the facts can be accounted for in terms of logical form.

More generally, linguists such as Carlson (1995), Cohen (2001), and Greenberg (2003) have noted that generics can sometimes have a normative flavor, e.g. “a gentleman opens the door for ladies” or “boys don’t cry.” A connection between linguistic form (e.g., bare plural vs. indefinitely singular) and normativity is often drawn, with some theorists such as Greenberg (2003) and Cohen (2001) arguing that indefinite singulars can express only “rules and regulations”, in the sense of Carlson (1995).

Greenberg and Cohen offer distinct semantic analyses of the phenomenon of normative generics: Greenberg (2003) implements her analysis by way of possible worlds semantics, while Cohen proposes that the logical form of such normative generics are entirely different from that of descriptive generics. In particular, for Cohen (2001), normative generics assert that certain rules are in effect, as opposed to expressing generalizations over kinds.

Leslie (2015b) offers an alternative account of how some generics can have normative force, building on the work of Knobe, Prasada, and Newman (2013) on dual character concepts. Knobe et al. note that certain concepts seem to have dual normative/descriptive senses. For example, we might say of a professional scientist who cares only about getting grants and publications and not at all about discovering the truth that though there is a sense in which they are clearly a scientist, there is also a sense in which they are not a (true) scientist. Conversely, we might say of a postal worker who applies the scientific method whenever they can and who cares about truth above all else that even though there is a sense in which they are clearly not a scientist, there is nonetheless a sense in which they are a (true) scientist. Leslie proposes that a given generic has normative reading just in case the kind in question is associated with a dual character concept.

Unlike Greenberg, Cohen, and Leslie, Hesni (2021) argues that the normative force of generic statements cannot be located in the semantics of generic statements. Instead, Hesni proposes that when we consider a wider variety of generic sentences that do not contain dual character concepts but appear to have normative force in certain contexts (e.g., “Rocks aren’t breakfast”), we must appeal to Gricean pragmatics to explain their normative force.

3.2 Definite and Bare Singular Generics

Definite singular generics appear to invoke constraints similar to those of indefinite singulars, but also some more besides. For example, definite singular subjects are often infelicitous if they do not refer to well-established kinds (Krifka et al. 1995; example from Carlson 1977, attributed to Barbara Partee):

The coke bottle has a narrow neck
*The green bottle has a narrow neck

What does it take to be a well-established kind? Krifka et al. suggest that almost anything can become a well-established kind given an appropriate body of background knowledge. For example, suppose it is well known that green bottles preserve the effectiveness of certain life-saving antibiotics. In this context, a definite singular generic like “The green bottle saves lives” might be true.

Other constraints on the acceptability of definite singulars have been noted by Nunberg and Pan (1975), Carlson (1977), Dahl (1985), and others. However, definite singular generics have received less attention overall than indefinite singulars, while bare plurals have received by far the most discussion in the literature.

In addition to definite and indefinite singular generics, there are also bare singular generics, which feature mass nouns in the subject position (Ojeda 1991; Heyer 1987; Bäck 1996, Carlson 2011; Wilkinson 1995). For example, “Gold is a metal” and “Nicotine is highly addictive” are two true bare singular generics. Like definite singular generics, bare singular generics have received less attention than definite singular generics and bare plural generics.

4. Generics and Psychology

In recent years, there has been increasing interest in generic generalizations among psychologists. Cognitive psychology has long been interested in understanding how our conceptual knowledge concerning kinds is organized and represented; however, until somewhat recently the connection with generic sentences, and the generalizations they articulate, had not been explored. Psychologists’ interest in generics lies primarily with what these sentences can reveal about our basic ways of conceiving of kinds, rather than specifically with formulating a semantic analysis of Gen. However, several results from psychology arguably place important constraints on what the semantics of generic sentences might look like.

4.1 The Generics-as-Defaults Hypothesis

Infants are able to make generalizations concerning kinds and categories in their first year of life (e.g., Baldwin, Markman, and Melartin 1993), and by the mid-preschool years, children hold richly structured and detailed beliefs about the general properties of members of kinds (e.g., Gelman 2003). An important question in cognitive development concerns the nature of these generalizations. How might we characterize these cognitively fundamental generalizations? To what sorts of information is our most basic way of generalizing sensitive? And how might these generalizations be articulated in natural language, once it is acquired?

Several researchers have proposed that generic sentences articulate cognitively fundamental, default generalizations, and that quantified statements, in contrast, articulate cognitively more sophisticated ones (e.g., Cimpian and Erickson 2012; Gelman 2010; Leslie 2007, 2008, 2012). Generics are acquired early in development, by approximately 30 months of age (Gelman, Goetz, Sarnecka and Flukes 2008; Gelman and Raman 2003; Graham, Nayer and Gelman 2010). By 30 months, children understand that generics tolerate exceptions (Gelman and Raman 2003), and several studies have found that children’s judgments of generics are similar to adults’ judgments throughout the preschool years (e.g., Brandone, Cimpian, Leslie and Gelman 2012; Brandone, Gelman, Hedglen 2015; Hollander, Gelman and Star 2002). Interestingly, preschool children, like adults, understand that, e.g., “birds lay eggs” can be true yet “birds are girls” false, even though only “girl” birds lay eggs. Thus even preschoolers understand at least some of the “troublesome” generics—the generics that cause difficulties for the standard semantic analyses of generics—in the same way that adults do.

Interestingly, several studies have found that, throughout the preschool years, children have a tendency to interpret kind-wide quantified statements as generics—e.g., evaluating a statement quantified with “all”, “most” or “some” as though it were a generic. This phenomenon has been documented among English-, Mandarin-, and Quechua-speaking children (Brandone et al. 2015; Hollander et al. 2002; Leslie and Gelman 2012; Mannheim et al. 2011; Tardif et al. 2010; see also Gelman and Tardif 1998 for more discussion of the acquisition of generics by Mandarin-speaking children). The tendency is not limited to children either; under some circumstances, adults will also “default” to the generic interpretation when confronted with a quantified statement. For example, adults show a consistent tendency to accept, e.g., “all ducks lay eggs”, despite knowing that male ducks don’t lay eggs (a tendency which does not seem to be due to adults interpreting the quantified statement as ranging over subkinds of ducks; Leslie, Khemlani and Glucksberg 2011; Meyer, Gelman and Stilwell 2011; but see Lazaridou-Chatzigoga, Katsos, and Stockall 2015). Further, a range of adult reasoning errors with universal quantifiers are readily explicable on the hypothesis that adults sometimes interpret universally quantified statements as generics (Jönsson and Hampton 2006; Sloman 1993, 1998). Additionally, both adults and preschoolers frequently recall quantified statements as generics, but not vice versa, a tendency that has been documented in both Spanish and English (Gelman, Sánchez Tapia, and Leslie 2015; Leslie and Gelman 2012).

If generics do indeed give voice to cognitively fundamental, default generalizations, this would explain an otherwise puzzling fact: the absence of an articulated word “gen” in most or perhaps even all natural languages. That is, languages rarely if ever contain a dedicated, articulated operator that uniquely signals a generic statement, in the way that “all” signals a universal statement. Rather, languages overwhelmingly exploit less marked syntactic forms to express generic statements (Dahl 1985; Krifka et al. 1995; see also Carlson 2012). If generics express default generalizations, this pattern can be explained: in general, if a system has a default way of operating, then it is inefficient to explicitly instruct the system to operate in this way, since it will do so anyway, even in the absence of instruction. If processing a universal statement requires the cognitive system to deviate from its default way of generalizing, then explicit instruction is required—hence the word “all”. If generics require no such deviation, then languages need not contain a word “gen” (Leslie 2008).

The empirical findings suggest that these cognitively fundamental generalizations are articulated as generics rather than quantified statements. Compared to generic generalizations, quantified generalizations represent cognitively more taxing and sophisticated generalizations. This is potentially of philosophical interest since many of the semantic analyses of Gen reviewed above aim in some way or other to reduce Gen to the more theoretically tractable quantifiers—for example, the possible worlds and normalcy-based approaches often analyze Gen in terms of universal quantification over worlds, individuals, or both. Thus, on such an account, generic generalizations constitute a specific kind of universal quantification—the restriction of universal quantification to a range of (often complex, abstract) entities. On such an account, generics depend on universal quantification, and the latter is in some sense more fundamental than the former. Depending on one’s view of the subject matter of semantics, it may be a challenge to reconcile such a view with the available psychological data.

4.2 Are Generics Sensitive to Content-Based Factors?

Researchers who take a psychological approach to generics have also recently proposed that our judgments of generics may be sensitive to a range of content-based factors. That is, while standard semantic analyses of generics aim to treat them in an abstract, formal framework, psychologically-oriented theorists have argued instead that generic generalizations are sensitive to the nature of the property being generalized. For example, consider the generics “mosquitoes carry West Nile virus”, “sharks attack swimmers”, and “ticks carry Lyme disease”. People robustly accept such generics, despite knowing that very few members of the kind have the property in question. One possibility is that such familiar generics are accepted at low prevalence levels because the property in question is dangerous—the sort of property one would do well to avoid (Leslie 2008). This hypothesis is supported by experimental data that finds that people are more likely to accept novel generics at low prevalence levels if the property in question is a dangerous one (Cimpian, Brandone and Gelman 2010). As noted above, generics like “ticks carry Lyme disease” have proved difficult for the formal semantic approaches to accommodate. If generics are indeed sensitive to factors such as whether the property is question is dangerous or not, this difficulty would be expected—since formal semantic frameworks do not normally take into account such features of the property, but rather aim to abstract away from such content-based considerations.

If generic generalizations are indeed sensitive to the nature of the property being generalized, might that account for other “troublesome” generics? In addition to being sensitive to whether the property is dangerous or not, it has been proposed that generics may also be sensitive to whether the property in question is characteristic of the kind (Cimpian, Brandone et al. 2010; Cimpian, Gelman et al. 2010; Gelman and Bloom 2007; Leslie 2007, 2008; Prasada and Dillingham 2006, 2009). Examples of characteristic properties of kinds would include salient, distinctive physical features (e.g., “lions have manes”), methods of reproduction for animal kinds (e.g., “ducks lay eggs”), and functions for artifact kinds (e.g., “Orange-Crusher-2000s crush oranges”). If a generic attributes a characteristic property to the kind, then the generic may be accepted even if few members of the kind have the property in question.

If generics are indeed sensitive to such factors, it may be possible to explain why some generics are accepted even though the property is not prevalent among members of the kind. What, though, of generics such as “books are paperbacks” or “school teachers are female”? People tend to reject such generics, despite judging that the property in question is highly prevalent (Prasada et al. 2013). One proposal is that generics may be sensitive to the nature of the exceptions to the generic claim (Leslie 2007, 2008). That is, amongst the members of the kind that fail to have the predicated property, it may matter how they fail to have the property—in particular whether they simply lack the property, or whether they have an equally salient, concrete, positive property instead. The non-infected ticks simply do not carry Lyme disease—they do not have an alternative property instead. However, the books that are not paperbacks are instead hardcover. Similarly, people who are not right-handed are instead left-handed; elementary school teachers who are not female are male. Intuitively, one might feel as though one would be “overlooking” these hardcover books, these left-handed individuals, and these male school teachers if one accepted the generics in question. Thus, it is possible that generics may be sensitive to the nature of the exceptions to the generalization. However, more empirical investigation is needed on this point.

4.3 A Bayesian Model of Generics

Tessler and Goodman (2019) offer an account of generics that is rooted in a Bayesian computational approach to cognition. They model acceptance/rejection of a generic as a speaker’s decision to produce an utterance of the generic to a naive listener. The goal of the speaker, on their model, is to produce an utterance that aligns the listener’s beliefs about the prevalence of the property among members of the kind (the “referent prevalence” in their terminology) with the speaker’s beliefs. The speaker’s decision is driven by whether the referent prevalence is more likely under the listener’s prior beliefs vs. their posterior beliefs after hearing the generic. On their model, generics have a threshold semantics, according to which a generic is true if the referent prevalence exceeds a threshold, however this threshold is unspecified and unknown by both speaker and hearer. Bayesian computational modeling provides a mathematical framework in which such uncertainty can be readily handled; specifically, interpretation on the model involves integrating over the possible values of this threshold. A listener’s posterior beliefs are arrived at by Bayesian updating, such that they are proportional to the product of the listener’s prior beliefs about the distribution of the prevalence \(p\) of the property in question (i.e., over comparable kinds), \(Pr(p),\) the probability of possible thresholds \(\theta\), \(Pr(\theta),\) and a delta function that is 1 if \(p \gt \theta\) and 0 otherwise.

To put the model in less precise but more intuitive terms, the decision to utter a generic “\(K\)s are \(F\)” depends on beliefs a naive listener would likely have concerning the distribution of the property \(F\) over comparable kinds. Consider, for example, the distribution of the property laying eggs over animal kinds. For most animal kinds, the proportion that lay eggs is approximately zero, but there are some animal kinds for which ~50% of members lay eggs. Any other proportions of egg-laying are quite unusual. This describes the shape of the prevalence prior for laying eggs. Consider, then, an utterance of the generic “robins lay eggs”: approximately 50% of robins lay eggs, and hearing such a generic will, according to the mathematics of the model, lead the naive listener to update their prevalence prior in such a way that most of the probability distribution will be clustered around 50% and very little will remain around 0%. Thus, uttering this generic will lead the listener’s prevalence posterior to be better aligned with the speaker’s beliefs than their prevalence prior, and so the generic is endorsed.

Tessler and Goodman’s model does a remarkable job of predicting the degree to which people endorse a given generic with great quantitative accuracy, and it extends a growing body of evidence in cognitive science that much of human cognition, including early cognitive development, involves or approximates to Bayesian inference (e.g., for a recent review, see Ullman and Tenenbaum 2020). While their model predicts that prior beliefs about the distribution of the prevalence of the property over comparable kinds mediates all endorsement/rejection of generics, they allow that these priors may be influenced by content-based factors. For example, “mosquitoes carry West Nile virus” is predicted to be accepted with a high degree of confidence by the model because the prevalence prior for carrying West Nile virus is almost entirely bunched up very close to zero, and correspondingly the prevalence posterior upon hearing the generic shifts modestly over to low but decidedly non-zero values. If people have a higher order prior expectation that strikingly dangerous properties are rare, such that the prevalence priors for such properties resemble that of carrying West Nile virus, then this would mean that people would be disposed to accept generics that predicate such properties, even though the referent prevalence is low.

4.4 Inferences from Generics

Despite the fact that people are often willing to accept generics despite knowing that only a minority of the kind has the property (e.g., Brandone et al. 2012; Cimpian, Brandone et al. 2010), the available data suggest that people are nonetheless disposed to treat generics as quite inferentially powerful. For example, if people are told that a given percentage of a novel animal kind has a property, they are often willing to accept the corresponding generic at prevalence levels of 50%, 30%, or even 10%, particularly if the property being described is dangerous and/or characteristic of the kind. However, if people are instead presented with the generic and asked to estimate the prevalence of the property, the estimates are very high indeed—often reaching 100% (Cimpian, Brandone et al. 2010). Preschool-aged children show a similar pattern (Brandone et al. 2015).

These studies show that people give very high estimates of prevalence when presented with a generic statement concerning a novel animal kind. When the generics concern familiar kinds, prevalence estimates can be more realistic. Nevertheless, accepting a generic increases people’s tendency to believe a given member of the kind will have the property in question, over and above their beliefs about the prevalence of the property (Khemlani, Leslie, and Glucksberg 2012). For example, people correctly give comparable prevalence estimates concerning the number of ducks that are female vs. lay eggs. However, when asked to judge whether a given duck would have a property (e.g., “suppose you are told that Quacky is a duck. Evaluate the following statement: Quacky lays eggs”), people were significantly more likely to agree that the duck would lay eggs than they were that the duck would be female (Khemlani et al. 2012). These results suggest that people may treat generics as being inferentially quite powerful, in a way that cannot be reduced to their background beliefs about the prevalence of the property. When people are asked to judge whether a given member of a kind will have a property or not, they rely in part on their background judgment of the generic, rather than solely on their beliefs about how prevalent the property is.

These findings support the idea that accepting a generic disposes people—all else being equal—to believe that an arbitrary instance of the kind will have the property, as has long been suggested in the defeasible reasoning literature (e.g., Pelletier and Asher 1997). However, the defeasible reasoning literature has tended to focus on “non-troublesome”, high prevalence generics like “tigers are striped”; it is notable that people show a tendency to draw such inferences even for lower prevalence generics.

5. Beyond Language: Philosophical Applications of Generics

The study of generics is not only of interest from the perspective of understanding language, or the psychology associated with that portion of language. In recent years, there has been an upsurge of interest in the applications of generics. The range of potential applications of generics has proved extremely broad, and comprises issues from social prejudice to the sorites paradox and the principle of sufficient reason.

5.1 Generics, Stereotyping and Prejudice

From a young age, we conceive of certain kinds, both natural and social, as having a fundamental, underlying nature that is shared by its members (e.g., Gelman 2003). That is, we believe that, while some kinds may group individuals together on the basis of superficial properties (as an extreme example, consider the kind trinkets), other kinds group their members together on the basis of deep, intrinsic similarities (animal kinds are paradigmatic examples here). Kinds that fall in the latter category are said to be essentialized in the psychological sense. Members of an essentialized kind are believed to be deeply similar to each other—even if they seem to differ superficially—and are believed to share a range of important properties, which are the causal upshot of their shared natures (Gelman 2003). In the social realm, essentialist beliefs can be very damaging, and the groups that are most highly essentialized often face the worst forms of social prejudice (Haslam, Rothschild and Ernst 2000, 2002).

Sally Haslanger (2011) offers a fascinating analysis of generics that concern social kinds, for example “women are submissive” (see also McConnell-Ginet 2012 and Leslie 2014 for related discussion). It may be a fact that, given social circumstances, the majority of women defer to men on important decisions and life choices. With some complications (as noted above), this sort of high prevalence often suffices for a generic to count as true (e.g., Prasada and Dillingham 2006, 2009). Haslanger poses the question: even if we are in the circumstances that would plausibly render the generic true, might there still be something objectionable about uttering the generic? She argues that indeed there is, if the generic makes reference to an essentialized social kind and thereby perpetuates various forms of oppression. Generics, Haslanger argues, suggest that the property is grounded in the nature of the kind, and so an utterance of “women are submissive” invites the interpretation that it lies in the very nature of women to be submissive—rather than their submissiveness coming about as the result of extrinsic, accidental, and changeable social circumstances.

Empirical evidence supports Haslanger’s hypothesis. For example, from a young age, we tend to interpret information conveyed via generic language as indicating a stable and intrinsic property of the kind, whether the kind is natural or social (e.g., Cimpian and Erickson 2012; Cimpian and Markman 2009, 2011). Further, hearing generic language about a novel social or animal kind leads both children and adults to essentialize that kind in the first place . For example, even a wholly novel social group, composed of individuals who are diverse for race, ethnicity, gender, and age will rapidly be essentialized by preschoolers and adults alike if they hear various properties being attributed to the group via generic language (Gelman, Ware and Kleinberg 2010; Rhodes, Leslie and Tworek 2012; Leshin, Leslie and Rhodes 2021). (An interesting quandary emerges when we note that quantified statements are often interpreted and recalled as generics: is there any way to speak of social groups at a general level without inducing essentialist beliefs?)

As another illustration of the impact generic language, and language about identity categories more generally, can have on young children, Rhodes and Leslie noted that science is often described to young children using identity-focused language, e.g., “Let’s be scientists! Scientist explore the world using their senses.” However, action-focused language offers an alternative way to communciate much the same content, e.g., “Let’s do science! Doing science means exploring the world with our senses.” In a series of experiments, Rhodes and Leslie and collaborators have found that children who belong to social groups that are underrepresented in science (girls, children from underrepresented minorities or lower income backgrounds) show more engagement and persistence when they hear science described using action-focused language as opposed to identity-focused language (e.g., Rhodes, Cardarelli and Leslie 2020).

In addition to fostering essentialist beliefs, generics are also often used to communicate normative statements about social groups, e.g., “boys don’t cry”, “a woman puts family before career”, “friends don’t let friends drive drunk” (see also section 3.2 above). Generics such as these are not intended as descriptions of the facts on the ground, but rather carry a particular normative force; “friends don’t let friends drive drunk” was not introduced as a banal observation about what is in fact the case, but rather was introduced precisely to address the fact that, all too often, people were allowing their friends to drive under the influence. In the context of gender, these normative generics can serve as a concise (and child-friendly) means of communicating and sustaining problematic social norms. Moreover, recent empirical work reflects that very young children may interpret generics as having prescriptive force, even if those generics seems to adults to be only descriptive generalizations (Roberts, Ho and Gelman 2017).

Generic generalizations may be relevant to understanding social prejudice in other respects too. For example, “ticks carry Lyme disease” is accepted at low prevalence levels, perhaps because carrying Lyme disease is a dangerous property, of the sort one would wish to avoid. What then are we to make of similar generics in the social realm, e.g., “Muslims are terrorists”? Clearly, there is something deeply wrong with the latter that is not wrong with the former. One possibility is that these “dangerous generics” involve the assumption that the members of the kind in question share a nature that ground the property in question (or at least the corresponding disposition or propensity), and so generalizations such as “Muslims are terrorists” again involve false essentialist beliefs about social groups (Leslie 2017).

As a final illustration of the significance of generics for the social world, consider the phenomenon of stereotype threat (Steele and Aronson 1995; Steele 2010). Stereotype threat occurs when members of a stigmatized social group perform worse than they otherwise would have, because their membership in that group was made salient to them. For example, the performance of women and African-Americans on standardized tests is lowered if they are reminded first of their group membership by, e.g., being asked to report their gender or race before the exam. Interestingly, stereotype threat on a totally novel task can be induced by simply uttering a generic—e.g., telling a girl “boys are really good at this game” (Cimpian 2013; Cimpian, Mu and Erickson 2012). Simply hearing an evaluative generic statement about a gender group was enough to impair children’s performance.

These findings suggest that generic language has an undesirable influence on how we come to understand the social world around us. Nevertheless, Ritchie (2019) defends the use of some social generics (e.g., “Blacks face economic, legal, and social discrimination”, “Women are expected to want children”) on the grounds that they are uniquely apt for describing and ameliorating conditions of structural injustice.

5.2 Generics and Philosophy More Generally

Some philosophers have recently applied the study of generics to a range of long-standing philosophical issues and puzzles. As a fascinating illustration, Roy Sorensen (2012) argues that a proper understanding of generics can solve the sorites paradox. An example of the sorites paradox is the following: 1 is a small number; small numbers have small successors; therefore 1,000,000,000 is a small number. The second premise is the inductive step, and is here formulated as a generic. Sorensen proposes that, like most generics, the inductive step admits of exceptions: there are some (or at least one) small numbers whose successor is not itself a small number. If this is so, then the paradox is resolved: the argument is simply invalid. In order for the argument to be valid, the inductive step cannot be an exception-tolerating generic, but rather an exceptionless universal, e.g., for all n, if n is a small number, so is \(n+1\). Indeed, the paradox is often formulated in this way—i.e., with a universal as the inductive step. Here, however, Sorensen argues that we are simply interpreting the universal as a generic, just as when adults accept “all ducks lay eggs” despite knowing that male ducks do not lay eggs (Leslie et al. 2011).

A similar strategy is applied by Mahrad Almotahari (2022) to the kalām cosmological argument: Everything that begins to exist has a cause for its existence; the universe began to exist; therefore the universe has a cause for its existence. Almotahari argues that acceptance of the first premise of the argument rests on the generic overgeneralization effect. Certainly, anything that we encounter in ordinary life that begins to exist has a cause, and it is entirely reasonable to accept the corresponding generic things that begin to exist have causes for their existence. But the kalām cosmological argument requires a universal generalization, not a generic one, and Almotahari argues that this is a step to which we are not entitled.

Additionally, generics have been said to solve, or at least illuminate, other long-standing philosophical puzzles. For example, Kai Yuan Cheng (2011) argues that a proper understanding of generics and habituals can help resolve the Kripke/Wittgenstein rule-following paradox. Bernhard Nickel (2010, 2014) has argued that generics can be used to analyze ceteris paribus laws; similarly, Asher and Daniel Bonevac (1996, 1997) have relied on a normalcy-based approach to generics to provide an account of prima facie obligation. Michael Graff Fara (2005) and Ryan Wasserman (2011) both recruit generics and habituals to give accounts of dispositions.

Reflection on generics has also influenced debates about philosophical methodology. Mark Johnston (2016) suggests that certain well-known inadequacies of the “method of cases” in the philosophy of personal identity can be explained by the fact that we as philosophers have treated what is in fact merely generic-based—and thus exception-tolerating—knowledge of the application conditions of our concepts as if it were knowledge of universal necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the relevant concepts. Johnston and Leslie (2012, 2019) rely on similar considerations to question the philosophical methodology known as the Canberra Plan. Lastly, Lerner and Leslie (2013) argue that a greater understanding of the role of generics in moral cognition undermines certain applications of the method of reflective equilibrium within normative ethics.


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