Generally regarded as one of the most important philosophers to write in English, David Hume (1711–1776) was also well known in his own time as an historian and essayist. A master stylist in any genre, his major philosophical works—A Treatise of Human Nature (1739–1740), the Enquiries concerning Human Understanding (1748) and concerning the Principles of Morals (1751), as well as his posthumously published Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (1779)—remain widely and deeply influential.
Although Hume’s more conservative contemporaries denounced his writings as works of scepticism and atheism, his influence is evident in the moral philosophy and economic writings of his close friend Adam Smith. Kant reported that Hume’s work woke him from his “dogmatic slumbers” (Prolegomena, Introduction) and Jeremy Bentham remarked that reading Hume “caused the scales to fall” from his eyes (“A Fragment on Government”, chapter 1, paragraph 36, footnote 2). Charles Darwin regarded his work as a central influence on the theory of evolution. The diverse directions in which these writers took what they gleaned from reading him reflect both the richness of their sources and the wide range of his empiricism. Today, philosophers recognize Hume as a thoroughgoing exponent of philosophical naturalism, as a precursor of contemporary cognitive science, and as the inspiration for several of the most significant types of ethical theory developed in contemporary moral philosophy.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. The relation between the Treatise and the Enquiries
- 3. Philosophical Project
- 4. Account of the Mind
- 5. Causation
- 6. The Idea of Necessary Connection
- 7. Moral Philosophy
- 8. Philosophy of Religion
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1. Life and Works
Born in Edinburgh, Hume spent his childhood at Ninewells, his family’s modest estate in the border lowlands. He came from a “good family” (MOL 2)—socially well connected but not wealthy. His father died just after David’s second birthday, leaving him and his elder brother and sister in
the care of our Mother, a woman of singular Merit, who, though young and handsome, devoted herself entirely to the rearing and educating of her Children. (MOL 3)
Katherine Falconer Hume realized that David was uncommonly precocious, so when his older brother went up to Edinburgh University, Hume went with him, although he was only 10 or 11. There he studied Latin and Greek, read widely in history and literature, ancient and modern philosophy, and also did some mathematics and natural philosophy—what we now call natural science.
The education David received, both at home and at the university, aimed at training pupils to a life of virtue regulated by stern Scottish Calvinist strictures. Prayers and sermons were prominent aspects of his home and university life. At some point, Hume read The Whole Duty of Man, a widely circulated Anglican devotional tract that details our duties to God, our fellow human beings, and ourselves.
Hume’s family thought him suited for a legal career, but he found the law “nauseous”, preferring to read classical texts, especially Cicero. He decided to become a “Scholar and Philosopher”, and followed a rigorous program of reading and reflection for three years until “there seem’d to be open’d up to me a new Scene of Thought” (HL 3.2). The intensity of developing his philosophical vision precipitated a psychological crisis in the isolated scholar.
The crisis eventually passed, and Hume remained intent on articulating his “new Scene of Thought”. As a second son, his inheritance was meager, so he moved to France, where he could live cheaply, and finally settled in La Flèche, a sleepy village in Anjou best known for its Jesuit college where Descartes and Mersenne had studied a century before. Here he read French and other continental authors, especially Malebranche, Dubos, and Bayle, and occasionally baited the Jesuits with arguments attacking their beliefs. By this time, Hume had not only rejected the religious beliefs with which he was raised, but was also opposed to organized religion in general, an opposition that remained constant throughout his life. In 1734, when he was only 23, he began writing A Treatise of Human Nature.
Hume returned to England in 1737 to ready the Treatise for the press. To curry favor with Joseph Butler (1692–1752), he “castrated” his manuscript, deleting his controversial discussion of miracles, along with other “nobler parts” (HL 6.2). Book I, “Of the Understanding”, and Book II, “Of the Passions”, appeared anonymously in 1739. The next year saw the publication of Book III, “Of Morals”, as well as his anonymous “Abstract” of Books I and II.
The Treatise was no literary sensation, but it didn’t fall “deadborn from the press” (MOL 6), as Hume disappointedly described its reception. Despite his surgical deletions, it attracted enough of “a Murmour among the Zealots” (MOL 6) to fuel his lifelong reputation as an atheist and a sceptic. When he applied for the Chair of Ethics and Pneumatical (“Mental”) Philosophy at Edinburgh in 1745, his reputation provoked vocal and ultimately successful opposition. Six years later, he stood for the Chair of Logic at Glasgow, only to be turned down again. Hume never held an academic post.
In 1745, he accepted a position as a young nobleman’s tutor, only to discover that his charge was insane. A year later he became secretary to his cousin, Lieutenant General James St Clair, eventually accompanying him on an extended diplomatic mission in Austria and Italy.
In 1748, An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding appeared, covering the central ideas of Book I of the Treatise and his discussion of liberty and necessity from Book II. He also included material he had excised from the Treatise. In 1751, he published An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, a “recasting” of Book III of the Treatise, which he described as “incomparably the best” of all his work (MOL 10). More essays, the Political Discourses, appeared in 1752, and Hume’s correspondence reveals that a draft of the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion was also underway at this time.
An offer to serve as Librarian to the Edinburgh Faculty of Advocates gave Hume the opportunity to begin another project, a History of England, using the law library’s excellent resources. Published in six volumes between 1754 and 1762, his History was a bestseller well into the next century, giving him the financial independence he had long sought. But even as a librarian, Hume’s reputation as an atheist and sceptic dogged him. One of his orders for “indecent Books” prompted an unsuccessful move for his dismissal and excommunication from the Kirk. Friends and publishers persuaded him to suppress some of his more controversial writings on religion during his lifetime.
In 1763, Hume accepted a position as private secretary to the British Ambassador to France. During his three-year stay in Paris, he became Secretary to the Embassy, and eventually its chargé d’affaires. He became the rage of the Parisian salons, enjoying the conversation and company of famous European intellectuals. He was known for his love of good food and wine, as well as his enjoyment of the attentions and affections of women.
Hume returned to Edinburgh in 1769. He built a house in Edinburgh’s New Town, and spent his autumnal years quietly and comfortably, dining and conversing with friends, not all of whom were “studious and literary”, for he also found that his “company was not unacceptable to the young and careless” (MOL 21). He spent considerable time revising his works for new editions of his Essays and Treatises, which contained his collected Essays, the two Enquiries, A Dissertation on the Passions, and The Natural History of Religion, but—significantly—not A Treatise of Human Nature.
In 1775, Hume was diagnosed with intestinal cancer. Before his death in 1776, he arranged for the posthumous publication of his most controversial work, the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion, and composed a brief autobiography, “My Own Life”. Although there was much curiosity about how “the great infidel” would face his death, his friends agreed that he prepared himself with the same peaceful cheer that characterized his life.
2. The relation between the Treatise and the Enquiries
In 1775, as he was readying a revised edition of his Essays and Treatises for the press, Hume sent his publisher an “Advertisement”, asking that it be included in this and any subsequent edition of his works. In it, he complains that his critics focused “all their batteries” on the Treatise, “that juvenile work”, which he published anonymously and never acknowledged. He urges his readers to regard the Enquiries “as containing his philosophical sentiments and principles”, assuring his publisher that they provide “a compleat answer” to his critics.
Hume’s apparent disavowal of the Treatise and his regard for the Enquiries raise a question about how we should read his work. Should we take his statements literally and let the Enquiries represent his considered view, or should we ignore his “Advertisement” and take the Treatise as the best statement of his position?
Both options presuppose that the differences between the Treatise and the Enquiries are substantial enough to warrant taking one or the other as best representing Hume’s views, but there are good reasons for doubting this. Even in the “Advertisement”, Hume says, “Most of the principles, and reasonings, contained in this volume, were published” in the Treatise. He repeats his conviction that he was guilty of “going to press too early”, and that his aim in the Enquiries was to “cast the whole anew … where some negligences in his former reasoning and more in the expression, are … corrected”.
Hume’s description of his aims suggests another option. Rather than repudiating the Treatise, perhaps his recasting of it represents a shift in the way he presents his “principles and reasoning” rather than a substantive change in what he has to say. He reinforces this option when he says of the first Enquiry that the “philosophical Principles are the same in both” and that “By shortening & simplifying the Questions, I really render them much more complete” (HL 73.2). He also comments in “My Own Life” that the Treatise’s lack of success “proceeded more from the manner than the matter”—more from its structure than its content (MOL 8). It is not unreasonable to conclude that Hume’s recasting of the Treatise was designed to address this issue, which suggests that we might understand him best by reading both works, despite their differences, together.
3. Philosophical Project
As the title of the Treatise proclaims, Hume’s subject is human nature. He summarizes his project in its subtitle: “an attempt to introduce the experimental method into moral subjects”. In his day, “moral” meant anything concerned with human nature, not just ethics, as he makes clear at the beginning of the first Enquiry, where he defines “moral philosophy” as “the science of human nature” (EHU 1.1/5). Hume’s aim is to bring the scientific method to bear on the study of human nature.
Hume’s early studies of philosophical “systems” convinced him that philosophy was in a sorry state and in dire need of reform. When he was only 18 years old, he complained in a letter that anyone familiar with philosophy realizes that it is embroiled in “endless Disputes” (HL 3.2). The ancient philosophers, on whom he had been concentrating, replicated the errors their natural philosophers made. They advanced theories that were “entirely Hypothetical”, depending “more upon Invention than Experience”. He objects that they consulted their imagination in constructing their views about virtue and happiness, “without regarding human Nature, upon which every moral Conclusion must depend”. The youthful Hume resolved to avoid these mistakes in his own work, by making human nature his “principal Study, & the Source from which I would derive every Truth” (HL 3.6).
Even at this early stage, the roots of Hume’s mature approach to the reform of philosophy are evident. He was convinced that the only way to improve philosophy was to make the investigation of human nature central—and empirical (HL 3.2). The problem with ancient philosophy was its reliance on “hypotheses”—claims based on speculation and invention rather than experience and observation.
By the time Hume began to write the Treatise three years later, he had immersed himself in the works of the modern philosophers, but found them disturbing, not least because they made the same mistakes the ancients did, while professing to avoid them. Why, Hume asks, haven’t philosophers been able to make the spectacular progress in understanding human nature that natural philosophers—whom we now call “scientists”—have recently achieved in the physical sciences? His answer is that while scientists have cured themselves of their “passion for hypotheses and systems”, philosophers haven’t yet purged themselves of this temptation. Their theories were too speculative, relied on a priori assumptions, and paid too little attention to what human nature is actually like. Instead of helping us understand ourselves, modern philosophers were mired in interminable disputes—evident even to “the rabble without doors”—giving rise to “the common prejudice against metaphysical reasonings of all kinds”, that is, “every kind of argument which is in any way abstruse, and requires some attention to be comprehended” (T xiv.3).
To make progress, Hume maintains, we need to “reject every system … however subtle or ingenious, which is not founded on fact and observation”. These systems, covering a wide range of entrenched and influential metaphysical and theological views, purport to have discovered principles that give us a deeper and more certain knowledge of ultimate reality. But Hume argues that in attempting to go beyond anything we can possibly experience, these metaphysical theories try to “penetrate into subjects utterly inaccessible to the understanding” (EHU 1.11/11), which makes their claims to have found the “ultimate principles” of human nature not just false, but unintelligible. These “airy sciences”, as Hume calls them, have only the “air” of science (EHU 1.12/12).
Worse still, these metaphysical systems are smokescreens for “popular superstitions” that attempt to overwhelm us with religious fears and prejudices (EHU 1.11/11). Hume has in mind a variety of doctrines that need metaphysical cover to look respectable—arguments for the existence of God, the immortality of the soul, and the nature of God’s particular providence. Metaphysics aids and abets these and other superstitious doctrines.
But he insists that because these metaphysical and theological systems are objectionable, it doesn’t mean we should give up doing philosophy. Instead, we need to appreciate “the necessity of carrying the war into the most secret recesses of the enemy”. The only way to resist the allure of these pseudo–sciences is to engage with them, countering their “abstruse … metaphysical jargon” with “accurate and just reasoning” (EHU 1.12/12).
This means that the initial phase of Hume’s project must be critical. A prominent part of this aspect of his project is to “discover the proper province of human reason”—determining the extent and limits of reason’s powers and capacities (EHU 1.12/12). He believes that his investigation will show that metaphysics as the quest for understanding the ultimate nature of reality is beyond reason’s scope.
Scholars once emphasized this critical phase at the expense of the rest of Hume’s project, encouraging the charge that he was just a negative skeptic, who rejects the views of others without defending any positive position himself. But while he is indeed skeptical about the possibility of metaphysical insights that go deeper than science can, investigating the proper province of reason isn’t only a critical activity. His critique of metaphysics clears the way for the constructive phase of his project—the development of an empirical science of human nature—and Hume is not at all skeptical about its prospects.
In his “Introduction” to the Treatise, Hume launches the constructive phase of his project by proposing nothing less than “a compleat system of the sciences, built on a foundation entirely new” (T xvi.6). The new foundation is the scientific study of human nature. He argues that all the sciences have some relation to human nature, “even Mathematics, Natural Philosophy, and Natural Religion” (T xv.4). They are all human activities, so what we are able to accomplish in them depends on understanding what kinds of questions we are able to handle and what sorts we must leave alone. If we have a better grasp of the scope and limits of our understanding, the nature of our ideas, and the operations we perform in reasoning about them, there is no telling what improvements we might make in these sciences.
We should expect even more improvement in the sciences that are more closely connected to the study of human nature: “Logic, Morals, Criticism, and Politics”. Many longstanding philosophical debates are about the nature of our ideas—causation, liberty, virtue and beauty—so getting clear about their content should help us cut through these “endless disputes”.
As the science of human nature is the only solid foundation for the other sciences, “the only solid foundation we can give to this science itself must be laid on experience and observation” (T xvi.7). Although Hume does not mention him by name, Newton (1642–1727) is his hero. He accepts the Newtonian maxim “Hypotheses non fingo”, roughly, “I do not do hypotheses”. Any laws we discover must be established by observation and experiment.
Hume is proposing an empiricist alternative to traditional a priori metaphysics. His empiricism is naturalistic in that it refuses to countenance any appeal to the supernatural in the explanation of human nature. As a naturalist, he aims to account for the way our minds work in a manner that is consistent with a Newtonian picture of the world.
Hume portrays his scientific study of human nature as a kind of mental geography or anatomy of the mind (EHU 1.13/13; T 184.108.40.206/326). In the first section of the first Enquiry, he says that it has two principal tasks, one purely descriptive, the other explanatory. Mental geography consists in delineating “the distinct parts and powers” of the mind (EHU 1.13/3). While everyone can make some sense of the basic distinctions among the mind’s contents and operations, more fine–grained distinctions are harder to grasp.
Hume, however, wants to go much further. He wants to explain how the mind works by discovering its “secret springs and principles”. He reminds us that astronomers, for a long time, were content with proving the “motions, order, and magnitude of the heavenly bodies”. But then “a philosopher”—Newton—went beyond them and determined “the laws and forces, by which the revolutions of the planets are governed and directed” (EHU 1.15/14). Newton’s example led other natural philosophers to similar explanatory successes. Hume believes he will be equally successful in finding the fundamental laws governing our “mental powers and economy”, if he follows the same caution Newton exhibited in carrying out his inquiries.
Newton’s scientific method provides Hume with a template for introducing the experimental method into his investigation of the mind. In An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, he says he will follow “a very simple method” that he believes will bring about a transformation in the study of human nature. Following Newton’s example, he argues that we should “reject every system … however subtile or ingenious, which is not founded on fact and observation”, and accept only arguments derived from experience. When we inquire about human nature, since we are asking “a question of fact, not of abstract science”, we must rely on experience and observation (EPM 1.10/173–174).
As the fledgling Newton of the moral sciences, Hume wants to find a set of laws that explain how the mind’s contents—perceptions, as he calls them—come and go in the mind and how simple perceptions combine to form complex perceptions in ways that explain human thought, belief, feeling and action.
Newton’s achievement was that he was able to explain diverse and complex physical phenomena in terms of a few general principles. Like him, Hume proposes to explain “all effects from the simplest and fewest causes” (T xvii.8). He predicts that it is likely that one “principle of the mind depends on another” and that this principle may in turn be brought under another principle even “more general and universal” (EHU 1.15/15). But he emphasizes that while he will try to find the most general principles, rendering them as universal as possible, all of his explanations must be based completely on experience.
Although philosophy, as an empirical enterprise, is itself bound by experience, this is not a defect in the science of human nature. The same is true for all the sciences: “None of them can go beyond experience, or establish any principles which are not founded on that authority” (T Intro 10). Explanations must come to an end somewhere. When we see that we have “arriv’d at the utmost extent of human reason, we sit down contented”, for the only reason we can give for our most general principles is “our experience of their reality” (T 9).
Hume is Newtonian in much more than method. He sees that Newton is significantly different from John Locke (1632–1704) and the other Royal Society natural philosophers, because he rejects their mechanist picture of the world. Newton’s greatest discovery, the Law of Gravitation, is not a mechanical law. Hume explicitly models his account of the fundamental principles of the mind’s operations—the principles of association—on the idea of gravitational attraction. By appealing to these same principles throughout, Hume gives an explanation of these diverse phenomena that enable him to provide a unified and economical account of the mind.
4. Account of the Mind
To explain the workings of our minds with the economy Newton displayed in his physics, Hume introduces the minimal amount of machinery he thinks is necessary to account for the mind’s operations. Each piece is warranted by experience.
The early modern period was the heyday of the investigation of the ideas of causation, moral good and evil, and many other philosophically contested ideas. Every modern philosopher accepted some version of the theory of ideas—the view that we immediately perceive certain mental entities called ideas, but don’t have direct access to physical objects. Hume holds an empiricist version of the theory, because he thinks that everything we believe is ultimately traceable to experience.
He begins with an account of perceptions, because he believes that any intelligible philosophical question must be asked and answered in those terms. He uses perception to designate any mental content whatsoever, and divides perceptions into two categories, impressions and ideas.
Impressions include sensations as well as desires, passions, and emotions. Ideas are “the faint images of these in thinking and reasoning” (T 220.127.116.11/1). He thinks everyone will recognize his distinction, since everyone is aware of the difference between feeling and thinking. It is the difference between feeling the pain of your present sunburn and recalling last year’s sunburn.
Hume distinguishes two kinds of impressions: impressions of sensation, or original impressions, and impressions of reflection, or secondary impressions. Impressions of sensation include the feelings we get from our five senses as well as pains and pleasures, all of which arise in us “originally, from unknown causes” (T 18.104.22.168/7). He calls them original because trying to determine their ultimate causes would take us beyond anything we can experience. Any intelligible investigation must stop with them.
Impressions of reflection include desires, emotions, passions, and sentiments. They are essentially reactions or responses to ideas, which is why he calls them secondary. Your memories of last year’s sunburn are ideas, copies of the original impressions you had when the sunburn occurred. Recalling those ideas causes you to fear that you’ll get another sunburn this year, to hope that you won’t, and to want to take proper precautions to avoid overexposure to the sun.
Perceptions—both impressions and ideas—may be either simple or complex. Complex impressions are made up of a group of simple impressions. My impression of the violet I just picked is complex. Among the ways it affects my senses are its brilliant purple color and its sweet smell. I can separate and distinguish its color and smell from the rest of my impressions of the violet. Its color and smell are simple impressions, which can’t be broken down further because they have no component parts.
Hume initially distinguishes impressions and ideas in terms of their degree of force and vivacity. Impressions are more forceful and vivacious than ideas. My impression of this ripe tomato’s bright red color is as vivid as anything could be. Last year’s tomatoes were just as vivid when I was looking at them, but now my idea of them is much less vivid than my impressions of the tomato in front of me. Since last year’s tomatoes were the same color, the difference can’t be that they are different shades of red; the difference must lie in the sharpness, clarity, and brightness of my impressions—their force and vivacity. At various times, Hume tries other ways of characterizing the difference between impressions and ideas, but he was never completely satisfied with them. Still, what he says works well enough to give us a handle on the felt differences between impressions and ideas.
When Hume distinguishes impressions and ideas in terms of their relative force and vivacity, he is pointing out something that is generally true of them as a matter of fact. On occasion, in dreams or a high fever, ideas may approach the force and vivacity of impressions, but these are exceptions that prove the—empirical—rule. In general, impressions and ideas are so different that no one can deny the distinction.
Although nothing seems freer than the power of thought, which isn’t “restrained within the limits of nature and reality” (EHU 2.4/18), Hume insists that our imagination is in fact “confined within very narrow limits”. We can separate and combine our ideas in new and even bizarre ways, imagining creatures we’ve never seen or faraway galaxies, but all the materials of thinking are ultimately derived from our impressions. Since “all our ideas or more feeble perceptions are copies of our impressions or more lively ones”; we are restricted to “compounding, transporting, augmenting, or diminishing the materials afforded us by the senses and experience” (EHU 2.5/19).
4.1 The Copy Principle
In the Treatise, Hume qualifies his claim that our ideas are copies of our impressions, making clear that it applies only to the relation between simple ideas and simple impressions. He offers this “general proposition”, usually called the Copy Principle, as his “first principle … in the science of human nature”:
All our simple ideas in their first appearance are deriv’d from simple impressions, which are correspondent to them, and which they exactly represent. (T 22.214.171.124/4)
He presents the principle as something that everyone’s experience confirms, but he also gives an argument to establish it.
He argues first that there is a one–to–one correspondence between simple ideas and simple impressions. He can’t prove that this correspondence holds universally, since he can’t examine every individual impression and idea. But he is so confident the correspondence holds that he challenges anyone who doubts it to produce an example of a simple impression without a corresponding simple idea, or a simple idea without a corresponding simple impression. Since he is certain they will fail, he concludes that there is a constant conjunction between simple impressions and simple ideas.
Next, he maintains that this constant conjunction is so universal that the correspondence can’t be a matter of chance. There must be a causal connection between them, but do ideas cause impressions or do impressions cause ideas?
Finally, he argues that experience tells us that simple impressions always precede and thus cause their corresponding ideas. To support this claim, he appeals to two sorts of cases. First, if you want to give a child an idea of the taste of pineapple, you give her a piece of pineapple to eat. When you do, you are giving her an impression of the pineapple’s taste. You never go the other way round. His other case involves a person born blind, who won’t have ideas of color because he won’t have impressions of color.
The Copy Principle is an empirical thesis, which he emphasizes by offering “one contradictory phenomenon” as an empirical counterexample to the principle. He imagines someone who has had the same sorts of experiences of colors most of us have had, but has never experienced a certain shade of blue. Hume thinks that if he orders all the shades of blue he has experienced from the darkest to the lightest, he will see immediately that there is a gap where the missing shade should be. Then he asks
Whether ‘tis possible for him, from his own imagination, to … raise up to himself the idea of that particular shade, tho’ it had never been convey’d to him by his senses? I believe there are few but will be of opinion that he can; and this may serve as a proof, that the simple ideas are not always deriv’d from the correspondent impressions; tho’ the instance is so particular and singular, that ‘tis scarce worth our observing, and does not merit that for it alone we shou’d alter our general maxim. (T 126.96.36.199/6)
Hume repeats the case of the missing shade almost verbatim in the first Enquiry. While scholars have wondered exactly how the person might supply the missing shade, he seems unconcerned with the details. For Hume, once again the exception proves the—empirical—rule.
4.2 Hume’s Account of Definition
Although Hume’s distinctive brand of empiricism is often identified with his commitment to the Copy Principle, his use of the principle’s reverse in his account of definition is perhaps the more innovative element of his system.
As his diagnosis of traditional metaphysics reveals, Hume believes that
the chief obstacle … to our improvement in the moral or metaphysical sciences is the obscurity of the ideas, and ambiguity of the terms. (EHU 7.1.2/61)
Conventional definitions—replacing terms with their synonyms—merely replicate philosophical confusions and never break out of a narrow definitional circle. Getting clear about the content of the ideas and the meanings of the terms we are investigating requires something else.
Hume argues that we must “pass from words to the true and real subject of the controversy”—ideas. He believes he has found a way to accurately determine their content—his account of definition. He touts it as “a new microscope or species of optics”, predicting that it will produce equally dramatic results in the moral sciences as its hardware counterparts—telescopes and microscopes—have produced in natural philosophy (EHU 7.1.4/62).
Hume’s account of definition uses a simple series of tests to determine cognitive content. Begin with a term. Ask what idea is annexed to it. If there is no such idea, then the term has no cognitive content, however prominently it figures in philosophy or theology. If there is an idea annexed to the term, and it is complex, break it down into the simple ideas that compose it, and trace them back to their original impressions. If the process fails at any point, the idea in question lacks cognitive content. When carried through successfully, however, it yields a “just definition”—a precise account of the troublesome idea’s content.
Hume uses his account of definition in the critical phaseof his project to show that many of the central concepts of traditional metaphysics lack intelligible content. He also uses it in the constructive phase to determine the exact meaning of our terms and ideas.
4.3 Principles of Association
Although we are capable of separating and combining our simple ideas as we please, there is, nevertheless, a regular order to our thoughts. If ideas occurred to us completely randomly, so that all our thoughts were “loose and unconnected”, we wouldn’t be able to think coherently (T 188.8.131.52/10). This suggests that
There is a secret tie or union among particular ideas, which causes the mind to conjoin them more frequently, and makes the one, upon its appearance, introduce the other. (Abstract 35)
Hume explains this “tie or union” in terms of the mind’s natural ability to associate certain ideas. Association is not “an inseparable connexion”, but rather “a gentle force, which commonly prevails”, by means of which one idea naturally introduces another (T 184.108.40.206/10).
In the first Enquiry, Hume says that even though it is obvious to everyone that our ideas are connected in this way, he is the first philosopher who has “attempted to enumerate or class all the principles of association” (EHU 3.2/24). He regards his use of these “universal principles” as so distinctive that he advertises them as his most original contribution—one that entitles him call himself an “inventor” (Abstract 35).
Hume identifies three principles of association: resemblance, contiguity in time and place, and causation. When someone shows you a picture of your best friend, you naturally think of her because the picture resembles her. When you’re reminded of something that happened in the 1960s—miniskirts, for example—you may think of the Vietnam War, because they are temporally contiguous. Thinking of Sausalito may lead you to think of the Golden Gate Bridge, which may lead you to think of San Francisco, since they are spatially contiguous. Causality works both from cause to effect and effect to cause: meeting someone’s father may make you think of his son; encountering the son may lead you to thoughts of his father.
Of the three associative principles, causation is the strongest, and the only one that takes us “beyond our senses” (T 220.127.116.11/74). It establishes links between our present and past experiences and our expectations about the future, so that “all reasonings concerning matters of fact seem to be founded on the relation of Cause and Effect” (EHU 4.1.4/26). Taking aspirin in the past has relieved my headaches, so I expect that the aspirin I just took will soon relieve my present headache. Hume also makes clear that causation is the least understood of the associative principles, but he tells us, “we shall have occasion afterwards to examine it to the bottom” (T 18.104.22.168/11).
Like gravitational attraction, the associative principles are original, and so can’t be explained further. Although the associative principles’ “effects are everywhere conspicuous” their causes “are mostly unknown, and must be resolv’d into original qualities of human nature, which I pretend not to explain”. Accordingly, we should curb any “intemperate desire” to account further for them, for doing so would take us illegitimately beyond the bounds of experience (T 22.214.171.124/12–13).
Hume doesn’t try to explain why we associate ideas as we do. He is interested only in establishing that, as a matter of fact, we do associate ideas in these ways. Given that his claim that the associative principles explain the important operations of the mind is an empirical one, he must admit, as he does in the first Enquiry, that he cannot prove conclusively that his list of associative principles is complete. Perhaps he has overlooked some additional principle. We are free to examine our own thoughts to determine whether resemblance, contiguity, and causation successfully explain them. The more instances the associative principles explain, the more assurance we have that Hume has identified the basic principles by which our minds work.
In the Abstract, Hume concludes that it should be “easy to conceive of what vast consequences these principles must be in the science of human nature”. Since they “are the only ties of our thoughts, they are really to us the cement of the universe, and all the operations of the mind must, in great measure, depend on them” (Abstract 35). Just what these “vast consequences” are will become clear when we examine Hume’s revolutionary accounts of our causal inferences and moral judgments.
The medieval synthesis Thomas Aquinas (1224–74) forged between Christian theology and Aristotle’s science and metaphysics set the terms for the early modern causation debate. Aristotle (384–322 BCE) drew an absolute categorical distinction between scientific knowledge (scientia) and belief (opinio). Scientific knowledge was knowledge of causes and scientific explanation consisted in demonstration—proving the necessary connection between a cause and its effect from intuitively obvious premises independently of experience.
Modern philosophers thought of themselves as scientific revolutionaries because they rejected Aristotle’s account of causation. Even so, they accepted his distinction between knowledge and belief, and regarded causal inference as an exercise of reason, which aimed at demonstrating the necessary connection between cause and effect. Malebranche (1638–1715), and others following Descartes (1596–1650), were optimistic about the possibility of demonstrative scientific knowledge, while those in the British experimental tradition were more pessimistic. Locke was sufficiently sceptical about what knowledge we can attain that he constructed one of the first accounts of probable inference to show that belief can meet standards of rationality that make experimental natural philosophy intellectually respectable.
When Hume enters the debate, he translates the traditional distinction between knowledge and belief into his own terms, dividing “all the objects of human reason or enquiry” into two exclusive and exhaustive categories: relations of ideas and matters of fact.
Propositions concerning relations of ideas are intuitively or demonstratively certain. They are known a priori—discoverable independently of experience by “the mere operation of thought”, so their truth doesn’t depend on anything actually existing (EHU 4.1.1/25). That the interior angles of a Euclidean triangle sum to 180 degrees is true whether or not there are any Euclidean triangles to be found in nature. Denying that proposition is a contradiction, just as it is contradictory to say that 8×7=57.
In sharp contrast, the truth of propositions concerning matters of fact depends on the way the world is. Their contraries are always possible, their denials never imply contradictions, and they can’t be established by demonstration. Asserting that Miami is north of Boston is false, but not contradictory. We can understand what someone who asserts this is saying, even if we are puzzled about how he could have the facts so wrong.
The distinction between relations of ideas and matters of fact is often called “Hume’s Fork”, generally with the negative implication that Hume may be illicitly ruling out meaningful propositions that don’t fit into these two categories or fit into both of them. To defuse this objection, however, it is important to bear in mind that Hume’s categories are his translations of a traditional absolute categorical classificatory distinction, which all his contemporaries and immediate predecessors accepted.
Hume’s method dictates his strategy in the causation debate. In the critical phase, he argues that his predecessors were wrong: our causal inferences aren’t determined by “reason or any other operation of the understanding” (EHU 5.1.2/41). In the constructive phase, he supplies an alternative: the associative principles are their basis.
Hume’s contributions to the critical phase of the causation debate are contained in Treatise 1.3.6 and Section 4 of the first Enquiry, appropriately titled “Sceptical doubts concerning the operations of the understanding”. The constructive phase in his Enquiry account is the following section, also appropriately titled “Sceptical solution of these doubts”, while the corresponding sections of the Treatise stretch from 1.3.7 through 1.3.10.
5.1 Causal Inference: Critical Phase
Causal inferences are the only way we can go beyond the evidence of our senses and memories. In making them, we suppose there is some connection between present facts and what we infer from them. But what is this connection? How is it established?
If the connection is established by an operation of reason or the understanding, it must concern either relations of ideas or matters of fact.
Hume argues that the connection can’t involve relations of ideas. Effects are different events from their causes, so there is no contradiction in conceiving of a cause occurring, and its usual effect not occurring. Ordinary causal judgments are so familiar that we tend to overlook this; they seem immediate and intuitive. But suppose you were suddenly brought into the world as an adult, armed with the intellectual firepower of an Einstein. Could you, simply by examining an aspirin tablet, determine that it will relieve your headache?
When we reason a priori, we consider the idea of the object we regard as a cause independently of any observations we have made of it. It can’t include the idea of any other distinct object, including the object we take to be its usual effect. But then it can’t show us any “inseparable and inviolable connection”—any necessary connection—between those ideas. Trying to reason a priori from your idea of an aspirin, without including any information you have of its effects from your previous experience, yields only your simple ideas of its “sensible qualities”—its size, shape, weight, color, smell, and taste. It gives you no idea of what “secret powers” it might have to produce its usual effects. Hume concludes that a priori reasoning can’t be the source of the connection between our ideas of a cause and its effect. Contrary to what the majority of his contemporaries and immediate predecessors thought, causal inferences do not concern relations of ideas.
Hume now moves to the only remaining possibility. If causal inferences don’t involve a priori reasoning about relations of ideas, they must concern matters of fact and experience. When we’ve had many experiences of one kind of event constantly conjoined with another, we begin to think of them as cause and effect and infer the one from the other. But even after we’ve had many experiences of a cause conjoined with its effect, our inferences aren’t determined by reason or any other operation of the understanding.
In the past, taking aspirin has relieved my headaches, so I believe that taking aspirin will relieve the headache I’m having now. But my inference is based on the aspirin’s superficial sensible qualities, which have nothing to do with headache relief. Even if I assume that the aspirin has “secret powers” that are doing the heavy lifting in relieving my headache, they can’t be the basis of my inference, since these “secret powers” are unknown.
Nonetheless, Hume observes, “we always presume, when we see like sensible qualities, that they have like secret powers, and expect that effects, similar to those we have experienced, will follow from them” (EHU 4.2.16/33). Since we neither intuit nor infer a priori that similar objects have similar secret powers, our presumption must be based in some way on our experience.
But our past experience only gives us information about objects as they were when we experienced them, and our present experience only tells us about objects we are experiencing now. Causal inferences, however, do not just record our past and present experiences. They extend or project what we have gathered from experience to other objects in the future. Since it is not necessarily true that an object with the same sensible qualities will have the same secret powers that past objects with those sensible qualities had, how do we project those experiences into the future, to other objects that may only appear similar to those we’ve previously experienced?
Hume thinks we can get a handle on this question by considering two clearly different propositions:
- I’ve found that headache relief has always followed my taking aspirin;
- Taking aspirin similar to the ones I’ve taken in the past will relieve my present headache.
There is no question that “the one proposition may be justly inferred from the other”, and that “it is always inferred”. But since their connection obviously isn’t intuitive, Hume challenges us to produce the “chain of reasoning” that takes us from propositions like (1) to propositions like (2) (EHU 4.2.16/34).
(1) summarizes my past experience, while (2) predicts what will happen in the immediate future. The chain of reasoning I need must show me how my past experience is relevant to my future experience. I need some further proposition or propositions that will establish an appropriate link or connection between past and future, and take me from (1) to (2) using either demonstrative reasoning, concerning relations of ideas, or probable reasoning, concerning matters of fact.
Hume thinks it is evident that demonstrative reasoning can’t bridge the gap between (1) and (2). However unlikely it may be, we can always intelligibly conceive of a change in the course of nature. Even though aspirin relieved my previous headaches, there’s no contradiction in supposing that it won’t relieve the one I’m having now, so the supposition of a change in the course of nature can’t be proven false by any reasoning concerning relations of ideas.
That leaves probable reasoning. Hume argues that there is no probable reasoning that can provide a just inference from past to future. Any attempt to infer (2) from (1) by a probable inference will be viciously circular—it will involve supposing what we are trying to prove.
Hume spells out the circularity this way. Any reasoning that takes us from (1) to (2) must employ some connecting principle that connects the past with the future. Since one thing that keeps us from moving directly from past to future is the possibility that the course of nature might change, it seems plausible to think that the connecting principle we need will be one that will assure us that nature is uniform—that the course of nature won’t change—something like this uniformity principle:
- The future will be like the past.
Adopting [UP] will indeed allow us to go from (1) to (2). But before we can use it to establish that our causal inferences are determined by reason, we need to determine our basis for adopting it. [UP] is clearly not intuitive, nor is it demonstrable, as Hume has already pointed out, so only probable arguments could establish it. But to attempt to establish [UP] this way would be to try to establish probable arguments using probable arguments, which will eventually include [UP] itself.
At this point, Hume has exhausted the ways reason might establish a connection between cause and effect. He assures us that he offers his “sceptical doubts” not as a “discouragement, but rather an incitement … to attempt something more full and satisfactory”. Having cleared the way for his constructive account, Hume is ready to do just that.
5.2 Causal Inference: Constructive Phase
Hume calls his constructive account of causal inference a “sceptical solution” to the “sceptical doubts” he raised in the critical phase of his argument.
Since we’re determined—caused—to make causal inferences, then if they aren’t “determin’d by reason”, there must be “some principle of equal weight and authority” that leads us to make them. Hume maintains that this principle is custom or habit:
whenever the repetition of any particular act or operation produces a propensity to renew the same act or operation … we always say, that this propensity is the effect of Custom. (EHU 5.1.5/43)
It is therefore custom, not reason, which “determines the mind … to suppose the future conformable to the past” (Abstract 16). But even though we have located the principle, it is important to see that this isn’t a new principle by which our minds operate. Custom and habit are general names for the principles of association.
Hume describes their operation as a causal process: custom or habit is the cause of the particular propensity you form after your repeated experiences of the constant conjunction of smoke and fire. Causation is the operative associative principle here, since it is the only one of those principles that can take us beyond our senses and memories.
Hume concludes that custom alone “makes us expect for the future, a similar train of events with those which have appeared in the past” (EHU 5.1.6/44). Custom thus turns out to be the source of the Uniformity Principle—the belief that the future will be like the past.
Causal inference leads us not only to conceive of the effect, but also to expect it. When I expect that aspirin will relieve my headache, I’m not just abstractly considering the idea of headache relief, I believe that aspirin will relieve it. What more is involved in believing that aspirin will relieve my headache than in merely conceiving that it will?
It can’t be that beliefs have some additional idea—the idea of belief, perhaps—that conceptions lack. If there were some such idea, given our ability to freely combine ideas, we could, by simply willing, add that idea to any conception whatsoever, and believe anything we like.
Hume concludes that belief must be some sentiment or feeling aroused in us independently of our wills, which accompanies those ideas that constitute them. It is a particular way or manner of conceiving an idea that is generated by the circumstances in which we find ourselves.
If constant conjunctions were all that is involved, my thoughts about aspirin and headaches would only be hypothetical. For belief, one of the conjoined objects must be present to my senses or memories; I must be taking, or just have taken, an aspirin. In these circumstances, believing that my headache will soon be relieved is as unavoidable as feeling affection for a close friend, or anger when someone harms us. “All these operations are species of natural instincts, which no reasoning … is able either to produce or prevent” (EHU 5.1.8/46–47).
While Hume thinks that defining this sentiment may be impossible, we can describe belief, if only by analogy, although he was never completely satisfied with his attempts to do so. Belief is a livelier, firmer, more vivid, steady, and intense conception of an object. Hume intends these characterizations to go beyond merely recording intensity of feeling to capture how belief
renders realities … more present to us than fictions, causes them to weigh more in the thought, and gives them a superior influence on the passions and imagination. (EHU 5.2.12/49)
But how does an idea come to be conceived in such a manner that it constitutes a belief?
Hume’s explanation is that as I become accustomed to aspirin’s relieving my headaches, I develop a propensity—a tendency—to expect headache relief to follow taking aspirin. The propensity is due to the associative bond that my repeated experiences of taking aspirin and headache relief have formed. My present impressions of taking an aspirin are as forceful and vivid as anything could be, and some of their force and vivacity transfers across the associative path to the idea of headache relief, enlivening it with enough force and vivacity to give it the “strength and solidity” that constitutes belief.
Since I don’t know how aspirin relieves headaches, it is fortunate that there is “a kind of pre-established harmony between the course of nature and the succession of our ideas” that teaches me to take aspirin when I have a headache. Custom, Hume maintains, in language that anticipates and influenced Darwin,
is that principle by which this correspondence has been effected; so necessary to the subsistence of our species, and the regulation of our conduct, in every circumstance of human life. (EHU 5.2.21/55)
It is far better, Hume concludes, to rely on “the ordinary wisdom of nature”, which ensures that we form beliefs “by some instinct or mechanical tendency”, rather than trusting it to “the fallacious deductions of our reason” (EHU 5.2.22/55).
In keeping with his project of providing a naturalistic account of how our minds work, Hume has given empirical explanations of our propensity to make causal inferences, and the way those inferences lead to belief.
6. The Idea of Necessary Connection
The early modern causation debate revolved around a family of “nearly synonymous” key ideas, the most prominent of which were the ideas of power and necessary connection. For Hume, “there are no ideas, which occur in metaphysics, more obscure and uncertain”. He showcases the critical and constructive uses of his account of definition as he attempts “to fix … the precise meaning of these terms”, in order to “remove some part of that obscurity, which is so much complained of in this species of philosophy” (EHU 7.1.3/61–62).
6.1 Necessary Connection: Critical Phase
To get clear about the idea of power or necessary connection, we need to determine the impressions that are its source. Hume identifies three possible sources in the work of his predecessors: Locke thought we get our idea of power secondarily from external impressions of the interactions of physical objects, and primarily from internal impressions of our ability to move our bodies and to consider ideas. Malebranche argued that what we take to be causes of the motion of bodies or mental activity aren’t causes at all. They are only occasions for God, the sole source of necessary connection, to act in the world. Hume rejects all three possibilities.
He argues that external impressions of the interactions of bodies can’t give rise to our idea of power. When we see that the motion of one billiard ball follows another, we’re only observing their conjunction, never their connection.
Attending to internal impressions of the operations of our minds doesn’t help. Although voluntary bodily movements follow our willing that those movements occur, this is a matter of fact I learn through experience, not from some internal impression of my will’s power. When I decide to type, my fingers move over the keyboard. When I decide to stop, they stop, but I have no idea how this happens. Were I aware of the power of my will to move my fingers, I’d know both how it worked and its limits.
Our ability to control our thoughts doesn’t give us an impression of power, either. We don’t have a clue about how we call up our ideas. Our command over them is limited and varies from time to time. We learn about these limitations and variations only through experience, but the mechanisms by which they operate are unknown and incomprehensible to us. If I decide to think about Istanbul, my idea of that city comes to mind, but I experience only the succession of my decision followed by the idea’s appearance, never the power itself.
When ordinary people can’t determine an event’s cause, they attribute it to some “invisible intelligent principle”. Malebranche and other occasionalists do the same, except they apply it across the board. True causes aren’t powers in the physical world or in human minds. The only true cause is God’s willing that certain objects should always be conjoined with certain others.
Anyone aware of our minds’ narrow limits should realize that Malebranche’s theory takes us into “fairyland”—it goes so far beyond our experience that we have no way of intelligibly assessing it. It also capitalizes on how little we know about the interactions of bodies, but since our idea of God is based on extrapolations from our faculties, our ignorance should also apply to him.
6.2 Necessary Connection: Constructive Phase
Since we’ve canvassed the leading contenders for the source of our idea of necessary connection and found them wanting, it might seem as if we have no such idea, but that would be too hasty. In our discussion of causal inference, we saw that when we find that one kind of event is constantly conjoined with another, we begin to expect the one to occur when the other does. We suppose there’s some connection between them, and don’t hesitate to call the first, the cause, and the second, the effect. We also saw that there’s nothing different in the repetition of constantly conjoined cases from the exactly similar single case, except that after we’ve experienced their constant conjunction, habit determines us to expect the effect when the cause occurs.
Hume concludes that it is just this felt determination of the mind—our awareness of this customary transition from one associated object to another—that is the source of our idea of necessary connection. When we say that one object is necessarily connected with another, we really mean that the objects have acquired an associative connection in our thought that gives rise to this inference.
Having located the missing ingredient, Hume is ready to offer a definition of cause. In fact, he gives us two. The first,
A cause is an object, followed by another, where all the objects similar to the first are followed by objects similar to the second,
gives the relevant external impressions, while the second,
A cause is an object followed by another, and whose appearance always conveys the thought to the other,
captures the internal impression—our awareness of being determined by custom to move from cause to effect. Both are definitions on Hume’s account, but his “just definition” of our idea of cause is the conjunction of the two (EHU 7.2.29/76–77). Only together do they capture all the relevant impressions involved.
Hume locates the source of the idea of necessary connection in us, not in the objects themselves or even in our ideas of those objects we regard as causes and effects. In doing so, he completely changes the course of the causation debate, reversing what everyone else thought about the idea of necessary connection. Subsequent discussions of causation must confront the challenges Hume poses for traditional, more metaphysical, ways of looking at our idea of causation.
Hume’s treatment of our idea of causation is his flagship illustration of how his method works and the revolutionary results it can achieve. He goes on to apply both his method, and its concrete results, to other prominent debates in the modern period, including probable inference, testimony for miracles, free will, and intelligent design.
7. Moral Philosophy
Hume’s explanation of morality is an important part of his efforts to reform philosophy. He takes his primary task to be an investigation into the origin of the basic moral ideas, which he assumes are the ideas of moral goodness and badness. As with the idea of cause and necessary connection, he wants to explain moral ideas as economically as possible in terms of their “simplest and fewest causes”. Determining their causes will determine what their content is—what we mean by them. His secondary concern is to establish what character traits and motives are morally good and bad.
Hume follows his sentimentalist predecessor, Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746), in building his moral theory around the idea of a spectator who approves or disapproves of people’s character traits and motives. The sentiments of approval and disapproval are the source of our moral ideas of goodness and badness. To evaluate a character trait as morally good is to evaluate it as virtuous; to evaluate it as morally bad is to evaluate it as vicious.
As he did in the causation debate, Hume steps into an ongoing debate about ethics, often called the British Moralists debate, which began in the mid-seventeenth century and continued until the end of the eighteenth. He uses the same method here as he did in the causation debate: there is a critical phase in which he argues against his opponents, and a constructive phase in which he develops his version of sentimentalism. Hume has two sets of opponents: the self-love theorists and the moral rationalists. He became the most famous proponent of sentimentalism.
Thomas Hobbes’ (1588–1679) radical attempt to derive moral and political obligation from motives of self-interest initiated the British Moralists debate. Hobbes, as his contemporaries understood him, characterizes us as naturally self-centered and power-hungry, concerned above all with our own preservation. In the state of nature, a pre-moral and pre-legal condition, we seek to preserve ourselves by trying to dominate others. Since we are all sufficiently “equal” in power, this results in a state of “war of all against all” in which life is “nasty, brutish, and short” (Leviathan, Ch. 13). The way out is to make a compact with one another. We agree to hand over our power and freedom to a sovereign, who makes the laws necessary for us to live together peacefully and has the power to enforce them. While acting morally requires that we comply with the laws the sovereign establishes, the basis of morality is self-interest.
Bernard Mandeville’s (1670–1733) The Fable of the Bees served to reinforce this reading of Hobbes during the early 18th century. According to Mandeville, human beings are naturally selfish, headstrong, and unruly. Some clever politicians, recognizing that we would be better off living together in a civilized society, took up the task of domesticating us. Realizing that we are proud creatures, highly susceptible to flattery, they were able to dupe many of us to live up to the ideal of virtue—conquering our selfish passions and helping others—by dispensing praise and blame. Moral concepts are just tools clever politicians used to tame us.
Two kinds of moral theories developed in reaction first to Hobbes and then to Mandeville—rationalism and sentimentalism. The rationalists oppose Hobbes’ claim that there is no right or wrong in the state of nature, that rightness or wrongness is determined by the sovereign’s will, and that morality requires sanctions to motivate us. The sentimentalists object to Hobbes’ and Mandeville’s “selfish” conceptions of human nature and morality. By the mid–eighteenth century, rationalists and sentimentalists were arguing not only against Hobbes and Mandeville, but also with each other.
Hume opposes both selfish and rationalist accounts of morality, but he criticizes them in different works. In the Treatise, Hume assumes that Hobbes’ theory is no longer a viable option, so that there are only two possibilities to consider. Either moral concepts spring from reason, in which case rationalism is correct, or from sentiment, in which case sentimentalism is correct. If one falls, the other stands. In the second Enquiry, Hume continues to oppose moral rationalism, but his arguments against them appear in an appendix. More importantly, he drops the assumption he made in the Treatise and takes the selfish theories of Hobbes and Mandeville as his primary target. Once again, he thinks there are only two possibilities. Either our approval is based in self-interest or it has a disinterested basis. The refutation of one is proof of the other.
7.1 Moral Rationalism: Critical Phase in the Treatise
Hume thinks that “systems and hypotheses” have also “perverted our natural understanding” of morality. The views of the moral rationalists—Samuel Clarke (1675–1729), Locke and William Wollaston (1660–1724)—are prominent among them. One distinctive, but unhealthy, aspect of modern moral philosophy, Hume believes, is that it allies itself with religion and thus sees itself as serving the interests of “popular superstition”. Clarke’s theory and those of the other rationalists epitomize this tendency.
Clarke, Hume’s central rationalist opponent, appeals to reason to explain almost every aspect of morality. He believes that there are demonstrable moral relations of fitness and unfitness that we discover a priori by means of reason alone. Gratitude, for example, is a fitting or suitable response to kindness, while ingratitude is an unfitting or unsuitable response. He believes that the rational intuition that an action is fitting has the power both to obligate us and to move us. To act morally is to act rationally.
Hume’s most famous and most important objection to moral rationalism is two-pronged. In Treatise 2.3.3, “Of the influencing motives of the will”, he rejects the rationalist ideal of the good person as someone whose passions and actions are governed by reason. In T 3.1.1, he uses these arguments to show that moral ideas do not spring from reason alone.
In the first prong of his objection, Hume begins by remarking that nothing is more common than for philosophers, as well as ordinary people, to talk about the “combat” between reason and passion. They say we ought to be governed by reason rather than passion, and if our passions are not in line with reason’s commands, we ought to restrain them or bring them into conformity with reason. Hume counters that “reason alone can never be a motive to any action of the will” and that by itself it can never oppose a passion in the direction of the will.
His first argument rests on his empiricist conception of reason. As we saw in his account of causation, demonstrative reasoning consists in comparing ideas to find relations among them, while probable reasoning concerns matters of fact. He considers mathematical reasoning from the relation of ideas category and causal reasoning from the category of matters of fact. He asks us to look at instances of actions where these two types of reasoning are relevant and says that when we do, we will see that reason alone couldn’t have moved us.
No one thinks that mathematical reasoning by itself is capable of moving us. Suppose you want to stay out of debt. This may move you to calculate how much money comes in and how much goes out, but mathematical reasoning by itself does not move us to do anything. Mathematical reasoning, when it bears on action, is always used in connection with achieving some purpose and thus in connection with causal reasoning.
Hume, however, argues that when causal reasoning figures in the production of action, it always presupposes an existing desire or want. On his view, reasoning is a process that moves you from one idea to another. If reasoning is to have motivational force, one of the ideas must be tied to some desire or affection. As he says,
It can never in the least concern us to know, that such objects are causes, and such others effects, if both the causes and effects are indifferent to us. Where the objects themselves do not affect us, their connexion can never give them any influence; and ‘tis plain, that as reason is nothing but the discovery of this connexion, it cannot be by its means that the objects are able to affect us (T 126.96.36.199/414).
Noticing a causal connection between exercise and losing weight will not move you to exercise, unless you want to lose weight.
It immediately follows that reason alone cannot oppose a passion in the direction of the will. To oppose a passion, reason must be able to give rise to a motive by itself, since only a motive can oppose another motive, but he has just shown that reason by itself is unable to do this.
Having exposed reason’s pretensions to rule, Hume inverts the rationalist’s ideal of the good person, and concludes that “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions, and can never pretend to any other office than to serve and obey them” (T 188.8.131.52/415).
The second prong of Hume’s objection, the argument from motivation, is directed primarily against Clarke and concerns the source of our moral concepts: either they spring from reason or from sentiment. Couching this debate in terms of his own version of the theory of ideas, he reminds us that to engage in any sort of mental activity is to have a perception before the mind, so “to approve of one character, to condemn another, are only so many different perceptions” (T 184.108.40.206/456). Since there are only two types of perception—ideas and impressions—the question between rationalism and sentimentalism is
Whether ’tis by means of our ideas or impressions we distinguish betwixt vice and virtue, and pronounce an action blameable or praise-worthy? (T 220.127.116.11/456)
The argument from motivation has only two premises. The first is that moral ideas have pervasive practical effects. Experience shows that we are often motivated to perform an action because we think it is obligatory or to refrain because we think it is unjust. We try to cultivate the virtues in ourselves and are proud when we succeed and ashamed when we fail. If morality did not have these effects on our passions and actions, moral rules and precepts would be pointless, as would our efforts to be virtuous. Thus “morals excite passions, and produce or prevent actions” (T 18.104.22.168/457).
The second premise is that by itself reason is incapable of exciting passions or producing and preventing actions, which Hume supports with the arguments we just looked at about the influencing motives of the will. The argument from motivation, then, is that if moral concepts are capable of exciting passions and producing or preventing actions, but reason alone is incapable of doing these things, then moral concepts can’t spring from reason alone.
Reason for Hume is essentially passive and inert: it is incapable by itself of giving rise to new motives or new ideas. Although he thinks the argument from motivation is decisive, in T 3.1.1 he offers a battery of additional arguments, which are intended to show that moral concepts do not arise from reason alone.
Hume takes the defeat of rationalism to entail that moral concepts spring from sentiment. Of course, he was not the first to claim that moral ideas arise from sentiment. Hutcheson claimed that we possess, in addition to our external senses, a special moral sense that disposes us to respond to benevolence with the distinctive feelings of approbation. Hume, however, rejects the idea that the moral sentiments arise from a sense that is an “original quality” and part of our “primary constitution”.
He first argues that there are many different types of virtue, not all of which are types of benevolence—respecting people’s property rights, keeping promises, courageousness, and industriousness—as Hutcheson maintained. If we agree with Hume, but keep Hutcheson’s idea of a moral sense, we would have to believe that we have many different “original” senses, which dispose us to approve of the variety of different virtues separately. But he complains that this is not only highly implausible, but also contrary to the
usual maxims, by which nature is conducted, where a few principles produce all the variety we observe in the universe. (T 22.214.171.124/473)
Instead of multiplying senses, we should look for a few general principles to explain our approval of the different virtues.
The real problem, however, is that Hutcheson just claims—hypothesizes—that we possess a unique, original moral sense. If asked why we have a moral sense, his reply is that God implanted it in us. Although in his critical phase Hume freely borrows many of Hutcheson’s arguments to criticize moral rationalism, his rejection of a God-given moral sense puts him on a radically different path from Hutcheson in his constructive phase. One way of understanding Hume’s project is to see it as an attempt to naturalize Hutcheson’s moral sense theory. He aims to provide a wholly naturalistic and economical explanation of how we come to experience the moral sentiments that also explains why we approve of the different virtues. In the course of explaining the moral sentiments, Hutcheson’s idea of an original moral sense disappears from Hume’s account of morality.
7.2 Sentimentalism: Constructive Phase
In Treatise 3.3.1, Hume turns to his constructive task of providing a naturalistic explanation of the moral sentiments. He refers to them as feelings of approval or disapproval, praise or blame, esteem or contempt. Approval is a kind of pleasant or agreeable feeling; disapproval a kind of painful or disagreeable feeling. In several key passages, he describes the moral sentiments as calm forms of love and hatred. When we evaluate our own character traits, pride and humility replace love and hatred.
Hume’s project is “to discover the true origin of morals, and of that love or hatred, which arises” (T 3.3.1/575) when we contemplate our own or other people’s character traits and motives. He traces the moral sentiments to sympathy. Sympathy is a psychological mechanism that explains how we come to feel what others are feeling. It is not itself a feeling or sentiment and so should not be confused with feelings of compassion or pity. Hume appeals to sympathy to explain a wide range of phenomena: our interest in history and current affairs, our ability to enjoy literature, movies, and novels, as well as our sociability. It is central to his explanations of our passions, our sense of beauty, and our sense of what is morally good and bad.
Sympathy is a process that moves me from my idea of what someone is feeling to actually experiencing the feeling. There are four steps to this process. I first arrive at the idea of what someone is feeling in any of the usual ways. I next become aware of the resemblances between us, so we are linked by that principle of association. While we resemble every human being to some extent, we also resemble some individuals more than others—for instance, those who share our language or culture or are the same age and sex as we are. The associative principles of contiguity and causality also relate individuals who are located closely to us in time or space or who are family members or teachers. According to Hume, we are able to sympathize more easily and strongly with individuals with whom we have strong associative ties. The stronger the associative relations, the stronger our sympathetic responses. Hume then claims—controversially—that we always have a vivid awareness of ourselves. Finally, he reminds us that the principles of association not only relate two perceptions, but they also transmit force and vivacity from one perception to another.
Suppose my friend recently suffered a devastating loss and I realize she is feeling sad. The associative principles transmit force and vivacity from my vivid awareness of myself to my idea of my friend’s sadness. Since for Hume the difference between impressions and ideas is that impressions are more lively and vivacious than ideas, if an idea of a passion is sufficiently enlivened, it becomes the very passion itself. I now feel sad too, but not quite as strongly as my friend.
The way Hume uses the idea that the associative principles transmit force and vivacity in his explanation of sympathy is parallel to the way he uses it in his explanation of causal inference. In the case of causal inference, if we have an impression of an effect (smoke), the associative principles give rise not only to the idea of its cause (fire), but they also transmit some of the impression’s force and vivacity to the idea of its cause, so that we come to believe that fire is the cause of the smoke. A belief is an idea that is so lively that it is like an impression, and influences us in the way impressions do. Similarly, my lively awareness of myself enlivens by association my idea of my friend’s sadness. But the result in the case of sympathy is even stronger: when an idea of a passion is sufficiently enlivened, it becomes the very passion itself.
One advantage Hume’s explanation of the moral sentiments in terms of sympathy has over Hutcheson’s claim that we possess a God-given moral sense is that it enables him to provide a unified theory of the mind. He explains the moral sentiments by appealing to sympathy, which, in turn, he explains in terms of the same associative principles he invoked to explain causal beliefs. Without sympathy, and the associative principles that explain it, we would be unimaginably different than we are—creatures without causal or moral ideas.
Hume develops his account of moral evaluation further in response to two objections to his claim that the moral sentiments arise from sympathy. The first is the “sympathy is variable” objection. Sympathy enables us to enter into the feelings of anyone, even strangers, because we resemble everyone to some extent. But it is an essential feature of his account of the natural and spontaneous operation of sympathy that our ability to respond sympathetically to others varies with variations in the associative relations. I am able to sympathize more easily and strongly with someone who resembles me or is related to me by contiguity or causation. The objection is that the moral sentiments can’t be based in sympathy because the loves and hatreds that result from the natural and spontaneous workings of sympathy vary, but our moral approval doesn’t vary. The second objection is that “virtue in rags” still evokes our approval. Sympathy works by looking at the actual effects of a person’s character traits, but sometimes misfortune or lack of opportunity may prevent an individual from exercising their good character traits, yet we still admire them.
Hume argues that moral love and hatred spring from sympathy, but only when we regulate our sympathetic reactions by taking up what he calls “the general point of view”. There are two regulatory features to the general point of view. The first is that we survey a person’s character from the perspective of the person and his usual associates—friends, family, neighbors, and co-workers. We sympathize with the person and the people with whom that person regularly interacts and judge character traits in terms of whether they are good or bad for these people. Second, we regulate sympathy further by relying on general rules that specify the general effects and tendencies of character traits rather than sympathizing with their actual effects.
By putting together these two regulatory features, we arrive at Hume’s idea of the general point of view, which defines a perspective from which we may survey a person’s character traits that we share with everyone. When we occupy the general point of view, we sympathize with the person herself and her usual associates, and come to admire the person for traits that are normally good for everyone. The general point of view is, for Hume, the moral perspective. We do not experience the moral sentiments unless we have already taken up the general point of view. The moral sentiments and the concepts to which they give rise are products of taking up that standpoint.
Hume offers the claim that we admire four sorts of character traits—those that are useful or immediately agreeable to the agent or to others—as an empirical hypothesis. While he provides support for it in his discussion of the individual virtues, he also uses his fourfold classification to undermine Christian conceptions of morality. He makes pride a virtue and humility a vice. He throws out the “monkish” virtues—celibacy, fasting, and penance—on the grounds that they are not pleasant or useful to anyone. He also rejects the distinction between virtues and natural talents, which legislators, “divines” and modern moralists defend by claiming that the moral virtues are voluntary, whereas natural talents aren’t. Their goal is to reform us—or at least our outward behavior—making us better, when understood in Christian terms. They accordingly restrict the domain of the moral to actions that proceed from character traits because they believe only they can be modified, shaped, and controlled by sanctions, while talents can’t. Hume, however, rejects the distinction along with the dubious function these reformers assign to morality.
Hume identifies both what has value and what makes things valuable with features of our psychology. Our first-order sentiments, passions and affections, as well as actions expressive of them, are what have moral value. Our second-order reflective sentiments about our own or other people’s sentiments, passions and affections are what give them value. On his view, morality is entirely a product of human nature.
In the “Conclusion” of the second Enquiry, Hume summarizes his explanation of morality with a definition of virtue or merit:
every quality of mind, which is useful or agreeable to the person himself or to others, communicates a pleasure to the spectator, engages his esteem, and is admitted under the honourable denomination of virtue or merit. (EPM 9.1.12/277)
This is a precise parallel of his two definitions of cause in the first Enquiry. Both sets of definitions pick out features of events, and both record a spectator’s response to those events.
7.3 Self-Interest Theories: Critical Phase in the Enquiry
Hume’s second Enquiry is a sustained and systematic attack on the “selfish” or “self-love” theories of Hobbes and Mandeville. He follows Hutcheson in thinking that they assign two distinct roles to self-interest in their accounts of morality: first, moral approval and disapproval are based in a concern for our own interest and, second, the motive of which we ultimately approve is self-interest. Although many people during this period understood Hobbes’ theory through Mandeville’s lens, Hume believes it is important to distinguish them. As he sees it, Mandeville’s theory is superficial and easily dismissed. Hobbes is his main opponent.
Hume’s rejection of Hobbes’ selfish account of approval and disapproval begins in Section II and ends in Part I of the “Conclusion” of the Enquiry. Like Hutcheson, he mistakenly supposes that Hobbes was offering a rival theory of approval and disapproval. We approve of people’s character traits when they benefit us and disapprove of them when they harm us. Hume looks at each of the four types of virtue and argues that in each case, our approval does not spring from a concern for our own happiness, but rather from sympathy.
In Section II, Hume argues that one reason we approve of benevolence, humanity, and public spiritedness is that they are useful to others and to society. In Sections III and IV, he argues that the sole ground for approving of justice and political allegiance is that they are useful to society. In Section V, he asks: But useful for whom? Since it is obvious that it has to be “for some body’s interest”, the question is “Whose interest then?” He assumes there are only two possibilities: approval and disapproval spring either from sentiments that are interested or from a disinterested source.
According to Hume, Hobbes’ “deduction of morals from self-love” begins with our realization that we cannot subsist alone. A social order provides security, peace, and mutual protection, conditions that allow us to promote our own interests better than if we lived alone. Our own good is thus bound up with the maintenance of society. Although Hume agrees with Hobbes up to this point, he rejects his explanation that we approve of justice, benevolence, and humanity because they promote our own happiness.
Hume is confident that “the voice of nature and experience” will show that Hobbes’ theory, understood in this way, is mistaken. Borrowing many of Hutcheson’s arguments, he points out that if approval and disapproval were based on thoughts about the possible advantages and disadvantages to us of people’s characters and actions, we would never feel approval and disapproval of people from “very distant ages and remote countries”, since they cannot possibly affect us. We would never admire the good deeds of our enemies or rivals, since they are hurtful to us. We would also never approve or disapprove of characters portrayed in novels or movies, since they are not real people and cannot possibly help or harm us. We approve of character traits and actions that are useful not because they benefit us, but because we sympathize with the benefits they bestow on others or society.
Hume next examines the remaining three types of character traits—those that are useful to the agent (industriousness, good judgment), agreeable to the agent (cheerfulness) or agreeable to others (politeness, decency). Why, for example, do we approve of industriousness and good judgment, character traits that are primarily advantageous to the possessor? In most cases they are of absolutely no benefit to us and, in cases of rivalry, they counteract our own interest. We approve of these character traits not because they are beneficial to us, but because we sympathize with the benefits they confer on others. Hume takes this as further evidence against Hobbes’ explanation in terms of self-interest and in support of his sympathy-based account.
In Part I of the “Conclusion”, Hume complains that Hobbes’ self-love theory is unable to explain two important features of our moral sentiments: we tend to approve of the same sorts of character traits and we are able to morally evaluate anyone, at any time or place. If our approval and disapproval were based on thoughts about our own benefits and harms, the moral sentiments would vary from person to person and for the same person over time. We wouldn’t have moral feelings about most people, since most people don’t affect us. The moral sentiments spring from our capacity to respond sympathetically to others.
Hume is equally adamant that any explanation of the motives that prompt us to virtuous actions in terms of self-interest is mistaken. He opposes them in Appendix II of the Enquiry, which was originally part of Section II, “Of Benevolence”. He follows Hutcheson in thinking that the issue is whether the various benevolent affections are genuine or arise from self-interest. Once again he distinguishes Mandeville’s from Hobbes’ explanations of benevolence and takes Hobbes to be his main opponent. On Hume’s reading of Hobbes, while we approve of kindness, friendship, and other benevolent affections, any desire to benefit others really derives from self-interest, although we may not always be conscious of its influence on those desires.
Hume offers two arguments against this selfish view. He first asks us to consider cases in which people are motivated by a genuine concern for others, even when such concern could not possibly benefit them and might even harm them. We grieve when a friend dies, even if the friend needed our help and patronage. How could our grief be based in self-interest? Parents regularly sacrifice their own interests for the sake of their children. Non-human animals care about members of their own species and us. Is their concern a “deduction” of self-interest? He concludes that these and “a thousand other instances … are marks of a general benevolence in human nature, where no interest binds us” (EPM App 2.11/300).
Hume supplements this argument from experience with a highly compressed sketch of an argument he borrows from Butler. Happiness consists in the pleasures that arise from the satisfaction of our particular appetites and desires. It is because we want food, fame, and other things that we take pleasure in getting them. If we did not have any particular appetites or desires, we would not want anything and there would be nothing from which we would get pleasure. To get the pleasures that self-love aims at, we must want something other than happiness itself.
7.4 Justice: Constructive Phase
Hume rightly showcases his pioneering account of justice. In the Treatise, he emphasizes the distinction between the natural and artificial virtues. The natural virtues—being humane, kind, and charitable—are character traits and patterns of behavior that human beings would exhibit in their natural condition, even if there were no social order. The artificial virtues—respecting people’s property rights, fidelity in keeping promises and contracts, and allegiance to government—are dispositions based on social practices and institutions that arise from conventions.
Hume believes that nature has supplied us with many motives—parental love, benevolence, and generosity—that make it possible for us to live together peacefully in small societies based on kinship relations. One of his important insights is that nature has not provided us with all the motives we need to live together peacefully in large societies. After arguing in Treatise 3.2.1 that justice is artificial, in T 3.2.2, he asks two different questions: What motivates human beings to establish the rules of justice that give rise to property rights, and why do we approve of people who obey these rules of justice? The first question concerns justice as a practice constituted by its rules. The second concerns justice as a virtue, a person’s disposition to obey the rules of justice.
Hume argues that we enter into a series of conventions to bring about practices, each of which is a solution to a problem. Each convention gives rise to new problems that in turn pressure us to enter into further conventions. The convention to bring about property rights is only the first of several into which we enter. After property rights are established, we enter into conventions to transfer property and to make promises and contracts. According to him, we are by nature cooperators, although at first we cooperate only with members of our own family. But it is also advantageous for us to cooperate with strangers, since it allows us to produce more goods and to exchange them. All three conventions are prior to the formation of government. On Hume’s view, it is possible for there to be a peaceful society of property owners who transfer and exchange material possessions before there is government.
Hume argues that the practice of justice is a solution to a problem we naturally face. The problem is that since we care most about our family and close friends, but material goods are scarce and portable, we are tempted to take goods from strangers to give to our family and friends. Disputes over these goods are inevitable, but if we quarrel we will forfeit the benefits that result from living together in society—increased power, ability, and security. The solution to the problem is to establish property rights. We make rules that specify who has a right to what, and agree to follow the rules and to keep our hands off the property of others. Hume was one of the first to see that what is useful is the practice of justice, rather than individual acts of justice. Like Hobbes, he believes that it is in our interest to have the practice of justice in place.
As we just saw, Hume parts company with Hobbes when he answers the second question about why we approve of people who obey the rules of justice. If Hobbes’ answer in terms of self-interest is excluded, he thinks only one possibility remains. We approve of just people not because they benefit us but because we sympathize with the benefits they bestow on others and society as a whole. Hume thus explains our approval of justice by appealing to the same principle he invoked to explain our approval of the natural virtues. Thus
self-interest is the original motive to the establishment of justice: but a sympathy with public interest is the source of the moral approbation, which attends that virtue. (T 126.96.36.199/499–500)
In Part 2 of the “Conclusion” of the Enquiry, Hume raises a serious problem with his account of justice. While it is in our interest to have the practice of justice in place, it may not always be in our interest to obey its rules in every case. This is the free rider problem. The free rider, whom Hume calls the sensible knave, wants to get the benefits that result from having a practice in place without having to always follow its rules. He knows that the only way to obtain the advantages of social cooperation is for the practice of justice to be in place, but he also realizes that a single act of injustice will not significantly damage the practice. Most people will obey the rules of justice, so if he commits one act of injustice, the institution will not be in any danger of collapsing. Suppose he has the opportunity to commit an act of injustice that will benefit him greatly. Why shouldn’t he?
Hume confesses that if the sensible knave expects an answer, he is not sure there is one that will convince him.
If his heart rebel not against such pernicious maxims, if he feel no reluctance to thoughts of villainy or baseness, he has indeed lost a considerable motive to virtue…. (EPM 9.2.23/283)
There is no general agreement about whether Hume actually provides an answer to the sensible knave and if he does, whether it is adequate.
8. Philosophy of Religion
Hume wrote forcefully and incisively on almost every central question in the philosophy of religion, contributing to ongoing debates about the reliability of reports of miracles, the immateriality and immortality of the soul, the morality of suicide, and the natural history of religion, among others. All his work excited heated reactions from his contemporaries, and his arguments still figure centrally in discussions of these issues today.
Hume’s greatest achievement in the philosophy of religion is the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion, which is generally regarded as one of the most important and influential contributions to this area of philosophy. While all Hume’s books provoked controversy, the Dialogues were thought to be so inflammatory that his friends persuaded him to withhold them from publication until after his death.
Hume’s philosophical project, and the method he developed to execute it, dictates his strategy in all the debates he entered. In the debates about causation and ethics, there is an initial critical phase, where Hume assesses the arguments of his predecessors and contemporaries, followed by a constructive phase, where he develops his own position. In the natural religion debate, however, the situation is very different. Hume’s critique of the central concepts of natural religion in the critical phase shows that these concepts have no content, so there is nothing for the constructive phase of his argument to be about. Instead of resolving this debate, Hume effectively dissolves it.
The Dialogues are a sustained and penetrating critical examination of a prominent argument from analogy for the existence and nature of God, the argument from design. The argument from design attempts to establish that the order we find in the universe is so like the order we find in the products of human artifice that it too must be the product of an intelligent designer.
8.1 The Characters
The Dialogues record a conversation between three characters. Cleanthes, a self–proclaimed “experimental theist”, offers the argument from design as an empirical proof of God’s existence and nature (DCNR 5.2/41). Demea opposes him, maintaining that the argument’s merely probable conclusion demeans God’s mystery and majesty. He believes that God’s nature is completely inscrutable. Cleanthes dubs Demea a mystic, while Demea derides Cleanthes’ anthromorphism—his human–centered bias in comparing the creator of the universe to a human mind.
Cleanthes and Demea represent the central positions in the eighteenth–century natural religion debate. Cleanthes embodies its dominant, progressive strain, consisting primarily of theologians in the British Royal Society, who were fascinated by probability and the previous century’s impressive successes in experimental natural philosophy. Convinced that the new science gave witness to God’s providence, they rejected traditional a priori proofs, which purported to demonstrate God’s existence with mathematical certainty and without appeal to experience. Instead, they used the order and regularity they found in the universe to construct a probabilistic argument for a divine designer.
Holdouts clung to demonstrative proof in science and theology against the rising tide of probability. Demea is the champion of these conservative traditionalists. Since he trots out a lame version of Samuel Clarke’s cosmological argument in Part 9, some have thought that Hume models Demea on him. But Demea lacks Clarke’s rigid rationalism. It is more likely that he epitomizes a group of minor theologians such as William King, who stressed God’s incomprehensibility and resorted to a priori arguments only when they absolutely needed them.
There was no genuinely sceptical presence in the eighteenth–century natural religion debate. This makes Philo, who both Cleanthes and Demea characterize as a sceptic, the ringer in the conversation. Although all three characters say very Humean things at one time or another, Philo’s views are consistently the closest to Hume’s. Philo’s form of scepticism is the mitigated scepticism of the first Enquiry, which makes him the most likely candidate for Hume’s spokesman.
As the Dialogues begin, all three characters agree that their subject is God’s nature, since everyone agrees that he exists. Parts 1–8 concern God’s natural attributes, his omnipotence, omniscience, and providence, while Parts 10 and 11 consider his moral attributes, his benevolence and righteousness.
8.2 God’s Natural Attributes
Demea holds that God is completely unknown and incomprehensible; all we can say is that God is a being without restriction, absolutely infinite and universal. Cleanthes is adamant that the argument from design establishes all of God’s traditional attributes. Natural objects and human artifacts resemble one another, so by analogy, their causes also resemble each other. God is therefore like a human mind, only very much greater in every respect.
Demea objects that the argument’s conclusion is only probable, but Philo responds that the real problem is that the analogy is so weak. He launches a battery of arguments to show just how weak it is. The dissimilarities between human artifacts and the universe are more striking than their similarities. We only experience a tiny part of the universe for a short time; much of what we do experience is unknown to us. How can we legitimately infer anything about remote parts of the universe, much less the universe as a whole?
Philo, however, moves quickly away from chipping at the argument’s strength to questioning the intelligibility of its conclusion. We have no experience of the origin of a universe. Since causal inference requires a basis in experienced constant conjunction between two kinds of things, how can we legitimately draw any conclusion whatsoever about the origin of the universe? Does it even require a cause? One or many? Does the cause of the universe itself require a cause? The problem, then, is not just that the analogy is weak; the real problem is that it attempts to take us beyond what we can know.
Meanwhile, Demea derides Cleanthes’ anthropomorphism while remaining smugly satisfied with what Cleanthes disparagingly calls his mysticism. The barbs they throw at each other, and the speeches Philo goads them to make, help create a dilemma that Philo uses them to construct. He directs the dilemma at Cleanthes, but it affects both characters, although Demea is slow to realize this. He thinks Philo is in league with him in detailing the problems with Cleanthes’ anthropomorphism.
Challenging Cleanthes to explain what he means by God’s mind, Philo pushes him to admit that he means “a mind like the human”. Cleanthes, taking the bait, responds, “I know of no other” (DCNR 5.4/42). He argues that mystics like Demea are no better than atheists, since they make God so remote and incomprehensible that he bears no resemblance to human characteristics. Philo adds that although we regard God as perfect, perfection—as we understand it—is relative, not absolute, so we can’t conclude that we grasp God’s perfections. Since all God’s attributes involve perfection—perfect knowledge, perfect power, perfect goodness—we shouldn’t think that any of his attributes resemble or are even analogous to ours. But this means that we don’t know what we’re talking about when we talk about God using the familiar terms we apply to human minds.
Demea adds that giving God human characteristics, even if they are greatly magnified, denies him attributes theists have always ascribed to him. How can an anthropomorphic God have the unity, simplicity, and immutability of the God of traditional theism?
Philo continues to detail just how inconvenient Cleanthes’ anthropomorphism really is. If he accepts the argument from design, he must be committed to a God who is finite in all respects. But what does it mean to say that God is finitely perfect? Once you admit that God is finite, you’ve opened a can of worms, for there are all sorts of equally probable alternatives to intelligent design. Why think that the universe is more like a human artifact than an animal or a vegetable? To illustrate, Philo throws out a number of outlandish alternative hypotheses. For instance, if you were a spider on a planet of spiders, wouldn’t you naturally believe that a giant spider spun an immense web to create the world?
Cleanthes’ design hypothesis is so underdetermined by the evidence that the only reasonable approach is to abandon any attempt to adjudicate among it and its many alternatives. Total suspension of judgment is the only reasonable response. Otherwise, we go beyond the bounds of anything to which we can give specific content.
The dilemma Philo has constructed encapsulates the issue about the content of the idea of God that is central to the critical aspect of Hume’s project in the Dialogues. If you accept that God’s attributes are infinitely perfect, you are using ordinary terms without their ordinary meaning, so that they do not have any clear meaning. If you deny God’s infinite perfection, you can give him understandable attributes, but only because they are amplified human characteristics. The closer Cleanthes comes to regarding God’s mind as like a human mind, the closer he comes to regarding God’s attributes as being like human attributes, and the less Godlike his “God” is. We can only give the idea of God intelligible content at the perilously high cost of denying that he is really God. To do so is to abandon God for some kind of superhero.
At the end of Part 8, which concludes their discussion of God’s natural attributes, Demea still thinks that Philo and he are partners. He remains clueless about Philo’s strategy until the very end of Part 11, when he finally realizes that he too is caught in the trap Philo has sprung.
Demea offers an a priori alternative to the design argument in Part 9. As noted earlier, it is an abbreviated, watered–down version of Clarke’s cosmological argument. Although Cleanthes quickly scotches his lame efforts, Part 9 serves as an interlude between the previous discussion of God’s natural attributes and the consideration of his moral attributes in Parts 10 and 11.
8.3 God’s Moral Attributes
Demea begins the discussion in Part 10. Attempting to save face from his recent drubbing, he suggests that we don’t accept the truths of religion as a result of reasoning, but from what we feel when confronted with how helpless and miserable we are. Religion is based on feelings of fear and anxiety that arise from awareness of our “imbecility and misery” (DCNR 10.1/68). Our forms of worship are attempts to appease unknown powers that oppress and torment us.
Philo joins in, claiming he is convinced that
the best and indeed the only method of bringing everyone to a due sense of religion is by just representations of the misery and wickedness of men. (DCNR 10.2/68)
They proceed with a joint litany of the misery and melancholy of the human condition, topping each other with catalogues of woes. Demea does not realize that Philo may mean very different things by “just representation” and “due sense of religion” than he does, so he fails to realize that Philo is just egging him on.
Philo maintains that we can’t evade the facts of disease, famine, and pestilence, except by “apologies, which still farther aggravate the charge” (DCNR 10.16/72). These apologies are theodicies—systematic attempts to reconcile God’s goodness with the existence of evil. Demea is also scornful of theodicies, blissfully unaware that all too soon he will be offering his own.
Cleanthes finally breaks in to say that he doesn’t feel oppressively anxious or miserable, and hopes that anguish isn’t as common as they claim. But hoping that the extent of human misery is not so widespread is not the same as proving that it is. Cleanthes is on weak ground. Philo capitalizes on it, challenging Cleanthes to explain how God’s mercy and benevolence can possibly resemble human mercy and benevolence. Given God’s omnipotence, whatever he wills happens, but neither humans nor animals are happy, so God presumably does not will their happiness.
Cleanthes—“smiling”—grants that if Philo can prove that mankind is “unhappy or corrupted”, he will have succeeded in doing in religion (DCNR 10.28/74). He thinks he finally has Philo on the ropes. In forcing a sceptic to prove a positive thesis, he must not only succeed at a difficult task, but violates his scepticism in the process. Cleanthes fails to realize that Philo will make his case without needing to prove anything, nor does he realize that he will soon be the one who needs a proof.
Demea objects that Cleanthes exaggerates the dire consequences of acknowledging the human condition, and, despite his earlier vehement rejection of theodicies, offers his own. Sometimes called “the porch view”, Demea’s theodicy compares our experience of the world to the world as a whole, including the afterlife, to trying to determine the structure of a large building from what little we can see from its porch. From our perspective, we suffer, but from a longer view, either we don’t suffer at all, or else our suffering is for our greater good or for the greater good of the world.
Cleanthes retorts that Demea denies the facts, and offers only empty hypotheses, which, if intelligible at all, could only establish their bare possibility, but never their reality. The only way to respond to challenges to God’s benevolence is to deny that the human condition is really so miserable.
Cleanthes has now put himself in the position in which he thought he had put Philo. He must establish that the facts are as he claims, and Philo is quick to stress how difficult this will be. By resting his case on such an uncertain point, any conclusion he draws will be equally uncertain.
Philo then ups the ante by granting for the sake of argument that human happiness exceeds human misery. But if God is infinitely powerful, wise, and good, why is there any misery at all? There is no answer that preserves all God’s attributes, except to grant that the subject exceeds the limits of our understanding.
Philo, however, refrains from pressing the question of intelligibility; he is more interested in building an even stronger case against Cleanthes’ inference to God’s benevolence. Raising the ante higher still, he grants that pain and suffering are compatible with God’s infinite power and goodness. Cleanthes, however, must prove from the “mixed and confused phenomena” that God’s benevolence is actual, not merely possible. Doing so is doubly difficult, since any inference from finite to infinite is shaky at best, even when the data are “pure and unmixed” (DCNR 10.35/77).
Philo concludes by admitting, with less than complete sincerity, that while he was hard pressed to make his case against Cleanthes when the discussion concerned God’s natural attributes, where his moral attributes are concerned, he is at ease. He challenges Cleanthes “to tug the laboring oar” and explain how he can infer God’s moral attributes from the facts about the human condition (DCNR 10.36/77).
Cleanthes “tugs”, but only for one short paragraph. He admits that if we go beyond their usual meanings when we apply human terms to God, what we say is indeed unintelligible. Abandoning all human analogy is thus to abandon natural religion, but preserving it makes it impossible to reconcile evil with an infinite God.
Cleanthes realizes he has painted himself into a corner, but once again he thinks there is a way out. Abandon God’s infinity; think of him as “finitely perfect”. Then “benevolence, regulated by wisdom, and limited by necessity, may produce just such a world as the present” (DCNR 11.1/78).
Cleanthes doesn’t realize that his new theory is worse than his old one. He also doesn’t seem to remember Philo’s earlier question about what “finitely perfect” might possibly mean. Instead of God, he is now committed to some kind of superhero. Besides, the story he is telling is itself a theodicy. His superhero’s limitations explain why he cannot eliminate evil, or create an evil–free world.
In any case, Cleanthes is no better off than he was before. Conjectures may show that the data are consistent with the idea of God, but are never sufficient to prove that he actually exists.
Philo then proceeds to outline four possible hypotheses about the cause of the universe: it is perfectly good; it is perfectly evil; it is both good and evil; it is neither good nor evil. Given the evil we know exists, the data is at best mixed, so we can’t establish either of the first two hypotheses. The regularity and uniformity of the general laws we find in experience is sufficient to discount the third, so the fourth seems the most probable. On that hypothesis, the cause of the universe is entirely indifferent to the amount of good and evil in the world.
These points about natural evil also apply to moral evil. We have no more reason to think that God’s righteousness resembles human righteousness than we have to think that his benevolence resembles human benevolence. We have even less reason, in fact, since moral evil outweighs moral goodness more than natural evil outweighs natural goodness.
In addition, Cleanthes’ new form of anthropomorphism is saddled with tracing moral evil back to God. Since every effect must have a cause, either the chain of causes goes back infinitely, or it stops with the original principle that is the ultimate cause of all things—God.
At this point, Demea, who has become increasingly agitated during Philo’s speech, interrupts. He finally realizes that the case Philo is making cuts against his own view as much as it cuts against Cleanthes’. Although it might appear that Demea can retreat to some form of the theodicy he sketched earlier, the extent to which Philo’s argument upsets him suggests that he now realizes it is inadequate. If he leans on the mystery–mongering he has professed until now, Philo has shown that, because of its lack of specific content, it does not point exclusively to a good God. It may just as well commit him to a supreme being who is “beyond good and evil” and is totally indifferent to morality. Commitment without content turns out to be no commitment at all. Demea realizes this, dimly at least, as he leaves the conversation.
8.4 The Conclusion: Part 12
With Demea’s departure, Cleanthes and Philo are left to finish the conversation. Their tone is conciliatory, so conciliatory that Philo says he must “confess” that although he is less cautious about natural religion than any other subject,
no one has a deeper sense of religion impressed on his mind, or pays more profound adoration to the divine Being, as he discovers himself to reason, in the inexplicable contrivance and artifice of nature. (DCNR 12.2/89)
Philo’s “confession” paves the way for a blockbuster that has puzzled generations of readers. Philo seems to reverse field, apparently recanting what he has argued for so forcefully. He grants Cleanthes that “a purpose, an intention, a design, strikes everywhere the most careless, the most stupid thinker” (DCNR 12.2/89).
His remarks are, however, by no means straightforward. Some take Philo—and, by implication, Hume—to be outing himself as a closet theist. Others conclude that, since he holds all the cards at this point, he can afford to be conciliatory. Read ironically, Philo could be saying that while “careless and stupid” observers are struck by purpose, intention, and design in the universe, careful, critical, intelligent ones are not. But there is no need to force the irony here. Read straight, nature’s “contrivance and artifice” is “inexplicable” precisely because reason can discover nothing about God’s natural or moral attributes. Everyone—even the stupid and careless—can see that the parts of animals and plants have functions, and so can easily understand why “an anatomist, who discovered a new organ or canal, would never be satisfied until he had also discovered its use and intention” (DCNR 12.2/90).
Recognizing that an organism’s parts have uses—functions—says nothing about whether their uses or functions are due to a designer’s plan, so Philo’s acknowledgement implies nothing about whether he now accepts the design hypothesis. In fact, what he says here reiterates his position in Part 8, that function alone is no proof of divine design:
it is in vain … to insist on the uses of the parts of animals or vegetables and their curious adjustment to each other. I would fain know how an animal could subsist, unless its parts were so adjusted? (DCNR 8.9/61)
No one should deny design in this sense, so long as they do so “without any religious purpose” (DCNR 12.2/90). Far from reversing himself, then, Philo’s position is continuous with the line he has taken throughout the Dialogues.
As the conversation continues, Philo provides a diagnosis of the dispute. While the works of nature do bear “a great analogy” to the products of human artifice, as its proponents claim, there are also considerable differences. He suspects that this may be the source of the intractability of the controversy, which suggests that it may be at bottom “somewhat of a dispute of words” (DCNR 12.6/92).
But verbal disputes can be resolved—or dissolved—by providing clear definitions. However, the dilemma about the content of our idea of God that Philo has constructed clearly implies that such a constructive solution is not possible here.
Philo explains why only a critical solution is possible by offering a deeper diagnosis of the problem. Although the dispute may appear to be merely verbal, it is in fact “still more incurably ambiguous”, for
there is a species of controversy, which, from the very nature of language and of human ideas, is involved in perpetual ambiguity, and can never, by any precaution or any definitions, be able to reach a reasonable certainty or precision. These are the controversies concerning the degrees of any quality or circumstance. (DCNR 12.7/92)
This is exactly what the dispute over intelligent design is about. Analogies are always matters of degree, and the degrees of the qualities involved in the design argument aren’t capable of exact measurement. The controversy thus “admits not of any precise meaning, nor consequently of any determination” (DCNR 12.7/93). The dispute about design is actually worse than a verbal dispute.
That is why anyone, even an atheist, can say, with equal plausibility, that “the rotting of a turnip, the generation of an animal, and the structure of human thought” all “probably bear some remote analogy to each other” (DCNR 12.7/93). That is why Philo, without renouncing any of his previous claims, can assent to the “somewhat ambiguous, at least undefined”, and, as we have seen, indefinable proposition into which
the whole of natural theology … resolves itself … that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence. (DCNR 12.33/101)
Anything is like anything else in some remote respect. So the ordering principle of the universe, if indeed there is one, can be absolutely anything.
If this is all there is to “the whole of natural theology”, then we can certainly conclude that the argument’s conclusion has no religiously significant content. But it has no religiously significant content because Philo’s critique has drained it of any content whatsoever. Cleanthes’ design hypothesis is not just false; it is unintelligible.
The conversation began with all three participants agreeing that their topic was to discuss only God’s nature, not his existence. As it concludes, it is no longer clear that these questions are really so distinct as originally assumed. We don’t know what we’re talking about when we talk about a God whose nature is inconceivable, incomprehensible, indeterminate, and indefinable. What, then, are we to make of the claim about his existence?
The Dialogues draw out the consequences of Hume’s statement, in the first Enquiry, that
the idea of God, as meaning an infinitely intelligent, wise, and good Being, arises from reflecting on the operations of our own mind, and augmenting, without limit, those qualities of goodness and wisdom. (EHU 2.6/19)
If we insist on “augmenting without limit”, we let loose the moorings that give intelligible content to God’s intelligence, wisdom, and goodness. If we stop short of the limit, we may have content, but we have also lost God.
The standard critical edition of Hume’s philosophical writings is The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume, currently in progress. The General Editors are Tom L. Beauchamp, the late David Fate Norton, and the late M.A. Stewart. The following volumes, in order of publication, are now in print:
- An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.
- An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom. L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1999.
- A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
- A Dissertation on the Passions and The Natural History of Religion, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007.
- Essays, Moral, Political, and Literary, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp and Mark A. Box, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2021.
Oxford is also simultaneously keeping these two long-familiar editions of the Treatise and the Enquiries in print, in order to “ensure their continued availability”:
- [T] A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd ed. revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. Page references in this entry are to this edition. [It also contains Hume’s “Abstract” of the Treatise. Abbreviated [Abstract], with paragraph references also to this edition.]
- [EHU] An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, and [EPM] An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals. Both are contained in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition, revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. Page references in this entry are to this edition.
Other Works by Hume
- The Letters of David Hume, edited by J.Y.T. Grieg, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1932. [HL]
- “My Own Life” (Hume’s Autobiographical Essay), in HL 1–7].
- New Letters of David Hume, edited by Raymond Klibansky and Ernest C. Mossner, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954.
- Further Letters of David Hume, edited by Felix Waldman, Edinburgh: Edinburgh Bibliographical Society, 2014.
- Dialogues concerning Natural Religion, edited by Dorothy Coleman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Abbreviated [DCNR], wirth page references to this edition.]
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Thanks to the late Annette Baier, and to Arthur Morton and David Owen, for their assistance. The editors thank Sally Ferguson for notifying us of a number of typographical errors.