International Distributive Justice

First published Thu Oct 24, 2013; substantive revision Mon May 4, 2020

International distributive justice has, in the past several decades, become a prominent topic within political philosophy. Philosophers have, of course, long been concerned with wealth and poverty, and with how economic inequalities between persons might be justified. They have, however, tended to focus only upon inequalities between inhabitants of the same state. In recent years, though, a sustained philosophical dialogue has emerged on how these ideas might be applied to the relationships and institutions holding at the global level. This dialogue has been prompted by issues of philosophy, but also by the realities of globalization and global poverty; in a world as connected as our own, is it justifiable that some have so much while others have so little?

This entry is an introduction to the development of this dialogue. It is, perhaps, appropriate to start with some limitations. This entry will discuss only the distributive aspects of international justice, rather than on all aspects of international relations and institutions that might be morally important. Philosophical discussion of global justice has become sufficiently rich and complex that it is no longer possible to discuss all the various threads of this discussion in one entry (see Chatterjee [2011] for a more encyclopedic discussion of the various debates within global justice). This entry will, accordingly, pass over such important topics as fairness in trade (Risse & Wollner 2019; James 2012; Wenar 2010; Kurjanska & Risse 2008); immigration (Blake forthcoming; D. Miller, 2016; Carens 2013; Wellman & Cole 2011; Carens 1987 [1995]); and gender (Kristof & WuDunn 2009; Jaggar 2005; Nussbaum 2000). The fact that we do not discuss these topics should not be read as implying their irrelevance; on the contrary, they are enormously important for any adequate theory of global justice, and deserve more attention than we can provide here. This entry will, moreover, discuss writings primarily within the tradition of liberal egalitarianism. Thinkers of a radical or a Marxist bent have had things to say about international justice, too, but these writings are here largely ignored (see Kohn 2010, Humphrey 2010, and Goto-Jones 2010 in Bell 2010, for discussions of these topics). The entry is, finally, focused almost exclusively on fairly recent writings. The reason for this is the simple fact, noted above, that international justice has been a central research topic only in recent years. This is emphatically not to say that less recent philosophers have not had important things to say about international justice: Immanuel Kant’s idea of a foedus pacificum continues to exert a strong influence over modern philosophical thought, for example, as does Mill’s liberal nationalism (Kant 1795; Mill 1859). The modern period, too, has seen some sustained discussion of global wealth and poverty, most notably in Peter Singer’s discussion of the ethics of global famine relief (Singer 1972; see also Singer 2002). Nevertheless, the modern dialogue about international distributive justice can be largely traced to the initial publication of John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice in 1971, and the prehistory of these ideas can be largely omitted in the present context.

1. Early Cosmopolitanism

We can begin, then, with John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice. The influence of this work on modern political philosophy can hardly be overstated. It shifted the assumptions with which political philosophers have operated—in part by resuscitating the social contract tradition, and in part by giving a sustained and analytically robust argument regarding the injustice of particular forms of economic inequality. A full analysis of Rawls’s work is beyond the scope of this entry; readers can see the related entries in this encyclopedia for more detail. Rawls introduces two principles of justice, which he argues represent the principles of justice we would accept as governing the “basic structure” of our society were we to bargain with one another under fair conditions. These principles of justice include those addressing political justice, and with what fairness would demand of the rules allocating persons to positions within the basic structure; they also include principles designed to evaluate the justice of particular forms of material inequality. In particular, the only inequalities of “primary goods” that could be justified are those that can be shown to be to the advantage of the least advantaged representative position. This idea—called the difference principle—represents a significant constraint on the exercise of the market, in that individuals are no longer entitled to obtain whatever share of resources their talents might obtain in a standard capitalist model of the labor market.

It is not part of our current project to criticize or defend the difference principle. We are, instead, simply going to highlight two facts about this principle. The first is that the principle does seem to place a significant constraint on the types and degrees of inequality that might be justifiable. The difference principle requires that all such inequalities of social primary goods must be justifiable to the representative worst-off party within society; appeals to utility, or to efficiency, or to other forms of social value simply will not suffice. The second thing to note is that this principle is taken by its author to apply only within the context of the domestic state. Rawls is explicit, in his theory, that his principles should be taken as only describing the nature of justice within the political society represented by a territorial state. When Rawls does deal with the issue of international justice, it is in a manner markedly less reformist than that with which he approaches domestic justice. Rawls argues that a just international regime would involve states agreeing to treat one another fairly in their mutual interaction—but that this fairness would not involve any sort of distributive consideration, or demand for economic justice. Indeed, Rawls argues that the principles to which states would agree would largely resemble those found in contemporary twentieth century international law. In contrast with the radical (or at least surprising) conclusions drawn domestically, Rawls argues that in international justice, there would be “no surprises” in the principles we ought to select (Rawls 1971: 378).

This difference in treatment between the domestic and the international context was immediately troubling to many philosophers. One way of highlighting this is by noting the apparent contradiction between the universalism of Rawls’s moral theory and the localism of its realm of application. The first argues that what is morally arbitrary should not be taken as legitimately grounding an inequality of wealth or income. If liberalism means anything, after all, it means an aversion to inherited caste privilege and other forms of feudal birthright privilege (Carens 1992). The second, however, applies this universal guarantee only within the very local context of the nation-state, ignoring the fact that membership in that state was, itself, morally arbitrary. The net result was, for many commentators, a sort of internal inconsistency in Rawls’s theory; if Rawls was to regard income inequality above that permitted by the difference principle as unjust, he should do so in a thoroughgoing way, and condemn the inequalities between the wealthy and the impoverished internationally (see Pogge 1989, 1992, 1994; Beitz 1979a,b, 1983; Scanlon 1973).

Rawls can, on this account, be taken as the originator of the modern dialogue on global distributive justice—not because he was the first to speak out against international inequality, but because he did not do so. Many of those who first did speak about international inequality, though, used Rawlsian ideas and concepts in their arguments. We can therefore proceed to examine some representative arguments used by these thinkers, to see how their cases were constructed.

Many initial commentators on Rawls’s work argued that the proper interpretation of Rawls’s principles was one in which the difference principle was applied at the global level. These authors are often referred to as “cosmopolitans”; this term, however, is often less than illuminating (see the accompanying entry on cosmopolitanism for more detail). We will instead refer to these authors as Left Institutionalists, for reasons we hope will become clear. Left Institutionalists agree on the following conclusion: that Rawls’s own limitation of his two principles of justice to the circumstances of a domestic society was a morally illegitimate constraint on his theory, so that a consistent liberalism taking off from Rawls’s arguments must apply its liberal principles at the global level—and, therefore, the well-being of the worst-off representative member of the global society, rather than the domestic, ought to be our starting-point for the justification of inequality. In this way, liberalism is made coherent with its ideals; rather than seeking some arbitrary fact to serve as a limitation on the liberal theory of justice, the cosmopolitans argue that we ought to live up to the globalism inherent in liberalism’s self-understanding. See, for instance, Thomas Pogge’s analysis of liberalism’s domestic focus:

Nationality is just one further deep contingency (like genetic endowment, race, gender, and social class), one more potential basis of institutional inequalities that are inescapable and present from birth. Within Rawls’s conception, there is no reason to treat this case differently from the others. And so it would seem that we can justify our global institutional order only if we can show that the institutional inequalities it produces tend to optimize (against the backdrop of feasible alternative global regimes) the worst social position. (Pogge 1989: 247)

Rawls, of course, had reasons to resist this interpretation of his work. His own view—made more explicit in his The Law of Peoples (1993), but present even in A Theory of Justice—is that what counts as justice within a given context must make reference to what that context is, and how we should understand its function and its rules. Thus, Rawls argues that his theory does not have application to such private institutions as churches or universities; it is only to be applied to the basic structure of a society—which is understood by Rawls as the major social institutions, and the ways in which they structure the rules of association and allocate the advantages of cooperation (Rawls 1971: 7). The first task of the cosmopolitan, then, is to analyze the notion of the basic structure, and demonstrate that such an entity is found internationally as well as domestically. Charles Beitz and Thomas Pogge both argue that the modern system of international trade has all the indicia given by Rawls to explain what makes the basic structure so central: international institutions allocate the advantages of trade, and their rules set the basic framework for the specific interactions taken among international agents. They argue, in short, that the international institutional set is indeed akin to a basic structure, in that this set is a site of cooperation, to which the principles of justice given in A Theory of Justice ought to apply. As Beitz has it:

[I]f evidence of global economic and political interdependence shows the existence of a global scheme of social cooperation, we should not view national boundaries as having fundamental moral significance. Since boundaries are not coextensive with the scope of social cooperation, they do not mark the limits of social obligation. Thus the parties to the original position cannot be assumed to know that they are members of a particular national society, choosing principles of justice primarily for that society. The veil of ignorance must extend to all matters of national citizenship, and the principles chosen will therefore apply globally. (Beitz 1979b: 151)

Rawlsian principles must therefore apply to the set of persons in the world as a whole, so that global institutions should be arranged to maximize the expectations of the globally worst-off representative individual.

The early Rawlsian cosmopolitans were enormously influential, and can be credited with forcing the attention of the philosophical community towards the issue of global underdevelopment and inequality. The theories, of course, were subject to enormous criticism, and Rawls himself rejected their conclusions, as we shall see. For the moment, we might note only that many theorists were skeptical of the conclusion that Rawls’s principles could apply as easily to the global community as to the domestic community. Two strands of criticism here deserve note: the first begins with coercion, and the second with the issue of nationality.

Some thinkers, then, have questioned whether or not the simple act of exchanging goods—even a great many goods—places people in a relationship that is morally akin to that shared by people who are liable to the same territorial state. Something like this point was noticed early by Brian Barry, who notes that

[T]rade, however multilateral, does not constitute a cooperative scheme of the relevant kind. Trade, if freely undertaken, is (presumably) beneficial to the exchanging parties, but it is not, it seems to me, the kind of relationship giving rise to duties of fair play.…Trade in pottery, ornamentation, and weapons can be traced back to prehistoric times, but we would hardly feel inclined to think of, say, the Beaker Folk as forming a single cooperative enterprise with their trading partners. No more did the spice trade unite East and West. (Barry 1982: 233)

Barry’s intuition, here, is that there seems to be something normatively distinct between what is shared by trading partners and what is felt by fellow citizens. One way of noticing this is to notice that some cosmopolitans sought to sever the distributive component of Rawls’s theory from the other aspects of that theory—in particular, from the parts of the theory dealing with political rights and political justification. There is, of course, a reason for this dismembering: there is, internationally, no polity, and the very concept of having (for example) democratic rights within that polity might seem misplaced. But many have thought that something has been missed that is morally relevant, and that we might better regard Rawls’s distributive conclusions and his political conclusions as more tightly linked than that. Some thinkers, in particular, have argued that Rawls’s conclusions are best read as principles intended to justify the coercive acts of a territorial state, rather than as principles applicable to cooperative ventures more generally (Blake 2001, 2013; Nagel 2005). These theorists have suggested that the state stands in need of justification, and that the justification we offer makes distributive principles applicable here—but not everywhere.

The other critical strand we wish to highlight began with the notion of nationality. The idea here is that the relationships that are most central to human flourishing and human creativity are always specific relationships, with specific persons and with specific cultural contexts. As such, the use of abstract principles like Rawls’s to determine what we owe to one another generally is either suspect or outright self-destructive. This critical posture, of course, can end up being a criticism of the liberal project itself (see Sandel 1982). But it can also end up being a simple criticism of the attempt to do justice without looking at the messiness of nations, of cultures, and of communities. These latter entities, it might be felt, are in need of support—and, in particular, are in need of support by individuals who are taken as duty-bound to prefer the good of that community to the abstract rights of foreign citizens (D. Miller 1995; Kymlicka 1995a). What is missed in the cosmopolitan argument, on this account, is not the presence of the coercive state, but the presence of the cultural nation. The nationalists, it should be noted, are not hostile to all notions of global justice; they are, instead, committed only to the relatively modest conclusion that nationality has some moral relevance—and that the principles of distributive justice that are right within the nation may not be right at the global level (D. Miller 2007).

There are a variety of ways of arguing for such a conclusion. Some theorists begin with dissatisfaction at the deracinated and abstract forms of philosophy practiced by cosmopolitans (Walzer 1983). Some theorists begin with the need for communities to preserve themselves, if they are to provide individuals with the goods needed to live decent lives (MacIntyre 1984). More generally, these theorists argue that the needs of community are such that the cosmopolitan does damage to what is needed by actual humans, by considering individuals without considering the communities within which they live:

[P]atriotism requires me to exhibit peculiar devotion to my nation and you to yours. It requires me to regard such contingent social facts as where I was born and what government ruled over that place at that time, who my parents were, who my great-grandparents were, and so on, as deciding for me what the question of virtuous action is—at least insofar as it is the virtue of patriotism which is in question. Hence the moral standpoint and the patriotic standpoint are systematically incompatible. (MacIntyre 1984: 5)

Both of these criticisms seem, to some degree, to be accepted by Rawls himself, in his fuller explanation of his own international theory in The Law of Peoples. Rawls is more explicit in this work—as he is in his 1993 volume Political Liberalism—that he takes the political dimension of the state as of primary importance, and that his principles of justice apply only within the state for that reason. He is, further, more explicit about his debt to the liberal nationalist idea in this volume, writing approvingly that these ideas help guide his vision of a just international regime. We may, then, proceed to examine Rawls’s Law of Peoples directly.

2. Justice and Particularity

The trend towards greater and more sophisticated theorizing about international justice was both exemplified and encouraged by the publication of Rawls’ The Law of Peoples. This work—an extensive elaboration and revision of an earlier essay (Rawls 1993b)—discusses and, has influenced the subsequent discussion of, a variety of issues of international and global import, including and especially the obligations of distributive justice in the international realm. Before we turn to Rawls’s account of international distributive justice, we should acknowledge some salient features of how he conceives of his project. Rawls’ perspective is unabashedly international rather than global. Unlike the early cosmopolitans who conceive of the world as a single cooperative unit and seek a single principle of distributive justice to govern everyone, Rawls explicitly seeks principles that will regulate the interactions among territorially defined political, corporate agents that have a monopoly on the legitimate use of force, called peoples—and, only indirectly, govern individuals (Rawls 1999a: 6).

Second, and partly as a consequence of this conceptualization of international justice, Rawls does not attempt to derive complete principles of international and global justice. Rather, he describes principles that ought to regulate the foreign policy of a liberal people (Rawls 1999a: 9–10). Thus, when Rawls says, for example, that some non-democratic peoples are sufficiently well-ordered to be worthy of full membership in the society of peoples, he is arguing that democratic peoples may not use political power or pressure to change them—not that non-democratic but well-ordered peoples are ideal or beyond moral criticism. Furthermore, he argues that the ideal case of international justice is a world composed entirely of well-ordered peoples whose interactions are governed by a set of moral principles. The account is then extended to cover various non-ideal cases: societies burdened by poverty and failing institutions or rogue states that wage aggressive war. What constitutes a minimally just or well-ordered people is a matter of immense controversy, but the broader conceptual point is unchanged: Rawls conceives of international justice as being ideally about the interactions of morally justified, centralized territorial polities.

Third, his account of the law of peoples is constrained by the need that it describe a “realistic utopia” (Rawls 1999a: 11–12) that follows Rousseau’s dictum to take “people as they are and laws as they might be”. As a consequence, there are at least three distinct instances where Rawls appeals to empirical facts as a way of “realistically” grounding particular normative claims. First, an international system composed of well-ordered peoples with representative governments will be peaceful (1999a: 44–54); second, issues beginning with cultural diversity, geographic distance, and linguistic pluralism combine to make a world state fundamentally unworkable (1999a: 36); and, lastly, the primary causal component of national wealth and prosperity is the political culture and the corresponding effectiveness of their political institutions (1999a: 108–110).

With the above normative and descriptive picture in view, Rawls presents a provisional list of principles that peoples could reasonably endorse:

  1. Peoples are free and independent, and their freedom and independence are to be respected by other peoples.
  2. Peoples are to observe treaties and undertakings.
  3. Peoples are equal and are parties to the agreements that bind them.
  4. Peoples are to observe a duty of non-intervention.
  5. Peoples have the right of self-defense but no right to instigate war for reasons other than self-defense.
  6. Peoples are to honor human rights.
  7. Peoples are to observe certain specified restrictions in the conduct of war.
  8. Peoples have a duty to assist other peoples living under unfavorable conditions that prevent their having a just or decent political and social regime. (Rawls 1999a: 37)

Notably absent from this list is the difference principle or anything like it. When deciding on these principles, peoples do not know how big, rich, prosperous, or powerful they will be. Yet, unlike individuals in the first original position, the peoples represented in this international original position will not demand that material inequalities among them be justified with reference to the expectations of the least well-off. The peoples in the second original position know that they have sufficient resources to be well-ordered, and they need no more. So, in the ideal case, where international society is fully composed of well-ordered states that follow the law of peoples, there are no distributive requirements at all. Some peoples may be very rich and others quite poor and, correspondingly, there could be large differences in wealth among individuals of different countries, but there is no principled reason—on Rawls’ view—to find that objectionable.

The Law of Peoples does include some elements that constrain inequality—or, at least, poverty. We shall mention three. First, inequalities that undermine the instantiation, enforcement, and maintenance of other principles will violate the Law of Peoples:

The Law of Peoples, on the other hand, holds that inequalities are not always unjust, and that when they are, it is because of their unjust effects on the basic structure of the Society of Peoples, and on relations among peoples and among their members. (Rawls 1999a: 113)

Thus, if one could show that a deep material inequality among peoples undermined their ability to, say, be considered equals in the negotiation of treaties or tempted peoples to inappropriately intervene in the domestic affairs of other peoples, then that would be a reason—from the standpoint of international justice—for eliminating that inequality. However, this principle must be moderated in light of Rawls suggestions that both poor and rich well-ordered peoples will be “satisfied” with their political and economic position within the Society of Peoples (Rawls 1999a: 27–30), and that the most important determinant of wealth is the political culture and institutions of a people. Well-ordered peoples—rich or poor—will generally act according to the principles that make up the law of peoples and even poor peoples will have fairly strong political institutions, so Rawls would argue that it is unlikely that mere inequality will be a problem among well-ordered states.

Second, all members of the Society of Peoples must respect human rights that guarantee that every person, regardless of society, a minimum level of material prosperity and physical security, though this minimum level will fall far short of distributive equality (Rawls 1999a: 65).

Third, Rawls writes:

Burdened societies, while they are not expansive or aggressive, lack the political and cultural traditions, the human capital and know-how, and, often, the material and technological resources needed to be well-ordered. The long term goal of (relatively) well-ordered societies should be to bring burdened societies, like outlaw states, into the Society of well-ordered Peoples. Well-ordered peoples have a duty to assist burdened societies. (Rawls 1999a: 106)

Some societies are sufficiently poor or have sufficiently weak institutions that they are unable to become and remain well-ordered on their own. In those cases, the Society of Peoples must produce the material, human, and institutional support to help these burdened societies become minimally just. This could very well include some wealth transfers from richer nations to burdened ones, but Rawls is skeptical that this will be the primary tool of assistance.

It is important to see that the duty of assistance to burdened societies is structurally dissimilar to the difference principle. First, the difference principle is meant to continuously apply, via the basic structure, to the flow of social and economic interactions, but the duty of assistance has a target and a cutoff point: once all societies are well-ordered, no people has any further obligation to distribute resources to burdened nations. Second, while the difference principle is explicitly about the distribution of primary goods, the duty of assistance might, in the end, have very little to do with actual wealth; burdened societies might be quite wealthy in terms of resources, but have failing or deeply embedded non well-ordered institutions while well-ordered nations may be quite poor. Furthermore, when confronted with consistently failing institutions, well-ordered peoples might conceivably discharge their obligations as much through the provision of technical know-how, information, and institutional assistance—rather than through than financial support.

Rawls thus argues for a two-tiered theory of distributive justice. The respect for the free and equal status of each citizen in domestic context demands an egalitarian distribution of primary goods, but equality in the international context requires that each person find themselves in a well-ordered people and that those peoples are respected within international society. Economic inequalities are inherently problematic—and require justification—at the domestic level but not at the international. In other words, the distributive outcomes of international trade and the global economy are only indirectly relevant to international justice.

But why this strong distinction between domestic and international? Rawls’s response has several themes. First, Rawls suggests that limitations on distributive justice are a consequence of tolerating and respecting the economic decisions of peoples (Rawls 1999a: 117–118). Insofar as peoples are well-ordered, they have made decisions about savings rates, education, and population policy that essentially determine national prosperity, and it would be disrespectful of the decisions made by richer and poorer nations—who presumably adopted these policies for what they took to be good reasons—to require one people to compensate another. This argument is especially controversial because Rawls argues that non-democratic “decent consultation hierarchies” are well-ordered and ought to be accepted into the ranks of the Society of Peoples (Rawls 1999a: 62–78). This leaves open the possibility that individuals will become impoverished as a consequence of public policies and choices that they had no hand in deciding. Kok Chor Tan, for example, has argued that Rawls has improperly stretched his argument for toleration of reasonable, but illiberal, comprehensive doctrines within a generally liberal political culture into an argument for respecting illiberal political cultures (Tan 1998).

Rawls further seems to suggest that the “basic structure” of international realm is quite different from the basic structure of the domestic state. In the domestic case, the basic structure is composed of powerful and effective institutions to which the principles of justice apply. In the international case, Rawls suggests that the basic structure simply is the principles by which well-ordered peoples govern themselves—there are no institutions distinct from the acts and decisions of the peoples themselves. In other words, the interactions among peoples are not—and need not be—regulated by a robust set of political, economic, and social institutions that would constitute an independent basic structure. As a consequence of this lack of an international basic structure, Rawls argues that the moral objections to inequality in the domestic case do not apply (Rawls 1999a: 114–115). Inequality among individuals of different peoples does not, for example, undermine the fair value of the political liberties or fair equality of opportunity, since they are not co-members of economic and political systems, and peoples will treat other peoples as equals insofar as they are well-ordered and reasonable. Since the political culture and institutions of a people are primary cause of wealth and its distribution, the criterion of reciprocity does not demand equal distributive shares among members of different polities.

Rawls’s arguments should not be taken as a defense of the status quo in international relations. Many states—especially authoritarian, weak, and failing ones—are not well-ordered, and the principles informing current foreign policies are not those described in The Law of Peoples. Neither Rawls nor his critics would defend the justice of the world today. The theoretical difference between these perspectives, though, is profound. The real point of dispute between them is this: once well-ordered nations have ensured that every person lives in a well-ordered state and are thereby guaranteed certain minimum protections against starvation and poverty, does the international order represent a basic structure of the right type, and robustness, so that the fact that some peoples are much wealthier than others ought to be considered an affront to justice? Rawls himself will answer in the negative, while his critics will answer in the affirmative.

3. Varieties of Institutionalism

Despite the fact that almost no element of The Law of Peoples has escaped controversy, it served as a well-spring of additional theorizing (see generally Martin & Reidy 2006) and has structured the subsequent debate concerning international distributive justice. Rawls’s two-tiered account strongly influenced those theorists who were unsatisfied with both cosmopolitan and nationalist accounts of distributive justice. Much of the ensuing discussion has pitted two groups of theorists who both purport to be building upon what they take to be the key insights of Rawls’s view. One group—we will call them right institutionalists—has followed the general contours of Rawls’s two-tiered account, developing more detailed accounts of why we should sharply distinguish between the international and domestic. They aim to justify Rawls’s fundamental position that egalitarian distributive justice only operates at the state level, even if they disagree with Rawls as to the rationale. Left institutionalists, on the other hand, have argued that international politics is characterized by a sufficiently robust set of institutions, such that they “trigger” principles of distributive justice that are more robust and that, pace the duty of assistance, operate directly on the distributive consequences of international economic regimes. As a consequence, left institutionalists generally argue for more robust distributive obligations and more radical institutional changes than right institutionalists even though the extent and nature of those obligations varies from thinker to thinker.

Before we go deeper into the divide between left and right institutionalism, it’s important to note what the two sides agree on and to see where the actual disagreements between the two sides lie. The important point of agreement lies in their mutual focus on institutions or rule-governed practices as the trigger of genuinely egalitarian distributive obligations. Both right and left institutionalists accept that principles of distributive justice only apply or are activated in particular institutional contexts or when people mutually participate in practices that are relevant to distribution. So, both right and left institutionalists would deny that we have obligations of distributive justice to, say, the lost city of Atlantis—should it appear—since Atlanteans have not participated with us in shared institutions or practices. In other words, principles of distributive justice apply to, and are activated by, a basic structure that mostly determines the distributive shares the participants receive. Right and left institutionalists disagree, then, concerning which institutions activate obligations of distributive justice among participants.

3.1 The Basic Structure as Coercive Legal System

Right institutionalists have generally adopted Rawls’s two-tiered approach, arguing for a sharp distinction between domestic and international distributive justice. While Rawls himself did not say much about why international politics was so different, much of the subsequent work by right institutionalists has been to find some morally salient feature that distinguishes the domestic from the international which justifies such strong differences in distributive principles in the face of growing globalization, increasing economic interdependence, and strengthening international civil society. In order to do so, right Rawlsians have argued that the international and domestic realms differ fundamentally in terms of political structure. Kenneth Waltz describes the difference nicely:

The parts of domestic political systems stand in relations of super- and subordination. Some are entitled to command; others are required to obey. Domestic systems are centralized and hierarchic. The parts of the international-political systems stand in relations of cooperation. Formally, each is the equal of all the others. None is entitled to command; none is required to obey. International structures are decentralized and anarchic. (Waltz 1979: 88)

More specifically, domestic politics is characterized by the existence of a superior political authority that claims—and possesses—sovereign judicial, legislative, and executive powers. No such shared, coercive legal system exists in the international realm. Since the world state is, at best, a distant possibility, this is unlikely to change. Domestic legal systems define the very terms of economic activity and represent a kind of fundamental political power over individuals. Samuel Freeman writes:

When Rawls says that the political constitution is part of the basic structure, he does not just mean the procedures that specify how laws are enacted and that define offices and positions of political authority. He means more or less the entire legal system, including most public and private law, that is the product of the constitution in this procedural sense. Modern legal systems, such as the federal system of the United States, are made up of countless acts of legislation, administration, judicial precedent, and other legal rulings that are issued by multiple legal bodies with lawmaking authority. An economic system that is regulated by the legal norms that are issued by the political constitutions is also part of the basic structure. Here, of course, the legal norms of property, contract, commercial law, intangibles, and so on that are essential for economic production and exchange are to be included in the basic structure. What makes possible the incredibly complicated system of legal norms that underlie production, exchange, and consumption is a unified political system that specifies these norms and revises them to meet changing conditions….Nothing comparable to the basic structure of society exists on the global level. (Freeman 2006: 38–39, emphasis added)

A Canadian citizen—no matter how economically and culturally entwined Canada might with the United States—does not get a vote in American elections, and the Canadian’s economic interactions and relationships are regulated and governed by Canadian, not American, law. As a consequence, the American government lacks “original jurisdiction or effective [or basic] political power” over Canadians. The Canadian citizen lacks the same hierarchical relationship with American political authorities that American citizens have, except under special circumstances are that are themselves negotiated by Canadian and American legal authorities. Different right institutionalists emphasize different elements of the domestic, coercive legal system. Matthias Risse (2006, 2012) and Michael Blake (2001, 2013), for example, emphasize the coercive nature of domestic legal systems. Risse has argued that the pervasiveness and immediacy of the coercion in domestic legal systems makes them fundamentally different from the kinds of interactions that occur at the international level: even international laws call on the powers of the state for their enforcement. Michael Blake, on the other hand, emphasizes how domestic legal systems structure the most basic of economic interactions, make determinate individual rights, and enforce them against abuses of private power. He suggests that egalitarian principles of distributive justice are what justifies the imposition of coercive political authority on autonomous agents. Samuel Freeman argues therefore that the international system—because it lacks the features and powers of a robust legal system—does not constitute “a system of social cooperation” and, therefore, does not invoke Rawls’s “Criterion of Reciprocity” that underlies the difference principle.

Blake, Risse, and Freeman all represent—along with Rawls himself—the moderate wing of right institutionalism. They are united by three claims. First, the presence of a coercive legal system leads to more demanding requirements of egalitarian distributive justice. Second, the international institutions, regimes, and organizations do not constitute a coercive legal system. However, moderates are aware of the many ways in which the international order can make the world hospitable for, or hostile to, well-ordered states. As a consequence, moderates argue for principles of international distributive justice that assist and protect legitimate peoples, with the goal of ensuring that everyone lives within a well-ordered state. International institutions don’t activate principles of justice that apply directly to distributive outcomes of global trade or economic activity. Rather, those principles are activated in the event only insofar as member polities (peoples, states, and the like) fail in their own distributive requirements (such as when peoples fail to prevent severe poverty, violating the human rights of their citizens) or need assistance. Moderate Right Institutionalists share, then, Rawls’s indirect account of international distributive justice, justifying the two-tiered account by appeal to the necessary relationship between the co-membership in a coercive legal system and distributive justice.

More extreme right institutionalists, most vividly represented by Thomas Nagel in his article “The Problem of Global Justice”, (2005) argue that the lack of an international legal system with sovereign coercive authority does not simply undermine claims of egalitarian distributive justice; it undermines all claims of justice outside the state. So, Nagel accepts the first two claims of the moderates but suggests that together they imply that justice is chimerical in the anarchic realm of international politics. He does accept that we have moral obligations to prevent people from starving, being assaulted, or murdered, but these are obligations of a universal “humanitarianism”. Justice, for Nagel, is a moral value that is necessarily indexed to coercive institutions, as coercive institutions are necessary for large-scale social coordination and cooperation. Claims of distributive justice only apply to those institutions that engage in such large-scale economic coordination, do so coercively, and do so in the name of the individuals coerced. For Nagel, that last part is essential: the answer to the question, “Why do we owe someone equal distributive shares (or equal consideration in light of the difference principle)?” is “We structure their economic lives through coercive political institutions in their name”. Co-citizens have their wills invoked as shared participants in the creation of distributively relevant public policy, and this invocation gives rise to egalitarianism. Since the international realm is characterized by institutions that do not invoke the wills of those involved as a justification of coercion, justice simply fails to apply to that realm.

Both the extreme and moderate versions of right institutionalism have been criticized, broadly, on two fronts. First, some have argued that the right institutionalist focus on coercion has been misguided. If we strip away coercive institutions, or were somehow able to make coercive institutions non-coercive, but retained the various regimes of economic cooperation, we would still have obligations of distributive justice. We will turn to these arguments in section 4.1. The second objection is an internal critique that denies their second shared claim. On this objection, the international realm is a coercive legal system and thereby activates principles of distributive justice akin to those in the domestic arena. Right institutionalism depends on the coercive nature of domestic politics being different from that of international politics. Those who argue against it thereby try to close the gap by pointing out the many ways in which coercion is deployed internationally. Cohen and Sabel (2006) argue that the collective activities of various states have created an international organization (the World Trade Organization [WTO]) that can essentially issue coercive threats: follow WTO or suffer impoverishment as a consequence of being denied access to global markets. They write:

Still, it might be said that any complaint against global rule-making bodies should really be directed against the state for accepting their [the World Trade Organization] directives…But this point seems almost facetious. Opting out is not a real option (the WTO is a “take it or leave it” arrangement without even the formal option of picking and choosing which parts to comply with), and given that it is not, and that everyone knows that it is not, there is a direct rule-making relationship between the global bodies and the citizens of different states. (Cohen & Sabel 2006: 168)

Eric Cavallero (2010), on the other hand, argues that the international system is coercive in a much more direct way: Great Powers (including and especially the United States) coercively enforce international norms of property by invading or covertly deposing nations that misbehave. Arash Abizadeh (2007) has emphasized the coercion inherent in the maintenance of borders and territorial integrity, especially in response to immigration. If states claim the right to determine who enters their territory, then they place themselves in the position of coercing non-citizens in virtue of the methods they use to prevent those who wish to cross their borders from doing so. Mirian Ronzoni (2009) argues that the existence of a global basic structure isn’t the right target for our theorizing; we ought to focus instead on whether such a basic structure should be brought into being in virtue of how states exercise their power over each other. Laura Valentini (2011), finally, argues that the distinct forms of coercion present at the global level give rise to distinct forms of moral principles; neither statists nor cosmopolitans, she argues, have been able to look at the global realm as its own site of coercion, with the result that a “third way” between statism and cosmopolitanism must be developed. In each case, the structure of the objection is quite similar: states coerce via invasion and espionage, via collective action through international institutions, and via border maintenance, therefore the international system is coercive in nature and, thus, appropriately calls for egalitarian distributive justice.

These objections have forced right institutionalists to become more attentive to the ways in which coercive contexts can be different. As a consequence, the responses to these objections will be complex. For example, it is clear that a state requiring a citizen to purchase health insurance, stopping a non-citizen at the border, or using a covert paramilitary organization to topple an unfriendly regime are all examples of coercion, but are they all the same type of coercion and do they all subsequently demand the same normative response? Furthermore, should we evaluate these coercive activities in their current form—where the international world is populated by rogue states, failed and failing states, and burdened societies—or should we evaluate these coercive activities based on how they would operate with a genuine Society of Peoples? At any rate, the debate is ongoing as right institutionalists are pushed by these objections to create more sophisticated accounts of coercion and to consider coercion is more specific contexts (see Blake 2011; Valentini, 2011).

3.2 The Basic Structure as Cooperative Interdependence

Left institutionalists are distinguished from right institutionalists in three ways. First, left institutionalists tend to argue for more robust distributive obligations that operate directly on the institutions that characterize international politics. Second, they tend to reject a strongly bifurcated view of the differences between international and domestic justice, some arguing that there is no difference, others arguing that there are many institutional contexts that give rise to distributive obligations, and still others claiming that domestic and international institutional contexts, and their corresponding principles of distributive justice, operate on a smooth continuum. Lastly, and perhaps most importantly, left institutionalists reject the right institutionalist emphasis on coercion in activating claims of distributive justice. To the contrary, left institutionalists typically characterize the basic structure in terms of cooperation, the provision of basic goods, or economic interdependence (Sangiovanni 2007: 19–20).

We have already examined some early left institutionalist responses above. We will, here, consider some more recent extensions of the view. These thinkers generally accept that the state—with its coercive legal apparatus—gives rise to especially stringent demands of distributive justice. However, they argue that the nature of the global economic system also gives rise to robust distributive obligations. These distributive obligations arise directly in virtue of the institutional features of the global economic system irrespective of their effects on domestic justice. What differentiates them from the early, more radical left institutionalist thinkers, is that they recognize and accept that distinct norms of egalitarian concern might be appropriate in the domestic and global contexts. Moderate left institutionalists then accept with Rawls a two-tiered account of global justice; they differ from right institutionalists (and from Rawls) in arguing that distinct norms of distributive justice apply to individuals at the global level.

Moderate left institutionalists generally present some view as to what activates these distributive obligations. Darrell Moellendorf (2011), for example, offers the following, jointly sufficient criteria:

The version of membership dependence that I affirm is based upon what I term the principle of associational justice. The idea is that duties of social justice exist between persons who have a moral duty of equal respect to one another if those persons are co-members in an association that is (1) relatively strong, (2) largely nonvoluntary, (3) constitutive of a significant part of the background rules for the various relationships of their public lives, and (4) governed by norms that can be subject to human control. (2011: 537)

Cohen and Sabel (2006) have offered three distinct principles by which these distributive duties might be justified. Andrea Sangiovanni (2007), despite the fact that his view has much in common with right institutionalisn, presents a left-oriented view because his account of international distributive justice is both non-coercive and direct:

I will argue that equality is a relational ideal of reciprocity among those who support and maintain the state’s capacity to provide the basic collective goods necessary to protect us from physical attack and to maintain a stable system of property rights and entitlements. (Sangiovanni 2007: 19–20)

These views can all be used to directly evaluate global inequalities. However, unlike the more extreme left institutionalism of early Beitz and Pogge, each view produces comparatively less egalitarian results at the global level. Moellendorf argues that, even though both the global economic system and the state satisfy all four criteria, the former activates obligations of “reciprocity” while the latter activates the obligations of “inclusive and equal citizenship”. Cohen and Sabel argue that the state requires liberal egalitarianism while international institutions create obligations of “inclusion”. In both cases, the obligations at the global level are less robust than at the domestic. Similarly, Sangiovanni argues that the provision of collective goods generates an obligation of reciprocity, understood as egalitarian shares. The global economic system gives rise to distributive obligations, but the scope of the obligation is limited to the public goods produced by the system itself, in the event it comes to produce them (whether it currently does so is a matter of controversy). This means that Sangiovanni’s account could be indifferent to considerable inequality among citizens of different countries as long as reciprocity held within each country and obtained in the contribution to a system of physical and economic rights made by the international system. What is important to note about moderate left institutionalism, and what distinguishes it from the more extreme version, is that moderates seek robust principles of distributive justice that apply to the particular domain of the global that are of a piece with the principles of distributive justice domestically but are nonetheless sensitive to the differences between the two domains.

Moderate left institutionalist views are considerably more diverse when compared to moderate right institutionalists: there is no central concept—like coercion—that binds them together. And moderate left institutionalism, as a view that is responsive to the particular features of international institutions, has much to recommend it. However, there are some areas of concern. First, one might worry that many left institutionalist arguments import notions of coercion into their view. Moellendorf makes “non-voluntariness” one of the criteria of distributively relevant institutions, which seems to imply that individuals or states that don’t wish to participate in the global economy will be coerced into doing so, generally by threat of economic catastrophe. Similarly, Cohen and Sabel present their three “weak” non-coercive accounts of when obligations of distributive justice are activated, but their argument that the WTO should invoke norms of inclusion is based—at least partly—on the fact that the WTO can issue coercive threats. Sangiovanni discusses the provision of public goods, which may seem non-coercive, but if these public goods are necessary for even minimally decent lives, then it seems that the threat of their non-provision could very well be a coercive one. To put it another way, is it really the case that economic cooperation through trade—even institutionalized in order to solve coordination problems—is ever enough to invoke norms of distributive justice if there is no chance that that economic cooperation, no matter how unequally distributed, will undermine the possibility of the participants to live decent lives? The worry here is that left institutionalists might be begging the question by covertly assuming that the international system is indeed coercive, will remain coercive even if reformed, and is coercive in precisely way needed to generate obligations of distributive justice. Left institutionalists, therefore, are quite adept at identifying injustices in the international arena, but they are less persuasive at showing that the appropriate normative response to these wrongs is to have the international system be governed by principles of distributive justice. For example, suppose Moellendorf is correct that the WTO wrongly forces an inappropriate development model on weak and failing nations that serves the rich and powerful while undermining the ability of those nations to become democratically well-ordered. Certainly the right response to recognizing this wrong is to have the WTO cease that unjust behavior. It is hard to see why we would need the more robust norm of distributive equality to understand the wrongness of the WTO’s behavior.

3.3 Neo-Republicanism as an Institutionalist Theory

In recent years, the debate about institutions and justice has broadened significantly. Some, as we will discuss in section 4, have begun to question whether institutions are all that significant from the standpoint of justice. Others, however, have begun to expand the toolkit with which global institutions are to be judged. The resurgence of republican thought in recent years has offered an opportunity for thinkers concerned with domination to examine how global institutions might be understood from the standpoint of republican justice. In this section, we will lay out the basic tenets of neo-republicanism and explain the major positions that have been staked out in their application to issues of global concern.

Neo-republicanism (see entry) is a family of views that emphasizes the close connection between justice and a particular kind of freedom. Namely, the purpose of social institutions is to protect us from domination by others and to ensure we can act independently from the wills of others. Unlike freedom from interference, freedom from domination is specifically about the power relation: a slaveowner who could interfere with her slaves but chooses not is still constraining their freedom. In this case, slaves are not free from the will of their owner even if they happen to live their lives mostly without interference. Thus, domination is a worry whenever one agent has superior power over another and can asymmetrically influence the choice situation of the weaker agent. However, it is sometimes, even usually, the case that we cannot eliminate differentials in social position or power, but one can be subject to superior power without being dominated if the exercise of that power is suitably constrained or directed. There is a fair amount of disagreement over the precise nature of these constraints, but neo-republicans have converged on a set of institutional prescriptions that ensure that citizens are not merely subject to power: the rule of law, constitutional protections, democracy, due process, and the provision of a social minimum at the very least. These institutional structures have a two-fold objective. First, they constrain state power such that there is no public domination. Second, they direct state power effectively towards its justificatory purpose: governing the relations between citizens such that there is no private domination. These purposes can only be achieved within a republican constitutional order and so freedom is only possible in the state. This is, perhaps, the key idea behind republicanism: we do not give up freedom in order to achieve the security of citizenship in a state, citizenship in a state is a precondition of freedom.

Given the neo-republican focus on the moral necessity of citizenship in a constitutional order, it is unsurprising that most neo-republicans have adopted a view that is functionally similar to the right institutionalists (Pettit 2010; Laborde & Ronzoni 2015; Smith forthcoming). The state is the primary site of distributive justice and the purpose of international institutions is to ensure that each state has the ability to ensure non-domination within its borders and to prevent states from dominating other states. This commitment is driven by considerations that are primarily non-ideal. Many statist neo-republicans have no principled objection to a world republic and may even find that institutional structure preferable under ideal conditions. Yet, they view a more robustly republican global order as simply too far away and difficult to achieve for the ideal case to be action-guiding.

A smaller but growing group of neo-republicans fit more in the mold of left institutionalists (Laborde 2010; Bohman 2004; Buckinx 2011). Generally, left institutionalist neo-republicans are impressed by “expansion” arguments that purport to show that the considerations that motivate us to be concerned about coercion, cooperation, or domination at the domestic level apply to issues of global governance. These left republicans do not expect or want the state to “wither away” but rather think that direct protections against domination at the level of regional or global governance are necessary. In general, left republicans are—at least on global justice issues—less optimistic about the ability of even well-ordered states to manage their affairs in the face of global coordination problems from climate change to immigration and thus argue that global governance regimes need to be designed with their own republican principles in mind and not treated as mere adjuncts to state capacity.

Finally, both left and right neo-republicans are—and need to—engage with a deeper conceptual issue: the republican world state. Jacobin republicans, for example, believed that if the civil condition between citizens was morally necessary, then a civil condition between states was equally necessary (Kleingeld 2011). This seems to suggest that the world state is morally necessary. Most neo-republican objections to the world state concern its lack of feasibility. This means that left and right republicans are both allied in suggesting that the improbability of the world republican state is sufficient to warrant its rejection as an institutional objective. Yet it is unclear whether these feasibility concerns, borrowed from Kant, are as quite as substantial as they appear (Deudney 2006) and it is also unclear why they should be so decisive in our normative theorizing even if they were (Gilabert 2017). There is a worrisome asymmetry in the neo-republican discussions of feasibility in the context of global justice: a modern state with the rule of law and reliable welfare provision would have been viewed as quite unfeasible in the early modern period and yet this did not prevent republicans from pushing for those institutional norms over time. Perhaps unsurprisingly, a key feature of future neo-republican theorizing about global justice will concern the appropriate mixture of ideal and non-ideal assumptions and the use of feasibility judgments when it comes to making normative prescriptions.

4. The New Cosmopolitanism and Beyond

As the above discussion demonstrates, much work in global justice begins with interpretations of—and arguments about—Rawlsian principles. Some recent work, however, has sought to break the Rawlsian spell, by demonstrating the plausibility of principles and theories not foundationally linked to Rawlsian arguments. This work includes many recent philosophical theories which—while undoubtedly influenced by Rawls—are less concerned with applying Rawlsian methods directly to global institutions (see also R. Miller 2010; Brock 2009; Altman & Wellman 2009). We will here examine four important recent contributions to this project. The first, which we might call pure egalitarianism, argues that egalitarianism applies among persons considered as human; no institutional framework is needed to give rise to strong duties of distributive justice. The second, associated with Thomas Pogge, argues that the global institutional structure we see today is not merely unjust, but actively violating the negative rights of the global poor. The third notes that the fact of history—in particular, the shared experience of colonialism and imperial exploitation—is a central, and underexplored, part of any plausible account of global distributive justice. The fourth, finally, argues that an independent concern with property rights is necessary for the evaluation of global justice. We will consider these arguments in turn.

4.1 Pure Egalitarianism

The dispute between left and right institutionalism has centered on how to interpret the institutions found at the global level; both sides in the debate agreed that the nature of these institutions is of primary importance in establishing whether or not egalitarian duties hold globally. Some recent theorists, however, have challenged this assumption. On this vision, what is relevant from the standpoint of justice is only whether or not a particular agent is, in fact, a recognizably human agent—not whether that agent stands in a particular relationship as regards other humans. Simon Caney is a chief exponent of this theoretical perspective, and defends it as follows:

Consider a world with two separate systems of interaction that have no contact but are aware of each other and suppose that one of them is prosperous whereas the other is extremely impoverished. Compare, now, two individuals—one from the prosperous system and one from the impoverished system—who are identical in their abilities and needs. The member of the prosperous system receives more. But it is difficult to see why—concentrating on any possible and reasonable criteria for entitlement—this is fair. Ex hypothesi, she is not more hard-working or more gifted or more needy. In all respects they are identical (bar one, namely that one is lucky to live in the prosperous society and one is not) and yet an institutionalist approach confers on one many more benefits. Moreover, it does so wholly arbitrarily because there is no ground on which the member of the prosperous society can claim to be entitled to more. (Caney 2005: 111; see also Tan 2004)

Other cosmopolitans have echoed this conclusion, while grounding it in a broader theory of ethics. Kok-Chor Tan, for instance, argues that any global order that allows economic inequality to rest upon arbitrary facts can be rejected as unjust:

The ideas of state sovereignty and the territorial integrity of states presume a global institutional order that grants these ideas a certain moral standing, as claims that others should respect. But this respect is achievable only if the global order is not one that persons subject to it can reasonably reject. My claim is that a global order that turns arbitrariness about persons into differential personal advantages is one that some can reasonably reject. (Tan 2012: 159)

These conclusions are echoed by Pablo Gilabert, who uses the notion of reasonable rejection to argue for a “humanist egalitarianism”, on which principles of distributive justice apply simply in virtue of status as human:

To say that some but not all humans are entitled to [economic] advantages would seem, on the face of it, morally arbitrary. It would fail to show equal concern and respect for all… Any conception of global distribution that gives some human beings less access to the important advantages identified [above] than it gives to others is one that the former have reason to reject. (Gilabert 2012: 196–97)

This form of egalitarianism has some undisputed attractions. It keeps the moral attention focused on human persons, which is—we might agree—right where it ought to be. It is compatible, moreover, with a variety of different theories of what might be the appropriate metric with which to demonstrate our egalitarian respect; Caney argues that a global principle of equality of opportunity is likely superior to one based upon resources (Caney 2001). It is compatible, moreover, with the institutions we have developed being relevant from the standpoint of justice, insofar as they help or hinder efforts to live up to the demands of global equality. It insists, in the end, only that such institutions are at most helpful tools, rather than foundational forms of human relationship that give rise to distinct moral duties.

The problem with this form of egalitarianism, however, is that comparatively few of us are prepared to take distributive equality as a foundational value; most of us believe that distributive equality is relevant only within certain relational contexts, as a way of guaranteeing that individuals are not dominated or marginalized within those relationships (Anderson 1999; Altman & Wellman 2009). To say that equality is itself a value seems to ascribe a fundamental moral importance to relative income shares—an importance that seems, at the very least, somewhat in need of defense . Return once again to the example of Atlantis. Imagine that the world were made fully just, according to whatever conception of justice you require, and that the island of Atlantis then rose into that just world; imagine further that every Atlantean were possessed of a small quantity of diamonds, which made them significantly more wealthy than the average person. Would the Atlanteans have the duty, simply in virtue of common humanity, to redistribute their diamonds, so as to ensure equality? The answer, for a pure egalitarian, must be yes; this answer, however, seems to say that what was a just world has now become unjust, simply because we are made aware of others doing better for themselves than we are (Blake 2012). This particular vision of egalitarianism depends upon an ideal of quality that many people—including both right and left Rawlsians—have regarded as deeply problematic.

4.2 Poverty and Causation

The pure egalitarian impulse begins with the idea that we have duties of justice towards one another that do not depend upon shared institutions. Thomas Pogge’s recent work, in contrast, argues that institutions are morally central—but in a manner somewhat unlike that argued for by the left Rawlsians. (Pogge was, of course, an early advocate of left institutionalism, but his more recent work does not depend upon left institutionalism being true.) Pogge’s recent work (see, especially, 2002) has argued that the institutions we have built in the world are, in fact, directly violating the rights of the poor. We can start our analysis here by noting the starkness of Pogge’s conclusion: global poverty represents, for Pogge, not just an unmet humanitarian obligation, but an ongoing human evil, perhaps the greatest one in history. Pogge’s argument insists that international poverty and underdevelopment—and the death and wasted potential this entails—find their causal origin in a set of global institutions created and imposed by the wealthy nations of the world upon the global poor (Pogge 2002, 2010a). As such, the poverty of the underdeveloped nations is not simply a fact in the world, to be dealt with by comparatively weak moral notions of humanitarian benefit and charity; it is, instead, a violation of the rights of the poor. It is not simply a violation of their legitimate expectations; they might expect to be helped, for instance, and we are not merely refraining from doing that. It is a violation of their negative rights to be free from harm. The poorer inhabitants of the world have rights that are being violated, on a massive scale, by the wealthy states. One significant mechanism for this violation is the ascription of the resource and borrowing privilege to any organization able to take effective political control of a territorial jurisdiction. A group does not have to truly represent the interests of a place’s inhabitants, on the rules set up by international law, in order to sell that jurisdiction’s resources. So long as an agent is able to effectively control and repress the inhabitants, it has the ability to speak in their name in international treaty-making—regardless of how badly it treats these inhabitants. The result, for Pogge, is that the institutions of global society have set up incentives by which undemocratic regimes are rewarded and encouraged in the underdeveloped countries, and in which resources predictably flow from these countries to those already blessed with wealth. The shared history of colonial rule, moreover, has led to the radical underdevelopment experienced by many former colonies, with the result that these colonies are likely to be exceptionally vulnerable to the decisions and acts of agents within former colonial powers. Global institutions are, in the end, developed and maintained to benefit the wealthier nations that set these institutions up, and whose participation is necessary for their survival as institutions. They serve only to impose a set of property rules upon the poorer nations that guarantee their continued poverty and underdevelopment.

Pogge’s analysis is powerful, and includes a number of valuable positive suggestions about how we might begin to rectify these defects—including revisions in how pharmaceutical research is incentivized, and mechanisms for a global tax on resource use (Pogge 1994 and 2011). For the moment, though, we may examine only the major critical responses to which Pogge’s argument has been subjected. Most of Pogge’s critics agree with his contention that international poverty is unjust, in addition to being a violation of humanitarian duties. These critics, though, have frequently questioned whether or not Pogge has made his case that this poverty is causally ascribable to the international institutional set—and that simple revisions in this set could dramatically decrease global poverty.

The first form of critique begins with an objection to Pogge’s idea that global institutions cause international poverty. The worry with this idea begins with concerns about the idea that the notion of a cause can be, without certain controversial assumptions, be easily ascribed to anything as complex as the global institutional set. In particular, for an institution to be said to have caused a result, there must be a comprehensible baseline of expectations to which the existing result might be compared. Alan Patten and Mathias Risse have each provided a version of this critique. Patten argues that Pogge illegitimately smuggles in a moralized baseline of expectations, in which the inhabitants of the poorer nations obtain the resources and rights they would have under ideal justice; this baseline is what the poor deserve, argues Patten, but it is a stretch to say that the wealthy nations cause the poverty of the poor when they fail to bring about ideal justice (Patten 2005). Mathias Risse offers an even more pointed criticism, pointing out that the usual baseline for causation to be ascribed to an interaction is the expectations that would hold in the absence of such interaction (Risse 2005). Risse points out that the statistical baseline for most of humanity throughout history has been radical poverty and misery. On this analysis, the interaction between the poor and the rich might be taken to have increased the wealth of the poor, rather than caused their poverty. This is compatible, of course, with the existence of duties of justice as regards the benefits of industrialization and globalization; the poor may have become slightly better off, but the wealthy have undoubtedly gotten much, much richer, and we might develop theories that condemn this gap. Pogge’s contention that global poverty is caused by the wealthy societies of the world, though, seems—to Risse and Patten—simply incorrect.

Joshua Cohen offers a more wide-reaching version of these concerns. He, too, begins with the difficulty of saying that the poverty of the global poor is caused by the wealth of the global rich (Cohen 2011). He challenges, that is, the extent to which the global institutions imposed by the wealthy are actually causally responsible. His analysis, though, draws more on modern development economics, and notes that modern theorists have identified various factors that might determine why some countries are poor and some are rich: they include the institutions described by Pogge, but they also include such endogenous factors as geography, resource allocation, and political culture (Easterly 2006). The precise weighting and power of these various factors is, of course, a matter of tremendous disagreement and controversy, and much of the field of development economics is devoted to developing more complete and powerful analyses of how the relative wealth and poverty of nations is to be explained. This is a difficulty for Pogge, argues Cohen, since his analysis of poverty includes only two possibilities: either the poor nations of the world are responsible for their own poverty, which is implausible, or the rich nations of the world are responsible for that poverty. Cohen’s conclusion is that Pogge has not adequately come to terms with the empirical complexity of how poverty is to be explained, and that as a result his conclusions about international culpability for poverty are simply unmotivated.

The debate between Pogge and his critics, of course, continues (see Pogge 2010b); Pogge is able to offer rejoinders to many of the objections discussed here. In particular, Pogge has emphasized recently that the baseline with which his analysis proceeds is one of a reasonable alternative set of arrangements that would not generate this massive human rights deficit. Christian Barry and Gerhard Øverland, moreover, have recently provided six distinct ways in which the global order might be thought to harm the poor, despite the conceptual worries of figures like Risse and Cohen (Barry & Øverland, 2016). It is important to recognize, though, that much of this debate turns on a mixture of empirical social science and political philosophy. This is, we believe, likely to be a territory in which an increasing amount of work on global justice will have to be situated in the years to come.

4.3 Colonialism

An increasingly important challenge to the institutionalist paradigm of global justice is the historical legacy and contemporary effects of colonialism. The idea that our obligations of distributive justice as determined by our current institutions might be undermined by the idea that the historical relationship of colonialism has tremendous influence on current distributions of wealth and power. The focus on colonialism has three aspects though this section will focus mostly on the second and third. First, there is a growing interest in whether the early modern progenitors of the social contract tradition were ideologically complicit in European imperialism. In particular, there is a lively debate concerning how Kant’s account of hospitality and cosmopolitan right can used to critique colonial and neo-colonial relations (Flikschuh & Ypi 2014). Second, there is a significant—and mostly cosmopolitan in orientation—debate concerning precisely what makes colonialism unjust or wrong. Third, given the wrong of colonialism and the likely reverberation of its negative effects onto the present, there is the question of rectificatory global justice. That is, colonial powers have some distributive duties in virtue of the fact that they must repair the harm caused by their imperial endeavors.

It is obviously true that the history of colonialism is replete with an almost unparalleled violence (Fanon 1961; Walter 2017). Yet, it seems equally clear that a colonial relationship that was essentially free of this sort of violence—or where the level of violence was considerably lower than the pre-colonial political situation—would still be morally unacceptable. The question of what precisely grounds the wrongness of colonialism is an attempt to grapple with difficult questions of procedural justice, sovereignty, and legitimacy—and how these ideas affect our current understanding of global distributive justice. Lea Ypi, for example, argues that colonialism is wrong because it represents a wrongfully unequal political relationship between the ruler and the ruled (Ypi 2013; see also Lu 2017). Thus, the defining feature of colonialism is set of unequal and non-reciprocal terms of political association. This feature of colonialism makes it uniquely wrong even if the colonizers refrain from atrocities, the colonized have no strongly claims—property or otherwise—to the land being taken, or the colonized lack significant rights to self-determination. This view, however, does give rise to a serious concern about how we should understand coercive associative political projects where the terms of association being offered are comparatively equitable. That is, imagine some more powerful state that comes to a weaker group of people and offers them an offer of political association that is both hard to refuse and, yet, based upon equitable terms. Ypi suggests that equitable terms of association are decisively undermined if the weaker party does not consent, so it must be true that the “colonized” group consents. And yet, it is at least possible to imagine cases where the weaker party sees the benefit of association and therefore consents to the association in ways that give rises to concerns of colonialism. In other words, Ypi’s account may miss a feature of colonialism that gives rise to its distinctiveness as a wrong (Valentini 2015). In most cases, the criticism of Ypi’s account lies in nature of the entity to which reciprocal association is owed: the colonized understood as individuals, as corporate bodies, or as a plurality. This is especially important because Ypi’s account—in order to be distinct—must not rely upon nationalism or some sort of corporate ownership of specific territory, and it remains an open whether her account can effectively avoid so relying. At any rate, discussions of how to precisely to characterize the wrong of self-determination are ongoing.

Finally, colonialism gives rise to claims that the distribution of wealth globally ought to be re-ordered in order to satisfy the demands of rectificatory global justice. The claim is that rich nations in general, or colonizing nations in particular, ought to transfer wealth or other valuable resources to poor nations in general or colonized nations in particular in virtue of the legacy of colonialism. It is important to see that these claims to rectification tend to be predicated upon the idea that there are contemporary effects of colonial relations. For example, the “new institutionalists” (Acemoglu & Robinson 2012) suggest that differences in development are a consequence of geographically driven differences in colonial history. In some cases, the colonial powers—often in the context of settler colonialism—set up relatively effective institutions with the rule of law and strong property rights. In other contexts, the colonial powers set up extractive institutions. These extractive institutions set up strong incentive structures for the “liberated” de-colonized elites to maintain the extractive nature of these institutions, inhibiting development. This is often encouraged—through corruption, military intervention, and less obviously criminal economic manipulation—by the former colonial powers themselves. As a consequence, the initial extractive equilibrium is hard to dispel. This account creates a complication for rectificatory views, which is that this view relies on the bad actions of local elites to sustain the equilibrium and so complicates the question of who, precisely, is responsible for the poor current state of many states (Lomasky & Tesón 2015). Nonetheless, many have argued that the contemporary effects—whether though the imposition of institutional forms or debt—of colonialism generates a special obligation to provide, for example, debt relief (Jaggar 2002), open borders (Amighetti & Nuti 2016) or additional emissions permits (Blomfield 2015). Yet, these views face some significant hurdles. They have difficulty in generating a general obligation by rich nations to help poor nations; rather, they generate obligations for colonizing states to help their former colonies. And while it may be true these relations mostly track the needs of the present, there is no requirement that they do so and, indeed, there seem to be cases where the requirement to assist needy countries and the requirement to help nations that have been negatively affected by colonialism conflict. So, rectificatory views must either accept that sometimes states will be obligated to rectify in cases where the objects of the obligation are not particularly needy or need to suggest that a broader participation in an ongoing system of neo-colonial economic relations is sufficient to activate the obligations. Yet, if we adopt this latter interpretation, then it is unclear that this view is truly different from left institutionalist views described above. If the former, then the claims of colonialism do not appear to be as urgent as distributive obligations. Furthermore, the nature of the claim to compensation depends on characterizing the relevant baseline: are we comparing the plight of the former colonies to how they would have been without colonization or a world where the colonizers acted justly? Each of these answers have their issues, with the former being too permissive towards colonialism and the latter collapsing into other views of justice. It is hard to deny that the legacy of colonialism is significant in a variety of applied issues—from trade to climate change to humanitarian intervention—and the growing interest in its effects and normative consequences is a welcome development; the philosophical difficulties of addressing that legacy, however, are likely to prove difficult indeed.

4.4. Property Rights

We can conclude this discussion of distributive justice by discussing some recent work on global economic justice that rejects the Rawlsian legacy in a more thoroughgoing manner. Much of this work begins with a concern for property rights, understood in terms that make them prior to—and, thus, constraints upon—principles of distributive justice. Rawlsian distributive justice, of course, is compatible with the defense of property rights; but those rights are taken to be constructed out of the theory of justice—they do not, as it were, exist before the discussion of economic justice. For many theorists, however, property rights must be respected as inputs to our theorizing about global distributive justice—rather than as outputs of that theorizing.

Three sorts of theories have recently been put forward into the debates surrounding global economic justice. The first—which we will call right libertarians—take individual rights to acquire and trade in property as foundational for any analysis of global economic justice. The second—who take their inspiration from the left libertarian tradition—take common property rights in the world as a basis for theorizing about global distributive justice. The final—who can be termed theorists of national property rights—take the right of a nation’s people to use and exploit its natural resources as foundational for thinking about global justice. We can discuss these in turn.

4.4.1 Right libertarianism

The debate between libertarian and liberal theories of distributive justice is a long-standing one within analytic political philosophy; Robert Nozick’s Anarchy, State, and Utopia offered a challenge to Rawlsian conceptions of distributive justice (Nozick 1974). Nozick argued that a rightful respect for property rights made it impossible for a just state to pursue “patterned” principles of distributive justice. The right to property, if respected, would make such principles of economic equality chimerical at best, and totalitarian at worst.

Ideas such as those of Nozick have only recently been applied to the global level. Bas van der Vossen and Jason Brennan (2018) have defended the thought that economic freedom would, if applied at the global level, lead to greater wealth—and greater human flourishing—than any attempt to pursue some particular pattern of wealth and poverty. In particular, they argue, social scientific data indicate that policy interventions designed to narrow the gap between the rich and the poor tends to do more harm than good; good intentions, they note, are inadequate to ensure good results. Loren Lomasky and Fernando Tesón (2015), similarly defend the thought that individual property rights would, if defended universally, lead to a significant reduction in global poverty. It is only by universalizing respect for individual property rights, they argue, that the global poverty can be reduced.

These arguments are, of course, intended to undermine global distributive justice as an independent goal, much as Nozick intended his work to undermine the Rawlsian belief than the gap between the rich and the poor was itself a relevant consideration for social justice. As such, the same arguments that have been made against Nozick might also hold true for those who defend libertarianism at the global level. In the first instance, we might note that there is, on these views, no independent worry about the size of the gap between the rich and the poor; even if the universalization of property rights were to produce an increase in overall wealth, there is nothing within these theories that allows us to regard an increased inequality between the rich and the poor as problematic in its own right. This, of course, is not an objection to the libertarian view; it is, instead, simply evidence that the libertarian and the liberal are motivated by distinct moral concerns. But it is also worth noting that some of what the libertarian says here is motivated by predictions about what the globalization of individual property rights would do. The libertarian is convinced that a global expansion of those rights would produce a world of flourishing communities and flourishing individuals. Others, however, would worry that the universalization of libertarian rights might produce something entirely different—that a world of unconstrained capitalism might produce dystopia and rampant inequality, rather than perpetual peace. The debate between the global liberal and the global libertarian is, then, going to turn upon both principle and prediction, in a way that makes this debate unlikely to be resolved soon.

4.4.2 Left libertarianism and common ownership

If the right-libertarian celebrates individual property rights, the left-libertarian regards property rights as a collective phenomenon. Left-libertarian thought is complex, and merits its own examination; we will not provide an adequate analysis of that thought here. We mean, instead, to note that one particular left-libertarian idea—that individual property rights in natural resources and in territory must acknowledge the symmetrical claims of all human persons to the use of those goods—has proven to be a fruitful one in theorizing about global distributive justice.

Hillel Steiner (2005) argues that all individuals are equally entitled to benefit from the exploitation of natural resources; as such, those left behind by territorial expropriation have the right to compensation, through the creation of a proposed Global Fund. Mathias Risse (2012) has more recently argued in favor of common ownership of the world’s natural resources as an independent ground of justice. Risse’s view is complex and polycentric, and includes sites on which global justice might be evaluated—including common humanity, shared subjection to a coercive legal system, and the fact that humanity shares a limited set of territorial goods. It is this latter aspect that is most relevant for our present discussion; Risse argues that the world’s natural resources, since they are not the result of any individual person’s agency, must be regarded as subject to symmetrical claims from all human persons. This vision of the world as given to mankind in common, of course, is borrowed from early modern thinkers; Risse vindicates their concern with natural resources, and argues that conclusions for both migration and for distributive justice can be derived from this ground.

These ideas are complex, and the debate over their relevance to global justice is likely to continue. One immediate worry, of course, is how to understand the relationship between that wealth created by natural resources, and that wealth created by human agency and ingenuity. Steiner and Risse both argue that the collective right to use the earth constrains what distribution of wealth can emerge at the global level; but both must provide some account of how to figure out what counts as given to humans by God or by nature, from that which is created by humans using their brains and their agency. Steiner and Risse do, of course, engage with exactly that issue; but the precise cut between what is made by God and what is made by humanity is likely to be a continuing source of controversy.

4.4.3 National property

We can conclude this section by examining a view on which property rights in the natural resources of a country are held by that set of people who live within that particular country. This view is defended in Wenar (2015), who argues that it would be revolutionary—in our world, as it emerges from colonialism and imperialism—for us to regard the inhabitants of a given country as actually owning that country’s national resources. Wenar notes, as does Pogge, that our current global institutions allow—indeed, incentivize—bad governance, by encouraging malign agents to gain control of a coercive state and sell of the natural resources of that state. Wenar, however, grounds this not in a cosmopolitan vision of Rawlsian right, but instead upon a view on which the territorial goods contained within a country are owned by the inhabitants of that country. Those who would sell those goods without the consent of the people, then, are best understood as thieves—whether or not those thieves present themselves as the legitimate government of the society in question:

If we believe in popular resource sovereignty, there can be no such thing as a ruler who is benevolent with resource revenues. No one can be generous by giving someone what they already own. The citizens of a country are entitled to all the value of their resources; the regime is entitled to not a penny. All of Saudi Arabia’s oil belongs to the Saudi people, and the royals can only have their super yachts and palaces—indeed, anything bought with the oil money—at the people’s sufferance. A king’s right is not to “all”, it is to “nothing” (Wenar 2015: 241).

Wenar’s argument is not directly focused on global distributive justice, so much as it is focused on the avoidance of Western complicity in tyranny and dispossession; Wenar defends Western legal instruments intended to avoid participation in unjustified resource sales, instead of principles of global distributive justice. Nevertheless, this vision of collective property rights over natural goods might be thought to pose an independent check on what sorts of redistributive policy are available, similar to the libertarian views discussed above. And, similarly, it is possible to object to Wenar’s view, with reference to whether or not this way of constructing property rights is morally defensible (see generally Wenar et al. 2018). In particular, the cosmopolitan might reject the thought that a Saudi citizen (say) has a greater claim than others to exploit the Saudi oilfields, simply because of his birth within the Kingdom of Saudi Arabia. Wenar’s view, nonetheless, is an important recent addition to the philosophical discussion of global distributive justice, and debate about that view is likely to continue.

5. Future directions

It is rarely a smart move to make predictions within philosophy. Nevertheless, it is perhaps appropriate to offer a few views about what we are likely to see in future work about global justice. The first, following on our discussion of Pogge’s work, is an increased engagement by philosophers with empirical evidence and empirical methods. Apart from the pure egalitarians, political philosophers all make assumptions about the nature and powers of global institutions; these assumptions can be grounded—or refuted—by engagement with international lawyers, development economists, and the like. To some extent, this engagement is already happening (Reddy & Pogge 2010; Hassoun & Subramanian 2012; Benatar & Brock 2011). More of this engagement is, we believe, both likely and likely to be beneficial.

The second trend we would identify is that there is increasingly likely a need for political philosophy dealing with specific global phenomena. Much of what we have dealt with here has looked only at the macro-level phenomenon of global inequality. A full analysis of global justice will also look at specific forms of human institution and agency that are likely to be relevant from the standpoint of justice. We have already mentioned, if only in passing, the issues of immigration, fairness in trade, and feminism. We would conclude here by mentioning some other areas of inquiry that might become increasingly important. Buchanan (2009) and Pogge (2009) have both produced recent work on global incentives for pharmaceutical research. Ypi, Goodin, & Barry (2009) have written on the issue of global debt relief. Gardiner (2004) and Caney (2008, 2009) have written on the relationship of global climate change and global inequality. Increasingly, we believe that these sorts of analyses are likely to proliferate, and philosophers come to terms not just with the fact of inequality, but with the plurality of different reasons for—and solutions to—that inequality. Political philosophy has only recently turned its attention to questions of global justice; it is our hope that this attention will deepen in years to come, as we gain more understanding of the nature and causes of global underdevelopment and inequality.

The final trend might be the most important; we are increasingly willing to move beyond the questions that animated Rawlsian analyses of global distributive justice, to a broader consideration of the agents and institutions that might be implicated in our global processes of production. Iris Marion Young (2011) raises some important questions about how to begin to understand the various agents whose acts might be constrained by moral theorizing—and how to understand the distinct ways in which our identities, as consumers and as citizens, might be implicated in the replication of poverty and inequality. Although this entry began with an examination of the Rawlsian tradition of thinking about distributive justice, it is an entirely good thing that the philosophical literature is increasingly willing to move beyond that tradition. As global relationships become more complicated and more central, we stand in need of more theorizing about how to understand the relationship between global wealth and global poverty—and about the moral principles within which that relationship is to be understood.


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