Retributive Justice

First published Wed Jun 18, 2014; substantive revision Fri Jul 31, 2020

The concept of retributive justice has been used in a variety of ways, but it is best understood as that form of justice committed to the following three principles:

  1. that those who commit certain kinds of wrongful acts, paradigmatically serious crimes, morally deserve to suffer a proportionate punishment;
  2. that it is intrinsically morally good—good without reference to any other goods that might arise—if some legitimate punisher gives them the punishment they deserve; and
  3. that it is morally impermissible intentionally to punish the innocent or to inflict disproportionately large punishments on wrongdoers.

The idea of retributive justice has played a dominant role in theorizing about punishment over the past few decades, but many features of it—especially the notions of desert and proportionality, the normative status of suffering, and the ultimate justification for retribution—remain contested and problematic.

1. The Appeal of Retributive Justice

The appeal of retributive justice as a theory of punishment rests in part on direct intuitive support, in part on the claim that it provides a better account of when punishment is justifiable than alternative accounts of punishment, and in part on arguments tying it to deeper moral principles.

Many share the intuition that those who commit wrongful acts, especially serious crimes, should be punished even if punishing them would produce no other good. Consider, for example, being the sentencing judge for a rapist who was just convicted in your court. Suppose that he has since suffered an illness that has left him physically incapacitated so that he cannot rape again, and that he has enough money to support himself without resorting to criminal activities. Suppose that this suffices to ensure that there is no need to deter or incapacitate him to prevent him from committing serious crimes in the future. Suppose, in addition, that you could sentence him to spend his days on a tropical island where he has always wanted to go, and where he will spend most of his days relaxing and pursuing his interests. You can, however, impose one condition on his time there: he must regularly report to a prison to be filmed in prison garb, and these videos will be posted online, sending the message that he is serving hard time for his crimes. As long as this ruse is secure from discovery, it could meaningfully contribute to general deterrence. But even if the goods normally cited by consequentialists to justify punishment—incapacitation and deterrence—are achieved, is that the sentence he should receive? Many share the intuition that there is still some reason to want him to be punished more harshly (see Moore 1997: 98–101).

Not only is retributivism in that way intuitively appealing, the primary alternative, consequentialist theories of punishment that focus on deterrence and incapacitation, seem to confront a deep problem. They have difficulty explaining a core and intuitively compelling feature of retributivism, namely the widely shared sense that it is always or nearly always impermissible both to inflict punishment on those who have done no wrong and to inflict disproportionately large punishments on those who have done some wrong. (Some respond to this point by adopting a mixed theory, according to which retributivism provides a necessary condition for punishment, but consequentialist considerations provide the reasons to punish. For more on such an approach see section 3.3.)

Both of these sources of retributivism’s appeal have clear limits. The direct intuition can be challenged with the claim that it is merely the reflection of a morally dubious psychological propensity to feel an excess of what Nietzsche, in the Genealogy of Morals, called ressentiment,

a witches’ brew [of] resentment, fear, anger, cowardice, hostility, aggression, cruelty, sadism, envy, jealousy, guilt, self-loathing, hypocrisy and self-deception. (Moore 1997: 120)

And the argument that retributivism justifies punishment better than consequentialism presupposes that punishment is justifiable (for criticism of this premise, see Golash 2005; Boonin 2008), and that there are no alternatives that are better than both (for three alternatives, see Quinn 1985; Tadros 2011; Lacey & Pickard 2015a).

To respond to these challenges, retributive justice must ultimately be justified in a larger moral context that shows that it is plausibly grounded in, or at least connected to, other, deeply held moral principles. Only in this way should its intuitive appeal be regarded, in reflective equilibrium, as morally sound. For a discussion of the prospects for deeper justification, see section 5.

2. Background Concepts

Two background concepts should be addressed before saying more about retributive justice: (1) punishment, and (2) the sorts of wrongs for which punishment might be thought deserved.

2.1 Punishment

The entry on legal punishment discusses this concept in depth. The following discussion surveys five elements of punishment that are central for the purpose of understanding retributivism.

First, punishment must impose some sort of cost or hardship on, or at the very least withdraw a benefit that would otherwise be enjoyed by, the person being punished. This is often denoted “hard treatment”.

Second, the punisher must inflict hard treatment intentionally, not as an accident, and not as a side-effect of pursuing some other end. For example, while sending a criminal to prison often has foreseeable harmful effects on the criminal's family, retributivists would say that those harms do not constitute punishment, not unless they are purposely inflicted as part of the punishment for the crime.

Some critics of retributivism reject this limitation as an appeal to a “definitional stop”, which they say is illicitly used to avoid having to justify the costs of the practice (Hart 1968: 5–6; Christopher 2002: 879–880). The worry is that retributivists will seek to justify only the purposeful infliction of hardship on wrongdoers, and will ignore the overall costs of the practice. But there is no reason to think that retributivists generally ignore the need to justify the negative effects of punishment on the innocent (see section 4.5). The retributivist's point is only that the intentional infliction of hard treatment has to be justified in a different way than the collateral damage that may befall either the criminal or the innocent as a result of punishing the former.

Third, the hardship or loss must be imposed in response to an act or omission. It is a confusion to take oneself to be “punishing” others for some facts over which they had no control (Mabbott 1939). One need not be conceptually confused to take oneself to have reason to intentionally inflict hard treatment on others because of some trait that they cannot help having. One might want to oppress others on the basis of some trait they cannot help having, such as their ethnicity or physical appearance. Doing so would presumably be immoral, but it need not be conceptually confused. What would be confused is thinking that one is inflicting “punishment”. (It is, however, not a confusion to punish one person more harshly than another on the basis of traits over which they have no control.)

Fourth, the act or omission ought to be wrongful. One can make sense of punishing another for an act that is not wrong (see Tadros 2016: ch. 17; Cornford 2017). But as a normative matter, if not a conceptual matter, such punishment is to be avoided if possible. (For arguments that it is possible for a well-developed legal system to generally or always avoid knowingly punishing acts that are not wrongful, see Duff 2018: chs. 2 and 7; Walen forthcoming).

Fifth, it is best to think of the hard treatment as imposed, at least in part, as a way of sending a message of condemnation or censure for what is believed to be a wrongful act or omission (Feinberg 1970; for a retributive theorist who rejects this element, see Berman 2012: 143). This element too is a normative matter, not a conceptual one. One can certainly make sense of punishment that is simply a response to wrongful or unwanted behavior—a response aimed at deterring such behavior or simply imposing suffering for a wrong done. But insofar as one thinks of punishment as aimed at moral agents, there is reason to use it to communicate to wrongdoers (and to victims of their wrongdoing as well as potential future wrongdoers) that their wrongful acts or omissions are indeed wrongful and that the hard treatment that they receive is a morally justified response to their wrongdoing (Duff 2018: 295).

2.2 The relevant kinds of wrongs

Not all wrongdoing justifies a punitive response. Which kinds of wrongs can be morally fitting bases for punishment is a much-debated topic (Shafer-Landau 1996: 289–292; Husak 2008; Asp 2013), beyond the scope of the present entry. Nonetheless, a few comments may be helpful.

The paradigmatic wrong for which punishment seems appropriate is an intentional or knowing violation of the important rights of another, such as murder or rape. It is almost as clear that an attempt to do the same is a proper basis for punishment, though how to define the concept of an attempt is highly contested (Duff 1996; Alexander, Ferzan, & Morse 2009: ch. 6; Yaffe 2010). The more tenuous the connection to a rights violation, and the less culpable the mental state, the more controversial punishment for an act or omission becomes. This raises special problems for purely regulatory (mala prohibita) offenses (for a critical discussion of mala prohibita offenses, see Husak 2008: 103–119; Duff 2018: 313–322) and for the punishment of negligent acts (for criticism of punishing negligent acts, see Alexander, Ferzan, & Morse 2009: ch. 3; for a defense of punishing negligent acts, see Stark 2016: chs. 7 & 8).

An important dimension of debate is whether all moral wrongs are at least presumptively a proper basis for punishment (Moore 1997: 35–37), or whether only a subset of moral wrongs are a proper basis punishment. One prominent way to delimit the relevant wrongs, at least for state punishment, is to say that only public wrongs may be the basis for punishment. (Duff 2018: 75–87; Duff & Hoskins 2017 [2019]: §2; for a criticism of Duff’s view of public wrongs, see Tadros 2016: 120–130).

Another important debate concerns the “harm principle” (see Mill 1859: ch. 1). It is often said that only those moral wrongs that cause harm can properly serve as the basis for punishment. But the harm principle, on any of a number of interpretations, is too restrictive to be consistent with retributive justice, which, unlike the harm principle, calls for giving the wrongdoer his just deserts even if no other good (such as the prevention of harm) should follow (Tomlin 2014a). (For a short survey of variations on the harm principle and their problems, see Tadros 2016: 102–107.)

It is important to keep in mind that retributive justice is not limited to liberal moral and political philosophy. Retributive justice may also be deemed appropriate by illiberal persons and inside distinctly illiberal organizations (Zaibert 2006: 16–24). Illiberal persons and groups may also make a distinction between wrongs that call for punishment and those that do not, but they will not draw the distinction in the same way that liberals would.

3. Range of Meanings and Uses

This section starts with a brief note on the etymological origins of “retributivism”. Most prominent retributive theorists have converged, however, on the second of the meanings given below: “positive retributivism”. Some argue, on substantive grounds, for a limited variation on retributivism: “negative retributivism”. Other limited applications of the idea are picked up by “limiting retributivism” and “communicative retributivism”. After surveying these limited versions of retributivism, I turn to three ideas that are sometimes confused with retributivism: lex talionis, retrospective criminal justice, and sublimated vengeance.

3.1 Etymological meaning of retributivism

As Didier Fassin (2018: 47) explains:

retribution … comes from Latin … retribuere [which] is composed of the prefix re-, “in return”, and tribuere, literally “to divide among tribes”.

Fassin’s point is that the root meaning traces to a tort-like idea, that when members of one tribe harm members of another, they have to pay compensation to keep the peace.

Seeing the root idea in this way helps to highlight a peculiar feature of the modern idea. There is something morally straightforward in the older idea that if members of one group harm members of another, then the harmed group could demand compensation. There is something at least mysterious, however, in the modern thought that an individual could owe suffering punishment to his fellow citizens for having committed a wrong. How does his suffering punishment “pay his debt to society”?

Important as it is to recognize this question, it is also important to recognize that the concept of retributive justice has evolved, and any quest for its justification must start with the thought that the core of the concept is no longer debt repayment but deserved punishment.

3.2 Positive retributivism

Positive retributivism, or simply “retributivism”, involves both positive and negative desert claims. The positive desert claim holds that wrongdoers morally deserve punishment for their wrongful acts (see section 4.6 for a discussion of the deontic and consequentialist dimensions of this). This claim comes in stronger and weaker versions. For example, Michael Moore (1997: 87) writes: “Retributivism … is the view that punishment is justified by the desert of the offender”. Jeffrie Murphy (2007: 11) is more pluralistic, writing: “[A] retributivist is a person who believes that the primary justification for punishing a criminal is that the criminal deserves it”. A retributivist could take an even weaker view, that there is some intrinsic positive value in punishing a wrongdoer for his wrongful acts, apart from any other consequences that might arise from doing so. (For a discussion of three dimensions of strength or weakness for a retributive view, see Berman 2016).

This positive desert claim is complemented by a negative deontic claim: Those who have done no wrong may not be punished. This prohibits both punishing those not guilty of wrongdoing (who deserve no punishment), and punishing the guilty more than they deserve (i.e., inflicting disproportional punishment).

Of course, the innocent will inevitably sometimes be punished; no human system can operate flawlessly. And retributivists should not duck what it means to commit such a mistake: it wrongs the innocent person. But this is not a fatal problem for retributivists. It does not imply that they risk acting impermissibly if they punish people. Permissibility is best understood as an action-guiding notion, not one tied directly to what is objectively justifiable (Scanlon 2008: 47–52). As an action-guiding notion, it must make use of a relevant standard of proof. If the right standard is met—the “beyond a reasonable doubt” standard has recently been called into question (Laudan 2011, but see Walen 2015)—then punishers act permissibly, even if they unwittingly punish the innocent (see also Schedler 2011; Simons 2012: 67–69).

Most contemporary retributivists accept both the positive and the negative desert claims. Illustrating with the rapist case from section 1: he may not be punished more than he deserves for the rape he committed, but he deserves a reasonably harsh sentence for his rape and he ought to be given the sentence he deserves, even though he is already incapacitated and he need not be punished in any serious way to contribute to general deterrence.

3.3 Negative retributivism

What has been called “negative” (Mackie 1982), “minimalist” (Golding 1975), or “weak” (Hart 1968: ch. 1) retributivism is the view that only something similar to the negative component of retributivism is true. It is the view that wrongdoers forfeit their right not to suffer proportional punishment, but that the positive reasons for punishment must appeal to some other goods that punishment achieves, such as deterrence or incapacitation. Wrongdoing, on this view, is merely a necessary condition for punishment. The desert of the wrongdoer provides neither a sufficient condition for nor even a positive reason to punish (see also Mabbott 1939; Quinton 1954).

Of these three labels, negative retributivism seems the most apt, as it picks up the idea that wrongdoing negates the right the wrongdoer otherwise would have not to be punished. The alternative labels also risk confusing negative retributivism with the thought that the reasons to punish given by positive retributivism can be quite weak. Differences along that dimension should not be confused with a position that denies that guilt, by itself, provides any reason to punish.

Negative retributivism is often confusingly framed as the view that it is impermissible to punish a wrongdoer more than she deserves. (Hart 1968: 236–237; Duff 2001: 12; Lippke 2015: 58.) If desert provides a limit to punishment, then it must be deserved up to that limit. But there is a reason to give people what they deserve. Yet negative retributivism is offered as the view that desert provides no reason to punish. This contradiction can be avoided by reading the negative limit in terms of proportional forfeiture without referring to desert.

The line between negative retributivism and retributivism that posits a weak positive reason to punish may seem unimportant. A negative retributivist holds that the justification for punishment must come completely from its instrumental value. A positive retributivist who thinks that the reasons provided by desert are relatively weak may say that most of what justifies punishment comes from the same instrumental bases. For both, a full justification of punishment will be “mixed”, appealing to both retributive and consequentialist ideas (Garvey 2004: 449–451).

Nonetheless, there are three reasons it is important to distinguish the two, and taken together they speak in favor of positive retributivism. First, negative retributivism seems to justify using people merely as a means (within retributive limits) for promoting the greater good (Duff 2001: 13). The thought that punishment treats wrongdoers as they deserve to be treated addresses this problem.

Second, a positive retributivist can distinguish different parts of the all-things-considered justification for punishment. She can say, as Moore does (1997: 87), that the justification for punishing another, the thing that makes an act punitive rather than merely an act of using or incapacitating another, is that the person deserves to be punished for a wrong done. She can also take note of the fact that punishment has its costs (see section 4.5), and she can cite the consequentialist benefits of punishment to outweigh those costs. Still, she can conceive of the significance of these consequentialist benefits as merely offsetting the consequentialist costs, not as providing a justification for the act qua punishment. This is not an option for negative retributivists.

Third, it is not clear whether forfeiture theories that do not appeal to desert can make sense of the proportionality restrictions that are central to retributivism (Duff 2001: 14–16). Indeed, the proportionality limits of a pure forfeiture model, without desert, may be quite different from the limits implicit in the notion of deserved punishment. A pure forfeiture model arguably would limit hard treatment only to ensure that penalties strike a fair balance between the claims of individuals not to have to bear them and the claims of the state to take effective measures to promote important public ends. All the concerns with the gravity of the wrong seem to go missing (Walen forthcoming). To cite the gravity of the wrong to set proportionality limits seems to presuppose some fundamental connection between the gravity of the wrong and proportional punishment (see section 4.4). That connection is naturally picked up with the notion of deserved punishment. If one eschews that notion, it is not clear how to make the connection.

3.4 Limiting retributivism

“Limiting retributivism” is not so much a conception of retributivism as it is retributivism with the addition of skepticism about our ability to make any but the most general statements about proportionality (see N. Morris 1982: 182–87, 196–200; Frase 2005: 77; Slobogin 2009: 671). It is, therefore, a view about how much influence retributivism can have in the practice of punishment. Consequentialist considerations, it is proposed, should be consulted to fill in the gap left by the supposed vagueness of proportionality. For example, while murder is surely a graver crime than robbery, the range of acceptable punishment for murder may overlap with that for robbery. If so, a judge may cite the importance of incapacitation to sentence a robber who seems likely to be a recidivist to a longer sentence than a murderer who, for whatever reason, seems to pose little danger to others in the future.

This view may move too quickly to invoke consequentialist considerations. Even if our ability to discern proportionality constraints is crude in absolute terms, comparative proportionality may leave relatively little leeway with regard to what punishments are morally defensible in a given jurisdiction (Robinson 2003; von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005: 180–185; von Hirsch 2011: 212; and section 2 of the supplementary document Challenges to the Notion of Retributive Proportionality). Nonetheless, insofar as the constraints of proportionality seem inherently vague, retributivists may have to make some sort of peace with the thesis of limiting retributivism.

3.5 Communicative retributivism

Communicative retributivism is another variation on retributivism, this time embracing skepticism that the hard treatment element of punishment is itself deserved. What is left then is the thought that censure is deserved for wrongdoing, but that hard treatment is at best justified either instrumentally, for deterrence or incapacitation, or to give meaning to the censure (see Duff 2001: 29–30, 97; Tadros 2011: ch. 5). Insofar as retributive justifications for the hard treatment element of punishment seem inadequate—see section 5—this may be the best default position for retributivists.

3.6 Lex talionis: Payback as response in kind

Lex talionis is Latin for the law of retaliation. It connects to the original retributive notion of paying back a debt, and it specifies that the debt is to be paid back in kind. It is reflected in the Biblical injunction (which some Biblical scholars warn should be taken symbolically, not literally) to take “an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth” (Exodus 21: 23–25; Leviticus 24:17–20). Kant also endorses, in a somewhat different way, this notion of punishment. Invoking the principle of equality for punishment, Kant writes:

whatever undeserved evil you inflict upon another within the people, that you inflict upon yourself. (1797 [1991: 141])

Thus, he who steals

deprives himself (by the principle of retribution) of security in any property…. [and if] he has committed murder he must die. (1797 [1991: 142])

Lex talionis provides a controversial principle of proportionality (for more on lex talionis as a measure of proportional punishment, see section 2 of the supplementary document Challenges to the Notion of Retributive Proportionality). But while retributive justice includes a commitment to punishment that is proportional to the crime, it cannot be reduced to a measure of proportionality (Moore 1997: 88; Husak 2019).

3.7 Retrospective criminal justice

It is commonly said that the difference between consequentialist and retributive theories of punishment is that the former is prospective, looking to the good that punishment may accomplish, while the latter is retrospective, seeking to do justice for what a wrongdoer has done. That is a difference between the two, but retributivism should not be reduced to the claim that it is punishment in response to a past crime. Other theories may refer to the fact that wrongdoers have already done something in virtue of which it is proper to punish them without thereby being retributivist. See, e.g., Quinn 1985 (it is rational to threaten people with punishment for crimes, and that rationality is transmitted to punishment if they commit crimes); Tadros 2011 (criminals have a duty to endure punishment to make up for the harm they have caused).

3.8 Sublimated vengeance

Retributivism has also often been conflated with revenge or the desire for vengeance. But the two concepts should not be confused. Robert Nozick drew five distinctions between the two, including that revenge is personal but retribution is not, and that

[r]evenge involves a particular emotional tone, pleasure in the suffering of another, while retribution either need involve no emotional tone, or involves another one, namely, pleasure at justice being done. (1981: 367)

These imply that even if no one wanted to take revenge on a wrongdoer, there could still be a retributive reason to punish her (Moore 1997: 89; for a skeptical take on these distinctions, see Fassin 2018: 36).

These distinctions do not imply that the desire for revenge plays no motivational role leading people to value retributive justice. Perhaps retributive justice is the sublimated, generalized version of the thirst for revenge. The two are nonetheless different. As George Fletcher wrote (2000: 417), retributivism “is not to be identified with vengeance or revenge, any more than love is to be identified with lust”.

4. Range of issues

This section will address six issues that arise for those trying to make sense of retributive justice: (1) the nature of the desert claim and questions it raises; (2) the proper identity of the punisher; (3) the normative status of suffering; (4) the meaning of proportionality; (5) the strength of retributive reasons; and (6) whether retributivism should be thought of as a consequentialist or deontological theory.

4.1 Desert

Desert has been analyzed into a three-way relationship between the person who deserves something, what she deserves, and that in virtue of which she deserves it. These can usefully be cast, respectively, as the desert subject, the desert object, and the desert basis (Feinberg 1970; Berman 2011: 437). A fourth dimension should also be noted: the person or persons who can appropriately give, or have a duty to give, the desert subject what she deserves. I call these persons desert agents. They raise a distinct set of issues, which are addressed in section 4.2.

Before discussing the three parts of desert, it is important to address the idea that desert is fundamentally a pre-institutional notion. As Joel Feinberg wrote:

desert is a moral concept in the sense that it is logically prior to and independent of public institutions and their rules. (Feinberg 1970: 87)

Accordingly, one challenge theorists of retributive justice often take themselves to have is to show how the criminal justice system can be, at least in part, justified by claims that wrongdoers deserve punishment in a pre-institutional sense. For more on this, see section 4.5 and section 6.

4.1.1 The desert subject

Retributivism presents no special puzzles about who is the desert subject: the wrongdoer. What may be particularly problematic for retributivism is the claim that certain kinds of persons (children or the insane) or entities (states or corporations) can or cannot deserve punishment. The fundamental issues are twofold: First, can the subject be responsible for wrongdoing? Second, does the subject have the mental (or information processing) ability to appreciate the punishment as conveying condemnation for a wrong done, rather than seeing it simply as hard treatment? Small children, animals, and the insane may lack both abilities, but a person who is only temporarily insane might lack one ability but not the other. (For contrasting views about punishing artificial persons, such as states or corporations, see French 1979; Narveson 2002.)

4.1.2 The desert object

The desert object has already been discussed in section 2.1: punishment. There is, of course, much to be said about what punishments are deserved for what wrongs. I highlight here two issues that are particularly salient for retributivists. First, is the question of whether the retributivist can justify inflicting hard treatment in addition to censure—see section 3.5 and section 5. This is tied to the normative status of suffering, which is discussed in section 4.3. Second, is the challenge of identifying proportional punishments—discussed in section 4.4.

One more matter should be mentioned under the heading of the desert object: namely the idea put forward by some retributivists, that wrongdoers have a “right to be punished” such that not punishing them wrongs them (Hegel 1821; H. Morris 1968). It is important to be clear about what this right is. It would be ludicrous to hold that an executive wrongs a wrongdoer by showing her mercy and pardoning her. What is meant is that wrongdoers have the right to be treated as the kind of being who can be held responsible and punished, rather than as sick or dangerous beasts.

4.1.3 The desert basis

The desert basis has already been discussed in section 2.2: a certain kind of wrong. The focus of the discussion at this point is on two puzzles about the existence of a desert basis. The first puzzle concerns how humans, given the fact that our choices are grounded in our brain activity, and that our brains are parts of the physical world, can have the sort of free will necessary to deserve punishment at all. The second puzzle concerns why, even if they deserve punishment, that fact should make it permissible for anyone to take on the role of giving them the punishment they deserve.

The laws of physics might be thought to imply that we are no more free and responsible for our “choices”, and therefore no more capable of deserving punishment, than any other physical object, be it a falling tree or a wild animal. One can resist this move by arguing that while we are physical beings, most of us have the capacity to weigh reasons for and against particular options, and to choose—these being the key abilities for being responsible agents who can deserve punishment if they choose to do wrong (Fischer and Ravizza 1998; Morse 2004; Nadelhoffer 2013). But this invites the reply that even in normally functioning adults the attribution of responsibility for choices is an illusion (Smilansky 2000). Upon closer inspection, the agent dissolves and all we are left with is a brain responding to stimuli in a way fully consistent with the underlying physical laws (Kelly 2009; Greene & Cohen 2011; Vihvelin 2003 [2018]). See the entry on compatibilism for a survey of a range of possible responses to this argument.

Assuming that wrongdoers can, at least sometimes, deserve punishment, the next question is: why think others may punish them just because they are deserving? David Dolinko (1991) points out that there is a difference between someone morally deserving something and others having a right to give it to her. In one example, he imagines a father who (perversely) gives his reprobate son almost everything in his will, and leaves his loving and respectful son a pittance. We may believe that the loving son deserves to inherit at least half of his father's estate, but that would not entitle anyone to take property from the other son to give to him (1991: 544). Putting the point more generally, desert by itself does not justify doing things that otherwise would violate rights. Moreover, since people normally have a right not to suffer punishment, desert alone should not justify punishing them.

The most promising way to respond to this criticism within a retributive framework is to distinguish two kinds of desert: desert that corresponds to a view about what would be a good outcome, and desert that concerns rights (Hill 1999: 425–426; Berman 2008: 271–281). Dolinko's example concerns the first kind of desert. But insofar as retributive desert presupposes forfeiture of the right not to be punished, it is unsurprising that there should be some agents who have the right to mete it out. Who they are is the subject of the next section.

4.2 Who may punish?

Assuming that wrongdoers deserve to be punished, who has a right to inflict the punishment? Who, in other words, are the appropriate desert agents? One might start, as Hobbes and Locke did, with the view that in the state of nature, the victim has the right to punish, and that the reasons for creating a state include reasons for potential victims to transfer that right to the state (Hobbes 1651: chs. 14 & 18; Locke 1690: ch. 9).

One worry about this sort of view is that it could license vigilante punishment. Social contract theorists can handle that by emphasizing that people not only delegate but transfer their right to punish, retaining only a vestigial right to punish in the case of minor punishments, such as would be doled out outside the criminal justice system, or if the state fails or is unable to act. Communitarians like Antony Duff (2011: 6), however, object to even a vestigial right to vigilante punishment. Duff sees the state, which speaks on behalf of the whole community, as the only proper punisher, at least in the context of crimes (For an even stronger position along these lines, see Hegel 1821: §102).

Others take a different view about vigilantes, namely that anyone is pro tanto entitled to punish a wrongdoer. Some forfeiture theorists hold that restrictions on the right to punish someone who has forfeited her right not to be punished arise only as a matter of political morality (Wellman 2017: 30–31). It is hard to see why a desert theorist could not take the same position. Indeed, some retributivists think that what vigilantes do should at least count against the total punishment someone is due (Husak 1990: 441–442; but see Kolber 2013 (discussed in section 3 of the supplementary document Challenges to the Notion of Retributive Proportionality) for a challenge to the logical implication that vigilantes “punish”).

Even if the state normally has an exclusive right to punish criminal wrongdoing, questions arise whether it is permitted to punish if it sustains or fails to address important social injustices (from distributive injustice to the denial of civil and political rights to socially disempowered groups). (For an overview of the literature on this, see Ewing 2018).

Finally, can the wrongdoer herself be her own punitive desert agent? Can she repent and voluntarily take on hardships, and thereby preempt others' right to punish her? Duff has argued that she cannot unless she has also suffered public criticism and social ostracism—and even then, such informal punishment should be discouraged as a substitute for formal punishment (Duff 2001: 118–120).

4.3 Moral puzzles of suffering

Retributive justice normally is taken to hold that it is intrinsically (or non-instrumentally) good that wrongdoers suffer hard treatment at the hands of punishers. But as Hart put it, retributive justice

appears to be a mysterious piece of moral alchemy in which the combination of the two evils of moral wickedness and suffering are transmuted into good. (Hart 1968: 234–235)

Moreover, some critics think the view that it is intrinsically good to inflict suffering is “barbaric” (Tadros 2011: 63) or “morally repugnant” (Scanlon 2013: 102).

The core retributivist response to these criticisms has to be that it is neither absurd nor barbaric to think that the normative valence of suffering might sometimes be positive. But even if that is correct, one must also ask whether suffering itself is valuable or if it is only the suffering of punishment that matters, and whether the suffering should be understood in terms of objective deprivations or subjective suffering.

4.3.1 The variable normative valence of suffering

Retributivists think that deserved suffering should be distinguished from non-deserved suffering. While the latter is inherently bad, the former, at least if inflicted by a proper punitive desert agent, is inherently good (Hegel 1821: §99; Zaibert 2018: chs. 2 & 3; Alexander & Ferzan 2018: 184–185). Just as grief is good and morally valuable when a loved one has died, so suffering might be good and morally valuable when experienced by a wrongdoer, especially if experienced in a way that is appropriately connected to having committed a particular wrong. Of course, it would be better if there were no occasion to inflict suffering, but given that a wrong has been committed, inflicting deserved suffering in response is better than not doing so. (For another example of something with a variable normative valence, see Kant's doctrine of the highest good: happiness in proportion to virtue. Kant 1788 [1956: 115].)

Victor Tadros (2013: 261) raises an important concern about this response to Hart's objection, namely that if a person were already suffering, then the situation might be made better if the person engaged in wrongdoing, thereby making the suffering valuable. One way to avoid this unwanted implication is to say that the negative value of the wrong would outweigh any increased value in the suffering, and that the wronging is still deontologically prohibited, even if it would somehow improve the value picture (see Alexander & Ferzan 2018: 187–188). But this reply leaves intact the thought that something valuable nonetheless occurs if a suffering person commits a crime: her suffering at least now fits (see Tadros 2015: 401-403). Insofar as retributivists should find this an unwanted implication, they have reason to say that suffering is valuable only if it is meted out for a wrong done. This connection is the concern of the next section.

4.3.2 Suffering in the abstract versus suffering through punishment

Some retributivists take the view that what wrongdoing calls for is the wrongdoer's suffering, whatever causes it. As Mitchell Berman writes (2013: 87), “the dominant retributivist view” is “that what wrongdoers deserve is ‘to suffer’” (see also Zaibert 2013: 43 n.19; but see Kleinig 1973: 67, discussing the value of imposing suffering). Even though Berman himself does not quite embrace that view, he embraces a close cousin, namely that a wrongdoer deserves that her life “go less well [than it] would have otherwise gone” (2013: 104).

There is something intuitively appealing, if one has retributive intuitions, about the thought that it is better if a wrongdoer—especially one who has committed serious wrongs—lives miserably than if she lives happily. There is something galling, if one feels the retributive impulse, in the thought that she might “get away with it”. Nonetheless, it is important to distinguish the thought that it is good to punish a wrongdoer so that she does not “get away with it”, from the thought that it is better that she suffer than that she live happily, even if the suffering is not inflicted by punishment. The latter thought may draw on the same emotional wellspring as retributivism. But a retributivist—at least one who rejects the fantasy that God inflicts such suffering as a matter of cosmic justice—should not base her conception of retributivism on it.

If retributivism were based on the thought that wrongdoers' suffering is good in itself, then punishment is not necessary as a bridge connecting the suffering and the individual bad acts. If the connection between individual bad acts and suffering is lost, then retributivists are left with the need to keep a whole-life ledger of good and bad acts, for which they want a person to have the appropriate amount of whole-life happiness or suffering (Ezorsky 1972: xxvi; Tadros 2011: 68). But the idea of tracking all of a person's good and bad deeds, and all of her happiness or suffering, and aiming to align them is problematic. It suggests that one could bank good deeds and “earn the ability to commit misdeeds with impunity” (Alexander 2013: 318). Such banking should be rejected, even though it is plausible that performing heroic deeds after having committed a wrong mitigates the punishment deserved.

4.3.3 Subjective suffering or measures expected to cause suffering

Adam Kolber, no retributivist, argues that retributivists cannot ignore the subjective experience of punishment.

To be retributively punished, the person punished must find the punishment aversive and the severity of the punishment is at least partly a function of how aversive he finds it. (2009: 215)

Kolber continues:

Retributivists who fail to consider variation in offenders' actual or anticipated experiences of punishment are not measuring punishment severity properly and are therefore punishing disproportionally. (2009: 215; see also Bronsteen et al. 2009: 1068–1072)

Yet, as Kolber points out, accommodating such variation would be intuitively problematic for retributivists. It would call, for example, for short sentences for those who would suffer a lot in prison and for extra harsh treatment for those who find prison easy to handle. This is a far cry from current practice. (For retributivists who agree and think the practice should be reformed, see Alexander & Ferzan 2018: 199.)

Many retributivists disagree with Kolber's claim that the subjective experience of suffering of particular individuals should be a significant concern for them. As Andrew von Hirsch and Andrew Ashworth put it:

What makes punishments more or less onerous is not any identifiable sensation; rather, it is the degree to which those sensations interfere with people's legitimate interests

—interests people generally share, such as in

freedom of movement, choice regarding … activities, choice of associates, privacy, and so on. (von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005: 147; see also Gray 2010; Markel & Flanders 2010)

But this response, by itself, seems inadequate. Surely Kolber is right that the subjective experience of punishment as hard treatment is part of its point, and that variation in that experience is something that needs to be justified.

A second way to respond to Kolber's argument is to reject the premise that retributivists must justify imposing greater subjective suffering on some rather than others as a matter of retributive justice. As was pointed out in section 2.1, punishment must be intentional; what results as a mere side-effect of punishment is not itself part of the punishment. Retributivists can intend to impose punishments that will generally be experienced as more severe—for example, longer prison terms or more austere prisons—the more serious the wrong for which they are imposed, knowing but not intending that different people will experience the same term in the same prison differently.

The retributivist can then justify causing excessive suffering in some people—too little suffering is less objectionable—if three conditions obtain:

  1. the punishment that leads to it is itself deserved,
  2. the importance of giving wrongdoers what they deserve—both the intrinsic importance in terms of retributive justice and the extrinsic importance in terms of other goods, such as deterrence and incapacitation thereby achieved—is sufficiently high to outweigh the bad of excessive suffering, and
  3. the problems with eliminating excessive suffering are too great to be overcome without excessive costs to other morally important ends.

These conditions call for a few comments. First, the excessive suffering in condition (b) should be incidental excessive suffering. If it is suffering that is intentionally inflicted to achieve some other end, then it will be as hard to justify as punishing the innocent. Second, there is reason to think these conditions often obtain. Focusing only on the last condition, there are at least four reasons to think it obtains: individual tailoring of punishment

  1. invites gaming the system;
  2. would be perceived by some as unfair because those who claim to be extra sensitive would seem to be given undue leniency, and that would lead to resentment and extra conflict;
  3. would undermine predictability, which would arguably be unfair to people contemplating a crime in the same way that ex post facto increases in punishment are considered unfair; and
  4. would likely lead to abuse of power.

(For responses to an earlier version of this argument, see Kolber 2019: 584–586.)

It might also often be less problematic to cause excessive suffering than it may at first seem if people are to some degree responsible for their own hypersensitivity—compare Rawls's thought that people are responsible for their own preferences (Rawls 1975 [1999: 261]).

That said, the state should accommodate people who would suffer extreme trauma from normal punishments. For example, someone who is extremely sensitive to the cold should be given extra clothing and blankets or a space heater. But that does not imply that the punishers should try, in general, to tailor the subjective experience of suffering to be proportional to the crime.

4.4 Proportionality

Retributive justice holds that it would be unjust to punish a wrongdoer more than she deserves, where what she deserves must be in some way proportional to the gravity of her crime. Inflicting disproportionate punishment wrongs a criminal in much the same way as, even if not quite as much as, punishing an innocent person wrongs her (Gross 1979: 436).

One might wonder how a retributivist can be so concerned with disproportionately punishing while also tolerating the known infliction of excessive suffering (see section 4.3.3). But there is an important difference between the two: an agent inflicting punishment may come to know that a particular individual is suffering more than most would from a particular punishment, but she should see that as just an unfortunate side effect of inflicting a proportional punishment; she must aim, however, at inflicting only a proportional punishment.

The possibility of punishing less than deserved is also normatively significant, but it provides a much weaker constraint. First, it does not seem to wrong anyone in particular (see Duus-Otterström 2013: 472–475). One might think that the victims of crime are wronged if wrongdoers are not punished. But the view that it wrongs victims not to punish wrongdoers confuses vengeance, which is victim-centered, with retributivism, which is agent-centered: concerned with giving the wrongdoer the punishment she deserves (see Paul Robinson's 2008 contrast between vengeful and deontological conceptions of deserved punishment). Second, it is clear that in any criminal justice system that allows plea-bargaining, intentional deviations below desert will have to be tolerated. Russell Christopher (2003) has argued that retributivists cannot accept plea-bargaining. But he bases his argument on a number of unsound assumptions, including that “[r]etributivism imposes an absolute duty to punish culpable wrongdoers whenever the opportunity arises” (2003: 101), and that punishing a wrongdoer less than she deserves violates her “right to punishment” (2003.: 128–129). Both of these have been rejected above. Christopher correctly notes that retributivists desire to treat equally culpable people alike (2003: 131). But this could be simply because they desire to give people the treatment they deserve in some non-comparative sense (Alexander and Ferzan 2018: 181), not because they care about equality per se.

This leaves two fundamental questions that an account of proportionality must address: how should we measure the gravity of a wrong, and how can a punishment be “proportional” to it? These are addressed in the supplementary document: Challenges to the Notion of Retributive Proportionality.

4.5 Strength of retributive reasons

How strong are retributive reasons? As was argued in section 3.3, even if they are weak, the presence of positive desert makes a difference to the justification of punishment. It might affect, for example, how one understands the forfeiture of the right not to be punished. It is a separate question, however, whether positive desert carries much weight in establishing an all-things-considered reason to punish.

To be more precise, there are actually two ways the strength or weakness of retributive reasons can be significant. It may affect whether an individual wrongdoer should be punished, even if no instrumental good (primarily deterrence and incapacitation) would thereby be achieved, assuming that the institutions for punishment are in place. But it may also affect whether institutions of punishment should be established, even if no instrumental goods would thereby be achieved. It may be relatively easy to justify punishing a wrongdoer by appeal to positive desert, even if her punishment yields no instrumental benefits, if the institutions of punishment are already up, running, and paid for (Moore 1997: 100–101; Husak 2000: 995). It is another matter to claim that the institutions of punishment, given all their costs, can be justified by positive desert alone. The point of saying this is not to suggest, in the spirit of Hart (1968: 9) that the justification of institutions of criminal justice should be purely consequentialist. The retributivist sees desert as a reason for setting up the institutions as well as for punishing the individual wrongdoer (Moore 1997: 154). The point is merely that one should be clear about just what one is assessing when weighing costs and benefits.

The primary costs of establishing the institutions of criminal punishment are:

  1. Financial: (according the U.S. Bureau of Justice Statistics, states spent over $51 billion on corrections in 2015) with corresponding opportunity costs (that money could have been spent on schools, medical research, infrastructure, or taxpayer refunds, to name only a few alternatives);
  2. Errors (convicting the innocent, over-punishing the guilty, and punishing those who deserve no punishment under laws that overcriminalize);
  3. The risk of the abuse of power (political and other forms of oppressive uses of the criminal justice system); and
  4. Collateral harm to innocents (e.g., the families of convicts who lose the support from those who are punished). (See Husak 2000 for the first three.)

It is implausible that these costs can be justified simply by the importance of punishing wrongdoers as they deserve to be punished. The only plausible way to justify these costs is if criminal punishment has large instrumental benefits in terms of crime prevention (Husak 2000; Cahill 2011; Lippke 2019).

4.6 Retributive consequentialism versus retributive deontology

Retributivism seems to contain both a deontological and a consequentialist element. Its negative desert element is deontological. It is a conceptual, not a deontological, point that one cannot punish another whom one believes to be innocent (section 2.1). But it is a deontological point that an avenue of justification for hard treatment is opened up, making permissible what might otherwise have been impermissible, if that person is guilty and therefore forfeits her right not to be so treated.

Insofar as retributivism holds that it is intrinsically good if a legitimate punisher punishes the guilty, it seems to have a consequentialist element as well. This good has to be weighed against other possible goods to decide what it would be best to do (Cahill 2011). Thus, most retributivists would accept that it is justifiable to forego punishing one deserving person if doing so would make it possible to punish two equally deserving people, or one more deserving person—as happens on a regular basis in plea-bargaining (Moore 1997: 157–158; Berman 2011: 451–452; see also section 4.4).

Berman (2011) has argued that retributivism can appropriately be understood not just as having a consequentialist element, but as having an instrumentalist element, namely that punishment is a valuable tool in achieving the suffering that a wrongdoer deserves. But he argues that retributivism can also be understood as non-instrumentalist if the desert object is punishment, not suffering. It would be non-instrumentalist because punishment would not be a means to achieving the good of suffering; it would be good in itself. As argued in section 4.3, punishment, not suffering, should be thought of as the proper retributive desert object, and thus the instrumentalist conception should be rejected.

5. The Question of Justification

The principal focus of concern when it comes to justifying retributivism is justifying its desert object. The question is: if we can assume that the institutions of punishment can be justified all things considered, can we justify the claim that wrongdoers deserve censure and hard treatment?

Censure is surely the easier of the two. It respects the wrongdoer as a responsible agent to censure her, and it respects the victim (if there is one) to stand up for her as someone whose rights should have been respected. The core challenge for justifying retributivism, then, is justifying the claim that hard treatment is equally deserved.

As Michael Moore (1997: 106) points out, there are two general strategies for justifying retributive hard treatment: (1) showing how such treatment “follows from some yet more general principle of justice that we think to be true”, and (2) showing that it fits with a theory of punishment that “best accounts for those of our more particular judgments that we also believe to be true”. These will be handled in reverse order.

5.1 Conformity with our considered judgments

The argument here has two prongs. First, most people intuitively think that it is important to punish wrongdoers with proportional hard treatment, even if no other good would thereby be brought about. Second, there is no reason to doubt that these intuitions are reliable.

It seems clear that the vast majority of people share the retributive intuition that makes up the first prong (Moore 1997: 101). Consider again the example of the incapacitated rapist mentioned in section 1. The intuition is widely shared that he should be punished even if doing so is expected to produce no consequentialist good distinct from him getting the punishment he deserves.

The weakness of this strategy is in prong two. One might suspect that retributive intuitions are merely the reflection of emotions, such as a thirst for vengeance, that are morally dubious. They may be deeply grounded in our species as part of our evolutionary history, but that fact by itself is insufficient to consider them morally reliable—compare other deeply engrained emotional impulses, such as tribalism, that are clearly morally problematic (Bloom 2013). Moreover, the label “vengeance” is not merely used as a pejorative; a retributive or vengeful response to wrongdoing has to confront moral arguments that it is a misplaced reaction. Foremost among these is the argument that we do not really have free will—see section 4.1.3. Respect for the dignity of wrongdoers as agents may call for censuring them when they do wrong, and with requiring them to make reparations when those can be made. It is unclear, however, why it calls, in addition, for hard treatment. Rather, sympathy for wrongdoers as products of their biology and environment seems to call for mercy and forgiveness (for a contrary view, see Levy 2014).

Moore (1997: 145) has an interesting response to this sort of criticism. He turns to the first-person point of view. He imagines that he has committed some horrible violent crime, and then says that he hopes his response “would be that I would feel guilty unto death”. As a result, he hopes that he would welcome punishment for having committed such a crime. Moore then turns the table and says that one should resist the “elitist and condescending” temptation to withhold that judgment from others (1997: 148).

This is a rhetorically powerful move, but it is nonetheless open to four objections. First, it presupposes that one can infer the propriety of the third-person reaction of blame and punishment from the first-person reaction of guilt and self-punishment. But there are things a person should do to herself that others should not feel equally free to do to her (Duff 2007: 383; Zaibert 2018: 94–95). Second, it may reflect only the imagination of a person who has committed no such serious crimes, rather than the insight of a person who knows what it is like to have committed a serious crime and then tried to come to terms with himself. Third, it equates the propriety of feeling or inflicting guilt with the propriety of adding punishment to guilt. But why is guilt itself not enough (see Husak 2016: 59–60)? Fourth, one can question whether even the reaction of guilt is a morally sound one. Might it not be a sort of sickness, as Nietzsche (1887 [2006: 60]) put it, “bad conscience, … the will to self-violation”.

Consider what Jeffrie Murphy (2007: 18) said, as a mature philosopher, looking back on his own efforts to justify retributivism:

[M]y enthusiasm for settling scores and restoring balance through retributive justice may in part have been extensions of what Nietzsche called “a soul that squints”—the soul of a shopkeeper or an accountant. If I had been a kinder person, a less angry person, a person of more generous spirit and greatness of soul, would robust retributivism have charmed me to the degree that it at one time did? I suspect not.

The point is not to say that this first justificatory strategy fails. It is to say that it does not obviously succeed. The notion of retributive justice would be on sounder footing if this justification were supplemented by a theoretical justification for punitive hard treatment that ties it to a more general set of principles of justice. Doing so would help dispel doubts that retributive intuitions are the crabbed judgments of a squinty, vengeful, or cruel soul.

5.2 Fairness and free riding

Arguably the most popular theoretical framework for justifying retributivism in the past fifty years or so has been Herbert Morris's (1968) appeal to fairness. The argument starts with the thought that it is to our mutual benefit to live in society, and that to be in society, we have to accept certain limits on our behavior. It then continues with this claim:

If a person fails to exercise self-restraint even though he might have… he renounces a burden which others have voluntarily assumed and thus gains an advantage which others, who have restrained themselves, do not possess. (1968: 33)

It concludes with the thought that his unfair advantage should be erased by “exacting the debt” (1968: 34). This is done with hard treatment.

Though influential, the problems with this argument are serious. First, it is unclear that criminals have advantages that others have forsaken. Suppose someone murders another in a moment of anger, triggered by a minor offense. Does he get the “advantage” of getting to express his anger? What if most people feel they can express their anger sufficiently in such situations by expressing it in words? Then it seems that the only advantage he has is being able to express his anger violently. But if most people do not, at least not upon reflection, wish to do that sort of thing, then he is not renouncing a burden that others too wish to renounce.

Even if there is some sense in which he gains an advantage over others, such as the advantage of being free to use violence, what would then be the proper measure of bringing him back in line? To see the problem, compare how “far ahead” such a murderer is likely to get to how “far ahead” someone might get by economic fraud. Fraud may produce a much greater advantage, but we normally think that violence is the greater crime. (Davis 1993 challenges this framing of the advantage gained, suggesting the right test is the value a crime would find at an auction of licenses to commit crimes; Shafer-Landau 1996: 303 rejects this solution as equally implausible.)

More problematically yet, it seems to be fundamentally missing the point to say that the crime of, for example, murder is, at bottom, free riding rather than unjustly killing another. (For these and related criticisms, see Braithwaite & Pettit 1990: 158–159; Dolinko 1991: 545–549; Murphy 2007: 13–14.)

An alternative interpretation of Morris's idea is that the relevant benefit is the opportunity to live in a relatively secure state, and the wrong is not the gaining of an extra benefit but the failure to accept the burdens that, collectively, make that benefit possible. Punishment then removes the benefit that the wrongdoer cannot fairly lay claim to, having shirked the burden that it was her due to carry (see Westen 2016). This interpretation avoids the first of the problems outlined above. But it still has difficulty accounting for the thought that a crime such as murder is not fundamentally about free riding. Moreover, it has difficulty accounting for proportional punishment in a plausible way. Presumably, the measure of a proportional punishment would be something like this: the greater the shirking of one's duty to accept the burdens of self-restraint, the larger should be one's punishment. But how do we measure the degree of shirking? By the harm one causes or risks causing, by the benefit one receives, or by the degree to which respecting the burden shirked would have been burdensome? Only the first corresponds with a normal retributive notion of punishment, but this alternative reading seems to point to one of the latter two meanings as the measure of unjust gain. In addition, this view seems to imply that one who entered a secure society from some sort of failed state, and who has not yet benefited from the secure state, cannot be punished if she commits violent criminal acts in the secure state. This is quite an odd implication, though one that a social contract theorist might be willing to accept.

For another attempt to develop a better Morris-like view, making the wrong the undermining of the conditions of trust, see Dimock 1997: 41. For a criticism, see Korman 2003. For an attempt to build on Morris's idea, translating the basic wrong into flouting legitimate, democratic law, see Markel 2011.

5.3 Vindicating victims by defeating wrongdoers

Jean Hampton tried to improve upon the unfair advantage theory by focusing on the idea that what wrongdoers (at least those who have victims) do is an affront to the victim, not just to the whole community. Her view is that punishment must somehow annul this affront. As she puts it:

If I have value equal to that of my assailant, then that must be made manifest after I have been victimized. By victimizing me, the wrongdoer has declared himself elevated with respect to me, acting as a superior who is permitted to use me for his purposes. A false moral claim has been made… The retributivist demands that the false claim be corrected. The lord must be humbled to show that he isn't the lord of the victim. … [R]etributive punishment is the defeat of the wrongdoer at the hands of the victim (either directly or indirectly through an agent of the victim's, e.g., the state) that symbolizes the correct relative value of wrongdoer and victim. It is a symbol that is conceptually required to reaffirm a victim's equal worth in the face of a challenge to it. (Murphy & Hampton 1988: 125–126)

This theory too suffers serious problems. First, why think that a wrongful act seriously challenges the equal moral standing of all? It may imply that the wrongdoer thinks of himself as above either the law in general or his victim in particular. But he's simply mistaken. Unless there is a danger that people will believe he is right, it is not clear why there is a pressing need to correct him.

Second, even if the message is offensive in a way that calls for correction, why isn't the solution simply to reaffirm the moral status of the victim, to censor the wrongdoer, and perhaps to require the wrongdoer to make compensation? The answer may be that “actions speak louder than words”. Perhaps some punishment may then be necessary to show that we really mean it when we say that he was mistaken. But why wouldn't it be sufficient to inflict “the punishment”—whatever that is—to reinforce the point? It's unclear why the punishment should rise above some baseline-level, in proportion with the gravity of the wrong, to show that “we mean it”.

Third, the message of equality through turning the tables seems peculiar. If the victim, with the help of others, gets to take her turn being lord, it is not clear how that sends the message of equality, rather than simply the message that this particular wrongdoer lost in the competition to be “lord”.

Fourth, Hampton seems to have fallen into a trap that also was a problem for Morris, namely substituting one wrong for another. The wrong of being raped is not the message that the rapist sends; it is the rape. (For variations on these criticisms, see Dolinko 1991: 551–554; for Hampton's replies to her critics, see Hampton 1992.)

5.4 Communication theories

Antony Duff (2001 and 2011) offers a communication theory according to which punishment is necessary to communicate censure for wrongdoing. It might be objected that his theory is too narrow to provide a justificatory framework for retributivism generally, because it is framed as a theory for legal punishment, meted out by a state that governs a community of equal citizens. (The same applies to the similar theory developed by Markel 2011.) But arguably it could be extended to any community.

Putting the narrowness issue aside, two questions remain. The first is whether it is constructive for the sort of community that Duff strives to preserve to condemn wrongdoers. As Lacey and Pickard (2015a) put it, stigmatizing offenders with condemnation alienates them from society (and they are likely alienated already) and undermines their potential to see themselves as eventually redeemed. To this worry, Duff may be able to respond that the form of condemnation he has in mind is nothing more than treating wrongdoers as responsible for their criminal acts.

But this then leads to a second question, namely whether Duff’s theory can account for hard treatment. As Duff raises the issue:

Censure can … be communicated by “hard treatment” punishments …—by imprisonment, by compulsory community service, by fines and the like, which are burdensome independently of their censorial meaning…: but why should we choose such methods of communication, rather than methods that do not involve hard treatment? (Duff 2013)

One answer he gives is that:

[P]enal hard treatment [is] an essential aspect of the enterprise of moral communication itself. Punishment, on this view, should aim not merely to communicate censure to the offender, but to persuade the offender to recognize and repent the wrong he has done, … and to make apologetic reparation to those whom he wronged. [The] hard treatment aspects [of his punishment], the burden it imposes on him, should serve both to assist the process of repentance and reform, by focusing his attention on his crime and its implications, and as a way of making the apologetic reparation that he owes. (2013)

The problem, however, as Duff is well aware, is that it is not clear why “hard treatment [is] a necessary aspect of a communicative enterprise” (2013, emphasis added). Indeed, Lacey and Pickard (2015a) suggest that hard treatment actually interferes with the communicative enterprise.

One might think it is enough for retributivist accounts of punishment if hard treatment can constitute an important part of communicating to both the wrongdoer and the rest of the community the censure that the wrongdoer deserves. The worry, however, is that it may not suffice to say that hard treatment is one possible method of communicating censure. Given the normal moral presumptions against imposing suffering on others, it may be necessary to show that censure alone, unaccompanied by extra suffering, cannot be fully or properly communicated. This may be very hard to show. Though the possibility that the value of suffering may depend on the context in which it is experience or inflicted—see section 4.3.1—may lighten the burden of proof.

6. Conclusion

Retributive justice has a deep grip on the punitive intuitions of most people. Nevertheless, it has been subject to wide-ranging criticism. Arguably the most worrisome criticism is that theoretical accounts of why wrongdoers positively deserve hard treatment are inadequate. If they are inadequate, then retributive justice provides an incomplete theory of punishment, one that at most explains why wrongdoers deserve censure. Even the idea that wrongdoers forfeit the right not to be suffer proportional hard treatment might be better explained by appeal to other explanations of why hard treatment (1) is instrumentally valuable, and (2) is consistent with respect for the wrongdoer.

The question is, what alternatives are there? Consider, for example, the proposal to replace moral desert with something like institutional desert, i.e., desert based on what the institution prescribes without appeal to a prior notion of moral desert. According to this proposal, a wrongdoer cannot reasonably complain that institutions that threaten punishment if she does wrong, and then follow through on the threat if she is duly convicted of wrongdoing, treat her unjustly (Quinn 1985; Hill 1999; Finkelstein 2004; Bedau & Kelly 2010 [2019: §4]). Surely there is utility in having such institutions, and a person would normally have a fair chance to avoid punishment—with the rare exception of false convictions—simply by avoiding wrongdoing. Nevertheless, this sort of justification of legal or institutional desert cannot straightforwardly explain the proportionality limit that forms such a core part of the intuitive appeal of retributive justice. To explain why the law may not assign whatever punishments the lawmakers reasonably conclude will produce the best effects overall, the idea of retributive justice may be essential.

This limitation to proportional punishment is central to retributivism. The negative desert claim holds that only that much punishment may be inflicted, and the positive desert claim holds that that much punishment, but no more, is morally deserved and in that sense respectful of the wrongdoer. Unless one is willing to give up on the idea that morality imposes a proportionality limit and on the importance of positive moral desert for justifying punishment up to that point as respectful of the individual—both intuitively difficult to give up—there is reason to continue to take notion of retributive justice, and the project of justifying it, seriously.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Beyond Intractability, by Michelle Maiese (University of Colorado); updated by Sarah Cast and Heidi Burgess.
  • Punishment, Kevin Murtagh (John Jay College of Criminal Justice), in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


The author would like to thank Mitchell Berman, Michael DaSilva, Antony Duff, Kim Ferzan, Doug Husak, Adam Kolber, Ken Levy, Beth Valentine and an anonymous editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for comments on earlier drafts.

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Alec Walen <>

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