The Analysis of Knowledge

First published Tue Feb 6, 2001; substantive revision Tue Mar 7, 2017

For any person, there are some things they know, and some things they don’t. What exactly is the difference? What does it take to know something? It’s not enough just to believe it—we don’t know the things we’re wrong about. Knowledge seems to be more like a way of getting at the truth. The analysis of knowledge concerns the attempt to articulate in what exactly this kind of “getting at the truth” consists.

More particularly, the project of analysing knowledge is to state conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for propositional knowledge, thoroughly answering the question, what does it take to know something? By “propositional knowledge”, we mean knowledge of a proposition—for example, if Susan knows that Alyssa is a musician, she has knowledge of the proposition that Alyssa is a musician. Propositional knowledge should be distinguished from knowledge of “acquaintance”, as obtains when Susan knows Alyssa. The relation between propositional knowledge and the knowledge at issue in other “knowledge” locutions in English, such as knowledge-where (“Susan knows where she is”) and especially knowledge-how (“Susan knows how to ride a bicycle”) is subject to some debate (see Stanley 2011 and his opponents discussed therein).

The propositional knowledge that is the analysandum of the analysis of knowledge literature is paradigmatically expressed in English by sentences of the form “S knows that p”, where “S” refers to the knowing subject, and “p” to the proposition that is known. A proposed analysis consists of a statement of the following form: S knows that p if and only if j, where j indicates the analysans: paradigmatically, a list of conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for S to have knowledge that p.

It is not enough merely to pick out the actual extension of knowledge. Even if, in actual fact, all cases of S knowing that p are cases of j, and all cases of the latter are cases of the former, j might fail as an analysis of knowledge. For example, it might be that there are possible cases of knowledge without j, or vice versa. A proper analysis of knowledge should at least be a necessary truth. Consequently, hypothetical thought experiments provide appropriate test cases for various analyses, as we shall see below.

Even a necessary biconditional linking knowledge to some state j would probably not be sufficient for an analysis of knowledge, although just what more is required is a matter of some controversy. According to some theorists, to analyze knowledge is literally to identify the components that make up knowledge—compare a chemist who analyzes a sample to learn its chemical composition. On this interpretation of the project of analyzing knowledge, the defender of a successful analysis of knowledge will be committed to something like the metaphysical claim that what it is for S to know p is for some list of conditions involving S and p to obtain. Other theorists think of the analysis of knowledge as distinctively conceptual—to analyse knowledge is to limn the structure of the concept of knowledge. On one version of this approach, the concept knowledge is literally composed of more basic concepts, linked together by something like Boolean operators. Consequently, an analysis is subject not only to extensional accuracy, but to facts about the cognitive representation of knowledge and other epistemic notions. In practice, many epistemologists engaging in the project of analyzing knowledge leave these metaphilosophical interpretive questions unresolved; attempted analyses, and counterexamples thereto, are often proposed without its being made explicit whether the claims are intended as metaphysical or conceptual ones. In many cases, this lack of specificity may be legitimate, since all parties tend to agree that an analysis of knowledge ought at least to be extensionally correct in all metaphysically possible worlds. As we shall see, many theories have been defended and, especially, refuted, on those terms.

The attempt to analyze knowledge has received a considerable amount of attention from epistemologists, particularly in the late 20th Century, but no analysis has been widely accepted. Some contemporary epistemologists reject the assumption that knowledge is susceptible to analysis.

1. Knowledge as Justified True Belief

There are three components to the traditional (“tripartite”) analysis of knowledge. According to this analysis, justified, true belief is necessary and sufficient for knowledge.

The Tripartite Analysis of Knowledge:
S knows that p iff
  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S is justified in believing that p.

The tripartite analysis of knowledge is often abbreviated as the “JTB” analysis, for “justified true belief”.

Much of the twentieth-century literature on the analysis of knowledge took the JTB analysis as its starting-point. It became something of a convenient fiction to suppose that this analysis was widely accepted throughout much of the history of philosophy. In fact, however, the JTB analysis was first articulated in the twentieth century by its attackers.[1] Before turning to influential twentieth-century arguments against the JTB theory, let us briefly consider the three traditional components of knowledge in turn.

1.1 The Truth Condition

Most epistemologists have found it overwhelmingly plausible that what is false cannot be known. For example, Hillary Clinton did not win the 2016 US Presidential election. Consequently, nobody knows that Hillary Clinton won the election. One can only know things that are true.

Sometimes when people are very confident of something that turns out to be wrong, we use the word “knows” to describe their situation. Many people expected Clinton to win the election. Speaking loosely, one might even say that many people “knew” that Clinton would win the election—until she lost. Hazlett (2010) argues on the basis of data like this that “knows” is not a factive verb.[2] Hazlett’s diagnosis is deeply controversial; most epistemologists will treat sentences like “I knew that Clinton was going to win” as a kind of exaggeration—as not literally true.

Something’s truth does not require that anyone can know or prove that it is true. Not all truths are established truths. If you flip a coin and never check how it landed, it may be true that it landed heads, even if nobody has any way to tell. Truth is a metaphysical, as opposed to epistemological, notion: truth is a matter of how things are, not how they can be shown to be. So when we say that only true things can be known, we’re not (yet) saying anything about how anyone can access the truth. As we’ll see, the other conditions have important roles to play here. Knowledge is a kind of relationship with the truth—to know something is to have a certain kind of access to a fact.[3]

1.2 The Belief Condition

The belief condition is only slightly more controversial than the truth condition. The general idea behind the belief condition is that you can only know what you believe. Failing to believe something precludes knowing it. “Belief” in the context of the JTB theory means full belief, or outright belief. In a weak sense, one might “believe” something by virtue of being pretty confident that it’s probably true—in this weak sense, someone who considered Clinton the favourite to win the election, even while recognizing a nontrivial possibility of her losing, might be said to have “believed” that Clinton would win. Outright belief is stronger (see, e.g., Fantl & McGrath 2009: 141; Nagel 2010: 413–4; Williamson 2005: 108; or Gibbons 2013: 201.). To believe outright that p, it isn’t enough to have a pretty high confidence in p; it is something closer to a commitment or a being sure.[4]

Although initially it might seem obvious that knowing that p requires believing that p, a few philosophers have argued that knowledge without belief is indeed possible. Suppose Walter comes home after work to find out that his house has burned down. He says: “I don’t believe it”. Critics of the belief condition might argue that Walter knows that his house has burned down (he sees that it has), but, as his words indicate, he does not believe it. The standard response is that Walter’s avowal of disbelief is not literally true; what Walter wishes to convey by saying “I don’t believe it” is not that he really does not believe that his house has burned down, but rather that he finds it hard to come to terms with what he sees. If he genuinely didn’t believe it, some of his subsequent actions, such as phoning his insurance company, would be rather mysterious.

A more serious counterexample has been suggested by Colin Radford (1966). Suppose Albert is quizzed on English history. One of the questions is: “When did Queen Elizabeth die?” Albert doesn’t think he knows, but answers the question correctly. Moreover, he gives correct answers to many other questions to which he didn’t think he knew the answer. Let us focus on Albert’s answer to the question about Elizabeth:

  • (E)Elizabeth died in 1603.

Radford makes the following two claims about this example:

  1. Albert does not believe (E).
  2. Albert knows (E).

Radford’s intuitions about cases like these do not seem to be idiosyncratic; Myers-Schutz & Schwitzgebel (2013) find evidence suggesting that many ordinary speakers tend to react in the way Radford suggests. In support of (a), Radford emphasizes that Albert thinks he doesn’t know the answer to the question. He doesn’t trust his answer because he takes it to be a mere guess. In support of (b), Radford argues that Albert’s answer is not at all just a lucky guess. The fact that he answers most of the questions correctly indicates that he has actually learned, and never forgotten, such historical facts.

Since he takes (a) and (b) to be true, Radford holds that belief is not necessary for knowledge. But either of (a) and (b) might be resisted. One might deny (a), arguing that Albert does have a tacit belief that (E), even though it’s not one that he thinks amounts to knowledge. David Rose and Jonathan Schaffer (2013) take this route. Alternatively, one might deny (b), arguing that Albert’s correct answer is not an expression of knowledge, perhaps because, given his subjective position, he does not have justification for believing (E). The justification condition is the topic of the next section.

1.3 The Justification Condition

Why is condition (iii) necessary? Why not say that knowledge is true belief? The standard answer is that to identify knowledge with true belief would be implausible because a belief might be true even though it is formed improperly. Suppose that William flips a coin, and confidently believes—on no particular basis—that it will land tails. If by chance the coin does land tails, then William’s belief was true; but a lucky guess such as this one is no knowledge. For William to know, his belief must in some epistemic sense be proper or appropriate: it must be justified.[5]

Socrates articulates the need for something like a justification condition in Plato’s Theaetetus, when he points out that “true opinion” is in general insufficient for knowledge. For example, if a lawyer employs sophistry to induce a jury into a belief that happens to be true, this belief is insufficiently well-grounded to constitute knowledge.

1.3.1 Approaches to Justification

There is considerable disagreement among epistemologists concerning what the relevant sort of justification here consists in. Internalists about justification think that whether a belief is justified depends wholly on states in some sense internal to the subject. According to one common such sense of “internal”, only those features of a subject’s experience which are directly or introspectively available count as “internal”—call this “access internalism”. According to another, only intrinsic states of the subject are “internal”—call this “state internalism”. See Feldman & Conee 2001 for the distinction.

Conee and Feldman present an example of an internalist view. They have it that S’s belief that p is justified if and only if believing that p is the attitude towards p that best fits S’s evidence, where the latter is understood to depend only on S’s internal mental states. Conee and Feldman call their view “evidentialism”, and characterize this as the thesis that justification is wholly a matter of the subject’s evidence. Given their (not unsubstantial) assumption that what evidence a subject has is an internal matter, evidentialism implies internalism.[6] Externalists about justification think that factors external to the subject can be relevant for justification; for example, process reliabilists think that justified beliefs are those which are formed by a cognitive process which tends to produce a high proportion of true beliefs relative to false ones.[7] We shall return to the question of how reliabilist approaches bear on the analysis of knowledge in §6.1.

1.3.2 Kinds of Justification

It is worth noting that one might distinguish between two importantly different notions of justification, standardly referred to as “propositional justification” and “doxastic justification”. (Sometimes “ex ante” justification and “ex post” justification, respectively.)[8] Unlike that between internalist and externalist approaches to justification, the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification does not represent a conflict to be resolved; it is a distinction between two distinct properties that are called “justification”. Propositional justification concerns whether a subject has sufficient reason to believe a given proposition;[9] doxastic justification concerns whether a given belief is held appropriately.[10] One common way of relating the two is to suggest that propositional justification is the more fundamental, and that doxastic justification is a matter of a subject’s having a belief that is appropriately responsive to or based on their propositional justification.

The precise relation between propositional and doxastic justification is subject to controversy, but it is uncontroversial that the two notions can come apart. Suppose that Ingrid ignores a great deal of excellent evidence indicating that a given neighborhood is dangerous, but superstitiously comes to believe that the neighborhood is dangerous when she sees a black cat crossing the street. Since forming beliefs on the basis of superstition is not an epistemically appropriate way of forming beliefs, Ingrid’s belief is not doxastically justified; nevertheless, she does have good reason to believe as she does, so she does have propositional justification for the proposition that the neighborhood is dangerous.

Since knowledge is a particularly successful kind of belief, doxastic justification is a stronger candidate for being closely related to knowledge; the JTB theory is typically thought to invoke doxastic justification (but see Lowy 1978).

2. Lightweight Knowledge

Some epistemologists have suggested that there may be multiple senses of the term “knowledge”, and that not all of them require all three elements of the tripartite theory of knowledge. For example, some have argued that there is, in addition to the sense of “knowledge” gestured at above, another, weak sense of “knowledge”, that requires only true belief (see for example Hawthorne 2002 and Goldman & Olsson 2009; the latter contains additional relevant references). This view is sometimes motivated by the thought that, when we consider whether someone knows that p, or wonder which of a group of people know that p, often, we are not at all interested in whether the relevant subjects have beliefs that are justified; we just want to know whether they have the true belief. For example, as Hawthorne (2002: 253–54) points out, one might ask how many students know that Vienna is the capital of Austria; the correct answer, one might think, just is the number of students who offer “Vienna” as the answer to the corresponding question, irrespective of whether their beliefs are justified. Similarly, if you are planning a surprise party for Eugene and ask whether he knows about it, “yes” may be an appropriate answer merely on the grounds that Eugene believes that you are planning a party.

One could allow that there is a lightweight sense of knowledge that requires only true belief; another option is to decline to accept the intuitive sentences as true at face value. A theorist might, for instance, deny that sentences like “Eugene knows that you are planning a party”, or “eighteen students know that Vienna is the capital of Austria” are literally true in the envisaged situations, explaining away their apparent felicity as loose talk or hyperbole.

Even among those epistemologists who think that there is a lightweight sense of “knows” that does not require justification, most typically admit that there is also a stronger sense which does, and that it is this stronger state that is the main target of epistemological theorizing about knowledge. In what follows, we will set aside the lightweight sense, if indeed there be one, and focus on the stronger one.

3. The Gettier Problem

Few contemporary epistemologists accept the adequacy of the JTB analysis. Although most agree that each element of the tripartite theory is necessary for knowledge, they do not seem collectively to be sufficient. There seem to be cases of justified true belief that still fall short of knowledge. Here is one kind of example:

Imagine that we are seeking water on a hot day. We suddenly see water, or so we think. In fact, we are not seeing water but a mirage, but when we reach the spot, we are lucky and find water right there under a rock. Can we say that we had genuine knowledge of water? The answer seems to be negative, for we were just lucky. (quoted from Dreyfus 1997: 292)

This example comes from the Indian philosopher Dharmottara, c. 770 CE. The 14th-century Italian philosopher Peter of Mantua presented a similar case:

Let it be assumed that Plato is next to you and you know him to be running, but you mistakenly believe that he is Socrates, so that you firmly believe that Socrates is running. However, let it be so that Socrates is in fact running in Rome; however, you do not know this. (from Peter of Mantua’s De scire et dubitare, given in Boh 1985: 95)

Cases like these, in which justified true belief seems in some important sense disconnected from the fact, were made famous in Edmund Gettier’s 1963 paper, “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?”. Gettier presented two cases in which a true belief is inferred from a justified false belief. He observed that, intuitively, such beliefs cannot be knowledge; it is merely lucky that they are true.

In honour of his contribution to the literature, cases like these have come to be known as “Gettier cases”. Since they appear to refute the JTB analysis, many epistemologists have undertaken to repair it: how must the analysis of knowledge be modified to accommodate Gettier cases? This is what is commonly referred to as the “Gettier problem”.

Above, we noted that one role of the justification is to rule out lucky guesses as cases of knowledge. A lesson of the Gettier problem is that it appears that even true beliefs that are justified can nevertheless be epistemically lucky in a way inconsistent with knowledge.

Epistemologists who think that the JTB approach is basically on the right track must choose between two different strategies for solving the Gettier problem. The first is to strengthen the justification condition to rule out Gettier cases as cases of justified belief. This was attempted by Roderick Chisholm;[11] we will refer to this strategy again in §7 below. The other is to amend the JTB analysis with a suitable fourth condition, a condition that succeeds in preventing justified true belief from being “gettiered”. Thus amended, the JTB analysis becomes a JTB+X account of knowledge, where the “X” stands for the needed fourth condition.

Let us consider an instance of this attempt to articulate a “degettiering” condition.

4. No False Lemmas

According to one suggestion, the following fourth condition would do the trick:

  1. S’s belief that p is not inferred from any falsehood.[12]

In Gettier’s cases, the justified true belief is inferred from a justified false belief. So condition (iv) explains why it isn’t knowledge. However, this “no false lemmas” proposal is not successful in general. There are examples of Gettier cases that need involve no inference; therefore, there are possible cases of justified true belief without knowledge, even though condition (iv) is met. Suppose, for example, that James, who is relaxing on a bench in a park, observes an apparent dog in a nearby field. So he believes

  1. There is a dog in the field.

Suppose further that the putative dog is actually a robot dog so perfect that it could not be distinguished from an actual dog by vision alone. James does not know that such robot dogs exist; a Japanese toy manufacturer has only recently developed them, and what James sees is a prototype that is used for testing the public’s response. Given these assumptions, (d) is of course false. But suppose further that just a few feet away from the robot dog, there is a real dog, concealed from James’s view. Given this further assumption, James’s belief in (d) is true. And since this belief is based on ordinary perceptual processes, most epistemologists will agree that it is justified. But as in Gettier’s cases, James’s belief appears to be true only as a matter of luck, in a way inconsistent with knowledge. So once again, what we have before us is a justified true belief that isn’t knowledge.[13] Arguably, this belief is directly justified by a visual experience; it is not inferred from any falsehood. If so, then the JTB account, even if supplemented with (iv), gives us the wrong result that James knows (d).

Another case illustrating that clause (iv) won’t do the job is the well-known Barn County case (Goldman 1976). Suppose there is a county in the Midwest with the following peculiar feature. The landscape next to the road leading through that county is peppered with barn-facades: structures that from the road look exactly like barns. Observation from any other viewpoint would immediately reveal these structures to be fakes: devices erected for the purpose of fooling unsuspecting motorists into believing in the presence of barns. Suppose Henry is driving along the road that leads through Barn County. Naturally, he will on numerous occasions form false beliefs in the presence of barns. Since Henry has no reason to suspect that he is the victim of organized deception, these beliefs are justified. Now suppose further that, on one of those occasions when he believes there is a barn over there, he happens to be looking at the one and only real barn in the county. This time, his belief is justified and true. But since its truth is the result of luck, it is exceedingly plausible to judge that Henry’s belief is not an instance of knowledge. Yet condition (iv) is met in this case. His belief is not the result of any inference from a falsehood. Once again, we see that (iv) does not succeed as a general solution to the Gettier problem.

5. Modal Conditions

5.1 Sensitivity

Another candidate fourth condition on knowledge is sensitivity. Sensitivity, to a first approximation, is this counterfactual relation:

S’s belief that p is sensitive if and only if, if p were false, S would not believe that p.[14]

A sensitivity condition on knowledge was defended by Robert Nozick (1981). Given a Lewisian (Lewis 1973) semantics for counterfactual conditionals, the sensitivity condition is equivalent to the requirement that, in the nearest possible worlds in which not-p, the subject does not believe that p.

One motivation for including a sensitivity condition in an analysis of knowledge is that there seems to be an intuitive sense in which knowledge requires not merely being correct, but tracking the truth in other possible circumstances. This approach seems to be a plausible diagnosis of what goes wrong in at least some Gettier cases. For example, in Dharmottara’s desert water case, your belief that there is water in a certain location appears to be insensitive to the fact of the water. For if there were no water there, you would have held the same belief on the same grounds—viz., the mirage.

However, it is doubtful that a sensitivity condition can account for the phenomenon of Gettier cases in general. It does so only in cases in which, had the proposition in question been false, it would have been believed anyway. But, as Saul Kripke (2011: 167–68) has pointed out, not all Gettier cases are like this. Consider for instance the Barn County case mentioned above. Henry looks at a particular location where there happens to be a barn and believes there to be a barn there. The sensitivity condition rules out this belief as knowledge only if, were there no barn there, Henry would still have believed there was. But this counterfactual may be false, depending on how the Barn County case is set up. For instance, it is false if the particular location Henry is examining is not one that would have been suitable for the erecting of a barn façade. Relatedly, as Kripke has also indicated (2011: 186), if we suppose that barn facades are always green, but genuine barns are always red, Henry’s belief that he sees a red barn will be sensitive, even though his belief that he sees a barn will not. (We assume Henry is unaware that colour signifies anything relevant.) Since intuitively, the former belief looks to fall short of knowledge in just the same way as the latter, a sensitivity condition will only handle some of the intuitive problems deriving from Gettier cases.

Most epistemologists today reject sensitivity requirements on knowledge. The chief motivation against a sensitivity condition is that, given plausible assumptions, it leads to unacceptable implications called “abominable conjunctions”.[15] To see this, suppose first that skepticism about ordinary knowledge is false—ordinary subjects know at least many of the things we ordinarily take them to know. For example, George, who can see and use his hands perfectly well, knows that he has hands. This is of course perfectly consistent with a sensitivity condition on knowledge, since if George did not have hands—if they’d been recently chopped off, for instance—he would not believe that he had hands.

Now imagine a skeptical scenario in which George does not have hands. Suppose that George is the victim of a Cartesian demon, deceiving him into believing that he has hands. If George were in such a scenario, of course, he would falsely believe himself not to be in such a scenario. So given the sensitivity condition, George cannot know that he is not in such a scenario.

Although these two verdicts—the knowledge-attributing one about ordinary knowledge, and the knowledge-denying one about the skeptical scenario—are arguably each intuitive, it is intuitively problematic to hold them together. Their conjunction is, in DeRose’s term, abominable: “George knows that he has hands, but he doesn’t know that he’s not the handless victim of a Cartesian demon”. A sensitivity condition on knowledge, combined with the nonskeptical claim that there is ordinary knowledge, seems to imply such abominable conjunctions.[16]

Most contemporary epistemologists have taken considerations like these to be sufficient reason to reject sensitivity conditions.[17] However, see Ichikawa (2011a) for an interpretation and endorsement of the sensitivity condition according to which it may avoid commitment to abominable conjunctions.

5.2 Safety

Although few epistemologists today endorse a sensitivity condition on knowledge, the idea that knowledge requires a subject to stand in a particular modal relation to the proposition known remains a popular one. In his 1999 paper, “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore”, Ernest Sosa proposed that a safety condition ought to take the role that sensitivity was intended to play. Sosa characterized safety as the counterfactual contrapositive of sensitivity.

If p were false, S would not believe that p.

If S were to believe that p, p would not be false.[18]

Although contraposition is valid for the material conditional \((A \supset B\) iff \(\mathord{\sim} B \supset \mathord{\sim}A)\), Sosa suggests that it is invalid for counterfactuals, which is why sensitivity and safety are not equivalent. An example of a safe belief that is not sensitive, according to Sosa, is the belief that a distant skeptical scenario does not obtain. If we stipulate that George, discussed above, has never been at risk of being the victim of a Cartesian demon—because, say, Cartesian demons do not exist in George’s world—then George’s belief that he is not such a victim is a safe one, even though we saw in the previous section that it could not be sensitive. Notice that although we stipulated that George is not at risk of deceit by Cartesian demons, we did not stipulate that George himself had any particular access to this fact. Unless he does, safety, like sensitivity, will be an externalist condition on knowledge in the “access” sense. It is also externalist in the “state” sense, since the truth of the relevant counterfactuals will depend on features outside the subject.

Characterizing safety in these counterfactual terms depends on substantive assumptions about the semantics of counterfactual conditionals.[19] If we were to accept, for instance, David Lewis’s or Robert Stalnaker’s treatment of counterfactuals, including a strong centering condition according to which the actual world is always uniquely closest, all true beliefs would count as safe according to the counterfactual analysis of safety.[20] Sosa intends the relevant counterfactuals to be making a stronger claim, requiring roughly that in all nearby worlds in which S believes that p, p is not false.

Rather than resting on a contentious treatment of counterfactuals, then, it may be most perspicuous to understand the safety condition more directly in these modal terms, as Sosa himself often does:


In all nearby worlds where S believes that p, p is not false.

Whether a JTB+safety analysis of knowledge could be successful is somewhat difficult to evaluate, given the vagueness of the stated “nearby” condition. The status of potential counterexamples will not always be straightforward to apply. For example, Juan Comesaña (2005) presents a case he takes to refute the requirement that knowledge be safe. In Comesaña’s example, the host of a Halloween party enlists Judy to direct guests to the party. Judy’s instructions are to give everyone the same directions, which are in fact accurate, but that if she sees Michael, the party will be moved to another location. (The host does not want Michael to find the party.) Suppose Michael never shows up. If a given guest does not, but very nearly does, decide to wear a very realistic Michael costume to the party, then his belief, based in Judy’s testimony, about the whereabouts of the party will be true, but could, Comesaña says, easily have been false. (Had he merely made a slightly different choice about his costume, he would have been deceived.) Comesaña describes the case as a counterexample to a safety condition on knowledge. However, it is open to a safety theorist to argue that the relevant skeptical scenario, though possible and in some sense nearby, is not near enough in the relevant respect to falsify the safety condition. Such a theorist would, if she wanted the safety condition to deliver clear verdicts, face the task of articulating just what the relevant notion of similarity amounts to (see also Bogardus 2014).

Not all further clarifications of a safety condition will be suitable for the use of the latter in an analysis of knowledge. In particular, if the respect of similarity that is relevant for safety is itself explicated in terms of knowledge, then an analysis of knowledge which made reference to safety would be in this respect circular. This, for instance, is how Timothy Williamson characterizes safety. He writes, in response to a challenge by Alvin Goldman:

In many cases, someone with no idea of what knowledge is would be unable to determine whether safety obtained. Although they could use the principle that safety entails truth to exclude some cases, those are not the interesting ones. Thus Goldman will be disappointed when he asks what the safety account predicts about various examples in which conflicting considerations pull in different directions. One may have to decide whether safety obtains by first deciding whether knowledge obtains, rather than vice versa. (Williamson 2009: 305)

Because safety is understood only in terms of knowledge, safety so understood cannot serve in an analysis of knowledge. Nor is it Williamson’s intent that it should do so; as we will see below, Williamson rejects the project of analyzing knowledge. This is of course consistent with claiming that safety is a necessary condition on knowledge in the straightforward sense that the latter entails the former.

5.3 Relevant Alternatives

A third approach to modal conditions on knowledge worthy of mention is the requirement that for a subject to know that p, she must rule out all “relevant alternatives” to p. Significant early proponents of this view include Stine 1976, Goldman 1976, and Dretske 1981. The idea behind this approach to knowledge is that for a subject to know that p, she must be able to “rule out” competing hypotheses to p—but that only some subset of all not-p possibilities are “relevant” for knowledge attributions. Consider for example, the differences between the several models that have been produced of Apple’s iPhone. To be able to know by sight that a particular phone is the 6S model, it is natural to suppose that one must be able to tell the difference between the iPhone 6S and the iPhone 7; the possibility that the phone in question is a newer model is a relevant alternative. But perhaps there are other possibilities in which the belief that there is an iPhone 6S is false that do not need to be ruled out—perhaps, for instance, the possibility that the phone is not an iPhone, but a Chinese knock-off, needn’t be considered. Likewise for the possibility that there is no phone at all, the phone-like appearances being the product of a Cartesian demon’s machinations. Notice that in these cases and many of the others that motivate the relevant-alternatives approach to knowledge, there is an intuitive sense in which the relevant alternatives tend to be more similar to actuality than irrelevant ones. As such, the relevant alternatives theory and safety-theoretic approaches are very similar, both in verdict and in spirit. As in the case of a safety theorist, the relevant alternatives theorist faces a challenge in attempting to articulate what determines which possibilities are relevant in a given situation.[21]

6. Doing Without Justification?

As we have seen, one motivation for including a justification condition in an analysis of knowledge was to prevent lucky guesses from counting as knowledge. However, the Gettier problem shows that including a justification condition does not rule out all epistemically problematic instances of luck. Consequently, some epistemologists have suggested that positing a justification condition on knowledge was a false move; perhaps it is some other condition that ought to be included along with truth and belief as components of knowledge. This kind of strategy was advanced by a number of authors from the late 1960s to the early 1980s, although there has been relatively little discussion of it since.[22] Kornblith 2008 provides a notable exception.

6.1 Reliabilist Theories of Knowledge

One candidate property for such a state is reliability. Part of what is problematic about lucky guesses is precisely that they are so lucky: such guesses are formed in a way such that it is unlikely that they should turn out true. According to a certain form of knowledge reliabilism, it is unreliability, not lack of justification, which prevents such beliefs from amounting to knowledge. Reliabilist theories of knowledge incorporate this idea into a reliability condition on knowledge.[23] Here is an example of such a view:

Simple K-Reliabilism:

S knows that p iff

  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S’s belief that p was produced by a reliable cognitive process.

Simple K-Reliabilism replaces the justification clause in the traditional tripartite theory with a reliability clause. As we have seen, reliabilists about justification think that justification for a belief consists in a genesis in a reliable cognitive process. Given this view, Simple K-Reliabilism and the JTB theory are equivalent. However, the present proposal is silent on justification. Goldman 1979 is the seminal defense of reliabilism about justification; reliabilism is extended to knowledge in Goldman 1986. See Goldman 2011 for a survey of reliabilism in general.

In the following passage, Fred Dretske articulates how an approach like K-reliabilism might be motivated:

Those who think knowledge requires something other than, or at least more than, reliably produced true belief, something (usually) in the way of justification for the belief that one’s reliably produced beliefs are being reliably produced, have, it seems to me, an obligation to say what benefits this justification is supposed to confer…. Who needs it, and why? If an animal inherits a perfectly reliable belief-generating mechanism, and it also inherits a disposition, everything being equal, to act on the basis of the beliefs so generated, what additional benefits are conferred by a justification that the beliefs are being produced in some reliable way? If there are no additional benefits, what good is this justification? Why should we insist that no one can have knowledge without it? (Dretske 1989: 95)

According to Dretske, reliable cognitive processes convey information, and thus endow not only humans, but (nonhuman) animals as well, with knowledge. He writes:

I wanted a characterization that would at least allow for the possibility that animals (a frog, rat, ape, or my dog) could know things without my having to suppose them capable of the more sophisticated intellectual operations involved in traditional analyses of knowledge. (Dretske 1985: 177)

It does seem odd to think of frogs, rats, or dogs as having justified or unjustified beliefs. Yet attributing knowledge to animals is certainly in accord with our ordinary practice of using the word “knowledge”. So if, with Dretske, we want an account of knowledge that includes animals among the knowing subjects, we might want to abandon the traditional JTB account in favor of something like K-reliabilism.

6.2 Causal Theories of Knowledge

Another move in a similar spirit to K-Reliabilism replaces the justification clause in the JTB theory with a condition requiring a causal connection between the belief and the fact believed;[24] this is the approach of Goldman (1967, 1976).[25] Goldman’s own causal theory is a sophisticated one; we will not engage with its details here. See Goldman’s papers. Instead, consider a simplified causal theory of knowledge, which illustrates the main motivation behind causal theories.

Simple Causal Theory of Knowledge:

S knows that p iff

  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S’s belief that p is caused by the fact that p.

Do approaches like Simple K-Reliabilism or the Simple Causal Theory fare any better than the JTB theory with respect to Gettier cases? Although some proponents have suggested they do—see e.g., Dretske 1985: 179; Plantinga 1993: 48—many of the standard counterexamples to the JTB theory appear to refute these views as well. Consider again the case of the barn facades. Henry sees a real barn, and that’s why he believes there is a barn nearby. This belief is formed by perceptual processes, which are by-and-large reliable: only rarely do they lead him into false beliefs. So it looks like the case meets the conditions of Simple K-Reliabilism just as much as it does those of the JTB theory. It is also a counterexample to the causal theory, since the real barn Henry perceives is causally responsible for his belief. There is reason to doubt, therefore, that shifting from justification to a condition like reliability will escape the Gettier problem.[26] Gettier cases seem to pose as much of a problem for K-reliabilism and causal theories as for the JTB account. Neither theory, unless amended with a clever “degettiering” clause, succeeds in stating sufficient conditions for knowledge.[27]

7. Is Knowledge Analyzable?

Gettier’s paper launched a flurry of philosophical activity by epistemologists attempting to revise the JTB theory, usually by adding one or more conditions, to close the gap between knowledge and justified true belief. We have seen already how several of these attempts failed. When intuitive counterexamples were proposed to each theory, epistemologists often responded by amending their theories, complicating the existing conditions or adding new ones. Much of this dialectic is chronicled thoroughly by Shope 1983, to which the interested reader is directed.

After some decades of such iterations, some epistemologists began to doubt that progress was being made. In her 1994 paper, “The Inescapability of Gettier Problems”, Linda Zagzebski suggested that no analysis sufficiently similar to the JTB analysis could ever avoid the problems highlighted by Gettier’s cases. More precisely, Zagzebski argued, any analysans of the form JTB+X, where X is a condition or list of conditions logically independent from justification, truth, and belief, would be susceptible to Gettier-style counterexamples. She offered what was in effect a recipe for constructing Gettier cases:

  • (1)Start with an example of a case where a subject has a justified false belief that also meets condition X.
  • (2)Modify the case so that the belief is true merely by luck.

Zagzebski suggests that the resultant case will always represent an intuitive lack of knowledge. So any non-redundant addition to the JTB theory will leave the Gettier problem unsolved.[28] We may illustrate the application of the recipe using one of Zagzebski’s own examples, refuting Alvin Plantinga’s (1996) attempt to solve the Gettier problem by appending to the JTB analysis a condition requiring that the subject’s faculties be working properly in an appropriate environment.

In step one of Zagzebski’s procedure, we imagine a case in which a subject’s faculties are working properly in an appropriate environment, but the ensuing belief, though justified, is false. Zagzebski invites us to imagine that Mary has very good eyesight—good enough for her cognitive faculties typically to yield knowledge that her husband is sitting in the living room. Such faculties, even when working properly in suitable environments, however, are not infallible—if they were, the condition would not be independent from truth—so we can imagine a case in which they go wrong. Perhaps this is an unusual instance in which Mary’s husband’s brother, who looks a lot like the husband, is in the living room, and Mary concludes, on the basis of the proper function of her visual capacity, that her husband is in the living room. This belief, since false, is certainly not knowledge.

In step two, we imagine Mary’s misidentification of the occupant of the living room as before, but add to the case that the husband is, by luck, also in the living room. Now Mary’s belief is true, but intuitively, it is no more an instance of knowledge than the false belief in the first step was.

Since the recipe is a general one, it appears to be applicable to any condition one might add to the JTB theory, so long as it does not itself entail truth. The argument generalizes against all “non-redundant” JTB+X analyses.

One potential response to Zagzebski’s argument, and the failure of the Gettier project more generally, would be to conclude that knowledge is unanalyzable. Although it would represent a significant departure from much analytic epistemology of the late twentieth century, it is not clear that this is ultimately a particularly radical suggestion. Few concepts of interest have proved susceptible to traditional analysis (Fodor 1998). One prominent approach to knowledge in this vein is discussed in §11 below.

Another possible line is the one mentioned in §2—to strengthen the justification condition to rule out Gettier cases as justified. In order for this strategy to prevent Zagzebski’s recipe from working, one would need to posit a justification condition that precludes the possibility of step one above—the only obvious way to do this is for justification to entail truth. If it does, then it will of course be impossible to start with a case that has justified false belief. This kind of approach is not at all mainstream, but it does have its defenders—see e.g., Sturgeon 1993 and Merricks 1995. Sutton 2007 and Littlejohn 2012 defend factive approaches to justification on other grounds.

A third avenue of response would be to consider potential analyses of knowledge that are not of the nonredundant form JTB+X. Indeed, we have already seen some such attempts, albeit unsuccessful ones. For instance, the causal theory of knowledge includes a clause requiring that the belief that p be caused by the fact that p. This condition entails both belief and truth, and so is not susceptible to Zagzebski’s recipe. (As we’ve seen, it falls to Gettier-style cases on other grounds.) One family of strategies along these lines would build into an analysis of knowledge a prohibition on epistemic luck directly; let us consider this sort of move in more detail.

8. Epistemic Luck

If the problem illustrated by Gettier cases is that JTB and JTB+ analyses are compatible with a degree of epistemic luck that is inconsistent with knowledge, a natural idea is to amend one’s analysis of knowledge by including an explicit “anti-luck” condition. Zagzebski herself outlines this option in her 1994 (p. 72). Unger 1968 gives an early analysis of this kind. For example:

S knows that p iff

  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S is justified in believing that p.
  4. S’s belief is not true merely by luck.

The first thing to note about this analysis is that it is “redundant” in the sense described in the previous section; the fourth condition entails the first two.[29] So its surface form notwithstanding, it actually represents a significant departure from the JTB+ analyses. Rather than composing knowledge from various independent components, this analysis demands instead that the epistemic states are related to one another in substantive ways.

The anti-luck condition, like the safety condition of the previous section, is vague as stated. For one thing, whether a belief is true by luck comes in degrees—just how much luck does it take to be inconsistent with knowledge? Furthermore, it seems, independently of questions about degrees of luck, we must distinguish between different kinds of luck. Not all epistemic luck is incompatible with having knowledge. Suppose someone enters a raffle and wins an encyclopedia, then reads various of its entries, correcting many of their previous misapprehensions. There is a straightforward sense in which the resultant beliefs are true only by luck—for our subject was very lucky to have won that raffle—but this is not the sort of luck, intuitively, that interferes with the possession of knowledge.[30] Furthermore, there is a sense in which our ordinary perceptual beliefs are true by luck, since it is possible for us to have been the victim of a Cartesian demon and so we are, in some sense, lucky not to be. But unless we are to capitulate to radical skepticism, it seems that this sort of luck, too, ought to be considered compatible with knowledge.[31]

Like the safety condition, then, a luck condition ends up being difficult to apply in some cases. We might try to clarify the luck condition as involving a distinctive notion of epistemic luck—but unless we were able to explicate that notion—in effect, to distinguish between the two kinds of luck mentioned above—without recourse to knowledge, it is not clear that the ensuing analysis of knowledge could be both informative and noncircular.

9. Methodological Options

As our discussion so far makes clear, one standard way of evaluating attempted analyses of knowledge has given a central role to testing it against intuitions against cases. In the late twentieth century, the perceived lack of progress towards an acceptable analysis—including the considerations attributed to Zagzebski in §7 above—led some epistemologists to pursue other methodological strategies. (No doubt, a wider philosophical trend away from “conceptual analysis” more broadly also contributed to this change.) Some of the more recent attempts to analyse knowledge have been motivated in part by broader considerations about the role of knowledge, or of discourse about knowledge.

One important view of this sort is that defended by Edward Craig (1990). Craig’s entry-point into the analysis of knowledge was not intuitions about cases, but rather a focus on the role that the concept of knowledge plays for humans. In particular, Craig suggested that the point of using the category of knowledge was for people to flag reliable informants—to help people know whom to trust in matters epistemic. Craig defends an account of knowledge that is designed to fill this role, even though it is susceptible to intuitive counterexamples. The plausibility of such accounts, with a less intuitive extension but with a different kind of theoretical justification, is a matter of controversy.

Another view worth mentioning in this context is that of Hilary Kornblith (2002), which has it that knowledge is a natural kind, to be analysed the same way other scientific kinds are. Intuition has a role to play in identifying paradigms, but generalizing from there is an empirical, scientific matter, and intuitive counterexamples are to be expected.

The “knowledge first” stance is also connected to these methodological issues. See §11 below.

10. Virtue-Theoretic Approaches

The virtue-theoretic approach to knowledge is in some respects similar to the safety and anti-luck approaches. Indeed, Ernest Sosa, one of the most prominent authors of the virtue-theoretic approach, developed it from his previous work on safety. The virtue approach treats knowledge as a particularly successful or valuable form of belief, and explicates what it is to be knowledge in such terms. Like the anti-luck theory, a virtue-theoretic theory leaves behind the JTB+ project of identifying knowledge with a truth-functional combination of independent epistemic properties; knowledge, according to this approach, requires a certain non-logical relationship between belief and truth.

10.1 The “AAA” Evaluations

Sosa has often (e.g., Sosa 2007: ch. 2) made use of an analogy of a skilled archer shooting at a target; we may find it instructive as well. Here are two ways in which an archer’s shot might be evaluated:

  1. Was the shot successful? Did it hit its target?
  2. Did the shot’s execution manifest the archer’s skill? Was it produced in a way that makes it likely to succeed?

The kind of success at issue in (1), Sosa calls accuracy. The kind of skill discussed in (2), Sosa calls adroitness. A shot is adroit if it is produced skillfully. Adroit shots needn’t be accurate, as not all skilled shots succeed. And accurate shots needn’t be adroit, as some unskilled shots are lucky.

In addition to accuracy and adroitness, Sosa suggests that there is another respect in which a shot may be evaluated, relating the two. This, Sosa calls aptness.

  1. Did the shot’s success manifest the archer’s skill?

A shot is apt if it is accurate because adroit. Aptness entails, but requires more than, the conjunction of accuracy and adroitness, for a shot might be both successful and skillful without being apt. For example, if a skillful shot is diverted by an unexpected gust of wind, then redirected towards the target by a second lucky gust, its ultimate accuracy does not manifest the skill, but rather reflects the lucky coincidence of the wind.

Sosa suggests that this “AAA” model of evaluation is applicable quite generally for the evaluation of any action or object with a characteristic aim. In particular, it is applicable to belief with respect to its aim at truth:

  1. A belief is accurate if and only if it is true.
  2. A belief is adroit if and only if it is produced skillfully.[32]
  3. A belief is apt if and only if it is true in a way manifesting, or attributable to, the believer’s skill.

Sosa identifies knowledge with apt belief, so understood.[33] Knowledge entails both truth (accuracy) and justification (adroitness), on this view, but they are not merely independent components out of which knowledge is truth-functionally composed. It requires that the skill explain the success. This is in some respects similar to the anti-luck condition we have examined above, in that it legislates that the relation between justification and truth be no mere coincidence. However, insofar as Sosa’s “AAA” model is generally applicable in a way going beyond epistemology, there are perhaps better prospects for understanding the relevant notion of aptness in a way independent of understanding knowledge itself than we found for the notion of epistemic luck.

10.2 Fake Barn Cases

Understanding knowledge as apt belief accommodates Gettier’s traditional counterexamples to the JTB theory rather straightforwardly. When Smith believes that either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona, the accuracy of his belief is not attributable to his inferential skills (which the case does not call into question). Rather, unlucky circumstances (the misleading evidence about Jones’s car) have interfered with his skillful cognitive performance, just as the first diverting gust of wind interfered with the archer’s shot. Compensating for the unlucky interference, a lucky circumstance (Brown’s coincidental presence in Barcelona) renders the belief true after all, similar to the way in which the second gust of wind returns the archer’s arrow back onto the proper path towards the target.

Fake barn cases, by contrast, may be less easily accommodated by Sosa’s AAA approach. When Henry looks at the only real barn in a countryside full of barn facades, he uses a generally reliable perceptual faculty for recognizing barns, and he goes right in this instance. Suppose we say the accuracy of Henry’s belief manifests his competence as a perceiver. If so, we would have to judge that his belief is apt and therefore qualifies as an instance of knowledge. That would be a problematic outcome because the intuition the case is meant to elicit is that Henry does not have knowledge. There are three ways in which an advocate of the AAA approach might respond to this difficulty.

First, AAA advocates might argue that, although Henry has a general competence to recognize barns, he is deprived of this ability in his current environment, precisely because he is in fake barn county. According to a second, subtly different strategy, Henry retains barn-recognition competence, his current location notwithstanding, but, due to the ubiquity of fake barns, his competence does not manifest itself in his belief, since its truth is attributable more to luck than to his skill in recognizing barns.[34] Third, Sosa’s own response to the problem is to bite the bullet. Judging Henry’s belief to be apt, Sosa accepts the outcome that Henry knows there is a barn before him. He attempts to explain away the counterintuitiveness of this result by emphasizing the lack of a further epistemically valuable state, which he calls “reflective knowledge” (see Sosa 2007: 31–32).

11. Knowledge First

Not every concept is analyzable into more fundamental terms. This is clear both upon reflection on examples—what analysis could be offered of hydrogen, animal, or John F. Kennedy?—and on grounds of infinite regress. Why should we think that knowledge has an analysis? In recent work, especially his 2000 book Knowledge and Its Limits, Timothy Williamson has argued that the project of analyzing knowledge was a mistake. His reason is not that he thinks that knowledge is an uninteresting state, or that the notion of knowledge is somehow fundamentally confused. On the contrary, Williamson thinks that knowledge is among the most fundamental psychological and epistemological states there are. As such, it is a mistake to analyze knowledge in terms of other, more fundamental epistemic notions, because knowledge itself is, in at least many cases, more fundamental. As Williamson puts it, we should put “knowledge first”. Knowledge might figure into some analyses, but it will do so in the analysans, not in the analysandum.[35]

There is no very straightforward argument for this conclusion; its case consists largely in the attempted demonstration of the theoretical success of the knowledge first stance. Weighing these benefits against those of more traditional approaches to knowledge is beyond the scope of this article.[36]

Although Williamson denies that knowledge is susceptible to analysis in the sense at issue in this article, he does think that there are interesting and informative ways to characterize knowledge. For example, Williamson accepts these claims:

  • Knowledge is the most general factive mental state.
  • S knows that p if and only if S’s total evidence includes the proposition that p.

Williamson is also careful to emphasize that the rejection of the project of analyzing knowledge in no way suggests that there are not interesting and informative necessary or sufficient conditions on knowledge. The traditional ideas that knowledge entails truth, belief, and justification are all consistent with the knowledge first project. And Williamson (2000: 126) is explicit in endorsement of a safety requirement on knowledge—just not one that serves as part of an analysis.

One point worth recognizing, then, is that one need not engage in the ambitious project of attempting to analyze knowledge in order to have contact with a number of interesting questions about which factors are and are not relevant for whether a subject has knowledge. In the next section, we consider an important contemporary debate about whether pragmatic factors are relevant for knowledge.

12. Pragmatic Encroachment

Traditional approaches to knowledge have it that knowledge has to do with factors like truth and justification. Whether knowledge requires safety, sensitivity, reliability, or independence from certain kinds of luck has proven controversial. But something that all of these potential conditions on knowledge seem to have in common is that they have some sort of intimate connection with the truth of the relevant belief. Although it is admittedly difficult to make the relevant connection precise, there is an intuitive sense in which every factor we’ve examined as a candidate for being relevant to knowledge has something to do with truth of the would-be knowledgeable beliefs.

In recent years, some epistemologists have argued that focus on such truth-relevant factors leaves something important out of our picture of knowledge. In particular, they have argued that distinctively pragmatic factors are relevant to whether a subject has knowledge. Call this thesis “pragmatic encroachment”:[37]

Pragmatic Encroachment:

A difference in pragmatic circumstances can constitute a difference in knowledge.

The constitution claim here is important; it is trivial that differences in pragmatic circumstances can cause differences in knowledge. For example, if the question of whether marijuana use is legal in Connecticut is more important to Sandra than it is to Daniel, Sandra is more likely to seek out evidence, and come to knowledge, than Daniel is. This uninteresting claim is not what is at issue. Pragmatic encroachment theorists think that the practical importance itself can make for a change in knowledge, without reliance on such downstream effects as a difference in evidence-gathering activity. Sandra and Daniel might in some sense be in the same epistemic position, where the only difference is that the question is more important to Sandra. This difference, according to pragmatic encroachment, might make it the case that Daniel knows, but Sandra does not.[38]

Pragmatic encroachment can be motivated by intuitions about cases. Jason Stanley’s 2005 book Knowledge and Practical Interests argues that it is the best explanation for pairs of cases like the following, where the contrasted cases are evidentially alike, but differ pragmatically:

Low Stakes. Hannah and her wife Sarah are driving home on a Friday afternoon. They plan to stop at the bank on the way home to deposit their paychecks. It is not important that they do so, as they have no impending bills. But as they drive past the bank, they notice that the lines inside are very long, as they often are on Friday afternoons. Realizing that it wasn’t very important that their paychecks are deposited right away, Hannah says, “I know the bank will be open tomorrow, since I was there just two weeks ago on Saturday morning. So we can deposit our paychecks tomorrow morning”.

High Stakes. Hannah and her wife Sarah are driving home on a Friday afternoon. They plan to stop at the bank on the way home to deposit their paychecks. Since they have an impending bill coming due, and very little in their account, it is very important that they deposit their paychecks by Saturday. Hannah notes that she was at the bank two weeks before on a Saturday morning, and it was open. But, as Sarah points out, banks do change their hours. Hannah says, “I guess you’re right. I don’t know that the bank will be open tomorrow”. (Stanley 2005: 3–4)

Stanley argues that the moral of cases like these is that in general, the more important the question of whether p, the harder it is to know that p. Other, more broadly theoretical, arguments for pragmatic encroachment have been offered as well. Fantl & McGrath (2009) argue that encroachment follows from fallibilism and plausible principles linking knowledge and action, while Weatherson 2012 argues that the best interpretation of decision theory requires encroachment.

Pragmatic encroachment is not an analysis of knowledge; it is merely the claim that pragmatic factors are relevant for determining whether a subject’s belief constitutes knowledge. Some, but not all, pragmatic encroachment theorists will endorse a necessary biconditional that might be interpreted as an analysis of knowledge. For example, a pragmatic encroachment theorist might claim that:

S knows that p if and only if no epistemic weakness vis-á-vis p prevents S from properly using p as a reason for action.

This connection between knowledge and action is similar to ones endorsed by Fantl & McGrath (2009), but it is stronger than anything they argue for.

Pragmatic encroachment on knowledge is deeply controversial. Patrick Rysiew (2001), Jessica Brown (2006), and Mikkel Gerken (forthcoming) have argued that traditional views about the nature of knowledge are sufficient to account for the data mentioned above. Michael Blome-Tillmann (2009a) argues that it has unacceptably counterintuitive results, like the truth of such claims as S knows that p, but if it were more important, she wouldn’t know, or S knew that p until the question became important. Stanley (2005) offers strategies for accepting such consequences. Other, more theoretical arguments against encroachment have also been advanced; see for example Ichikawa, Jarvis, and Rubin (2012), who argue that pragmatic encroachment is at odds with important tenets of belief-desire psychology.

13. Contextualism

One final topic standing in need of treatment is contextualism about knowledge attributions, according to which the word “knows” and its cognates are context-sensitive. The relationship between contextualism and the analysis of knowledge is not at all straightforward. Arguably, they have different subject matters (the former a word, and the latter a mental state). Nevertheless, the methodology of theorizing about knowledge may be helpfully informed by semantic considerations about the language in which such theorizing takes place. And if contextualism is correct, then a theorist of knowledge must attend carefully to the potential for ambiguity.

It is uncontroversial that many English words are context-sensitive. The most obvious cases are indexicals, such as “I”, “you”, “here”, and “now” (David Kaplan 1977 gives the standard view of indexicals).

The word “you” refers to a different person, depending on the conversational context in which it is uttered; in particular, it depends on the person one is addressing. Other context-sensitive terms are gradable adjectives like “tall”—how tall something must be to count as “tall” depends on the conversational context—and quantifiers like “everyone”—which people count as part of “everyone” depends on the conversational context. Contextualists about “knows” think that this verb belongs on the list of context-sensitive terms. A consequence of contextualism is that sentences containing “knows” may express distinct propositions, depending on the conversational contexts in which they’re uttered. This feature allows contextualists to offer an effective, though not uncontroversial, response to skepticism. For a more thorough overview of contextualism and its bearing on skepticism, see Rysiew 2011 or Ichikawa forthcoming-b.

Contextualists have modeled this context-sensitivity in various ways. Keith DeRose 2009 has suggested that there is a context-invariant notion of “strength of epistemic position”, and that how strong a position one must be in in order to satisfy “knows” varies from context to context; this is in effect to understand the semantics of knowledge attributions much as we understand that of gradable adjectives. (How much height one must have to satisfy “tall” also varies from context to context.) Cohen 1988 adopts a contextualist treatment of “relevant alternatives” theory, according to which, in skeptical contexts, but not ordinary ones, skeptical possibilities are relevant. This aspect is retained in the view of Lewis 1996, which characterizes a contextualist approach that is more similar to quantifiers and modals. Blome-Tillmann 2009b and Ichikawa forthcoming-a defend and develop the Lewisian view in different ways.

Contextualism and pragmatic encroachment represent different strategies for addressing some of the same “shifty” patterns of intuitive data. (In fact, contextualism was generally developed first; pragmatic encroachment theorists were motivated in part by the attempt to explain some of the patterns contextualists were interested in without contextualism’s semantic commitments.) Although this represents a sense in which they tend to be rival approaches, contextualism and pragmatic encroachment are by no means inconsistent. One could think that “knows” requires the satisfaction of different standards in different contexts, and also think that the subject’s practical situation is relevant for whether a given standard is satisfied.

Like pragmatic encroachment, contextualism is deeply controversial. Critics have argued that it posits an implausible kind of semantic error in ordinary speakers who do not recognize the putative context-sensitivity—see Schiffer 1996 and Greenough & Kindermann forthcoming—and that it is at odds with plausible theoretical principles involving knowledge—see Hawthorne 2003, Williamson 2005, and Worsnip forthcoming. In addition, some of the arguments that are used to undercut the data motivating pragmatic encroachment are also taken to undermine the case for contextualism; see again Rysiew 2001 and Brown 2006.


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For the 2012 revision, we are grateful to Kurt Sylvan for extremely detailed and constructive comments on multiple drafts of this entry. Thanks also to an anonymous referee for additional helpful suggestions. For the 2017 revision, thanks to Clayton Littlejohn, Jennifer Nagel, and Scott Sturgeon for helpful and constructive feedback and suggestions. Thanks to Ben Bayer, Kenneth Ehrenberg, and Mark Young for drawing our attention to errors in the previous version.

Copyright © 2017 by
Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa <>
Matthias Steup

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