The Economic Analysis of Law

First published Mon Nov 26, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jan 7, 2022

Economic analysis of law applies the tools of microeconomic theory to the analysis of legal rules and institutions. Ronald Coase [1960] and Guido Calabresi [1961] are generally identified as the seminal articles but Commons [1924] and Hale [1952] among others had brought economic thinking to the study of law in the 1910s and 1920s.

Richard Posner [1973] brought economic analysis of law to the attention of the general legal academy; by the late 1970s, his work had provoked a vigorous controversy. This controversy was both general and doctrinally specific. Posner had claimed generally that the common law was and ought to be efficient. This latter claim provoked a broad controversy about the evaluation of legal rules.

More specifically, controversy recurred each time economic analysts of law addressed another doctrinal area. More often than not, the introduction of economic analysis into the study of a doctrine transformed that area of scholarship. For a time, economic analysis dominated the study of private law in the United States; arguably it still dominates, though a healthy resurgence of moral accounts of these areas has recently emerged to challenge economic analysis of private law.

Many practitioners and critics alike believe that economic analysis of law offers a comprehensive theory of law. As traditionally understood, a comprehensive theory of law has several components. First, a comprehensive theory of law begins with a characterization of the nature of law. This component distinguishes law not only from other normative systems such as morality, religion, and social conventions such as etiquette but also from coercion and politics.

The second part of a comprehensive theory of law characterizes the grounds of law. Dworkin framed the grounds of law as the truth conditions for a proposition of law. From this perspective, much of the debate over the concept of law concerns the role that morality plays in these truth conditions. As discussed in section 3 below, the first and second parts of a comprehensive theory of law have often been conflated in the debate over the concept of law.

The third part of a a comprehensive theory of law identifies the nature of the reasons for action that law provides. Often, this aspect of a theory of law is subsumed under the second part that identifies the grounds of law. For purposes of an exposition of the economic theory of law, however, it is useful to distinguish these two questions.

The fourth part of a comprehensive theory of law identifies the value of legality. The fifth and final part of a comprehensive theory of law articulates a normative theory of adjudication, a theory of how judges ought to decide cases.

Framed this way, it is not clear that economic analysis of law does provide a comprehensive theory of law. The questions posed above have rarely been addressed clearly and explicitly by economic analysts of law. The early debates conflated theories of adjudication with the value of legality; subsequent debates have largely concerned theories of private law rather than of law generally. This essay thus offers both an interpretation of the approach to these five questions implicit in the practice of economic analysis of law and a recharacterization of economic analysis of law generally.

Economic analysis of law is not a single, unitary practice but a set of projects that share a methodological approach. The typical economic analysis of law does not set its task within the framework of a general legal theory. Rather, it addresses a specific question about the causes or consequences or social value of a specific legal rule or set of legal rules. Phrased differently, the typical economic analysis of law investigates a specific legal rule or institution rather than make general claims about the nature of law.

Nonetheless, economic analysis of law, or at least strands of it, implicitly offer distinctive, often radical, answers to the questions addressed by legal theory. Moreover, some strands suggest a radically different perspective on law and legal theory. The next section sets out the complex set of claims that emerge from the mass of economic analyses of law and identifies three projects that organize much of the work in the field. Subsequent sections ask what perspective on law these claims and projects implicitly or explicitly provide.

1. Claims and Projects within Economic Analysis of Law

1.1 Rationality in Economic Analysis of Law

Economic analysis of law deploys the tools of micro-economic theory to study legal rules and institutions. The various approaches and projects within economic analysis of law thus share a common core. That core consists of the conception of action at the center of micro-economic theory.[1] When economic analysis of law first emerged in the 1960s, scholars adopted the standard rationality assumptions that dominated microeconomic theory at the time. This practice still dominates the literature; we shall call it the standard or classical model. In the 1990s, some scholars (see e.g. Jolls, Sunstein, and Thaler [1998]) began to apply the methods of behavioral economics to economic analysis of law. Behavioral economics rests on a different understanding of the underpinnings of choice and decision than the classical model.

1.1.1 Rationality in the Classical Model

Rational action in economics means that each agent acts to maximize her “preferences” in whatever environment she finds herself. A preference is a ranking of the elements in her domain of preference. The agent’s domain of preference consists of the things that fundamentally matter to her. In standard models of consumer behavior, for example, the agent has fundamental preferences over consumption bundles. Her decision problem consists of choosing a consumption bundle from the set of feasible consumption bundles, where feasibility is defined by the prices of goods and the agent’s income. Arlen and Kornhauser [2021] elaborate on the structure of preferences in economic analysis of law.

In most economic analyses of law, the situation is more complex. The agent has preferences over some set of consequences—her income or wealth, her state of health, etc.—and she chooses some action that in part determines which consequence is realized. Typically, her domain of preference differs from her domain of choice, often because she chooses a strategy that, in conjunction with the strategy choices of other agents, jointly determines the consequence.

At its most abstract level, this conception of rationality is very flexible as the constraints on preferences are almost purely formal. (The discussion in section 4 essentially investigates the extent of this flexibility.)

Basically, the agent’s ranking of elements of her domain of preference must be complete and transitive. Completeness means only that the agent, when presented with any pair A and B of elements in her domain of preference can rank A and B. That is, the agent either prefers A to B, prefers B to A, or is indifferent between A and B. Some, but not all, relations are complete. The relation “Pareto superior to,” discussed at length in section 6.2, for example, is not complete.

Transitivity means that if the agent prefers an element A to an element B and she prefers the element B to a third element C, then she prefers element A to element C. Many, but not all, relations are transitive. The relation “friends with,” for example, is not transitive as A may be friends with B and B may be friends with C while A and C mutually detest each other. The two conditions are thus minimal though not empty.

Every economic analysis of law provides some substantive content to each agent’s preference ranking. Typically, the analyst attributes self-interested preferences to each agent. The agent ranks consequences solely on the basis of their effect on her. In the standard market model, for example, the agent cares only about her own consumption not the consumption of others. In the standard economic model of accident law, she cares only about injuries to herself and costs that she may incur; she pays no attention to injuries to others or costs that others incur.

Of course, one might define “self-interested” in a broad way to include anything that motivates the agent. Typically, however, the analyst assumes that the agent’s preferences are narrowly self-interested; she cares only about her own economic advantage or her own health and safety. The assumption of narrowly self-interested preferences is very restrictive. An agent with narrowly self-interested preferences seems to be incapable of following a rule or having anything other than a prudential reason for action. The assumption of narrow self-interest thus seems to limit the conception of the normativity of law to a bare sanction theory of duty. We discuss this issue in section 4 below.

1.1.2 Behavioral Economic Analysis of Law

Behavioral economic analysis of law takes three forms. The first accepts the formal framework of rational choice but rejects the interpretation of preferences in this framework as self-interested. Call this the “broad RCT” branch of behavioral economics. The other two forms of behavioral economics derive from psychology which seeks to understand the mental processes that agents actually deploy in their decision making. Both of these forms of behavioral economics reject the apparent assumption of the classical model that agents consciously and directly maximize their preferences. But each form adopts a different stance towards human rationality. The “fast and frugal heuristics” branch claims that agents are ecologically rational. The heuristics and biases form of behavioral economics contends that agents are not rational. We discuss these in turn.

The broad RCT approach endorses the formal preference model of the classical model; it only rejects the narrow interpretation of preferences as self-interested. Individuals may have non-self-interested preferences. They may have “pro-social” preferences that reflect a concern for others. They may have preferences for “fairness” which reflect a “preference” for more equal distributions of benefits and burdens. Indeed, one might posit preferences that reflect concerns for almost anything. The approach thus risks the ad hoc ascription of preferences, an issue discussed further in section 4.

The ecological rationality school accepts the classical model as a normative standard against which individual behavior should be assessed. It rejects the classical model as descriptive of individual decision procedures. An agent does not solve the optimization problem that the classical and broad RCT models posit. This school recognizes that computation is costly and that often the agent lacks adequate information to complete the calculation. Consequently, individuals deploy heuristic decision procedures that, under these constraints, perform well as measured by the RCT model of rationality.

The heuristics and biases school, by contrast, understands the existence of heuristics and biases as evidence that individuals behave irrationally. Any decision process that deviates from classical logic, Bayesian updating, or strict preference maximization constitutes irrational behavior.

Behavioral economic analysis of law typically adapts the classical model to include a heuristic or bias. The model, that is, specifies a decision process that, except on the dimension along which the heuristic or bias works, conforms to the classical model. The analysis then identifies equilibrium behavior in this model. The structure of analysis thus parallels the structure of a classical analysis.

1.2 The Basic Claims Underlying Economic Analysis of Law

Posner [1973] made two claims that have usually defined the debate around the philosophical foundations of economic analysis of law. The first claim, often called the positive claim, asserts that common law legal rules are, in fact, efficient. The second claim, often called the normative claim, asserts that common law legal rules ought to be efficient. In both claims, Posner understood “efficiency” to mean the maximization of the social willingness-to-pay but subsequent authors have sometimes used the term in its more conventional economic sense of Pareto efficiency. As both of these claims predate the emergence of behavioral economic analysis of law, each relies on the classical theory.

Each claim is ambiguous. Consider the first claim, the positive claim. On the one hand, it might mean that common law legal rules induce efficient behavior. On the other hand, it might mean that the law is efficient; that is, that the content of the law is identified by its efficiency. Or the claim might mean that efficiency provides the best rationale of the “law” in some doctrinal area.

The second of Posner’s claims, that the common law ought to be efficient, also presents multiple ambiguities. Do we interpret the claim as a theory of adjudication (i.e., as a theory of how common law judges ought to decide cases)? Or should we understand the claim as asserting that efficiency is the appropriate criterion against which to assess judicial performance? Or should we understand the claim as asserting that lawmakers, whether judges, legislators, or administrators, should choose efficient rules?

This disambiguation of Posner’s claims yields six distinct claims about law that fall into a positive and a normative cluster. A third set of two claims follows from the methodology of economic analysis of law—the application of the tools of micro-economic theory to the study of legal rules and institutions.

I begin with the three positive claims that correspond to the disambiguation of Posner’s positive claim and the two claims that flow from economic methodology. Claim (I), the explanatory claim, asserts that common law legal rules induce efficient behavior. Claim (II), the content claim, asserts that the criterion of efficiency determines the content of the law. A positivist might understand this claim as a claim about the content of the rule of recognition. Claim (III), the doctrinal claim, states that the criterion of efficiency rationalizes prevailing legal rules and institutions. This doctrinal claim is weaker than the content claim; the latter asserts either that efficiency causes the content of the law or that it justifies it. The doctrinal claim, by contrast, asserts only that efficiency makes sense of the legal materials.

For clarity, note the ambiguity in the sense in which a legal rule is “efficient” in claims (II) and (III). In the most straightforward, economic interpretation, claims (II) and (III) refer to the efficiency of the behavior induced by the legal rule. Claims (II) and (III) therefore seem to presuppose claim (I). Many, if not most, economic analyses of law, however, assert only that the legal rule is efficient within some model.[2] A judge, policymaker, or analyst might believe, on the basis of the efficiency of a rule in a model, that the rule induces efficient behavior in the world but the efficiency of the rule in the model does not logically entail efficiency in the world.

Claims (I), (II) and (III) apparently all presuppose the classical model of narrowly self-interested actors as these preferences underlie the first and second welfare theorems of general equilibrium analysis. These theorems state that every competitive equilibrium is Pareto efficient and conversely, every Pareto efficient allocation can be supported by a competitive equilibrium. Of course, it is possible that ecological rationality would lead to similar desirable outcomes.

I now turn to the two claims that derive from the methodological commitments of economic analysis of law. These two claims are also explanatory claims. Claim (IV), the behavioral claim, asserts that economic theory explains how individuals respond to legal rules and institutions. Claim (V), the causal claim, asserts that economically motivated action by both public officials and private citizens explains the content of legal rules and the structure of legal institutions. Each of these claims in principle has two variants. Claim (IVa) for example asserts that the classical theory explains how individuals respond to legal rules. Claim (IVb)asserts that some behavioral theory explains how individuals respond to legal rules. Similarly, claim (V) asserts that private citizens and public officials conform to the same behavioral theory. In practice, virtually all research addressing claim (V) attributes classical, narrowly self-interested preferences to both private individuals and public officials.

Both claims (IV) and (V) might refer to the classical model or to any of the three variants of the behavioral model. In fact most of the literature relies on the classical model though, increasingly, scholars are investigating the consequences of the behavioral model within the context of claim (IV).

Claim (I) differs from claim (IV). The explanatory claim asserts that (some) legal rules and institutions induce efficient behavior but does not identify the mechanism through which this efficient behavior results. The behavioral claim, by contrast, identifies the mechanisms through which legal rules and institutions influence behavior, but it does not assert that the resulting behavior is efficient.[3] Claims (II) and (III) are equally silent about the mechanisms that yield efficiency though one might think that claim (II) asserts that judges and other public officials intentionally pursue efficient rules.

Note also that claim (II) differs from Claim (V) for similar reasons. Claim (II) states that efficiency is one of the grounds of law. Many legal rules should thus be efficient. Claim (V), by contrast, asserts only that law results from the self-interested behavior of individual citizens and public officials. This behavior does not necessarily yield efficient rules or institutions.

Finally, note that the methodological claims (IV) and (V) apparently reject standard accounts of the normativity of law, an issue addressed more fully in section 4.

Consider now the three normative claims that follow from the disambiguation of Posner’s initial normative claim. Claim (VI), the adjudicatory, claim asserts that judges ought, in their decision of cases, to promote efficiency. This claim understands Posner’s claim as a theory of adjudication. Claim (VII), the evaluative claim, asserts that the primary criterion against which to assess legal rules and institutions is efficiency. Claim (VIII), the design claim, asserts that policymakers should design legal rules and institutions to promote efficiency. Note that claims (VII) and (VIII) are independent. Designing efficient legal rules and institutions might be desirable for non-efficiency reasons. Conversely, efficiency might dictate the design of inefficient institutions.

In the late 1970s and early 1980s, controversy raged primarily over the evaluative claim. This debate largely recapitulated the debate over the “new welfare economics” that occurred in economics in the late 1930s and early 1940s. Debate over this claim briefly resurged with the publication of Kaplow and Shavell [2004]. More recently, however, claim (III), the doctrinal claim has received the most philosophical attention.

The philosophy of law has traditionally focused on a limited set of questions centered around the “concept of law” and the existence or non-existence of an obligation to obey the law. Thus, philosophers of law have investigated the nature of law, its relation to coercion and morality, how judges ought to decide cases, and whether, to what extent, and how law gives agents reasons for action.

The eight claims identified above do not correspond directly to these traditional questions in the philosophy of law. As already noted, claim (II) at least implicitly adopts a legal positivist understanding of law. Claim (VI) offers an explicit normative theory of adjudication, though one apparently at odds with how judges in fact decide cases. Central philosophic questions concerning the concept of law, its normativity, and the obligation to obey the law, however, are not directly addressed. The behavioral claim (IV) as well as the causal claim (V) and the explanatory claim (I), by contrast, concern empirical issues that philosophers of law generally neglect. Nevertheless, the controversy within the legal academy has generally regarded economic analysis of law as providing a comprehensive theory of law that challenges traditional approaches to law. Indeed, an explanation of the vehemence of the controversy should identify differences in fundamental views concerning law.

1.3 Three Strands of Thought within Economic Analysis of Law

The vast literature of economic analysis of law is not easily characterized. As the set of distinct claims suggests, the literature contains a large number of different projects. For purposes of this essay, we may identify three distinct strands of thought within economic analysis of law. A large percentage, but not all, of the literature in economic analysis of law falls within one of these three strands. I shall call one strand policy analysis, the second strand political economy, and the third strand doctrinal analysis.[4]

Policy analysis generally focuses on the analysis of the effects of legal rules and institutions on outcomes. An outcome usually consists of the “objective” effects of the rule or institution on the behavior of “private” individuals. Policy analysis then typically evaluates the rule or institution under study against some social objective function. Often policy analysis adopts “efficiency” as the evaluative criterion.

Policy analysis is thus linked both to the behavioral claim (Claim IV) and the design claim (Claim VIII). Neither of these links is logical or conceptual. The behavioral claim concerns the causal mechanism that determines how individuals respond to legal rules and institutions; these rules have effects through standard economic processes. The design aspect of policy analysis, however, requires not that the policymaker explain the effects of legal rules on behavior but that the policymaker predict the behavior the rules will induce. Prediction does not necessarily require the identification of a causal mechanism. Correlation suffices.

A gap also exists between the design aim of policy analysis and the design claim. The policy analyst may choose to assess the predicted behavior against any criterion she deems relevant; she may thus, contrary to the design claim, adopt non-efficiency criteria to select a legal rule.

Political economy, by contrast, investigates the operation of political institutions such as electoral systems, courts, legislatures, the executive and administrative agencies. These institutions make policy or determine which people make policy. Political economy thus seeks to explain how the content of the law is determined. In some instances we might understand political economy simply as the application of the behavioral claim to the constitutional and legal rules and practices that structure legislation, administrative action, and adjudication.

Both policy analysis and political economy examine behavior. The policy analyst focuses on the behavior induced by legal rules and institutions. Political economy concentrates on behavior that causes legal rules and institutions. Doctrinal analysis, by contrast, focuses on the content of the legal doctrine developed by courts in adjudication. It asserts that efficiency rationalizes the content of the law. We might understand “the content of the law” in at least three ways. First, it might, as the behavioral claim does, refer to the behavior induced by the legal rules announced in judicial opinions. Alternatively, the analyst interprets these opinions and other texts to extract an economic model that underlies the decision’s legal view of the world. On this interpretation, claims (II) and (III) might be true even though legal rules induced inefficient behavior in the real world because the announced legal rule might be efficient within the implicit model used by judges but inefficient in the world as it actually is.

The first understanding of doctrinal analysis suggests a connection to the classical behavioral claim (claim (IVa)). It would also suggest that doctrinal analysis would have developed a substantial empirical component that investigated what behavior doctrine actually induced. As this empirical component is largely absent, we may understand doctrinal analysis in the second, alternative way. The next section examines the philosophical debates that have emerged from this alternative, non-behavioral understanding of doctrinal analysis.

These three strands may be differentiated in a number of ways. First, each strand makes different motivational assumptions about public officials. Policy analysis generally assumes that public officials in general, and judges in particular, are conscientious. Judges thus enforce the legal rules as they are announced, regardless of the judge’s own view of the desirability of the legal rule or its impact on her personally. Political economy assumes that public officials have the same motivation as private individuals; they are self-interested (or subject to the same biases that private individuals are). In the context of adjudication, as will be elaborated below, the political economist interprets self-interested judicial behavior as decisions that promote the policy preferences of the judge. Doctrinal analysis does not analyze the behavior of public officials; it rationalizes the decisions of judges without necessarily imputing motivations to them.

Second, policy analysis and doctrinal analysis generally adopt a welfarist stance towards evaluation of legal rules, while political economy has evolved from a more contractarian tradition. Policy analysts, when evaluating legal rules, ask whether that legal rule induces behavior that satisfies some welfarist criterion, usually either Pareto efficiency or (constrained) social welfare maximization.[5] Political economy, however, has to a large extent emerged from an economic tradition, exemplified by James Buchanan,[6] that rejects the maximization of social welfare as a criterion and seeks to evaluate political institutions on grounds of (actual or hypothetical) consent. The political economist often asks not whether the rule induces Pareto efficiency but whether the parties have acted voluntarily, consented to the rule, or would have (rationally) consented to the rule.

Finally, we might understand the distinction among the three strands as a difference in the view each adopts about the instrumentalism of law. “Instrumentalism” here means that an agent designs the law to promote some collective goal. Kornhauser [2000, 2010] discuss this idea at length. For our purposes, we need only note several ambiguities in the brief definition just given. A more careful definition would specify the agent who designs, the meaning of design, what counts as “law,” and what is a collective purpose. Right now, we note only that instrumentalism may occur at the level of the rule, the institution or the legal system as a whole.

Policy analysis tends to proceed legal rule by legal rule. It asks, for example, how does a change in the standard of care affect the behavior of tortfeasors and tort victims? Or how does contracting behavior differ if the measure of damages shifts from expectation damages to reliance damages? The analyst thus imputes a purpose (usually, but not necessarily, the maximization of social welfare) to the promulgator of the legal rule. The analyst then assumes that the policymaker has chosen the legal rule that best promotes her (imputed) objective. Legal rules are then instrumental to the achievement of the posited goal; call this approach rule instrumentalism.

The political economist, by contrast, generally denies that any purpose can be attributed to the promulgator of a legal rule largely because legal rules are not promulgated by a single individual with power unilaterally to control the content of the rule. Certainly, from the perspective of political economy, legislators have no common purpose and one should not assume or expect that any statute maximizes social welfare. Legislation results from the interplay of interest groups that do not reflect all interests within society. Even if the legislature did reflect all interests within society, each interest does not have an equal (or proportionate) say in the formulation of the statute.[7] Finally, even if each interest did play a “proportionate” role in the formulation of the statute, Arrow’s General Possibility Theorem teaches that the aggregation of interests might still not yield a coherent purpose. Political economy thus rejects rule instrumentalism.

Further understanding of the approach of political economy requires acknowledgment of divergent views within political economy. I distinguish two such views: constitutional political economy and radical political economy. Each rejects rule instrumentalism but only the latter rejects instrumentalism altogether.

One might attribute the rejection of rule instrumentalism within political economy to a commitment to an explanatory rather than a normative project. At the level of constitutional political economy, however, the research program usually adopts the perspective of a constitutional designer and this designer arguably has a view of law that includes institutional instrumentalism: i.e., legal institutions, rather than specific legal rules, promote the specific goals of the constitutional designer.[8] The constitutional designer seeks a political structure that promotes her goals. The project of constitutional political economy is thus normative in nature. Indeed the normative nature of the project dominates any explanatory aim. Many within the project — see Brennan and Buchanan [1981, 1985] — argue that one ought to adopt an economic theory of behavior of public officials and private individuals even if that theory is not the best explanatory theory.

Radical political economists reject this reasoning. They carry the logic of the argument about the incoherence of legislative behavior through to the level of institutional and constitutional design. Constitutions are drafted by agents with political and economic interests that they seek to forward when they create the basic social, economic, and political institutions of the society. Incoherence may thus infect these institutions as well. The compromises over slavery in the US Constitution, for example, illustrate, when viewed against the democratic and equality elements of the document, such incoherence. Radical political economists thus reject the claim that the law is designed and hence reject instrumentalism altogether.

The relation of doctrinal analysis to instrumentalism depends on our understanding of the project of doctrinal analysis. If we understand doctrinal analysis simply as a rationalization of doctrine, it would appear to make no assumptions about the instrumental nature of law. The fact that doctrine is efficient might result from intentional behavior on the part of agents or might simply emerge from the structure of the institutions within which public officials work. On the other hand, if we understand doctrinal analysis as a theory of adjudication, then it clearly adopts a rule instrumental view of law. The project of doctrinal analysis is discussed at greater length in the next section.

These differences in the level at which law is instrumental, if the law is instrumental at all, suggest that the three strands of economic analysis of law will adopt different approaches to the study of adjudication. These theories are sketched and discussed in section 5 below.

More significantly for purposes of this entry, however, the classical variants of both policy analysis and political economy adopt the standard assumption of neo-classical economics that each individual seeks to maximize the satisfaction of her preferences. Moreover, they generally assume that each individual acts in her own self-interest, narrowly defined. This approach presents the single, greatest obstacle to the articulation of a general theory of law that confronts economic analysis: it has no room for the normative aspect of law. It is this denial of the normativity of law that accounts for the vehement resistance that economic analysis provoked within the legal academy.

2. Doctrinal Analysis

Doctrine organizes the vast legal materials of advanced societies as well as legal education and much of legal scholarship. First year law students study basic common law courses such as tort and contract; upper year courses address subjects such as antitrust, business organizations, and administrative law. The casebooks in these courses are organized doctrinally. Similarly, legal scholars typically specialize in the study of one or two doctrinal areas.

Posner was trained as a lawyer. Posner [1973] was organized doctrinally. Leff [1973] described Posner [1973] as a picaresque novel in which the eponymous protagonist Economic Analysis traveled down the river of doctrinal subjects, offering insight into each set of legal rules. Most current work in the field still analyzes some doctrinal rule, typically assessing its efficiency.

2.1 Doctrinal Analysis as a Rationalization of Private Law

Scholars thus generally consider doctrinal analysis the core project within economic analysis of law.[9] Certainly, legal scholars who work in the central private law areas of tort, contract, and property typically understand economic analysis of law as doctrinal analysis. This doctrinal analysis has provoked substantial philosophical attention and critique.

Critiques fall roughly into two groups. The first accepts the instrumentalism of law, at one level or another. It rejects, however, either efficiency as the aim of the designer or the assumption of rationality underlying any behavioral claim that may be implicated in a rationalization of doctrine. Issues related to the efficiency criterion are discussed below in section 6. The rejection of economic rationality generally rests on its failure to accommodate normativity, an issue we discuss in section 4.

The second set of critics have offered a panoply of alternative explanations of the relevant area of law. These alternative explanations share two features. First, they all take the language of “obligation” seriously. Second, and related, they all reject the view of doctrine as instrumental. Following Ripstein [2016], we shall call these alternative theories deontic theories.

To assess the debate, however, one must first determine how each side in the controversy understands the nature of doctrine and what counts as an explanation of it. Phrased differently, we must answer a substantive and a methodological question: what is private law theory (or doctrinal analysis of private law) a theory of? And against what criteria do we assess such theories?

To begin, consider the substantive question. This question has two aspects: a jurisdictional aspect and a “textual” aspect. Consider the textual aspect first. In doctrinal analysis, economic analysts of law seek to explain the outcomes of cases. An “outcome” here means the disposition of the case; the disposition of a case identifies the party that prevailed in the litigation, i.e, on the facts of the case, whether defendant was responsible or not.[10]. The critics of economic analysis of law understand the task of doctrinal analysis differently. Explaining doctrine requires an explanation not of the dispositions of decided cases but of the reasoning of those cases and, often, structural and procedural features of the litigation that gives rise to the reasons.[11]

The position of the critics is at least perplexing and arguably problematic. They apparently regard dispositions as mere applications of law to fact. Yet the practice of common law adjudication arguably treats the disposition as fundamental, i.e., as the aspect of the decision that requires respect. The priority of the disposition over the rule fits the English practice of seriatim opinions well. In such a practice, each judge offers her reasons for the disposition and may articulate rules. There are no reasons for dispositions or rules announced by the court. The court, however, does announce a disposition.

Similarly, it is not clear why an account of doctrine requires a rationalization of the bilateral nature of private law litigation. Critics (such as Coleman [2001], Ripstein [2016] and Weinrib [1995]) of the doctrinal analysis project in economic analysis of law consider this bilateral nature—the fact that this plaintiff sues that defendant and not someone else—essential. They point to the doctrinal analysts’ failure to provide an essential explanation as an important aspect of the superiority of their account of private law.

Though the critics are correct that doctrinal analysis does not consider the bilateral structure of private law as essential, it nonetheless can account both for how it emerged and why it persists. At the time of the emergence of private law, states were relatively small and had little capacity to monitor and enforce rules and regulations. Indeed, Henry II arguably introduced the common law courts to exert his power more broadly within England. At the time of the emergence of these private law institutions, there were no alternative institutions available to induce the desired behavior.

Moreover, the bilateral structure of private law exploits the private information of injured plaintiffs in enforcing the law. It is costly for the state to monitor everyone’s behavior; it is difficult to observe behavior that does not comply with announced norms. Injured victims, however, are well-placed—and, when the law enforces monetary claims for non-compliant behavior, injured victims have the incentive—to observe non-compliant behavior. The state frequently exploits this informational advantage of victims by creating private actions as in the antitrust and employment discrimination regimes in the United States.

The systematic use of these “private attorneys general” to promote public interests points to a deeper reason why the critics err when they treat the bilateral nature of private litigation as essential. This “bilateral nature” is a feature not simply of private law adjudication but of adjudication generally. Its explanation should therefore not rest on features peculiar to private law but on something fundamental to adjudication generally.

Turn now to the jurisdictional aspect of the substantive question. Which outcomes do doctrinal analysts rationalize? The reasoning of which opinions do the critics analyze? For a practicing lawyer, these questions have an obvious answer: analyze the outcomes or reasoning of the cases in the jurisdiction the law of which applies to the dispute. On this account, we would have a doctrinal analysis of, say, the contract law of New Jersey or the libel law of Montana. Private law theorists, however, have broader ambitions; they seek a more general theory though it is unclear how to generalize from the doctrine of jurisdiction J to doctrine in the abstract.

Doctrinal analysts within economic analysis of law face a somewhat lesser difficulty. Their project simply asks whether a legal rule that rationalizes a pattern of outcomes induces efficient behavior (perhaps within some model). One can pursue this task rule-by-rule and independently of the jurisdiction. The general claim then states simply that the doctrine in most jurisdictions is by-and-large rationalized by rules that induce efficient behavior. As more than one rule governing the same conduct may induce efficient behavior, there is no implication that rules are identical in different jurisdictions.[12]

For the critics, however, the problem seems deeper. Some structural features of private law may not vary across jurisdictions but the rules and the reasons for them do. It is less clear how one explains a mass of reasons and rules from different jurisdictions. The difficulty increases the more diverse the set of jurisdictions is. We might expect tort law in the United States to be relatively uniform across the fifty states. After all, the states largely share an approach to opinion writing and judges of one state may refer to the decisions of another. We would expect courts from different states to offer similar types of reasons. That unity might decrease if we consider all common law jurisdictions. After all, the conventions of opinion writing vary across these jurisdictions. Opinions issued from the judges of the Queen’s Bench do not obviously offer similar types of reasons as those issued by the California Supreme Court. An expansion to civil law jurisdictions increases the range of styles. Opinions of the French Cour de Cassation look nothing like the opinions of the two previously mentioned common law courts.

Though doctrinal analysts have not been methodologically self-conscious, several private law theorists—e.g., Coleman [2001], Kraus [2002], Smith [2006], and Ripstein [2016]—have outlined the requirements that a theory of private law must satisfy. These authors have articulated at least three criteria that apply to the evaluation of theories of private law: fit, transparency, and determinancy.

“Fit,” of course, refers to the extent to which the theory accounts for the observed phenomena—for the doctrinal economic analysts, the extent to which it accounts for the observed outcomes and for the deontic critics the extent to which it accounts for the reasoning of the courts and the relevant structural features. Though comparing degrees of fit across interpretations may be difficult, fit is uncontroversial as a criterion.

“Transparency” requires that the explanation be internal rather than external in the sense that the explanation relies on concepts deployed by judges and other actors producing the outcomes and reasoning to be explained. Doctrinal analysis, according to the critics, fails as an explanation of private law because it is opaque rather than transparent. Indeed, most of the criticisms of doctrinal analysis reduce, in one way or another, either to a claim that (1) it fails to satisfy transparency or (2) as discussed above, it fails to account for the bilateral nature of private law.

Transparency, however, seems an important theoretical ambition only for some accounts of doctrinal analysis. Most obviously, the content claim (claim II) that holds that efficiency determines the content of the law requires transparency when we interpret it as part of the rule of recognition. But neither the explanatory claim (claim I) nor the doctrinal claim (claim III) presuppose transparency. The content of a legal rule may be efficient even if judges do not aim at efficiency. An external account of the explanatory claim, however, provides an incomplete explanation until it identifies some mechanism that explains how judges, unconcerned about efficiency, nevertheless generally announce efficient rules.[13] Similarly, the doctrinal claim (claim III) that efficiency rationalizes the outcomes reached by the common law does not necessarily require transparency.

“Determinacy” requires an explanation to make a clear prediction of the application of legal rules to facts. Doctrinal analysis often satisfies this criterion; indeed, to the extent it seeks to rationalize dispositions, any successful doctrinal analysis must make such predictions. An explanation in doctrinal analysis identifies some “efficient” rule and this rule is determinate in the sense that it dictates a precise outcome or disposition in specific cases. On the other hand, efficient rules are often not unique; more than one rule will induce efficient behavior and these rules will not necessarily dictate the same disposition of a case.[14]

Deontic theories, by contrast, fare badly under the determinacy criterion. This lack of success may follow from the choice of subject matter to explain. These theories focus on the rules not the dispositions.

Deontic critics also reject the instrumentalism of doctrinal analysis. Doctrinal analysis treats the law as a means to the end of inducing efficient behavior. The value of legal rules derives solely from the value of the goal sought. On the deontic accounts, by contrast, the point of the law is to do justice between the parties.

2.2 Doctrinal Analysis as a Concept of Law?

Does doctrinal analysis implicitly or explicitly rely on some theory of law? It might be understood in a number of ways. It might be understood as the content claim (claim II) that holds that an efficiency criterion identifies the content of the law. The literature contains arguments that virtually every (common law) legal rule is efficient. This claim has both an empirical interpretation that each legal rule induces efficient behavior and a doctrinal interpretation that the prevailing legal rule is identified by its efficiency. The literature, however, has offered scant explanation or justification for the underlying theoretical claim that efficiency identifies the content of these legal norms. On what theory of law does efficiency become a ground of law?

One might justify the content in a variety of ways. A legal positivist might argue that the rule of recognition identifies efficiency as an appropriate ground of judge-made law. Or one might argue, as Dworkin has suggested, that efficiency provides the best interpretation of the practice governing the law of accidents. On either account, the claim that efficiency identifies the content of the law is a contingent claim. For the positivist, the content of the rule of recognition is contingent on the social practice of the relevant public officials; they may, but they need not, adopt an efficiency criterion.[15] Similarly, for Dworkin, the law derives from the best interpretation of the past political decisions of the community. These decisions are of course contingent; a different history of decisions might yield a different account of law. Claim (II) thus does not constitute a competing concept of law.

3. The Nature of Law

Philosophical inquiries into the nature of law have generally gone under the rubric “the concept of law.” Unfortunately, as multiple projects and questions fall under this single rubric, the debate has generated more confusion than clarity. This section seeks first to disentangle the various questions that have been conflated within a single concept of law.

The section then focuses on two of those concepts, identified in the next subsection as the doctrinal and sociological (or social scientific) concepts of law. We argue first that economic analysis of law is not committed to any specific doctrinal concept. Second, and finally, we argue that economic methodology does suggest how to define a sociological concept of law that is parasitic on a concept of governance and on the value of legality.

3.1 Concepts of Law

Since Dworkin’s initial challenge to Hart’s positivism in the mid-1960s, a robust but unresolved debate over the concept of law has riven the philosophy of law. Hart [1994] viewed this debate with some perplexity as he thought the two sides had not engaged. More pointedly, he thought there was nothing to argue about as he felt that he and Dworkin asked two different questions; and, consequently, explicated two distinct concepts of law.

Dworkin [1986] considered identification of the grounds of law the central question for the philosophy of law. The grounds of law identify the truth conditions of propositions of law. The doctrinal concept of law answered this question. For him, the jurisprudential debate thus focused on whether the grounds of law included moral principles or not. Implicitly, then, Dworkin interpreted Hart [1961] as centrally addressing this doctrinal question.

Hart, by contrast, did not understand his project as centrally focused on the grounds of law. Hart [1961] offered various, non-equivalent characterizations of his central task. In the first chapter, he suggests as a central aim the differentiation of law from a variety of other phenomena, specifically morality, religion, and coercion. In the preface, however, Hart suggests that his study might be regarded as an essay in “descriptive sociology.” The answer to the former question would rely on what Dworkin [2006] called a taxonomic concept of law that distinguished law from other social phenomena; the latter question, by contrast, demands what Dworkin [2006] called a sociological concept of law that furthers the aims of social science.

Before identifying further concepts of law, it is important to understand how the taxonomic and the sociological concepts of law differ. A taxonomic concept of law has two functions. As noted, it distinguishes legal norms in society S from other norms in that society. Second, and derivatively, it makes comparative law possible. Comparative law must identify which rules and institutions to compare across societies. A comparative study of tort law, for instance, must be able to identify which norms in country X are legal norms governing accidents between strangers in order to compare them to the legal norms governing accidents between strangers in country Y.

The sociological concept, by contrast, must serve the needs of social theorists who seek to understand society and social behavior. It will be a technical concept that emerges from the theory or theories that best explain the phenomena the social theorist studies. Note, moreover, that a social scientist might require more than one concept of law. Hart’s descriptive sociology might be interpreted as offering a functional concept of law. Anthropologists, by contrast, often seem more interested in an expressive concept of law. (See Pirie [2010] for a discussion that suggests an expressive account of the concept of law.)

The doctrinal, taxonomic and (various) sociological concepts of law do not exhaust the possible concepts that might be useful. Obviously, we require, for instance, an evaluative concept of law that identifies the value of legality. Similarly, some legal philosophers, such as Raz and Coleman, understand the inquiry as an investigation of a folk concept of law that underlies ordinary usage of the term. This folk concept will differ from the other concepts of law but it may be influenced (or perhaps tainted) by the others, particularly the doctrinal and evaluative concepts. Kornhauser [forthcoming] offers an achievement concept of law according to which law is a contingent achievement of a functioning governance system in specific circumstances. It realizes some value of legality. This view is elaborated at greater length in section 3.3.

A complex web of relations might connect these various concepts. Hart’s theory does yield a ground of law, and hence a doctrinal concept, from his sociological or taxonomic concept. What makes a proposition of law true, for Hart, is its pedigree which must trace back ultimately to the rule of recognition in the community. Similarly, we might create a taxonomy by considering how the grounds of law differ from the grounds of morality or religion. A taxonomy, that is, follows directly from comparing truth conditions for propositions of law to truth conditions for propositions of morality.

No necessary relation, however, holds among the concepts. One might have a sociological concept of law that does not rely on the doctrinal concept of law as their grounds are very different. What makes a proposition of law true bears no obvious relation to what concepts will shed light on questions of interest to social theorists.

3.2 The Doctrinal Concept of Law in Economic Analysis of Law

The prior section identified a plethora of concepts of law. On which of these concepts does economic analysis of law rely? On which of these concepts does it shed light? This section addresses these questions with respect to the doctrinal concept of law that lies at the center of legal practice. The next section addresses these questions with respect to the sociological concept of law that might play a role in the development of social theory.

Most doctrinal analyses take the “legal materials” as given. They seek to rationalize the decisions of some set of courts. Any concept of law that identifies the materials as the relevant ones to rationalize serves the doctrinal analysts’ purposes.

Policy analysis and political economy have also largely been silent about the doctrinal concept of law on which they rely or shed light. Each has largely put the questions that motivate the debates over the concept of law to one side.

An economic analysis of the behavioral effects of a legal rule generally begins with the assumption that the legal rule is clearly known not only to judges and other public officials but also to those subject to the legal rule. This knowledge of private citizens might amount simply to the knowledge of what consequences follow from each possible action the agent might take. Actions that provoke a response from public officials generally, or judges in particular, have no special character to them; the citizen in her deliberations treats the consequences of rule-following or rule-breaking as she treats any other price.

Similarly, investigations into the causes of legal rules and institutions typically take the background institutions and rules as given and, generally, known to all parties. It is not clear that the analysis attributes any special character to legal rules and institutions other than, perhaps, centralized legislation, adjudication, and enforcement.[16] Thus political economy, like policy analysis, seems agnostic about the central philosophical questions. Nothing in the analysis requires that legal rules be distinctive in any way. Indeed, radical political economy holds that self-interest governs individual and institutional action all the way down. It leaves no room for any normative force to law.

This agnosticism about the doctrinal concept of law is, on two accounts, harmless. First, as Murphy [2014] argues, competing positions on the role of morality in the truth conditions of propositions of law do not have many, if any, substantive consequences for the practice of law. Ignoring the doctrinal concept of law thus has no substantive consequence for economic analyses of these rules.

Second, as argued in Kornhauser [2015], a doctrinal concept of law is unnecessary for the practice of law. What legal theory requires is not a doctrinal concept of law but a set of theories of decision-making for various agents—judges, legislators, public officials, and citizens.

3.3 Law as an Achievement: Towards a Social Scientific Concept of Law?

Both policy analysis and political economy pursue projects substantially different from the philosophical ones. Policy analysis seeks to understand how legal rules influence behavior; political economy seeks to understand the ways in which society structures its political, economic, and legal institutions. These projects suggest a social scientific concept of law rather than a doctrinal or taxonomic one. A social-scientific concept of law would help us understand the social world in general, the emergence and persistence of social groups over time and the causes and consequences of different governmental structures. Political economy and policy analysis, or a general sociology, then seek to answer the question: How do we differentiate the structures of social governance in order to understand social phenomena?

An understanding of society and social phenomena, of course, may not require anything akin to the concept of law at issue in the philosophical debates. Two different reasons, however, suggest some relation between the philosophical debate and the social-scientific inquiry. One should recall that Hart [1961] characterized, perhaps off-handedly, his project as one in the descriptive sociology of law. Such a sociological project presumably requires a social scientific concept of law. Moreover, once one has articulated a viable and useful set of social-scientific concepts, one might ask what relation they bear to the issues at the center of the philosophical inquiries of the value of legality and of articulating the criterion that distinguishes legal from other grounds of decision.

Adopting Hart’s discussion as a starting point, we shall in the rest of this subsection, sketch a social-scientific concept of a governance structure and suggest how it might relate both to the project of political economy and to the philosophical debate over the concept of law. (Kornhauser [2004, 2015, forthcoming] provide a more extended account.)

One of Hart’s rhetorical devices provides a useful starting point for the development of a social scientific (functional) concept of governance. To introduce the concept of a secondary rule, Hart [1961] recounts a fable concerning the emergence of a legal system in a small community. He suggests that a small, homogeneous, stable, and closely knit society requires no differentiated structures of governance. These structures emerge to resolve problems that arise in societies that are large, heterogeneous, or subject to environmental uncertainty. Though Hart identifies only three such problems, we shall identify four distinct functions that might be distributed across societal structures: (1) the characterization of socially acceptable (or unacceptable) behavior, a task the importance of which grows as the rate of change in society increases;(2) policing of behavior to identify likely instances of deviant behavior; more anonymous societies may require more institutionalized policing; (3) definitive adjudication of non-conformity to social norms; again, when society is no longer face-to-face, such adjudication may be necessary to trigger sanctions; and (4)sanctioning of deviant behavior; informal sanctions grow more difficult to impose when society is not face-to-face.

Governance within a society requires that the society somehow accomplish each of these four tasks. A society might do so in a number of different ways. A governance structure is the set of institutional structures within a society that address one or more of the four problems of adaptation, detection, application, and sanction that are the central elements of governance. An institutional structure is a decision-making protocol that specifies procedures relevant to the resolution of one or more of the problems of adaptation, detection, application, and sanction. Clear understanding requires a distinction here between institutional structures, realized institutions, and functioning institutions. This distinction parallels the distinction between game forms, games, and plays of a game in the theory of games. As noted before, an institutional structure is simply the basic rules or protocol for governance; a realized institution is an institutional structure situated in a given society and populated by particular individuals; and a functioning institution is a realized institution as it operates in a society in actual conditions.

All societies have governance structures. The simplest, face-to-face societies have undifferentiated structures in which all of these functions are informal and diffused through the society. As social groups grow more numerous and their environment becomes more volatile, governance structures become more complex.

A crude taxonomy of governance structures might distinguish them along three dimensions: the degree of institutional differentiation in the governance structure, the degree of organization (or “direction,” or “structure)” – for further discussion see Kornhauser [forthcoming] – and the mechanism of internal, “bureaucratic” control.

A governance structure may be more or less differentiated from other institutions (such as those governing exchange or reproduction) in a society. Hart considered two extremes: a simple society with no differentiation of governance from other institutions and modern, municipal legal systems that have distinct institutions for adaptation, policing, adjudication, and sanctioning. Indeed, a society such as the United States has multiple legislative, executive and judicial institutions that relate in complex ways.

“Organization” refers to the degree to which governance in a given realm or of a given function (such as norm creation or norm monitoring) are “centralized” or “directed” by specified individuals. Simple, face-to-face societies typically have decentralized (and undifferentiated) institutions. The community as a whole monitors compliance and sanctions non-compliance. Private law is typically monitored in this decentralized way. Modern municipal legal systems, by contrast, are typically more structured and organized.

The mechanism of internal control refers to the character type that the governance institutions (seek to) select for public officials. As noted above, governance depends on who occupies official roles; governance structures function differently when public officials are self-interested rather than when they are conscientious. Hart contrasted two motivations for compliance with law or legal obligations: incentives that rely on the self-interest of individuals and acceptance of rules as guides to action. For Hart, law required that a core set of public officials had to accept the rule of recognition as an authoritative guide to action.

Political economy, by contrast, aims to explain all legal phenomena in terms of the self-interest of agents. This analytic strategy precludes a Hartian account of law; legal rules cannot play any role in the explanation of behavior of either private individuals or public officials because no agent has the relevant internal attitude towards the rule. An individual faced with a choice considers the costs and benefits that each option presents to her. These costs and benefits will include “legal costs and benefits” but these costs and benefits are not determined by rules; they are the result of the incentives that private and public officials face. Rules are only rules of thumb that express the response of average individuals under normal circumstances to particular events. Which rules of thumb are used, of course, may greatly affect the social equilibrium achieved in a particular jurisdiction.

Political economy thus seeks a concept of governance that relies only on incentives; it consequently denies the existence of legal systems in Hart’s sense. It might nonetheless acknowledge a different concept of law. Some political economists, for example, suggest that legality in the sense of an impartial “rule of law” promotes economic growth. The political economist then might identify law or legal systems as those governance structures that realize such a rule of law (in given circumstances). The political economist, then, might adopt two related concepts. The first concept of a governance structure is an explanatory one; it characterizes the mechanisms of social governance in terms of the degree of institutional differentiation and the mechanism of bureaucratic control within these institutions. The second related concept is normative. It identifies a value that a governance structure might realize. Call this value legality. The concept of law is thus a normative one; that identifies the value of legality. The social scientist then seeks to identify conditions under which specific governance structures will realize the value of legality.

The above discussion sketches a concept of governance, a concept clearly necessary for social science. We might understand law in two distinct ways. The first, traditional way regards law as a mode of governance, or, we might say, as a species of governance. On this account, some specific feature or features of a functioning governance system characterize law; these features identify the “essence” of law. Debates about the concept of law are thus debates over the features that are essential for law.

The alternative approach understands law as an achievement of a functioning governance system. On this account, the essence of law lies in the character of the achievement, i.e., in the value of “legality” that the functioning governance system realizes. Debates about the concept of law on this achievement account are thus debates over the nature of the value of legality.

4. The Normativity of Law

Traditional approaches to law treat legal rules as normative, i.e., as giving citizens reasons for action. These approaches present two philosophical questions: what is the nature of the reasons for action that law gives? and do individuals have a general obligation to obey the law? The first question is generally understood as asking whether a legal rule provides a moral reason for action. The second question has been extensively examined in the legal and philosophical literature. Murphy [2014] provides a clear perspective on this literature.

Claims (IV) and (V) assert that individuals respond to legal rules in an economic way. On classical economic accounts of rationality, an economic response is a prudential rather than a moral response. Legal rules, on the economic account, thus do give individuals reasons to act, but they are not regarded as moral reasons. A traffic sign designating a street as within a school zone both indicates that children may dart into the street and sets a reduced speed limit. Each of these indication provides the agent with reasons for action. The rule thus affects the agent’s behavior by affecting his beliefs about the likelihood of a causing an injury when traveling at various speeds and his beliefs about the expected costs of different courses of conduct. The sign and the legal rule give the agent prudential reasons for action. Economic analysis of law in its current form thus largely adopts the Holmesian “bad man” theory of law.

Critics of economic analysis of law contend that this failure to address the normativity of law provides ample grounds on which to reject its adequacy as a theory of law. This argument, however, does not satisfactorily address two questions.

To understand the first question, recall that, in the projects of policy analysis and political economy, micro-economic theory serves as a positive theory of behavior. For the critics’ objection to apply, then, the normativity of law must have behavioral implications. Legal obligation thus must influence behavior. Whether the economic theory of behavior can accommodate legal normativity must depend on what behavior that normativity induces.

Philosophers, however, have not addressed this question. Their investigations of practical reason generally and of legal reasons in particular typically understand their inquiry as setting the requirements of practical rationality not as being an actual theory of behavior.

The second question arises once the implications of legal normativity for behavior have been identified. Can the economic theory of behavior accommodate the requisite normative behavior? “Accommodation” in this context means that economic theory can generate models that predict the behavior that a legal obligation induces. Clearly, standard economic models do not attempt to accommodate normativity. The economic theory of behavior, however, is very flexible. Section 4.3 suggests some basic strategies that economic theorists might adopt to accommodate normativity.

To set the stage for this analysis, we first set out a simple example of choice against which to assess different understandings of behavior. We then consider why philosophers of law and lawyers generally might think that law provides non-prudential reasons for action.

4.1 Interpreting Choice

Consider Liza who has gone to a restaurant with friends. The menu offers two main courses: beef and tofu. Liza must choose one. Suppose Liza chooses tofu. How can we understand or rationalize her choice?

A rational choice explanation will refer to her preferences, her beliefs, and the environment in which she chooses. Liza might choose tofu because she prefers tofu to meat. She might choose tofu because she prefers healthy meals to unhealthy meals and she believes that tofu is healthier than meat. She might choose tofu because she is budget-constrained and tofu is cheaper than meat. Or Liza might have more complex preferences. Perhaps all of Liza’s friends have chosen tofu and Liza has a taste for conformity.

Suppose, however, that Liza believes that it is wrong to inflict pain on sentient creatures. She believes she has a moral obligation not to eat meat. She thus chooses tofu. How does the rational choice model accommodate this belief? It might accommodate this moral attitude by incorporating it into her preferences in one of two ways. Liza, that is, might internalize the norm in two distinct ways. Liza might develop a substantive preference for tofu over meat. She would internalize the content of the norm. On this account, if her moral view changed, Liza’s preference for tofu over meat would remain. The moral norm, or Liza’s endorsement of that norm, would not have had any (direct) influence on her behavior.

Or she might have a preference for norm compliance; that is, all other things equal, she prefers actions that conform to the norm to actions that violate it. One might say that Liza incurs a “cost” from non-compliance with a norm. Then, if she prefers meat to tofu, all else equal, she will choose tofu when the cost of norm violation is sufficiently high. If Liza’s moral views changed, she would revert to eating meat. The two forms of internalization thus yield different behavioral predictions. This account of normativity, however, has an ad hoc quality to it as the cost of norm violation is not directly observable.

4.2 Legal Form

Legal regulation takes a number of distinct legal forms to which legislators and judges pay strict attention. The state might impose, on the same conduct, one or more of the following forms of regulation: criminal penalties, a civil fine, an administrative fine, a tax, a license, or a private civil action. Different forms of regulation clearly have different expressive features. But typically the legal profession and the public may think the different forms have different behavioral consequences. These different behavioral consequences may suggest that the law, or at least the form the legal regulation takes, provides distinctive reasons for action.

Contrast, for example, enforcing an air pollution emission standard through a criminal penalty rather than a tax. The two regulatory regimes clearly express different attitudes towards emissions. The criminal penalty prohibits emissions (above the stated standard); the tax permits emissions (above the stated standard). Lawyers tend to believe that a criminal prohibition will reduce emissions more than the tax.

Similarly, a city might redesignate a section of the curb from “no parking,” enforced by an administrative fine to metered parking. The “no parking” designation prohibits parking in the identified zone while meters permit parking upon payment of the (licensing) fee. The city presumably expects that, under “no parking”, the stretch of curb will remain clear, while it expects cars to use the same stretch when parking is metered. The distinction between a prohibition and a permission clearly has expressive content.[17]

These legal forms, of course, differ not only in their expressive content but also in their substantive features. Monitoring for criminal violations differs dramatically from monitoring for regulation through a private civil action. In the latter case, private citizens identify violations of the standard; in the former, government officials police the regulated conduct. Further, the fora in which violations are adjudicated may differ not only in the burdens and standard of proof but also in the identity of the fact-finder that might be an administrator, a judge or a jury (with varying decision rules from majority to unanimity). Finally, the size and nature of both the formal and informal sanction may vary. The policymaker sets the formal sanction but the informal sanction arises from the informal social response to violation of the norm. Violating a criminal law typically provokes more severe social sanctions than violating an administrative regulation or a norm enforced only through private civil actions.

These institutional variations suggest that the rational policymaker will determine that different forms, even if they impose identical sanctions, will create different expected penalties for violating the norm and give rise to different distributions of type 1 and type 2 errors, where a type 1 error incorrectly rejects plaintiff’s claim and a type 2 error incorrectly accepts it. The different legal forms will thus create different incentives and induce different behaviors, even when imposed sanctions are identical. Moreover, the policymaker might in fact choose among these forms on the basis of these different incentives and on the relative importance of Type 1 and Type 2 errors.

The elaborate differences among these legal forms thus make it difficult to isolate a distinctive account of legal normativity. The subtle variations in form have consequences for behavior on the economic account that might explain variations in responses to the various legal forms that we might have initially attribute to normativity.

4.3 Strategies of Accommodation

As the last subsection noted, prudence can explain differences in behavior that result from the different legal forms. Each form creates a different expected sanction and an economically rational actor will respond differently to these different expected sanctions. Moreover, any differences in expected behavior might be attributable to differences in the policymaker’s objective function. Different burdens of proof generate different distributions of error types. A policymaker might tolerate more deviant behavior to ensure that innocent people do not suffer penalties.[18]

Nevertheless, one might intuitively expect greater compliance to emissions standards regulated through a criminal penalty than to emissions standards regulated by a tax, even if the expected payment for each available action were identical under the two regimes. This intuition runs counter to the rational choice explanation. Only if this intuition is correct could we say that the law provides non-prudential reasons for action.

The economic model of behavior, however, is extremely flexible. It requires careful consideration to conclude that the model cannot accommodate “normativity.” This section assesses the techniques available to the economic model of behavior to determine the extent to which ideas of normativity may be accommodated.

From the philosophical literature on obligation and the very limited economic literature on obligatory behavior, one may extract four possible mechanisms through which obligation influences individual action. The first mechanism simply reduces obligations to the standard model of (narrowly) self-interested rationality. The discussion of legal form above suggested how this reduction might proceed. Further methods of reduction are discussed below.

Second, one might weaken the assumption of full rationality. Boundedly rational agents may have reason to follow rules and these rules, though perhaps best treated as rules of thumb, might cause the agent to mimic normative behavior.

The third mechanism identifies preference as the pathway through which obligation operates; obligations motivate when they are “internalized.” Internalization may take at least two different forms. One form dissolves the normativity of law while the other has an ad hoc quality.

Finally, obligation may influence the agent’s deliberative or decision process. One might understand this mechanism as treating the agent’s preferences as context-dependent; how she ranks alternatives depends on whether (and which) obligations apply. I consider each of these mechanisms in turn.

4.3.1 Reduction

Economic analysis of law easily accommodates sanction theories of duty. The analyst here simply reduces the sanction theory to self-interested preference maximization. This approach, as noted above, adheres to the assumption that agents are (narrowly) self-interested. It recognizes, however, that a legal rule may either provide the agent with relevant information (and hence change her beliefs) or place a price on certain actions. The price a legal rule places on conduct will depend on the legal form as the legal form determines the monitoring mechanism and the burdens of proof, both of which determine the probability that the legal sanction will be imposed.

It is also straightforward to see how a legal rule might provide information that alters the agent’s beliefs about the likely outcome of various courses of action. Consider, for example, a driver on a mountain road who encounters a sign that indicates an impending curve on which the speed limit has been lowered to 15 miles per hour. In light of this sign, the agent should adjust her beliefs about the highest safe speed at which she can negotiate the road. Regulations of health and safety may operate in a similar way.

A third way that obligation might be reduced to self-interest relies on repeated interaction. Agents with foresight understand that behavior that deviates from the legal norm today may have consequences for their subsequent dealings in the future. This harm arises even when the legal sanction is not imposed. The threat of future harm thus may induce compliance with a legal norm even in the absence of sanction.

Finally, in many instances, rational agents need to coordinate their actions. In coordination games, for example, each agent ranks the different possible outcomes identically; but, when multiple equilibria exist, the agents may fail to coordinate on a desirable equilibrium. A legal rule may publicly announce an equilibrium to play and that announcement may coordinate the agents’ actions.

Announcement of a legal rule in this context can coordinate the players’ actions. It gives each agent a reason to choose as the rule dictates if it affects the individual’s beliefs concerning which strategy the other agents will adopt. On this account, the social fact that individuals accept the law provides each individual with a reason to act. This reason is independent of any sanction that the law might impose for non-compliance. Moreover this reason is prudential in that it best promotes the agent’s own welfare. Of course, one might say that the reason is also moral as it best promotes the well-being of all. This coincidence between the moral and prudential results from the coincidence of interests of all agents.

4.3.2 Bounded Rationality

A second route to the accommodation of normativity within the economic model acknowledges that individuals are boundedly rational. The assumption of bounded rationality admits the possibility that agents should follow rules. A legal rule would then be justified, in a manner consistent with Raz’s [1979, 1986] account of authority, when adherence to the rule improved the decision making of the agent.

In the simplest model in which such an account exists, agents face a cost of deliberation. The more complex the deliberative calculation, the higher the costs the agent incurs. When the marginal cost of deliberation is sufficiently high, the agent might do better to follow a rule that quickly, and therefore cheaply, identifies a good but not optimal action.[19] If the expected benefit from choosing the optimal action (relative to the good action) is less than the cost, it is prudent for the agent to adopt the rule of thumb. More sophisticated accounts of an economic rationale for rule-following rely on more complex models of bounded rationality.

To complete an economic account of the authority of law requires that one explain why the agent should consider legal rules as the relevant rules to which she should defer. One might argue that those who promulgate legal rules have special expertise that makes it likely that they will enact rules that are better than the rules that the agent herself would formulate. For some legal rules—technical rules concerning health and safety promulgated by administrative agencies—the argument may have merit. After all the decision at issue depends on a mass of technical data that is not easily assimilable or manipulable. For many other legal rules promulgated by legislatures and courts, however, the argument may not apply.

Several other features of this argument merit attention. First, it parallels the argument for authority offered by Joseph Raz.[20] As in Raz’s argument, authority is specific to legal rules rather than to law in general. An agent might believe the law more expert than she with respect to some decisions but not with respect to other decisions. In fact, agents with different expertise themselves would find different legal rules authoritative.

Second, on this account of authority, the legal rule affects the agent’s deliberation not because of the sanction for non-compliance but because compliance with the legal rule, even in the absence of a sanction, is in the agent’s best interest. This feature of the account of authority conforms to notions, developed further below, of the way in which rules enter the deliberative process. But this feature also limits the applicability of the account to those legal rules that bear on the agent’s immediate interest. Many legal rules direct the agent to adopt actions that raise her own costs; in the absence of a sanction for non-compliance, her own interest would dictate non-compliance. For example, a rule requiring that an agent adopt due care in certain activities may raise the agent’s costs.[21]

The prudential account of authority outlined above primarily addresses private individuals. One might ask the parallel question concerning the obligation to obey the law of public officials. In some respects, this question has greater significance than the question concerning private individuals because many acknowledge that the motivation of private individuals to obey the law is usually prudential, the desire to avoid sanctions. Moreover, on some jurisprudential accounts, most notably the legal positivism of H. L. A. Hart, the attitudes and behavior of public officials determine the existence and nature of law.

The economic account of authority, however, does not provide a compelling explanation of official behavior. Consider how the economic account applies to public officials. The relevant obligations here are the official obligations of the individual: the judicial obligation to decide cases according to the dictates of stare decisis and other obligatory practices; or the executive official’s obligation to apply the law. Two difficulties arise immediately. How is compliance with these official obligations in the individual’s interest? Why must the agent follow a rule rather than optimize in each instance? This second difficulty is less troublesome than the first; Ronald Heiner [1986], for example, has offered a prudential account, grounded in bounded rationality, of the judicial obligation to adhere to stare decisis.[22]

One might attempt to resolve the first difficulty concerning the agent’s interest by arguing that compliance with official obligation is in the individual’s interest because she desires to maintain her employment. But this explanation rests on an incentive argument. The sanction of dismissal induces the compliance rather than normative motivation to comply with one’s obligation; it is another prudential account. The prudential account of authority thus fails to overcome this first difficulty. It is not clear then that the prudential account of authority can ground the normativity of law.

4.3.3 Obligation within Preference

Economic theorists offer a highly abstract account of individual decision-making. Its abstract nature renders the theory remarkably flexible. As it is an account of instrumental rationality, it can accommodate many different substantive accounts that differ in their specification of what ends are rational or, more simply, whatever ends the agent happens to have.

Briefly, the economic explanation of decisions states simply that the agent chooses the feasible option that she ranks most highly according to her “preferences.” “Preference” is a technical term, not a psychological concept. By definition, a preference is a linear order over some domain of objects. A linear order is complete, asymmetric, and transitive. Less formally, we may understand preference as a relation “at least as preferred as” over the relevant domain. Completeness requires that, for any two objects a, b, either a is at least as preferred as b or b is at least as preferred as a. Asymmetry states that if a is at least as preferred as b and b is at least as preferred as a then a is indifferent to b. Finally transitivity requires that if a is at least as preferred as b and b is at least as preferred as c then a is at least as preferred as c.

An agent typically has a number of competing ends. One can interpret the agent’s preferences as her all-things-considered ranking of all possible outcomes. One might then consider the obligations under which the agent finds herself as among the agent’s competing “ends”. The question of compatibility between economic rationality as preference and obligation then reduces to the question of whether obligations may be integrated with the other concerns of the agent into an all-things-considered ranking that satisfies the preference axioms.

Integrability presents a serious challenge to the economic account of rationality. Nevertheless, the theory has substantial resources to meet this challenge. To illustrate, consider Neumann’s [2007] analysis of the famous example used by Anand [1993] and Sen [1993]. In this example, they consider an agent whom we shall call Freddie. Freddie is Liza’s guest for dinner and he has been offered a plate with three slices of cake on it. One slice is small, one medium, and one large. Freddie has two concerns: he wants the largest piece of cake available and he wants to conform to the social norm “never take the largest piece”. In Sen’s and Anand’s account, Freddie cannot integrate these two concerns into a preference because his choices violate a condition of contraction consistency which is necessary for transitivity. That is, from the pair (small slice, medium slice), Freddie chooses the small slice but from the triple (small slice, medium slice, large slice), Freddie chooses the medium slice. These choices, however, are inconsistent only under the description given.

Sen and Anand use the absolute size of the pieces of cake to describe Freddie’s options. As Neumann points out, this description ignores a decision relevant aspect of Freddie’s choice situation; Freddie cares about the relative size of the pieces of cake. Freddie’s choices under a description using relative sizes conform to the axioms defining a preference.

Will appropriate redescription resolve all conflicts between “preference” and “obligation”? A related approach to this problem suggests that the answer to this question depends on the structure of the norm. Baigent [2007] and Xu [2007] consider the rationalizability of choice when the agent faces normative constraints. In these situations, the agent, facing a set of feasible options, first eliminates those acts that are normatively prohibited. He then chooses the best available option from this restricted set of feasible options. Whether we can attribute an all-things-considered preference to the agent depends on the structure of the obligation and the detail of the agent’s preferences.

4.3.4 Deliberation.

Rationality in economics is instrumental; the agent’s ranking is taken as given and as fundamental. The agent does not deliberate about her ends.[23] Accounts of practical reason, however, often involve deliberation over ends. The economic account of rationality may have less success in accommodating these accounts of obligation.

Raz [1975] provides an account of practical reasoning in which obligation plays a central role. On this account, obligations are exclusionary reasons that provide the agent with both a first-order reason to take the obligatory act and a second-order reason not to consider some set of first-order reasons actions. This structure differentiates obligations (or prohibitions) from taxes (or permissions).

A simple example illustrates this logic. Consider a prohibition on emitting more than 75 parts per billion of sulfur dioxide per hour into the air. This prohibition gives a power-generating plant reason not to emit more than that amount of sulfur dioxide per hour. But it also excludes a variety of other first-order reasons for action from the plant’s consideration. On Raz’s account, the firm should not act on, for instance, the fact that emitting more than 75 parts per billion of sulfur dioxide per hour would increase its profits (or lower its costs). The obligation would not, presumably, exclude reasons that arose from a situation in which a temporary failure to exceed the emissions standard posed a substantial threat to the health and safety of employees.

A tax on sulfur dioxide emissions above 75 parts per billion per hour, by contrast, provides the firm with only a first-order reason for action. The firm regards the rate of taxation as a price on such emissions and can weigh that price against its other costs and benefits. On this account, then, a tax and a fine that create identical expected sanctions and the same distribution of type 1 and type 2 errors should induce different behaviors. The fine will never lead to higher emission rates and, under some circumstances, should induce lower emission rates.

Can the economic theory of rationality accommodate this understanding of normativity? Arguably, the ad hoc assumption that the agent incurs a cost when she fails to comply with a legal duty captures this idea. This ad hoc cost implies that ordinary costs and benefits must be sufficiently large to outweigh the cost imposed by the prohibition. But this approach fails to capture some of the potential subtleties of an exclusionary reason as the obligation may not depend on the size of the costs (or force of the reason) but on the nature of it. An obligation may exclude some types of costs, no matter how large, but not exclude other types of costs, no matter how small.

Alternatively, one might understand the agent’s preferences as context-dependent. The agent’s ranking of alternatives depends on which set of obligations apply to her. In each situation, she faces a different set of reasons for action and she must adjust her ranking of her options to reflect these different reasons.

5. Theories of Adjudication

Adjudication plays a central role in legal institutions and in legal philosophy. This centrality extends beyond the articulation of theories of adjudication. Debates about the concept of law, for instance, generally highlight the role of the judge. For Hart, judges are an important subset of those public officials whose social acceptance of a rule of recognition constitutes the community’s legal system. For Dworkin, the theory of adjudication itself determines the content of the law.

Each strand of economic analysis of law has, at least implicitly, articulated a theory of adjudication. Doctrinal Analysis as a theory of adjudication was discussed in section 2.2. In this section, I consider the theory of adjudication implicit in each of the other two strands of economic analysis of law.

Each theory occurs at the level at which the strand finds the law instrumental. Policy analysis offers a normative theory of adjudication that addresses the judge; it specifies that she should decide cases to maximize social welfare. Constitutional political economy, by contrast, offers a normative theory of court structure. It specifies the design of adjudicatory structures within which judges will, of necessity, act in a self-interested fashion. We briefly discuss each theory in the following subsections.

5.1 Adjudication in Political Economy

As noted earlier, the political economy strand of economic analysis of law itself contains two strands that are in tension with each other. On the one hand, the radical political economy strand seeks only to explain legal phenomena rather than to prescribe either the structure of legal institutions or the content of particular legal rules. One might find within this strand of political economy a positive theory of adjudication but not a normative theory. Indeed, the positive theory advanced argues that judges seek to promote their interests. Usually, these interests are defined as policy interests, that is, an interest to promote particular policies.

The second strand of political economy, constitutional political economy, does have normative aims. It assumes that political actors will act in a self-interested fashion within existing political institutions but that agents will act more impartially in the design of the political institutions within which they will work.[24] A normative theory of adjudication does emerge from this strand of political economy, but it differs significantly from the normative theory endorsed by the policy analysis strand of economic analysis of law. For constitutional political economy, a normative theory of adjudication must be a structural one; it should describe the structure of adjudication. The theory thus cannot dictate directly judicial motivation because, according to political economy, judges will always act self-interestedly. Adjudicative institutions, however, can be designed to align better the interests of judges with the interests of the designer of the constitution.

In 1975, Landes and Posner offered a justification for the independence of the judiciary that is often understood as a normative theory of adjudication within the tradition of constitutional political economy. On the account of Landes and Posner, an independent judiciary serves the interest of legislators who seek to impose their policies on the jurisdiction for periods that exceed the length of their majority in the legislature. As a consequence, they find it in their interest to have the judiciary enforce the original bargain struck in all legislation.

This argument contains a normative theory of statutory interpretation. Judges ought to enforce the bargains reached by the legislature that enacted the statute. On this account, a judge ignores the views of the current legislative majority. She also eschews interpretation of the statute in terms of her own policy preferences.

One should note that, from the perspective of constitutional political economy, the argument of Landes and Posner is incomplete. They ground their theory of judicial independence in the interests of legislators. The interests of legislators within extant legislative institutions may not coincide with the interests of the constitutional designer.

5.2 Adjudication in Policy Analysis

The normative theory of adjudication implicit in both policy analysis and doctrinal analysis follows from Posner’s early claim that the common law ought to be efficient. The theories are essentially identical. The two projects differ only in the seriousness with which they take actual behavior. Policy analysis rests on the behavioral claim and hence must look to the actual behavior induced by legal rules, while doctrinal analysis often seems to rely only on “efficiency” within some specified model.

A normative theory of adjudication was among the earliest claims advanced in the economic analysis of law. Posner [1973, 1979, 1980, 1985, 1990, 1995] asserted claim VI in the introduction: the common law ought to be efficient. He interpreted efficiency as “wealth maximization” but then interpreted wealth maximization as “willingness to pay.” This interpretive stance yielded an argument that judges in (common law) cases ought to choose the legal rule that maximized the ratio of benefits to costs as measured by the sum of individual willingnesses to pay.

Posner’s claim evoked great controversy in the late 1970s and early 1980s. (See, e.g., Symposium [1980].) Twenty years later, Kaplow and Shavell [2001] revived and revised Posner’s claim. The revision had two components. First, and most importantly, they chose welfarism generally rather than cost-benefit analysis in particular as the normative basis for adjudication. Welfarism requires that evaluation depend solely on the well-being of individuals. Cost-benefit analysis is thus a form of welfarist evaluation; but Kaplow and Shavell’s argument allows them to avoid various criticisms of cost-benefit analysis. Second, Kaplow and Shavell do not argue primarily for a normative theory of adjudication. Rather, they contend that evaluation of legal rules and institutions by scholars ought to be welfarist. They suggest, however, that judges by and large have the same evaluative obligation as the third-party analyst.

5.2.1 A brief critique of cost-benefit analysis as a theory of adjudication

Cost-benefit analysis attempts to implement a Kaldor-Hicks evaluative criterion. According to the Kaldor-Hicks criterion, a distribution of goods (broadly understood) X is superior to a distribution of goods Y if and only if there exists a third distribution of goods Z such that (a) Z is a redistribution of the distribution X; and (b) Z is Pareto preferred to Y.[25]

Cost-benefit analysis proceeds in two steps. First, for each individual, it identifies a particular representation of the individual’s ordinal ranking of the options open to the policy maker. Second, it aggregates these representations of each individual’s preferences into a social ranking.

The first step is unproblematic. Consider agent K. K has preferences over states of the world. A representation of these preferences begins with a baseline policy and ranks all policies relative to the baseline. Specifically, it assigns a number to each state of the world such that K prefers state X to state Y if and only if the number assigned to state X is higher than the number assigned to state Y. Cost-benefit analysis defines states of the world as (policy, wealth) pairs and defines the agent’s willingness to pay for a move from state X to Y as the change in wealth in state Y that would the agent indifferent to the state X. This procedure thus links the range of numbers that the agent may assign to the agent’s wealth as willingness to pay is defined in part in terms of the agent’s ability to pay.[26] The procedure for assigning numbers on the basis of an individual’s willingness to pay in fact yields a representation of that agent’s preferences. Willingness to pay is a utility function that accurately represents the agent’s (ordinal) preferences over states. Notice, however, that, if the agent chooses a different baseline policy, the numbers, though ordered identically, will not be the same as those derived from the original baseline. (One sees this immediately when one notes that the baseline policy always receive a value 0.)

The second step of cost-benefit analysis is more problematic. To aggregate the individual willingnesses to pay, cost-benefit analysis simply sums the individual willingnesses to pay. One can see immediately several difficulties with this procedure. First, each ranking is ordinal; the numbers have no significance beyond the order. Suppose that, using the status quo Q as a baseline, K assigns a number 2 to policy X, a number 4 to policy Y and a number 16 to policy Z while, when using policy P as a baseline, she assigns a number 3 to policy X, a number 9 to policy Y and a number 27 to policy Z. As the representations are ordinal, one cannot conclude anything about K’s intensity of preference; her Q-based representation of her preferences “assesses” the difference between Z and Y as six times the difference between Y and X while her P-based representation of her preferences thinks the difference between Z and Y is only three times the difference between Y and X. not prefer Z to Y. The choice of baseline may thus affect the choice of policy.

Second, cost-benefit analysis adopts a method of interpersonal comparisons of well-being that is particularly unconvincing. Interpersonal comparison of well-being requires that one identify the appropriate representation of each individual’s preference ordering and compare those representations. Cost-benefit analysis, however, does not identify representations on moral or political grounds; rather it chooses the representations that contingently arise from the actual distribution of wealth and income in the society.[27] If Tom is poor while Bill is wealthy, it is unclear why the representations of the well-being of each that derives from willingness to pay provide interpersonally comparable measures. Equally, if Tom and Bill are equally wealthy but Tom is disabled and Bill is not, the willingness to pay of each may still not be interpersonally comparable.

5.2.2 A Structural Critique of Welfarist theories of adjudication.

One might construct a normative theory of adjudication at either of two levels. First, one might take as given the general structure of adjudication within a particular judicial system and ask what obligations the judges within that system ought to have. Second, one might more fundamentally design the judicial system from scratch. On this second account, the institutional environment in which judges act as well as the obligations of judges within that institutional environment would be subject to evaluation.

Most normative theories of adjudication are of the first type. They take the institutional structure in which adjudication occurs largely as given and then identify the obligations of judges within that system. Phrased differently, normative theories of adjudication are interpretive of an ongoing practice rather than efforts to design a practice from scratch. Welfarist theories of adjudication face several difficulties when understood as interpretive theories of existing (common law) practice.[28]

First, the structure of adjudication does not generally provide adequate or appropriate information for the selection of rules that maximize social welfare. Adjudication in a common law system usually focuses on a past transaction between particular parties. This transaction may not be typical of transactions that were litigated; it certainly will not be typical of the entire population of transactions that a rule would govern. Under a given rule, for instance, the set of transactions that do not lead to litigation are likely to differ systematically from the set of transactions that do give rise to litigation. Equally important, different legal rules are apt to generate different sets of transactions. The current structure of adjudication does not provide any information that would help a decision maker assess these differences across potential legal rules.

Second, the selection procedure for judges does not identify individuals with the appropriate training and background to make accurate calculations of social welfare. Judges in common law countries have generally not been trained systematically in economics and statistics, two disciplines necessary (but not sufficient) for the determination of social welfare under alternative legal rules.

Third, and related, judges usually face severe constraints in the set of legal rules they may consider in any adjudication. When confronted by a tort case, for example, the court usually considers a limited number of legal regimes; perhaps it will reformulate the standard of care or shift from a regime of negligence to one of strict liability. A court, however, is unlikely to adopt a complex scheme of no-fault insurance or to impose a different insurance scheme, even though these more radical transformations of social institutions would provide higher overall welfare.

6. Evaluation of Legal Rules and Institutions

The evaluative tradition in economics is resolutely welfarist. That tradition extends to the policy analysis branch of economic analysis of law. In the prior section, we considered the manifestation of this tradition in the advocacy of cost-benefit analysis as a normative theory of adjudication. In this section, we consider arguments for welfarism as the sole evaluative standard against which to appraise legal rules and institutions.

The critique of cost-benefit analysis described in section 5.2.1 was directed against cost-benefit analysis, a specific and concrete form of welfarism developed to implement the more abstract evaluative ideas underlying welfarism. Objections to this specific instantiation of welfarism do not necessarily run against the more general class of evaluative criteria. Similarly, the critique described in section 5.2.2 focused on the institutional structure of adjudication; though this structure may be hostile to an implementation of a welfarist theory of adjudication, it has no bearing on the appropriate criteria against which a third party should assess legal rules and institutions.

The discussion in this section reviews the debate over whether the evaluation of legal rules and institutions should rely only on welfarist criteria. As noted earlier, Kaplow and Shavell [2001] offered an extensive argument for welfarism as the sole criterion. Their argument has several elements.[29] The first element identifies an individual’s well-being with her preferences. Thus, an individual K has greater well-being in state X than in state Y, if and only if she prefers state X to state Y. In the second, key element of the argument, welfarism interprets the agent’s preferences as her all-things-considered ranking of alternatives. This step thus incorporates within the agent’s preference ordering anything that the agent considers relevant to her decisions. Consequently, the claim about an agent’s well-being now becomes: K prefers state X to state Y if and only if K believes, all things considered, that state X is better than (or ought to be promoted rather than) state B.

K’s all-things-considered judgments, of course, will included many considerations that, in ordinary language, are not usually considered as in K’s self-interest or even as contributing to her well-being. So, for example, her all-things-considered judgments will incorporate concerns for the well-being of others as well as considerations of justice and deontological constraints on action. Section 6.1 discusses the counterargument that an individual’s concerns for justice and her endorsement of deontological constraints cannot be integrated into an adequate concept of well-being.

Kaplow and Shavell’s argument for the exclusivity of welfarism as an evaluative criterion rests on a third leg. The argument contends that use of any non-welfarist criterion is incompatible with the Pareto criterion. Section 6.2 accepts this claim for purposes of argument. The discussion then points out that the Pareto criterion conflicts with principles of rationality, valuation, liberty, and responsibility that have an equally strong appeal.[30] It is thus not clear that we should accept the Pareto criterion and reject these others principles.

6.1 Preference and Well-being

Call an ordering that incorporates every consideration that the agent views as relevant to her decision “an extended preference ordering”. Kaplow and Shavell include the agent’s moral concerns in this extended preference ordering. We may call this approach the “strategy of incorporation.”

A complete argument that the extended preference ordering does not correspond to a morally compelling conception of well-being would require articulation of the concept of well-being, a task well beyond the scope of this entry. Here we outline two formal arguments against the strategy of incorporation that treats the agent’s moral concerns, her views about equality, fairness, and distributive and corrective justice more generally, as elements of well-being.

We broached the first formal argument in section 4. There we noted that not every norm could be integrated with self-interested concerns into an all-things-considered set of judgments that satisfied the formal conditions of a preference. To succeed, the strategy of incorporation must show that each of the agent’s moral “tastes” or concerns have a normative structure that is compatible with her underlying, self-interested preferences. The strategy of incorporation thus might fail because of the structure of the obligations that the agent endorses.

Second, a welfarist theory distinguishes between the well-being of each agent and the criteria that determine the structure of the social welfare function.[31] The theory, that is, distinguishes what makes an individual’s life go better and the concerns that determine how one integrates the well-being of individuals into “social welfare.” These latter concerns weigh the well-being of individual J against the well-being of individual K. Consider two states of the world s and t. Agent J’s well-being is higher in state s than in state t while agent K’s well-being is higher in state t than in state s. To rank the two states, society must determine the relative importance of the well-being of the two individuals.

Moral norms perform precisely this function. A moral norm determines when the well-being of agent J should take precedence over the well-being of agent K. Indeed, we say that agent J has a right against agent K precisely when we think that the decisions or choices of agent J should prevail over the decisions or choices of agent K. The moral concerns of each agent thus reflect the agent’s views about the structure of the social choice function, not (necessarily) her views about what constitutes her own well-being.

Of course, an agent might believe that her life goes better if she lives in a more egalitarian society. But she might also believe to the contrary that her life would go better if she lived in a more hierarchical society. Then, the social structure would affect the agent’s well-being. The choice of social structure, however, is not dependent on the agent’s well-being. The structure of the social choice function rather determines the social structure. Thus, an agent may believe that an egalitarian social welfare function is appropriate (or perhaps even “better than” a hierarchical social welfare function, but she may nonetheless believe that her own well-being would be higher in a hierarchical society than in an egalitarian one.

The social welfare function resolves conflicts of “interest” between individuals. Moral disagreements, however, reflect not conflicts of interest but a dispute over how such conflicts should be resolved. The resolution of a moral conflict determines whose well-being counts not how much well-being the agent has. The strategy of incorporation confuses these two concepts.[32]

Many of the concerns that, under the strategy of incorporation, are included in an individual’s extended preference ordering thus bear on the structure of the social choice function; they do not necessarily make the agent’s life go better. Concerns for distributive justice, for example, reflect moral judgments about how to integrate different distributions of well-being. They do not reflect judgments about how well-off each agent is.[33] Similarly, respect for deontological constraints on action reflect the judgment that the effects on the well-being of the constrained agent do not bear on our assessment of the social state.

The social welfare function aggregates or integrates the well-being of each individual in society into a social ranking of states. It does not integrate or aggregate the differing views of the individuals concerning the appropriate social welfare function. Conflicts over the appropriate social welfare function must be resolved through some separate process. Society for example might vote on which social welfare function to adopt. Such a vote might be justified on epistemic grounds; it cannot be justified on social welfare grounds. We do not choose our social welfare function in order to maximize social welfare.[34]

6.2 The Pareto Criterion

Let us first define the Pareto criterion. Consider a society of n individuals, each of whom has a well-defined preference over all possible states of the world. The Pareto criterion states that a state of the world x is socially better than a state of the world y if and only if each individual considers state x at least as preferred as state y and at least one person strictly prefers x to y. It follows from this definition, of course, that, if each individual prefers x to y, then x is socially better than y.

The Pareto criterion has a strong intuitive appeal. If everyone agrees that a state x is preferred to a state y, certainly the collective assessment must rank x more highly than y. The Pareto criterion moreover appears to be weak, i.e., to impose few constraints on social choice. After all, each member of the society will only rarely rank two alternatives as every other member of the society. Nevertheless, the Pareto criterion has strong implications for the aggregation of individual judgments. Indeed, as summarized below, the Pareto criterion is inconsistent with a large number of other principles, each of which also has strong intuitive appeal.

Perhaps the inconsistency that would most disconcert an economist arises between the Pareto criterion and the demand for aggregate rationality under uncertainty. Consider again our society of n individuals. Assume now, though, that society must choose among a number of policies, the consequences of which will depend on the underlying but unknown state of the world. Each individual has preferences over these policies that satisfy the axioms of subjective expected utility theory. Consequently, one may represent each individual’s preference over actions by a set of preferences over consequences and a set of beliefs (that satisfy the probability axioms) over states of the world; moreover, the individual prefers policy p to policy q if and only if the expected utility from policy p exceeds the expected utility from policy q.

Aggregate rationality imposes two constraints on the construction of collective preference over policies. First, it demands the construction of a collective preference over policies that also satisfies the axioms of subjective expected utility theory. Second,it demands that each the collective preference be responsive to the preferences of the members of the collective. This demand implies, when individual preferences satisfy the axioms of subjective expected utility theory, that each component of the representation of collective preference be responsive to the corresponding component of the representations. Both the collective utility function and the collective beliefs must be responsive to the individual utilities (or preferences over outcomes) and the individual beliefs about the likelihood of states of the world.

Suppose, in addition, that we demand that the collective preference satisfy the Pareto criterion. That is, if each individual in society prefers policy p to policy q, then society collectively must prefer p to q. Unfortunately, Seidenfeld, Kadane, and Schervish [1989] have proven that, if at least two individuals both rank two consequences differently and assess the likelihoods of two states of the world differently, then society cannot simultaneously satisfy the Pareto criterion and the demands of aggregate rationality.

The Pareto criterion also conflicts with substantive moral claims. Larry Temkin [1993], for example, has argued that the Pareto criterion is inconsistent with the existence of communal goods. A communal good is one that provides social value but does not improve the well-being of any individual. A communal good, that is, is good for us even though it is good for no individual. He offers equality as an example. A society with equality of well-being, for instance, might be better than a society in which individuals have highly unequal levels of well-being even if each person in the unequal society has higher well-being than she has in the more equal society.

Communal goods often seem scarce or improbable; how could something that is good for us together be good for none of us in particular? Many people, for example, reject either the claim that equality is a communal good or that it is valuable at all. Our prior discussion in section 6.1, however, suggests a host of potential other communal “goods”. There is a sense in which each of the determinants of the structure of the social welfare function is good for us without necessarily being good for anyone. At least for a welfarist, the structure of the social welfare function is constitutive of the good. Everyone might be “better off” under a regime of slavery but that regime would nevertheless remain worse than a free society.

The Pareto criterion is also inconsistent with three different aspects of the value of autonomy: liberty, responsibility, and self-governance. A formal argument underlies each of these claims. Amartya Sen [1971] first articulated the conflict between the Pareto criterion and liberty. He began from the standard social choice framework developed by Arrow [1963] in which each agent has preferences over final states of the world. He imposed two of the Arrovian conditions, universal domain and the Pareto criterion, but substituted the condition of minimal liberty for the other two (non-dictatorship and independence of irrelevant alternatives). Minimal liberty is indeed minimal; Sen required only that each member in society was decisive over two alternatives. He then proved that one could not construct a social preference that satisfied all three axioms; the Pareto criterion and minimal liberty conflict.

The Arrovian framework, however, does not present the ideal environment in which to study minimal liberty. An agent may have the right (or in Hohfeldian terms a privilege) to determine a social decision. Typically, though, he need not exercise his right. Or the agent may be willing to trade or waive his right in exchange for some benefit. Gibbard [1974] argued that the power to waive one’s rights undermined Sen’s claim. Subsequent authors then reformulated Sen’s argument within a more suitable, game theoretic framework. See, e.g., Deb, Pattanaik and Razzolini [1997]. The conflict thus persists in a more plausible and appealing formal framework.

In Hohfeld’s taxonomy of legal rights, a legal duty is the jural correlate of a legal right. We might similarly consider responsibility the ethical correlate of liberty within the conceptual framework of autonomy. Recent formal work has shown that this aspect of autonomy also conflicts with the Pareto criterion.

Sen defined autonomy as liberty understood as freedom to choose. Autonomy as responsibility for one’s choices and actions represents the obverse side of this freedom to choose. Political philosophers have examined this issue in their study of distributive justice. Rawls [1971] famously argued that individuals were not responsible for their innate talents. Dworkin [1981] extended this argument through his distinction between “brute luck” and “option luck”. Distributive justice in both arguments required insurance against bad realization of risks of “brute luck” but responsibility for the bad realizations of option luck.

Within economics, the study of responsibility has emerged from the literature initiated by Duncan Foley [1967] and Hal Varian [1974] on fairness. An allocation is fair if and only if it is Pareto efficient and envy-free. An allocation is envy-free if no individual would prefer the outcome assigned to another individual to the outcome assigned to her. In an exchange economy, a competitive equilibrium that results from an initial, equal allocation of resources is both Pareto efficient and envy-free because each individual has the same set of options available to her. The competitive equilibrium is thus fair.

In a production economy, however, a similar argument will fail if individuals have different talents. The argument fails for two reasons. First, talents are not transferable though, of course, we may transfer money between agents. Second, when two individuals have unequal talents, they face different sets of feasible options. The more talented have better options and hence do better. The less talented may envy them. As a consequence, no efficient and envy-free equilibrium exists.

These arguments apply to the more abstract concerns of distributive justice and responsibility. The no-envy test outlined above combines two distinct ideas. First, individuals with identical attributes for which they are responsible should have identical well-being. Second, individuals with identical characteristics for which they are not responsible should receive identical compensation for their losses. The first condition addresses option luck; the second brute luck.

Fleurbaey [2008] comprehensively explores the tensions between these two aspects of the no-envy test and between the no-envy test and the Pareto criterion. The compatibility of these two conditions depends on the nature of the correlation of these effects of brute and option luck on the agent’s well-being. If the well-being of agents with bad luck is unusually responsive to their bad luck, no fair allocation exists. The requirements of no-envy and the Pareto criterion again conflict.

We now turn to a third aspect of autonomy, self-governance. In the context of collective action, self-governance refers to democratic governance. The vast literature on social choice theory investigates the relation of self-governance to the Pareto criterion in this context.

Various assumptions reflect the value of democratic governance in this literature. The most minimal assumption is non-dictatorship. We may interpret Arrow’s initial result as demonstrating, for direct democracy, a complex incompatibility between the Pareto criterion and several other axioms including non-dictatorship, the axiom of minimal self-governance. The complexity arises because we cannot easily determine which of the several axioms is most fundamental. The literature, for example, has investigated the importance of the axiom of independence of irrelevant alternatives more thoroughly than the Pareto criterion. This emphasis perhaps reflects the strong appeal of the Pareto criterion.

Representative democracy, however, presents the conflict more starkly. In modern society, communal self-governance generally operates through representative institutions. Individuals do not directly enact substantive legislative programs. Rather, they elect representatives to legislatures that then enact substantive legislative programs. Phrased differently, election procedures are candidate-based rather than assembly-based or program-based. Notice that this distinction persists even in those states that have adopted party-list proportional representation schemes. In these schemes, an individual votes for a party rather than an individual candidate that has endorsed a specific program. The election determines the party composition of the legislature. Each contesting party then constitutes a candidate.

These candidate-based procedures, however, are inconsistent with the minimal demands of communal self-governance. Benoit and Kornhauser [2010] have proven that the only Pareto efficient, candidate-based procedure is a dictatorship. Again the Pareto criterion conflicts with a (minimal) requirement of communal self-governance or autonomy.

6.3 The Argument for Welfarism Revisited

The discussion in the previous section has not decisively demonstrated that we should reject welfarism as the sole evaluative criterion for legal rules and institutions. We have argued only that arguments that rest on the intuitive appeal of the Pareto criterion are insufficient to establish the welfarist claim. The Pareto criterion has great intuitive appeal but it also has strong implications that bring it into conflict with other principles that also have strong intuitive appeal.

Legal rules and institutions offer a comprehensive guide to and regulation of social life. The intuitive appeal of various principles may vary with the range of activity governed by the legal rule or institution. The intuitive appeal of the Pareto criterion is strongest in those areas of law that regulate corporate and commercial behavior. Perhaps here, indeed, welfarist considerations should provide the sole guide to the structure of legal rules and institutions. Election law and laws regulating political speech, by contrast, may be legal domains in which the appeal of principles of communal self-governance dominate. In these areas, evaluation based exclusively on welfarist considerations seems less appropriate.

Controversies in many areas of law, however, implicate many of our values. Environmental regulation, for example, clearly implicates welfarist concerns. Regulation determines in part the relative costs of production of various goods and services that contribute to individual well-being. Environmental regulation, however, also clearly implicates questions of autonomy. Productive activities may impose unwanted risks on individuals that limit the exercise of the individual’s autonomy. Tort law perhaps raises these issues more starkly.

Similarly, we may understand conflicts over the appropriate tax and social welfare policy as raising questions not only of efficiency but also of autonomy as responsibility. Exclusive focus on welfarist concerns distorts these policy debates by ignoring fundamental issues that divide us.

7. Concluding Remarks

Though the controversy over economic analysis of law has waned, its project continues to disquiet many scholars who study legal phenomena. The prior discussion identifies two distinct sources for that disquiet.

Many legal scholars object to the normative theory of adjudication advanced by policy analysts. These scholars generally reject the welfarism to which policy analysis is committed. The prior discussion suggests, however, that a rejection of welfarism as a moral theory is neither necessary nor sufficient for the rejection of the normative theory of adjudication advanced by policy analysts. Moreover, the core commitments and achievements of economic analysis do not lie in the construction of a normative theory of adjudication. Rejection of the economic theory of adjudication thus leaves the central elements of policy analysis, political economy, and doctrinal analysis largely intact.

The methodology of economic analysis of law poses a more significant challenge to traditional accounts of law. Economic analysis of law provokes disquiet because the model of self-interested maximization of preferences apparently does not admit a concept of normativity but explaining the normativity of law is a central pre-occupation of philosophy of law. The logic of this commitment to self-interested maximization of preferences would appear to lead to a denial of the need for a distinct concept of law in the explanation and evaluation of social institutions. As section 4 suggested, this denial of normativity may only be apparent as the methodological resources of economic analysis of law allow for at least some accommodation for the incorporation of some normative reasons into the explanation of behavior.

Economic analysis of law seeks primarily to explain how people behave in response to legal rules and institutions. This core project of economic analysis of law complements traditional legal theory with its emphasis on the nature of law and its normative claims. Within economic analysis of law, however, lies a more ambitious project that would radically reconstruct the debate over the concept of law (as sketched above in section 3.3). It replaces the debate over the concept of law with two related inquiries.

The first inquiry is explanatory. It requires a concept of governance that facilitates our understanding of how societies resolve problems of adaptation, monitoring, application, and sanction. Governance regimes include purely coercive regimes as well as regimes with some normative aspect to them. It regards the debate over which of these systems should be called “legal systems” as fruitless and uninteresting.

The second inquiry is normative and treats the term “law” as an honorific or a term of commendation that we apply to some governance structures. The value of legality, of course, is neither clear nor uncontroversial. It requires much elaboration. However elaborated, this approach treats law as an achievement of governance, not a mode of governance.

These two conceptual inquiries intersect. An analogy with economics may clarify the intersection. Economics at its core studies resource allocation mechanisms. In so doing, economists have identified a particular value, efficiency, that good resource allocation mechanisms achieve or manifest. Economists then seek to identify the conditions under which specific resource allocation mechanisms, such as competitive markets, will realize efficiency.

Economic analysis of law suggests a similar research project. First, characterize governance structures. Next, specify the value of legality. Finally, identify the conditions under which specific governance structures realize the value of legality. This project thus transforms the project of legal theory as currently understood while nonetheless leaving past legal theory both comprehensible and fertile. Traditional legal theory suggests how we might articulate both the concept of governance and the concept of legality that economic analysis seeks to develop and elaborate.


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Other Internet Resources


Research for this entry was supported by the Filomen d’Agostino and Max E. Greenberg Research Fund of New York University School of Law. This revision benefited from comments on a draft from Felipe Jimenez Castro and Liam Murphy. I also thank Robert Cooter for his persistent questioning during a seminar we co-taught on these topics at NYU in spring 2015.

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