The Normativity of Meaning and Content

First published Wed Jun 17, 2009; substantive revision Mon Dec 19, 2022

Normativism in the theory of meaning and content is the view that linguistic meaning and/or intentional content are essentially normative. As both normativity and its essentiality to meaning/content can be interpreted in a number of different ways, there is now a whole family of views laying claim to the slogan “meaning/content is normative”.

In this essay, we discuss a number of central normativist theses, and we begin by identifying different versions of meaning normativism, presenting the arguments that have been put forth for and against them. We then continue by discussing content normativism, providing an overview of the contemporary debate. Both debates are very much on-going and at this point there is little consensus as to whether normativism holds for either meaning or content. Since the first publication of this essay much of the debate has focused on two of its central issues: First, it has been debated whether meaning normativism can be derived from the fact that meaningful expressions necessarily have correctness conditions. This is the argument we labeled “the simple argument” and in section 2.1.1 we discuss contributions to the debate. Second, the nature of rule-guidance has been much discussed, in particular relating to content normativism, and new proposals have been made as to how it is to be understood. We discuss this in sections 2.2 and 3.2. Finally, the debate surrounding normativity has also evolved into a discussion about the normativity of rationality and around the question of whether or not logic sets the standards for how we ought to reason. Though in this entry we will primarily devote our attention to the meaning and content, we will also make reference to related issues concerning the normativity of rationality.

1. Interpretations of the Normativity Thesis

1.1 Metaphysical Questions

Normativism is a claim about the nature of meaning/content. According to normativism, there cannot be meaning/content without norms, where the impossibility is metaphysical, conceptual, or both. A first question thus is: which is prior—norms or meanings/contents?

Read metaphysically, the question is: Are certain norms valid, or in force, because certain things such as linguistic expressions and intentional states have certain meanings/contents? Or do such things have meaning/content because some norms are in force? We shall distinguish between meaning/content “engendered” (ME/CE) normativity and meaning/content determining (MD/CD) normativity (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2009). MD/CD norms are such that they metaphysically determine, ground, or constitute meaning/content; here, the norms are prior. ME/CE normativity is normativity engendered by, or consequent upon, meaning/content, regardless of how the latter is determined.[1]

MD/CD normativism aims at answering “foundational” questions and providing metaphysical explanation: In virtue of what do linguistic expressions/intentional states have meaning/content? Metaphysical explanation of \(X\) by means of \(Y\) requires that \(X\) at least supervenes upon \(Y\).[2] Supervenience relations involve three elements: a set of supervenient entities \(S_E\), a set of entities forming the supervenience base \(S_B\), and a principle according to which what is in \(S_B\) determines what is in \(S_E\) (a function from \(S_B\) to \(S_E)\). Whether supervenience suffices for metaphysical explanation or not, an explanation will therefore not be complete unless the principle of determination is specified.[3] When it comes to meaning, this is arguably one of the most important lessons of Wittgenstein’s so-called rule-following considerations; as long as only the supervenience base is specified, its elements can be mapped onto meanings in any old way, thus leaving meaning completely indeterminate (cf. Pagin 2002, Glüer 2018).[4]

1.2 Varieties of Normativity

Normativism claims that nothing can have meaning/content unless norms of a certain kind are valid, or in force.[5] A second basic question thus is: what kind of norm would that be?

The most basic distinction relevant here is that between norms for action and norms of being.[6] Norms of being are often associated with evaluations; they tell us that a certain state of affairs ought to obtain, i.e., is valuable or good in a certain sense. Norms for action, on the other hand, tell us what to do. Both can either be prima facie (or pro tanto) or categorical (cf. Ross 1930 [1987]). Prima facie norms or evaluations can be overridden or outweighed (by other norms, obligations or evaluations), categorical ones cannot. Both norms of action and values can also be categorized by provenance: There are the norms of morals, etiquette, and prudence, the laws of the state, and the rules of games. Analogously, values of different kinds can be distinguished. The normativity of meaning/content typically is construed in terms of norms for action.

Concerning norms for action, we can distinguish between instrumental and non-instrumental norms. An instrumental norm tells us what to do in order to reach a certain goal, where the relation between means and end is contingent. Its normative force for an agent is contingent upon the agent’s goals. An example would be:

If you want to make the hut habitable, you ought to heat it (von Wright 1963: 10).

Among non-instrumental norms we can further distinguish between prescriptions and other norms for action, and thirdly between constitutive and non-constitutive rules or norms.[7]

Prescriptions can typically be formulated in deontic vocabulary, i.e., in terms of what is prescribed, forbidden, or allowed/proscribed.[8] They can be conditional (CP) or unconditional (P). For conditional prescriptions, we can distinguish between those where the deontic operator (“ought”, “should”) takes wide scope over the conditional \((\CP_w )\), and those where it takes narrow scope \((\CP_n )\):

You ought to do \(X\).
\((\CP_w )\)
You ought to (if \(C\) then do \(X)\).
\((\CP_n )\)
If \(C\), you ought to (do \(X)\).

The main difference between \((\CP_w )\) and \((\CP_n )\) is that on \((\CP_w )\), there are two ways of discharging your obligation: by doing \(X\) or by making it the case that \(C\) is not fulfilled. Not so on \((\CP_n )\): once \(C\) is fulfilled, you must do \(X\). Only on \((\CP_n )\), that is, can the consequent be detached.

For prescriptions, two principles are usually taken to hold intuitively. These are the principle that ought implies can, and the principle that ought implies the possibility of violation. Both principles are somewhat controversial, but have initial plausibility as there would not seem to be much point to prescribing, forbidding, or allowing impossible things (cf. Williamson 2000: 241).

Many norms or rules concern types of action or activities that exist independently of them. Constitutive rules or norms, by contrast, in some sense “create” the very actions or activities they regulate. Rules of games are prime examples. According to Midgley (1959) and Searle (1969; 33ff), constitutive rules typically, and naturally, can be put into the following form:

In \(C\), doing \(X\) counts as doing \(Y\).

According to this suggestion, constitutive rules tell us that, in a certain context \(C\) (for instance, a game of soccer), an action of type \(Y\) (for instance, scoring a goal) can be performed by means of performing an action of a different type \(X\) (for instance, kicking the ball into a netted box). According to Searle, constitutive rules play an important role in social ontology: “institutional facts” (facts concerning social statuses such as being money, having meaning, or being an assertion) can be explained in terms of collective acceptance of rules of this kind (cf. Searle 1995, 2010). Other accounts of social institutions in terms of rules constitutive of social statuses have stressed the normative consequences of having a such a status (cf., e.g., Ransdell 1971, Hindriks 2009).

Despite its predominance in the literature, the characterization of constitutive rules by means of forms like (CR) is too narrow, however. There are prescriptions that are constitutive of certain games—for instance, that spearing is forbidden is constitutive of ice-hockey—and these do not naturally fit the (CR) form. It is better to characterize a set of rules or norms as constitutive of a certain type of action/activity \(A\) iff \(A\) cannot be performed, or engaged in, unless these norms are in force (cf. Pagin 1987; Glüer & Pagin 1998; Kaluziński 2018; Reiland 2020; García-Carpintero 2022).[9]

With these distinctions in place, we can proceed to mapping the debates concerning the normativity of meaning/content. Given that the norms in question are supposed to be essential to meaning/content, we can already now see that what we are looking for are non-instrumental norms of purely semantic provenance. MD/CD norms will moreover have to be of the constitutive kind.

2. Meaning

We have distinguished two ways in which normativism about meaning can be understood: ME normativism and MD normativism. The difference between the two, again, is that the MD normativist is committed to the metaphysical priority of norms, since the norms are said to determine meaning, while the ME normativist remains neutral on the issue of meaning determination. Both versions of meaning normativism, however, claim that the following is both necessary, and essential to, an expression \(e\)’s having meaning (for a speaker, or group of speakers, \(S\) at a time \(t)\):

\(e\) means \(M\) for \(S\) at \(t\) only if a norm for \(e\) is in force for \(S\) at \(t\).

Historically, MD normativism is associated with Wittgenstein (in particular the “Middle Period” writings) and the tradition of appealing to linguistic conventions, prominent in the 1950s and 1960s (in the writings of Grice, Lewis, Searle, and Strawson for instance). ME normativism appeared on the philosophical scene more recently, and is associated with Saul Kripke’s book on Wittgenstein’s rule-following considerations (Kripke 1982). In the book Kripke presents us with a meaning skeptic who challenges the very idea that there are facts in virtue of which our terms have a meaning. Kripke’s skeptic puts down certain constraints on the range of facts that could serve to determine meaning, among these that the essentially normative character of meaning has to be respected. The meaning determining fact, Kripke argues, must be such that it follows from it how the term ought to be applied (1982: 11). Equipped with this normativity constraint the skeptic goes on to argue against all theories that fail to accommodate the required normative dimension of meaning, in particular dispositionalist theories according to which meaning is determined by the speaker’s dispositions to apply her terms (1982: 22–37).

Kripke’s discussion reignited interest in the question of the relation between meaning and rules, and resulted in an enormous literature both on the skeptical argument and the very idea that meaning is essentially normative. Much of that discussion has been carried out without reference to the earlier debate on meaning and conventions, but attempts have also been made to relate the two debates. In what follows we shall first discuss ME normativism, where the discussion following Kripke’s book plays a central role, and then MD normativism.

2.1 Meaning Engendered Normativity

It is clear that the type of normativity Kripke has in mind is ME normativity; i.e., the claim is that meaning statements such as “expression \(e\) means \(M\) for \(S\)” have normative consequences. Moreover, it is clear that the relevant normativity is that of prescriptivity, concerning what \(S\) ought to do.[10] As noted above, arguments in support of the thesis that meaning is essentially normative need to be based on semantic premises—the normativity in question cannot derive from external sources. In the case of ME normativity, the arguments may be more or less direct, depending on more or less substantial assumptions about meaning. On one end of the spectrum are arguments that turn on the idea that there are direct conceptual entailments from meaning statements to normative consequences; on the other end are arguments that depend on substantial theoretical assumptions about meaning. In the debate, direct arguments have played a prominent role since these fit the idea, implicit in Kripke, that the claim that meaning is normative provides a pre-theoretical constraint on any acceptable theory of meaning; one that has to be accepted independently of one’s specific semantic theory. Let us begin with the most well known direct argument in support of ME normativity, what we call “the simple argument”.

2.1.1 The Simple Argument

The classic defense of ME normativity can be found in Paul Boghossian (1989a). According to Boghossian the normativity of meaning derives from the fact that meaningful expressions have correctness conditions. If “green” means green, Boghossian argues, it follows immediately that “green” applies correctly only to green objects, and this, in turn, has immediate normative consequences for how a speaker \(S\) should apply “green”:

The fact that the expression means something implies, that is, a whole set of normative truths about my behavior with that expression: namely, that my use is correct in application to certain objects and not in application to others. (1989a: 513; see also Blackburn 1984: 281; Miller 1998: 198; Whiting 2007 and 2009.)

The strategy, therefore, is to move from (CM), to a normative conclusion, \((\ME_1)\):

For any speaker \(S\), and any time \(t\): if “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), then it is correct for \(S\) to apply “green” to an object \(x\) iff \(x\) is green at \(t\).
For any speaker \(S\), and any time \(t\): if “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), then \(S\) ought to apply “green” to an object \(x\) iff \(x\) is green at \(t\).

(CM) can hardly be challenged: Meaningful expressions have semantic correctness conditions. Of course, there is some controversy as to how these correctness conditions are to be construed, whether the basic notion of semantic correctness is that of truth or warranted assertability, for instance. However, it cannot be questioned that some notion of semantic correctness is required. This, indeed, seems to be part of the very concept of meaning. If, therefore, the notion of semantic correctness is an essentially normative notion, we would have a very direct argument in support of ME normativity, based simply on conceptual entailments. Before discussing the argument, let us make some preliminary remarks concerning \((\ME_1)\).

First, what is it to apply an expression? It should be clear that the relevant notion of application is that of predication. For instance, we apply a predicate such as “green” when we use it in an assertion, to predicate a property of an object \(x\). In the case of singular terms, similarly, what is of relevance is referential use.[11] The notion of application, hence, is more narrow than that of use, since we use our terms in a wide variety of ways that do not include the expression of judgments, as when we ask a question or make a hypothetical statement (see Millar 2004: 162; Reiland forthcominga).

Second, how should the deontic operator in \((\ME_1)\) be construed? Since \((\ME_1)\) involves an embedded conditional, we may in fact distinguish between three readings, a narrow scope reading, an intermediate and a wide scope reading:

If “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), then (\(S\) ought to (apply “green” to \(x)\) iff \(x\) is green).
If “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), then (\(S\) ought to (apply “green” to \(x\) iff \(x\) is green)).
\(S\) ought to (if “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), apply “green” to \(x\) iff \(x\) is green).

In the debate, all three construals can be found. Thus, it has been suggested that the intermediate scope interpretation best captures the intuition that if \(S\) means green by “green” she is thereby obligated to use the term in certain ways (under certain conditions), without (as on the narrow scope reading) implying that the obligation is conditional on \(x\) being green (Hattiangadi 2006: 225, fn 4). Another issue concerns the possibility of detaching. Some favor the narrow scope reading, since it allows one to detach the “ought”, and supports the intuition that the semantic obligation can only be discharged one way: in this case, by applying “green” to green objects (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 283). Others prefer the wide scope reading, precisely because it does not allow one to detach “ought” and hence implies a more disjunctive obligation: \(S\) ought either to apply “green” to green objects, or not mean green by “green” (Gampel 1997: 228; Millar 2004: 168–169).

A related question is whether \((\ME_1)\) clashes with the widely endorsed principle that ought implies can. As it stands, \((\ME_1)\) can be read as implying that \(S\) has an obligation to apply “green” to all green objects, an obligation that cannot possibly be fulfilled (Hattiangadi 2007: 180). One response to this is to endorse the wide scope reading, \((\ME_1 ''')\), since it allows the subject to discharge her obligation by not meaning green by “green”—something that does seem to be in her power. Another response consists in removing the biconditional in \((\ME_1)\), replacing it with a weaker principle (Whiting 2007: 137):

For any speaker \(S\), and any time \(t\): if “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), then \(S\) ought to apply “green” to an object \(x\) only if \(x\) is green at \(t\).

The question has been raised, however, whether \((\ME_2)\) is sufficiently strong to support ME normativity. The trouble is that \((\ME_2)\) does not seem to place any normative constraints on the subject’s behavior. If \(x\) is green, it no longer follows that \(S\) ought to apply “green” to \(x\), whereas if \(x\) is not green it just follows that it is not the case that \(S\) ought to apply “green” to \(x\). The latter, it has been stressed, is distinct from the claim that \(S\) ought not to apply “green” to \(x\)—for instance, it is compatible with it being permissible to apply “green” to \(x\) (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 280). This means that \((\ME_2)\) fails to support the claim that when \(S\) applies a term in a way that is semantically incorrect, then she has done what she ought not do: “semantically incorrect” and “ought not” thus come apart.

In response it has been suggested that “ought” in (ME1) is replaced by a “may”. This allows the normativist to retain the biconditional and yet avoid the troubles caused by the principle that ought implies can: That an action is correct implies only that one may do it, not that one is obligated to do it, and there is no principle that ought implies can. If “green” is true of green objects only then \(S\) may apply “green” to an object if and only if it is green, and this is not in conflict with the fact that the subject is not able to apply “green” to every green object there is (Whiting 2009: 544 and 2010: 216; Peregrin 2012: 88).

There is therefore some initial unclarity as to precisely which prescription is supposed to follow directly from (CM). A more fundamental question is whether the strategy of the simple argument can succeed in the first place. Opponents of ME normativity do not challenge (CM) which, again, seems trivially true. Rather, they deny that (CM) has normative consequences just by itself. The crucial claim here is that “correct” can be used both normatively and non-normatively (cf. Glüer 2001; Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 36; 2015a). If that is true, the simple argument won’t go through: Rather, an additional premise will be required to the effect that “correct” in (CM) is used normatively. And whether or not that premise can be supplied, the argument won’t be direct anymore.[12]

Anti-normativists usually go further and claim that the way “correct” is used in (CM) in fact is non-normative. What the appeal to correctness conditions gives us, it is claimed, is only a way of categorizing applications of “green” into two basic kinds (the true and the false, for instance), and this does not in itself entail that one ought to apply the term in any particular way. The notion of semantic correctness is non-normative in just this sense: That an application of \(e\) is correct, does not entail that it ought to be made, and, conversely, incorrect applications do not immediately imply that \(S\) has violated any semantic prescription. If “green” means green then \(S\) applying it to a red object implies that her statement is false, but it does not thereby follow that she has failed to do what she ought, semantically, to do (Fodor 1990; Horwich 1995; Glüer 1999b; 2001; Wikforss 2001; Dretske 2000; Hattiangadi 2006; 2009a).[13] [14]

Proponents of the direct argument respond by insisting that the notion of semantic correctness is a normative notion. To many, this seems a simple conceptual truth holding for the notion of correctness in general, and therefore also for that of semantic correctness (Gibbard 2005: 358; Whiting 2007: 135 and 2009: 538).[15] Normativists also appeal to ordinary usage here, suggesting that “correct” is normally used normatively and should therefore be interpreted that way in semantics as well (Whiting 2009: 538; Peregrin 2012: 84). That hasn’t convinced anti-normativists who point out that dictionaries such as Merriam-Webster’s commonly list normative and non-normative usages for the adjective “correct” (Glüer & Wikforss 2015a).[16]

Normativists have also argued that even if the basic semantic concept itself wasn’t normative, the notion of semantic correctness still would or could be. Semantic correctness, it is argued, is not simply the same as, for instance, truth. Normativists here appeal to a distinction stressed by Rosen (2001: 620) between correctness and the “correctness making feature”, the (non-normative) property something must have in order to count as correct. According to Rosen, correctness is a higher-order property. To say that something is correct is not just to say that the correctness making features are in place (as when someone plays the notes of the Moonlight Sonata) but to make the higher-order claim that the action (the piano performance) possesses the feature that makes for correctness in acts of that kind (the act of playing the Moonlight Sonata). Similarly, it is argued, to say that applying “green” to a green object is correct, is to say that the application has a certain non-normative property (the expression applies truly) but it is also to make the higher-order statement that the application possesses the feature that makes it correct in a normative sense. Even if the basic word-world relation is non-normative, therefore, it does not follow that the property of correctness does not have a normative dimension (Speaks 2009: 408; Whiting 2009: 540; Fennell 2013: 58–59). It is difficult to see, however, how something like “the correctness making feature” could strictly speaking be a second-order property (i.e., a property of a property). It is one and the same object that both has the correctness making feature and is correct, after all. Rather, Rosen-style correctness is a first-order, second-level property (to use the terminology of Russell’s ramified theory of types). More importantly, even if that is the best way to construe the intuitive general notion of correctness, all this means is that it might be possible to provide arguments for the claim that the notion of semantic correctness is normative even if we agree that the basic semantic concept itself is not normative. But the basic anti-normativist challenge applies to Rosen-style correctness just as to any other construal of the intuitive, general notion of correctness: Since “correct” can be used normatively and non-normatively, there is no simple, direct implication from correctness to normativity (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 37, fn. 10; 2015a).

This strand in the debate might seem to suggest that behind the discussion of the simple argument lies nothing but a basic clash of intuitions. The anti-normativist denies what the normativist asserts—that the concept of semantic correctness is an essentially normative concept. A possible conclusion, therefore, is that the normativist and the anti-normativist operate with different concepts of semantic correctness. This raises the question, however, whether there is nevertheless co-extensionality between the two concepts. As long as (CM) is the common starting point this would seem to be the case; any sorting effected by the normative distinction between correctness and incorrectness will coincide with the sorting effected by the non-normative distinction. If so, it would seem that further arguments are required to resolve the dispute, beyond the appeal to intuitions: The normativist would have to provide some reasons why the non-normativist notion of correctness is not a notion of semantic correctness. This poses a special challenge to normativists who appeal to Rosen’s distinction and grant that the basic semantic relation is non-normative: If this relation is non-normative then the question is not whether the concept of semantic correctness could be given a normative construal but whether semantics needs such a construal (Glüer & Wikforss 2015a).

Another strand in the discussion of the simple argument concerns the status of the relevant semantic obligations. Here it is often emphasized that semantic obligations are merely prima facie and may be overridden by other obligations, such as the obligation (in a certain context) to tell a lie. It is therefore not an objection to ME normativity that there are situations in which “green” means green for \(S\), without it being the case that \(S\) ought to apply “green” to green objects only (Whiting 2007: 139 and 2009: 546).

This appeal to prima facie obligations has been challenged. What is distinctive of a prima facie obligation, as opposed to a mere instrumental means-end imperative, is that it cannot be overridden by mere desires. However, it is argued, if \(S\) has no desire to speak the truth, then \(S\) has no obligation to apply “green” to green objects. For instance, if neither \(S\), nor her audience, care whether \(S\) tells the truth, then there is no obligation to apply “green” correctly. Hence, (CM) does not even yield prima facie obligations (Hattiangadi 2006: 232 and 2007:189). In response, the normativists suggest that in such a situation the speaker’s use would nevertheless be semantically incorrect and involve a violation of her semantic obligations. The violation would not be very serious, but it would still be a violation (Whiting 2007: 139). This has been challenged, too. Verheggen, for instance, argues that Whiting’s attempt to back this up by the possibility of criticising a speaker who misapplies an expression out of mere desire is not convincing. After all, the speaker acts as she does precisely because of what she means by the expression—therefore, there is no semantic reason to criticize her (Verheggen 2011: 562).

Nevertheless, it would be hasty to conclude that nothing but instrumental norms can be derived from meaning facts in conjunction with desires. As noted above, it is clear that an appeal to merely instrumental norms, or means-ends norms, fails to support the idea that meaning is essentially normative. Although facts about correctness conditions may play a role in the generation of instrumental norms such as “If you wish to communicate with ease you ought to apply ‘green’ to \(x\) if and only if \(x\) is green”, the ought in question derives from the agent’s desires and intentions (given certain empirical facts, regularities, or laws), not from the correctness conditions themselves. Indeed, very many facts can play a role in the generation of instrumental norms without thereby being intrinsically normative—for instance, given the laws of nature, facts about the weather, taken together with facts about my desires, have implications for how I should dress (Coates 1986; Bilgrami 1993; Glüer 2001; Wikforss 2001; Hattiangadi 2006, 2009b). Not all hypothetical norms are instrumental, or based on contingent means-ends relations, however. An example would be the following: If you want to castle in chess, you should (or indeed: must) move your king and one of your rooks in a certain way. Similarly, it has been suggested that there is an important difference between hypothetical norms involving ordinary non-normative facts (such as facts about the weather) and norms involving meaning facts: Since meaning facts are constituted by correctness conditions, meaning facts always dictate how I should behave when I intend to produce a meaningful utterance. Even though what they dictate depends on my particular desires in the situation, the fact that they dictate something does not depend on any desire—in contrast to the dictates derivable from weather facts (Verheggen 2011: 563). One might wonder, though, whether the cases ultimately really are disanalogous: Just as one might not care whether one gets wet or stays dry, it might seem, one might just not care whether what one says is semantically correct or not—do correctness conditions really dictate anything if all I want to do is say something meaningful?[17]

It is worth, in this context, to comment on the relation between Kripke’s normativity constraint and the so called “problem of error”. As noted above, Kripke takes his normativity constraint to rule out dispositionalist accounts of meaning. Although he formulates his objection to dispositionalism in various ways (1982: 29–37), in the debate the main focus has been on the question whether the dispositionalist can account for the possibility of mistake or error. For an expression meaning green, for instance, it is just as much a platitude that mistaken or erroneous application is (in principle) possible as that the expression has correctness conditions. The question, then, is the following: If meaning is determined by how \(S\) is disposed to use her term, then how could she use the term incorrectly? It has been argued that she couldn’t—rather, every apparent error would just indicate a difference in meaning (Boghossian 1989a: 537–540).[18] It is much disputed whether the dispositionalist can solve this problem. It should be noted, however, that the problem of error does not seem to have much to do with semantic normativity (Fodor 1990: 135–136; Bilgrami 1992; Wikforss 2001: 208; Hattiangadi 2006: 229; 2007: 186). The error objection does not turn on the fact that the dispositionalist cannot allow for semantic oughts but, rather, on the fact that we must not construe the relation between the meaning determining facts and meaning in such a way that mistake is ruled out.

Of course, even provided with a solution to the problem of error dispositionalism might come to grief with Kripke’s skeptic. Solving the problem of error requires showing that there is a plausible principle \(P\) assigning meanings to expressions on the basis of the speaker’s dispositions to use them, a principle underwriting plausible ascriptions of error. On a quite plausible interpretation of the skeptic’s main strategy—i.e., that of “quussing” candidate facts—this strategy is as applicable here as elsewhere. If, for instance, \(P\) assigns addition to “plus” on the basis of disposition \(D\), the skeptic will want to know why this is the right principle—as opposed to some other principle \(P'\) assigning quaddition to “plus” on the basis of \(D\). As the mere fact of the speaker’s having \(D\) does nothing to determine which of these principles is the right one, dispositional facts are as quussable as any of the other candidates—and this remains the case even if your dispositionalism comes with a plausible principle of meaning determination (cf. Pagin 2002: 160f).[19]

2.1.2 Using an Expression in Accordance with its Meaning

An alternative to the simple argument is to suggest that there is a further notion of semantic correctness, one that is not co-extensional with that of (CM) but that is both essential to meaning and normative. Thus, it has been claimed that there is a crucial ambiguity in the notion of correct use (Millar 2004: 160). On the one hand, there is the notion of semantic correctness as in (CM); on the other hand there is the notion of correct use as in “using an expression in accordance with its meaning”. That the two do not coincide is clear from the fact that one may use an expression in accordance with its meaning, and yet make a false statement, as when one has a false belief about the world (McGinn 1984; Millar 2002; 2004: 160–175; Moore 1954/1955: 308; Sellars 1956: 166; Buleandra 2008: 180; Fennell 2013: 69, Reiland forthcominga). We must distinguish empirical mistakes from linguistic mistakes, it is argued, and it is essential that we are able to allow for both. Moreover, it is said, this further notion of semantic correctness is an essentially normative notion, one that has implications for what \(S\) ought to do or is obligated to do: if “green” means green for \(S\), then \(S\) ought to use “green” in accordance with its meaning. (This idea, too, goes back to Kripke who, at points, speaks of what I should do, if my use of the term is to be “in accordance with how it was meant” (1982: 30, 37).)

How is the notion of “using an expression in accordance with its meaning” to be construed? According to one proposal, it concerns which expressions are “appropriate” or “suitable” for expressing a certain belief. The notion of “suitability”, in turn, is derived from the ordinary semantic correctness conditions taken together with what I intend to express by my expressions: If “green” applies correctly only to green objects, and I mean to express my belief that \(x\) is green, then I ought to use the term “green” and not, say, “red”. This allows for the possibility that my use is correct in the sense of (CM), and yet linguistically incorrect (if \(x\) is red and I use the term “red” to express my belief that \(x\) is green); and, vice versa, that my use is incorrect in the sense of (CM), but linguistically correct (if \(x\) is red and I use the term “green” to express my belief that \(x\) is green) (McGinn 1984: 60; Millar 2004: 162–163). Hence, in the place of (CM) we have:

For any speaker \(S\), and any time \(t\): if “green” means green for \(S\) at \(t\), then it is correct for \(S\) at \(t\) to apply “green” to an object \(x\) iff \(S\) intends to express the belief that \(x\) is green at \(t\).[20]

Possible misuses are said to include both performance errors (such as slips of the tongue) and so-called meaning errors (as when the speaker thinks “arcane” means ancient) (Millar 2004: 163).

This raises the question of what motivates this further notion of correctness. While it is a platitude that meaningful expressions have semantic correctness conditions, it is not a platitude that an expression is meaningful only if there are these further correctness conditions. If “green” means green for \(S\), and \(S\) uses “red” to express her belief that \(x\) is green, she may fail in her communicative intentions (although not necessarily, consider the use of irony and metaphor), but does it follow that she has used her expressions incorrectly in a semantically relevant sense? The added notion of correctness, it may therefore be argued, simply does no semantic work. This concern has been raised by some normativists as well. For instance, Whiting (2016) argues that it is a mistake to try to defend normativism on these grounds, and that the normativist should stick to the orthodox interpretation that takes as its starting point (CM).

In the literature, the most common route to the conclusion that we need some such further notion of semantic correctness goes via assumptions about the nature of understanding (Wright 1980: 20; McDowell 1984; McGinn 1984:109; Kot̓átko 1998; Millar 2004; Buleandra 2008; Fennell 2012). Understanding the meaning of a term, it is argued, involves using it in accordance with its meaning and, moreover, feeling obligated to thus using it. To learn the meaning of an expression, McDowell writes for instance,

is to acquire an understanding that obliges us subsequently … to judge and speak in certain determinate ways, on pain of failure to obey the dictates of the meaning we have grasped. (1984: 45)

This motivates the appeal to further correctness conditions, it is held, since a speaker may fully understand a term while using it in a false judgment and, conversely, use the term in a true judgment while failing to understand the term properly.

The route via understanding depends on assumptions about the nature of linguistic understanding that may be challenged. Thus, Timothy Williamson has argued that there are no understanding-assent links of the relevant sort, thereby rejecting the assumption that understanding the meaning of an expression \(e\) involves using \(e\) in certain ways (Williamson 2007). However, even if this assumption is accepted, it is a further supposition that this brings with it any semantic obligations. First, it might be held that the link between understanding and use is constitutive, and that all that follows if \(S\) fails to use e in accordance with a certain meaning \(M\), is that e does not mean \(M\). For instance, if a speaker (regularly) uses “arcane” in accordance with the standard meaning of “ancient”, then “arcane” means ancient and not arcane.[21] Second, as in the case of the simple argument, it could be argued that the appearance of an ought here derives from added normative principles, such as instrumental norms concerning the ease of communication, or pragmatic norms regulating speech acts.[22]

In response it has been suggested that the relevant normative consequences should not be understood in terms of obligations but, rather, in terms of commitments. This is the line taken by Alan Millar (2002 and 2004). Meaning statements, such as “‘Green’ means green”, Millar argues, are true in virtue of there being a rule-governed practice. If \(S\) uses “green” to mean green, therefore, she becomes a participant in this practice and incurs a commitment to use the term accordingly. To be properly committed, Millar suggests, \(S\) has to be disposed to adjust her use if she discovers that it is not in keeping with the meaning of the expression (as when \(S\) uses “arcane” to mean ancient). The commitment is not dependent on one’s desire to communicate, or on the intention to speak the truth, but merely on \(S\) participating in the practice of using “green” with a certain meaning. However, Millar stresses, it does not follow that she ought to use her expressions a certain way, since it does not follow that she ought to participate in the practice—there may be reasons to withdraw from the practice instead. Hence, one may participate in a practice without it following that one ought to “carry out the performances associated with one’s role” (Millar 2004: 173).[23]

This proposal illustrates how ME normativity might be derived from MD normativity: Meaning statements have normative consequences, according to Millar, because meaning is determined by the speaker following certain rules. Metaphysically the rules come first and make meaning possible. Before turning to a discussion of MD normativity, let us briefly consider some other arguments put forth in support of ME normativity.

2.1.3 Alternative Arguments

The arguments above are all attempts to show that meaning statements have normative implications. An alternative strategy is to suggest that meaning statements simply are prescriptions. When we state “‘Green’ means green” we may appear to be making a descriptive statement whereas, in fact, we are prescribing how “green” ought to be used (Gauker 2007, 2011; Lance & O’Leary Hawthorne 1997; Peregrin 2012: 96; Gibbard 2012). This proposal can either be construed as a claim about the semantic content of meaning statements, or as a claim about the typical use of meaning statements. Thus, a statement may be used prescriptively, while having a descriptive, factual content (“In this classroom we raise our hands before speaking”).

If the suggestion is that meaning statements have a prescriptive content it would provide another very direct argument in support of ME normativity, one that does not have to proceed via the controversial claim that the notion of semantic correctness is an essentially normative notion. This is an advantage over the simple argument. However, there are also disadvantages. For instance, the question arises whether the claim that meaning statements lack descriptive content can accommodate the role of such statements in inferential contexts (see Gauker 2007: 194–195 for a discussion). Another question concerns the implications from “ought”-statements to meaning statements. According to the simple argument, “‘Green’ ought to be applied to \(x\) if and only if \(x\) is green” follows immediately from “‘Green’ means green”. According to this argument the converse also holds: “‘Green’ means green” follows directly from “‘Green’ ought to be applied to \(x\) if and only if \(x\) is green” (cf. Gibbard 2012: 12 and 113–115). The latter has been questioned on the grounds that even if it is true that “green” ought to be applied this way, the “ought” in question may not have anything to do with semantics but, say, with religious practices (Byrne 2002: 207).

These difficulties are avoided if, instead, meaning statements are simply construed as having a prescriptive use (while having a descriptive content). On either construal, however, the question arises why we should believe that meaning statements are prescriptive. One suggestion is that the prescriptive function of meaning statements follows from their role in coordinating our linguistic use (Gauker 2007 and 2012: 279). Meaning statements are proposals about how terms ought to be used, and as such they serve to determine meaning and remove an otherwise irresolvable indeterminacy (see also Gibbard 2012: 109–112). As a result, “we all think of meanings as standards that we are obliged to conform to” (Gauker 2007: 185). This defense of the normativity thesis therefore turns on controversial issues concerning indeterminacy. Another proposal shuns the metaphysical questions concerning the nature of meaning and appeals to the function of meaning statements in our practices (Lance & O’Leary Hawthorne 1997). Instead of asking for the facts that constitute meaning, it is argued, we should consider the role of meaning statements in our socio-linguistic practices. It then emerges that such statements serve the regulative function of licensing and censoring certain uses. It should be noted that unless this proposal about the function of meaning statements is said to have some metaphysical implications concerning the nature of meaning, it will fall short of supporting the claim that meaning is essentially normative.[24] [25]

In addition, there are a variety of other arguments in support of ME normativity. One such argument grants that correctness conditions are not themselves normative, but suggests that we derive the normativity of meaning from the idea that we ought to speak the truth (Ebbs 1997; Haugeland 1998: Soames 1997: 221, 224). As noted above, this only succeeds if the obligation in question can be said to derive purely from semantic sources. The question, then, is whether there is any reason to suppose that we have a semantic obligation to speak the truth. The impression that there is, it has been suggested, is a result of a conflation of semantics and pragmatics. Thus, it is commonly held that there are rules of assertion, and some of these are such that they are violated when the speaker makes a false judgment. For instance, it has been proposed that there is a “knowledge rule”: “One must: assert \(p\) only if one knows \(p\)” (Williamson 2000: 242). However, opponents of ME normativity stress, these are pragmatic rules, regulating the performance of speech acts, not semantic ones. If such rules are essential for the possibility of assertion, then assertion is essentially normative, but it does not follow that meaning is (Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 37–38; Speaks 2009). For discussion of the claim that assertion is normative, see the entry on assertion, for a suggestion as to how to connect norms of assertion to the meanings of sentences by means of the Alstonian idea of meanings as speech-act-potentials (Alston 2000), see García-Carpintero 2012, 2021.

Another set of arguments reject the focus on correctness conditions and appeal to other aspects of Kripke’s normativity objection to dispositionalist theories. For instance, it has been suggested that the claim that meaning is essentially normative is primarily a claim about the justificatory role of meaning. Facts about meaning are, essentially, such that they are able to justify \(S\)‘s use of her terms, able to guide \(S\)‘s usage. In this sense, meaning facts are like prescriptive rules, such as the rules of etiquette—it is of their essence that they guide action or give directions. The reason dispositionalism fails, then, is not that the dispositionalist cannot account for error, but that facts about what I am disposed to do are not essentially capable of justifying (Gampel 1997: 225–231; Zalabardo 1997: 480–483; Kusch 2006: 50–94).

Whether this argument succeeds depends on whether it can be shown that the role of meaning in motivating action is equivalent to that of prescriptions. Thus, the fact that “green” means green may of course guide the speaker’s actions in the sense that any facts do so—i.e., if \(S\) believes that “green” means green. To show that meaning facts play a normatively guiding role, therefore, it does not suffice to appeal to the idea that meaning facts play a role in motivating action; it also has to be shown that the motivating role is that of a prescription rather than a belief (see section 2.2 below).[26]

In the discussion of ME normativity so far it is assumed that the relevant norms are norms for action, prescriptions for the speaker’s use of her expressions. This, again, is how Kripke discusses the topic and how those writing on Kripke tend to construe the relevant normativity. However, as far as ME normativity goes, normative consequences might also be construed axiologically. Thus, it might be argued that semantically correct applications, by themselves, are valuable. This, too, would show that meaning is an essentially normative notion, although in a different sense than the standard one. And in this case too, the crucial question would be whether the step from (CM) to normative consequences can be motivated. Does sorting \(S\)’s applications into the semantically correct and the semantically incorrect ones, by itself imply that actions of one or the other of these kinds are valuable (Glüer 2001: 60–61)?[27]

Another option would be to construe the rules or norms of meaning as constitutive ones (cf. section 1.2 above). Rules of meaning, the idea would be, are rules for the use of expressions that determine the meaning of these expressions. Appealing to constitutive rules thus would mean accepting what we call MD normativism: It would mean accepting that expressions have meaning because there are rules or norms in force for their use.

2.2 Meaning Determining Normativity

Meaning determining normativism (MD normativism) is the claim that meaning is essentially such that it is (at least partially) determined by norms. This is a claim in the metaphysics of meaning, more precisely, in “foundational semantics” (Stalnaker 1997: 535). It is an answer to the question in virtue of what linguistic expressions have their meanings: Linguistic expressions cannot have meanings without norms, and the norms come first in the order of metaphysical determination or explanation. Normative facts, if you will, (at least partially) “ground” meaning facts.[28] [29] Strong versions of MD normativism hold that MD norms also determine which meanings the expressions governed by them have.

Initial motivation for MD normativism is furnished by the arbitrary, contingent, and “man-made” nature of the connection between linguistic expressions and their meanings. Observed by philosophers since ancient times, the nature of this connection suggests that it might be established by convention. But plausible as such conventionalism might seem, earlier discussions have shown it to be quite controversial (cf. Davidson 1984a; Dummett 1986). If conventions are to play a role in an informative account of meaning, we cannot simply claim that it, for instance, is a convention of English that “green” means green. Rather, the relevant conventions would need to be specified in non-semantic terms (cf. Davidson 1984a; Glüer 2013).

Moreover, the relation between conventionalism and MD normativism is complicated. On David Lewis’s influential account, for instance, a convention is a regularity in the behavior of a community which is arbitrary but perpetuates itself because it serves

some sort of common purpose. Past conformity breeds future conformity because it gives one a reason to go on conforming. (Lewis 1975: 4)

Arguably, a Lewisian convention is not normative; it does, for instance, not seem to require any prescription to conform being in force in the community. Yet another question concerns the requirement of regularity. Even if regularity of use were required for meaning (Davidson famously disputed this; cf. Davidson 1984a; 1986b), such regularity might not need to be due to either norm or convention. A relevant observation here is that people, upon reflection, usually can provide at least rough formulations of the rules or conventions they are following and cite them as reasons for their actions. But when it comes to the semantic rules of natural language, this is far from being the case; the question would be why.

The connection between meaning and use provides another starting point for MD normativism, the thought being that it is not how we are disposed to use an expression that determines its meaning, but how we are supposed to use it (cf. Glock 2000; Brandom 1994: 159). The most common form of MD normativism thus holds that the meanings of linguistic expressions are (at least partially) determined by rules for their use. At a minimum, such MD normativism claims that the following is an essential truth about meaning, or more precisely about a linguistic expression \(e\)’s having a meaning \(M\) (for a speaker, or group of speakers, \(S\) at a time \(t)\):

\(e\) means \(M\) for \(S\) at \(t\) only if there is a rule \(R\) for the use of \(e\) in force for \(S\) at \(t\).[30]

This idea was famously formulated by Ludwig Wittgenstein, who wrote in his so-called “Middle Period”:

[W]ithout these rules the word has as yet no meaning; and if we change the rules, it now has another meaning (or none), and in that case we may just as well change the word, too. (PG 133)

It is quite plausible to read Wittgenstein as here espousing a strong version of MD normativism.

\((\MD_R)\) is compatible with claiming that meaning is solely a matter of the norms or rules governing the use of linguistic expressions, no matter how they are actually used (e.g., Hlobil 2015), but MD normativism can take less radical forms, too. One might for instance think that speakers’ dispositions to use expressions do play a role in meaning determination, but argue that only a certain kind of disposition is relevant, a kind that can only be specified by means of its normative properties. In this vein, Wedgwood argues more generally that it is only “rational” dispositions that determine intentional content (where rationality is taken to be a normative property; cf. Wedgwood 2007: 167ff; 2009). Normative teleosemantics can be construed as making a similar move: Here, it is those dispositions realizing the biological function of the mechanism of using an expression that determine meaning (where biological functions are taken to be something normative; cf. Millikan 1990, Neander 1995).

One might also think that meaning is determined on a non-normative basis, but by a normative principle. Davidson (1970) famously used the claim that meaning and intentional content are determined by the “principle of charity” to argue for a kind of non-reductive naturalism. According to Davidson, speakers essentially are by and large rational and beliefs by their nature “veridical”, i.e., by and large true (Davidson 1986a). According to the principle of charity, the best interpretation of a speaker \(S\) therefore optimises overall coherence, or rationality, and truth across \(S\)’s utterances, propositional attitudes, and intentional actions (e.g., Davidson 1973, 1974, 1991; see also Glüer 2011: ch. 3). Because of its appeal to rationality, the principle of charity has been interpreted as a normative principle, and Davidson as a normativist (see for instance, McDowell 1984; Hornsby 1997: 87; Gampel 1997; Hurley 1998: 5; Glock 2000; Jackman 2004 [Other Internet Resources]; Wedgwood 2007: 161ff; Kriegel 2010; Liebesman 2018). This is controversial, however; it has been argued that its constitutive role in fact prevents the principle of charity from being normative: It determines what meaningful utterances (contentful mental states) are, not how anything should be or what anyone should do (cf. Glüer 2001; Wikforss 2001; Schroeder 2003; Engel 2007: 187ff; for a different argument, see Bilgrami 1992: 102ff.). Quite independently, the claim that rationality is essentially normative is of course itself controversial (cf. Schnädelbach 1990; Kolodny 2005; Broome 2007; Glüer & Wikforss 2013a, 2018).

Other influential ideas behind MD normativism include Wittgenstein-inspired skepticism towards meanings as “Platonic entities”; in this tradition, meanings and concepts themselves are construed as products of our norms or conventions (cf. for instance, Baker & Hacker 1985: 269ff). Another idea derives from meaning’s psychological role: It has been argued that, since competent speakers are guided in their use of expressions by the knowledge of their meanings, a knowledge that is general in form, such guidance must be construed as guidance by rules (cf., for instance, Boghossian 2008: 489).

In the next two sections we shall look a little closer at \((\MD_R)\).

2.2.1 Meaning Determining Rules or Norms

Assume that meaning is determined by rules. How exactly does this work? What kind of rule could do this job? What does it mean for such rules to be “in force” for a speaker or group of speakers, and in what relation do such rules stand to the actual use of the expressions they govern?

Quite clearly, meaning determining rules would be constitutive rules (see section 1.2 above). Typically, they are taken to determine not only that expressions have meaning, but also which meanings they have. A rule \(R\) governing the use of an expression \(e\), the thought is, divides possible uses of \(e\) into those that accord with R and those that do not. On the assumption that the former are the semantically correct uses of \(e, \ R\) thus endows \(e\) with semantic correctness conditions, i.e., meaning. Ideas like this are drawn on by a great number of philosophers, including Wittgenstein scholars such as Baker and Hacker or Glock, as well as philosophers such as von Wright, Sellars, and Searle.

Still, the question is how this exactly works. Constitutive rules “create” new kinds of action. Actions of these kinds are such that they cannot be performed if the rules are not in force. Searle suggested that such rules typically can be brought into the following form:

In \(C\), doing \(X\) counts as doing \(Y\).

He also suggested that meaning is determined by such rules (1969: 42ff). But it is not easy to see how rules of form (CR) would endow expressions with semantic correctness conditions (cf. Glüer & Pagin 1998).[31]

It might be more promising to allow meaning determining rules to be prescriptions (or proscriptions), endowing expressions with meanings by distinguishing between semantically correct (pre- or proscribed) and incorrect (forbidden) uses. They would be constitutive in the sense of its being impossible to meaningfully use the expressions they govern without their being in force for the speaker (cf. Glüer & Pagin 1998; Kiesselbach 2014; Hlobil 2015; Reiland forthcominga).

What, then, does it mean for a meaning determining rule \(R\) to be in force for a speaker \(S\)’s use of an expression \(e\) (at a time \(t)\)? Broadly, there are three main options for the MD normativist. According to the first, using \(e\) (at \(t)\) has to be motivated by or to follow \(R\) in the sense of attempting to do what is in accordance with \(R\). On the second construal, \(S\) has to accept R in some sense not requiring (all) particular uses of \(e\) to be motivated by \(R\). Both of these would plausibly seem to require \(S\) to have certain intentional states. But, third, \(R\)’s being in force for \(S\) could also be construed as independent of any of \(S\)’s intentional states (with respect to \(R)\).

The laws of the state, for instance, would seem to fall into the third category; they are in force even for those individual citizens who do not accept them. Analogously, one might claim meaning determining rules to be in force in a speech community quite independently of any (or even all) of its member’s acceptance of, or attitudes towards, them. Construing MD (or CD) normativism along these lines has recently gained some proponents (e.g., Tracy 2020; Hlobil 2015). Many games are in the second category; they are such that even though participation requires players to accept their rules, participants nevertheless can intentionally violate these very rules within the game. For instance, intentional spearing does occur in ice hockey games, and will be punished precisely because the rule against spearing is in force even for players who spear intentionally. Again, in semantics the situation might seem analogous: Speakers can intentionally say semantically incorrect things without their expressions losing or changing their meanings (cf. Railton 2000; Glüer & Pagin 1998; Glüer 1999b; 2001; Wikforss 2001, Kiesselbach 2014, Reiland 2020; forthcomingb).[32]

The most common and traditional idea, however, is that expressions “get” their meanings by speakers’ following the rules for their use (see, for instance, Baker & Hacker 1985: 154ff; Glock 1996a: 323ff); speaking meaningfully is conceived of as a form of rule-guided action. Let’s call this form of MD normativism “guidance normativism”.[33]

A crucial question for guidance normativism concerns the distinction between rule guided and merely regular behavior. As Quine classically noted, on pain of vicious regress, meaning determining rules or conventions cannot be explicitly and deliberately adopted; they must somehow be “implicit” in the behavior of speakers. But then, Quine argued, we risk depriving the notion of a linguistic rule “of any explanatory force and reducing it to an idle label” (Quine 1935 [1976: 106]). We shall look at this issue in the next section.

2.2.3 Guidance by Meaning Determining Rules

It is quite natural to think that behavior guided by an (implicit or explicit) rule \(R\) is behavior that can be explained by means of \(R\). More precisely, many philosophers think, the explanation needs to be a reasons-explanation. Therefore, the thought is, there is an “intentional condition” on rule-guidance, requiring, for instance, intentions to follow \(R\) (e.g., Baker & Hacker 1985: 155; Glock 1996a: 325), or some other state of accepting or internalizing \(R\) (Boghossian 2008).[34]

If there is an intentional condition, even guidance by implicit rules would seem to require prior mental states with intentional content. A much-discussed question is whether this leads back into vicious regress. This question would seem to arise not only for those who think that thought depends on language, or that thought and language are interdependent, but also for any kind of guidance normativism about mental content (cf. Boghossian 1989a; 2008). For instance, if having a contentful intentional state is itself a matter of being guided by a content determining rule, then another intentional state is required for having the first one, and so on ad infinitum.[35] It has therefore been argued that according to Wittgenstein there must be a basic form of rule following that is not subject to any intentional condition, but “blind” (Wright 2007; see also García-Carpintero 2012). Alternatively, it has been argued that therefore the late Wittgenstein did not conceive of meaningful use of language as rule guided anymore (Glüer & Wikforss 2010a). Boghossian (2008: 493f) provides an independent, general argument against an intentional condition on rule guidance. He argues that the relevant intentional state would be a state with general (prescriptive) content, and that acting under particular circumstances on an intentional state with general content always involves some sort of inference. Inference itself, however, essentially involves following a rule, and thus a regress—reminiscent of that familiar from Lewis Carroll (1895)—ensues. In response, the assumption that inference is essentially rule guided has been questioned (cf. Glüer & Wikforss 2010a). Miller (2015) offers a different response; he contends that Wittgensteinian “blindness” does not amount to giving up on the intentional condition, but to denying that application of a general rule to a particular case involves inference. Blind rule-following, Miller suggests, is to be construed in terms of a causal connection between rule-acceptance and application, where the former causes the latter “in the right kind of way” (2015: 411ff).[36]

Together with the observation recorded earlier—that speakers do not usually seem to be able to formulate semantic rules or to cite them as reasons—some philosophers have looked for alternative ways of understanding the explanatory power of meaning determining rules, for instance in terms of evolution. Ideas here range from using evolutionary explanation as a mere analogy (as in Sellars 1954 or Searle 1995)[37] to normative construals of the idea of a biological function in normative teleosemantics (cf., e.g., Jarvis 2012), possibly in combination with computational ideas about sub-personal rule following at the level of mental representation (cf. Jacob 2005: 200f; García-Carpintero 2012; for some critical discussion Boghossian 2008). There is a worry, though, that the basic question recurs: What distinguishes a sub-personal regularity from a performance governed by a sub-personal rule?[38]

2.2.4 Primitive Normativity

Ginsborg (2011a,b; 2012; 2018a,b; 2020; forthcoming) suggests that the normativity of meaning can be defended by interpreting the relevant “ought” and distinguishing normativity and regularity in a way that is quite radically different from the dominant view in most of the normativity debates, i.e., by referring to a “primitive ought”. This speaks to the primitively normative attitudes speakers must have towards their own uses of linguistic expressions. For starters, having primitively normative attitudes does not require prior grasp of rules, concepts, or meanings. Moreover, the norms speakers need to be primitively conscious of do not guide or justify them in their use of expressions (Ginsborg 2011b: 170).[39] And finally, the primitive “ought” relevant to meaning cannot be explicated in terms of, or equated with, truth—to be primitively correct is more fundamental than being semantically correct: Primitive normativity is not required to determine what is semantically correct (and incorrect), but rather to “distinguish the production of a term from mere noise” (Ginsborg 2012: 132, quoting Blackburn 1984: 281), or, more generally, to determine which behaviour is “subject to normative evaluation at all” (2011a: 243, fn. 21).[40]

Primitive normativity thus is what distinguishes the behaviour of the speaker who uses her terms with understanding from that of the parrot, or automaton. Using a term with understanding requires more than just being disposed to use it a certain way, Ginsborg argues; it requires understanding that it has a certain meaning. If a speaker for instance uses “slab” to mean slab, she needs to grasp or recognize that it means slab (2012: 135). Ginsborg’s ambition is precisely to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for what it is to have this understanding.

The account of meaning determination she arrives at has two components. Since one of them is a requirement of primitive normativity, primitive normativity qualifies as a (new) kind of meaning determining normativity. In rough outline, the account looks like this:

As used by a speaker \(S\), an expression \(e\) has a particular meaning \(M\) iff
\(S\) is disposed to use \(e\) in a certain way, and
\(S\) is disposed to adopt the attitude of taking-to-be-appropriate to the set of uses to which she is disposed (cf. 2011a: 244f; 2012: 138).

If \(e\) has meaning, the first disposition suffices to determine which meaning it has. But \(e\) has meaning only if the second disposition is in place. Moreover, if both conditions are fulfilled, having the primitively normative attitude of taking the use one is disposed to make of \(e\) amounts to understanding that \(e\) means \(M\).

These conditions are not only necessary, but sufficient for meaning, Ginsborg argues, because they allow us “to make sense of a given response being correct or incorrect” (2011a: 245), where correctness now is semantic correctness. Once these conditions are fulfilled, a particular use of \(e\) might not only be such that you “did not do what you were disposed to do, but also did not do what you were disposed to regard as appropriate” (2011a: 245). This, Ginsborg submits, is enough to make such a use of \(e\) into a mistake. Once these conditions are fulfilled, that is, the uses you are disposed to make of \(e\) “can retrospectively be identified as the extension of [\(e\)]” (2012: 138). And then, your primitively normative attitude amounts to understanding that \(e\) means what it does.

Though Ginsborg’s proposal is very interesting, and indeed rather different from more established interpretations of the normativity of meaning, it has not gone unchallenged. Miller (2019) and Sultanescu (2021) both raise worries about Ginsborg’s reply to the skeptic. Miller (2019) argues against Ginsborg’s defence of reductive dispositionalism against Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s “finitude” objection. Sultanescu (2021) points out that Ginsborg’s dispositionalism fails because it faces an unsolvable dilemma when it comes to the two constraints imposed by Kripke’s skeptic, i.e., that

the correctness of a particular use [of \(e\)] be constituted independently of the individual’s perspective on it,

and that

the individual have a perspective on the use [of \(e\)], on pain of rendering the use an instance of arbitrary behaviour.

Sultanescu points out that Ginsborg’s dispositionalism is able to meet the second constraint, but not the first. After proposing amends to Ginsborg’s proposal in order to make room for the first constraint, Sultanescu points out that now, under this new interpretation, Ginsborg fails to meet the skeptic’s second constraint.

Miller (2019) and Sorgiovanni (2018) also raise concerns about the viability of Ginsborg’s “primitive” rule-following. In particular, Miller (2019) points out that her argument for why rules do not guide agents, is based on the (mistaken, and disproven by Wittgenstein himself) assumption that being guided by a rule necessarily requires interpreting that rule (2019: 746).[41] What’s more, Miller takes issue with her primitive normativity by claiming that the attitude of “taking-to-be-appropriate” cannot really be made sense of unless we expect the speaker to already take e “to have a meaning or to be governed by a standard of correctness”. Finally, Miller (2019: 755–757) and Verheggen (2015) argue that we have little reason to prefer Ginsborg’s partial reductionism over both non-reductionism and reductionism as Ginsborg’s proposal seems to face the same challenges raised against those two opposing views.

3. Content

In the normativity debate the main focus has been on meaning: This is true of the Kripke discussion as well as of earlier discussions concerning the rulishness of language. However, parallel claims have also been made about mental content and recently the thesis that content is essentially normative has come into focus (McDowell & Pettit 1986, Brandom 1994, Engel 2000, Boghossian 2003, Gibbard 2003, Millar 2004, Jarvis 2012, Hlobil 2015, Miller 2015, Tracy 2020, Green 2021).[42]

Content normativism claims that the following is both necessary, and essential to, a mental state \(M\)‘s having a content \(p\):

\(M\) has content \(p\) only if there is a rule, or system of rules, \(R\) in force for \(M.\)[43]

The relevant notion of content is that of propositional content, something that can be judged, and the norms in question govern the “use” of concepts. We intend the talk of propositions and concepts in this context to be uncontentious, and not depend on any specific construals of these notions. A proposition, simply, is anything that has truth conditions essentially; it is whatever the propositional attitudes are attitudes towards. And talking of “concepts” should not be understood as implying a commitment to either structured contents or to a language-like, syntactically structured medium of representation. In this sense, a concept is “used” whenever a subject has an intentional mental state.[44]

As in the case of meaning, we distinguish between CE normativity, which is neutral on the question how content is determined, and CD normativity which takes the norms to be metaphysically primary. We shall begin by discussing CE normativity.

3.1 Content Engendered Normativity

According to CE normativity statements of the form “mental state \(M\) has content \(p\)” have normative consequences. The norms are typically construed as norms of action, most commonly as prescriptions, but could also be construed axiologically. That is, the claim need not be that the relevant norms guide our use of concepts, but could just be that it is a property essential to their having content that certain mental states (true beliefs, for instance) are valuable.

As in the case of meaning, we may distinguish between more or less direct arguments. One way to provide a direct argument for CE normativity would be to proceed from the notion of correctness conditions, in analogy with the simple argument (Boghossian 2003: 85). Just as meaningful expressions have correctness conditions essentially, along the lines of (CM), so do concepts: The concept green, for instance, applies to an object \(x\) if and only if \(x\) is green. However, unlike in the case of (CM), the application relation here is just that between a concept and the objects that “fall under” it. For normativity to enter some connection has to be made with the subject who employs the concepts, with her mental states.

The standard normativist strategy consists in appealing to the use of concepts in propositional attitudes, and to derive the normativity of content from that of the propositional attitudes. We shall consider two such common arguments: one that goes via the nature of belief, and one that goes via ideas about concept grasp.

3.1.1 The Argument from Belief

The argument from belief proceeds in two steps: It is argued, first, that belief is essentially normative, and second, that there is an essential connection between belief and content such that if belief is essentially normative it follows that content is, too. Our main concern here is not with the normativity of belief, but some comments concerning the first step are required.

According to the most common proposal, the normativity of belief derives from the connection between belief and truth. The proposal is not merely that beliefs, essentially, have contents that are true or false, but that beliefs, by their very nature, generate a normative requirement that establishes that they are correct or incorrect as a result of their content being true or false. Such a requirement is distinctive of belief and provides a “decisive reason” for having or not having a particular belief (Wedgwood, 2002: 268. See also Velleman 2000; Engel 2001, 2013; Noordhof 2021; Wedgwood 2007, 2013; Boghossian 2003; Gibbard 2003, 2005, 2012; Shah 2003; Speaks 2009; Nolfi 2015; Fassio 2016).

In response, it has been argued that what is essential to belief is merely that beliefs have contents that are true or false, not that one ought to believe a content if and only if it is true. The appearance of normativity, it is suggested, derives from other sources. For instance, as epistemic agents, we seek truth. And having true beliefs is essential to fulfilling our goals. This just shows that true beliefs have an instrumental value, and fails to support the normativity of belief thesis. Moreover, it is argued, even if it is claimed that truth has a non-instrumental value, the value in question is derived from moral or other values, not from the nature of belief as such (Papineau & Tanney 1999, 2013; Dretske 2000; Davidson 2001a; Horwich 2013; Bergamaschi Ganapini 2021).

Questions have also been raised concerning how the norm of belief is to be understood. With respect to meaning the question arose whether \((\ME_1)\) violates the principle that ought implies can. In the case of belief, a similar worry arises if the norm of belief is formulated in a parallel fashion, by proceeding from the correctness conditions of beliefs to normative consequences:

The belief that \(p\) is correct if and only if \(p\).
\( S\) ought to believe that \(p\) if and only if \(p\).

The trouble is that \((\NB_1)\) implies that \(S\) ought to believe everything that is true, an impossible task. This difficulty, it has been argued, is not solved by appealing to a wide-scope reading of “ought” since there are values of \(p\) that are such that \(S\) could neither bring it about that \(p\) is false, nor bring it about that she believes \(p\) (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 284).[45] The most common reaction, instead, is to weaken the norm (Boghossian 2003: 37):

\( S\) ought to believe that \(p\) only if \(p\).

This norm does not imply that \(S\) ought to believe everything that is true, and hence does not put impossible demands on \(S\). However, as noted in the discussion of \((\ME_1)\) above, the question arises whether \((\NB_2)\) suffices to provide any real constraints on \(S\)‘s belief formation. If \(p\) is true it does not follow that \(S\) ought to believe \(p\), and if \(p\) is false it merely follows that it is not the case that \(S\) ought to believe \(p\)—not that \(S\) ought not to believe \(p\) (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2007: 280).[46] In response, normativists have made the same move as in the case of meaning, and suggested that the “ought” in \((\NB_1)\) is replaced with a “may” (Whiting 2010: 216–217; 2013: 125). It has been objected that this is too weak since it undermines the fundamental role of the norm of truth when it comes to explaining other evidential and inferential norms (Bykvist & Hattiangadi 2013: 113–114) and to accounting for some key feature of doxastic deliberation (Sullivan-Bissett & Noordhof 2020).[47]

Adopting a different tack the normativist could say that the relevant norms should be understood in terms of the “telos” of belief: Just as a map is a map (giving a correct or incorrect picture of the world) only insofar as it is designed to represent the world, and in this sense ought to represent the world correctly, so a belief can be said to be correct or incorrect only insofar as representing the world belongs to its telos, to what it ought to do. Since this type of “ought” applies to the representing objects (such as maps or beliefs) and not to agents, it is argued, they are not action-guiding and the principle that ought implies can does not apply (Jarvis 2012).[48]

Another set of questions concerns the fact that \((\NB_1)\) is an objective norm.[49] Unlike a subjective norm, such as “\(S\) ought to believe that \(p\) only if \(S\) has evidence for \(p\)”, \((\NB_1)\) does not engage with \(S\)‘s reasons, her beliefs and desires, and this raises the question of how \((\NB_1)\) can serve to guide our belief formation. Objective norms can guide only via our beliefs, and it has been argued that this raises two worries for \((\NB_1\)). In order to be guided by \((\NB_1\)), \(S\) would have to have a belief about whether \(p\) is true. This means, first, that in order to be guided by \((\NB_1\)) the subject would already have had to form a belief as to whether \(p\) and hence the guidance comes too late; and, second, that whatever conclusion the subject comes to as to whether \(p\), the norm tells her to hold that very belief (if she forms the belief that \(p\) the norm gives her a reason to believe \(p\) and if she forms the belief that not-\(p\) the norm gives her a reason to believe not-\(p\)) (Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 44).[50] It is therefore disputed whether \((\NB_1)\) can be said to be a norm of belief, regulating our belief formation.[51]

Another key challenge to the idea that belief is essentially normative is that belief seems to be subject to multiple normative standards. In addition to the idea that one should only believe what is true or follow the evidence, there are now also several arguments for the claim that at times pragmatic and moral norms govern belief as well and these may be normatively heavier than any epistemic norm at play (Marušić 2011; Reisner 2018; Basu 201; Leary 2017; Rinard 2019) . If so, then there are no essential or constitutive normative requirements for belief: though there might be distinctive correctness conditions for belief (as in CB) these do not appear to be genuinely normative or do not seem to explain what “one just plain ought” to believe such and such (Maguire & Woods 2020; Bergamaschi Ganapini 2021).

Finally, assuming that belief is intrinsically normative, however, the decisive question is whether this has any implications for content. Why should the fact that belief is normative imply that content is? Indeed, it has been suggested that the opposite is true since if belief is normative the appearance of normativity of content can simply be explained by appealing to the normativity of belief (Speaks 2009: 409). According to Boghossian, the normativity of content derives from the fact that there is a constitutive connection between the notion of content and the notion of belief (Boghossian 2003). This is so, he argues, since we could not grasp the notion of content without first grasping the role contents play in belief. Moreover, Boghossian argues, although contents play a role in other attitudes as well, there are reasons to think that the concept of belief is conceptually primary: For instance, \(S\) could not have the concept of desire without first having the concept of belief (2003: 42–43). If so, the normativity of belief supports CE normativity.

The claim that the concept of belief is primary to that of desire can be questioned. Thus, there is empirical evidence from developmental psychology that children acquire the concept of desire prior to acquiring that of belief (Wellman 1993). It has also been argued that belief and desire are conceptually interdependent (Miller 2008). More importantly, even if it can be shown that the concept of belief is primary to that of desire, and of the other propositional attitudes, the question arises whether indeed one could not grasp the concept of content without grasping that of belief. Prima facie, grasping the concept of a propositional attitude such as belief is rather distinct from grasping the concept of content, since it involves the idea of taking up an attitude towards content.[52] Moreover, Boghossian is committed to the strong claim that opponents of content normativity fail to grasp the concept of content (or, alternatively, that they operate with a different concept).

An alternative strategy would be to avoid the appeal to conceptual entailments and argue that there is a metaphysical connection between mental content and belief such that if belief is essentially normative, content is. Such an argument may be more or less direct, going via more or less contentious assumptions about mental content.[53]

For instance, versions of conceptual role semantics imply that there is an essential link between mental content and belief as do versions of informational theories of content (Dretske 1981; Fodor 1990), although the latter are typically coupled with a non-normativist account of belief. Another line of reasoning appeals to the idea that there is a constitutive connection between grasping a concept, understanding a content, and using it in the propositional attitudes.

3.1.2 Use in Keeping with Content

To possess a concept, it is sometimes suggested, is to have the capacity to use the concept in various propositional attitudes. Since it is essential to the propositional attitudes that they stand in certain rational interconnections with one another, it is argued, this essential normativity transfers to concepts and contents. Possessing a concept, grasping it, incurs a commitment to use the concept “in keeping with its content”, in the various propositional attitudes. If the speaker fails to do so, she has misused the concept in question (Millar 2004; McDowell & Pettit 1986; Gibbard 2012: chapter 6).

This argument runs parallel to the argument from understanding in support of ME normativity (section 2.1.2). Even if that argument is accepted, however, the question arises whether it can be applied to concepts and content, since the notion of failing to use a concept in “keeping with its content” appears more problematic than the notion of failing to use a word in accordance with its meaning (McGinn 1984: 146–147; Millar 2004: 180–181). It is relatively unproblematic to speak of understanding the meaning of an expression (or misunderstanding it), but in the case of concepts there is nothing corresponding to the expression. To “understand” a concept is simply to possess it, to use it in thoughts. Hence there seems to be little or no room for the idea that \(S\) misunderstands a concept either. If \(S\) reasons as if she possesses the concept ancient rather than the concept arcane, it would seem to follow not that there is any misuse of concepts but that she has another concept.

One strategy is to distinguish between possession conditions and attribution conditions (Peacocke 1992: 27–33). This separates the conditions that determine \(S\)’s concepts from conditions for the attribution of the concept to \(S\). As a consequence, there is a potential gap between how \(S\) uses the concept, her grasp of it, and how it should be used if she were to use it in keeping with its content. To illustrate the distinction, it is common to appeal to Tyler Burge’s discussion of how social factors, under certain conditions, serve to determine content (Burge 1979; Peacocke 1992: 29; Millar 2004: 181–188). Burge gives an account of concept attribution that goes via word meaning. To be attributed the concept arcane, on this view, it suffices that \(S\) uses the expression “arcane” by and large correctly, “in keeping with its content”—if she is committed to her community practice of using the corresponding expression “arcane”. What determines her concept, thus, is not merely facts about her use and dispositions to stand corrected, but facts about the use of the term in the wider practice. It follows that speakers typically have an incomplete grasp of the concepts they think with and, as a result, tend to misuse these concepts.

Leaving aside the controversial question of whether we can separate possession conditions of concepts from attribution conditions, it might be asked whether Burge’s social externalism can be employed to support CE normativity. Burge’s argument depends on the (empirical) assumption that the individual is committed to the community practice (Burge 1979: 94–95, 101–102; Millar 2004: 182). But if the normativity in question is made conditional on the individual’s commitment to the community, it does not follow that content is essentially normative. After all, an individual who is not thus committed would still have concepts. (Equally, in the case of the experts, the suggested normative dimension would seem to drop out.) What would be required, rather, is an argument to the effect that the concept expressed is necessarily determined by the community practice, independently of \(S\)‘s commitments.

Arguments from concept grasp, again, typically appeal to the idea that there are rationality constraints on concept attributions. As noted in the discussion of ME normativity, the question has been raised whether the idea that there are such constraints coheres with normativism. It has been suggested that this question is particularly pressing in the case of content. When it comes to meaning, there is the option of attributing meaning errors and explaining the error by appealing to the subject’s mistaken conception of the meaning of an expression, thereby rationalizing her reasoning and actions. In the case of concepts, this option is not available, since the error is said to occur at the level of content. It would either have to be argued that the error can be rationalized some other way, or the claim that there are rationality constraints on content attributions would have to be rejected (see Brown 2004, Wikforss 2015 and 2017).

3.2 Content Determining Normativity

Like MD normativism, CD normativism is a foundational claim: Intentional content is (at least partially) metaphysically determined by rules or norms, content facts are, if you will, (at least partially) “grounded” by normative facts. Since the relevant norms or rules govern intentional mental states, the CD normativist typically tries to find a particular kind of state plausibly subject to rules or norms that by the same token (at least partially) determine contents for states of this kind. As truth and inference are intimately connected with both content and belief, the debate focuses on norms for belief.

Besides truth norms like (\(\NB_1)\) and \((\NB_2)\) above, two further kinds of candidate norms of belief have been discussed: knowledge norms, and norms of rationality, justification, or inference.[54] CD normativism then is the claim that beliefs cannot have content unless rules or norms of at least one of these kinds are in force for them. Strong versions of CD normativism hold that CD norms also determine which contents beliefs have. And again, being in force can roughly be interpreted in three ways: As requiring the subject to follow the relevant rule or norm \(R\), to accept \(R\) in a sense not requiring (general) following, or as independent of the subject’s attitudes and intentional states towards \(R\) (see above, section 2.2.1).

As in the case of meaning, CD normativism most often is a form of guidance normativism construing belief formation as an essentially rule-guided activity. Those inspired by pragmatism and/or Wittgensteinian anti-platonism might also think of the relevant rules as “of our own making” (Baker & Hacker 1985; Brandom 1994). A fairly common idea is that believers follow basic, objective norms such as truth or knowledge norms by means of being guided by subjective ones such as the rules of rationality (Boghossian 2003), but others take subjective rules as basic,[55] or argue that the nature of belief is given by subjective and objective norms in combination (Wedgwood 2007: 162).

Unsurprisingly, norms or rules for (rational) reasoning receive a lot of attention. Prime examples are inference rules such as modus ponens or the law of non-contradiction. Purely formal rules would arguably be too weak for the purposes of strong CD normativism; normative inferentialists such as Brandom (1994; 2000) or Peregrin (2008) therefore include norms governing material implication among the content determining rules. In general, principles governing epistemic rationality (as, for instance, formalized in Bayesian epistemology) are further examples, and for those who hold that there can be good practical reasons for belief, principles of practical reasoning are also relevant.[56]

As we have already seen in section 2.2 above, regress worries arise if CD normativism takes the form of guidance normativism. Here, a pragmatic conception of rule guidance such as Brandom’s normative version of inferentialism (Brandom 1994) might help. To avoid regresses, Brandom takes norms implicitly “instituted” by our practices to be basic and proposes a pragmatic phenomenalism about such norms. Objective “deontic statuses” are to be explained in terms of our normative attitudes. Something’s being correct, that is, is to be explained in terms of the attitude of taking it to be correct, making the norms in question “in some sense creatures of ours” (1994: 626); yet, the goal is to secure and explain the “objectivity of concepts” (1994: xvii).[57] As attitudes of taking something to be correct can themselves be correct or incorrect, being correct ultimately has to be explained in terms of being correctly taken to be correct. In this sense, the normativity is irreducible—it is “norms all the way down” (1994: 44; 625).

Questions that have been raised for pragmatic phenomenalism include whether it in fact can account for contents the truth of which is independent of our attitudes. Because it explains normative statuses by means of further normative statuses, pragmatic phenomenalism might not be able to tell us anything informative about how we make or “institute” the basic norms implicit in our practices (cf. Rosen 2001, Hattiangadi 2003) or to account for the difference between instituting and merely being in accordance with a norm. Yet another regress worry has also been raised: if for any normative status to be instituted by an implicit norm a further normative status already needs to be so instituted, an infinite regress of (implicit) norms might ensue despite the pragmatist nature of the proposal (cf. Hattiangadi 2007: 197; Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 60ff). This regress might not be vicious if the project is interpreted as an expressivist one, however.

Even if guidance normativism would inescapably lead to some form of regress, one might still hold on to the claim that there are contentful intentional states only if for instance the rules of rationality are in force for them. As we noted already in the previous version of this entry, such force might require acceptance, but not (general) guidance, or it might be completely independent of the attitudes of thinkers. Highlighting both these options, it has recently been argued that guidance normativism is unnecessarily demanding.

For one thing, even if the relevant rules require some sort of acceptance to be in force, not every performance governed by them needs to actually be guided by them (cf. Hlobil 2015; Tracy 2020). Plausible as this might initially seem, especially when thinking along the lines of the game analogy, a general observation of this kind does not yet substantiate the claim that an account of constitutive rules’ being in force that implements this possibility would be applicable to CD rules or norms.[58] Moreover, it should be noted that for CD rules or norms, making this move might not just amount to acknowledging that not every instance of belief formation has to be rule-guided. If the move is to stop an intentional condition on rule-following from giving rise to a regress, we might end up having to say that every instance of rule-guided belief formation requires the unguided formation of at least one other belief or intentional state. For every rule that is followed (on a particular occasion), that is, there is another that governs, but cannot guide, the formation of a further intentional state of the rule-follower (on that occasion).[59] This is at least a surprising situation to end up in for a defender of the view that belief is essentially governed by rules that can guide belief formation.[60] CD normativism might thus prove viable only if the force of the relevant rules or norms can plausibly be construed in complete independence of the attitudes of the thinkers.

4. Concluding Remarks: Normativism and Naturalism

The idea that the normative in some sense is not part of nature goes back at least to Kant (see, for instance, Critique of Pure Reason [1781 [A 547]]). Already Hume (in the Treatise [1739–1740]) argued against the metaethical naturalist that ought cannot be derived from is—to try to do so would be to commit a so-called “naturalistic fallacy”. With the “open question argument”, Moore (in Principia Ethica [1903]) added a weapon to the anti-naturalist’s arsenal also against giving naturalistic accounts of moral evaluations: According to the open question argument, there is no naturalistic (set of) concept(s) analytically equivalent to the moral concept of goodness, since no matter what naturalistic definition is given, the question whether all and only things satisfying it are good still makes sense. Much of recent normativism about meaning/content continues in this anti-naturalist tradition; many normativists about meaning/content hold that the essential normativity of meaning/content makes at least (fully) reductive naturalism untenable.

Many have construed Kripke’s Wittgenstein as saying exactly that: it is part of his skeptical campaign against semantic facts in general that such facts cannot be reduced to whatever precisely is allowed in a naturalistic supervenience base for meaning/content. An argument for this could take a weaker, intensionalist, and a stronger, extensionalist, form (cf. Boghossian 1989a: 532ff). The stronger argument concludes that no reductive naturalist account of meaning/content will be extensionally correct: For any meaning/concept, such an account will either include objects in its extension that, intuitively, do not belong there, or exclude objects from its extension that, intuitively, do belong there, or both. As we saw above (section 2.2.1), this “problem of error” is a problem for many naturalistic accounts of meaning/content, but as such it does not yet have anything to do with normativity. To that, the normativist could respond that it is precisely because of their essential normativity that no naturalistic account of meaning/content can be extensionally correct. The weaker argument grants extensional correctness, but argues that no naturalistic reduction will get the intension of the notion of meaning/content right; it will inevitably miss the normative character of what is semantically correct, its deontic or axiologic characteristics.

Despite the normativists’ argument, it seems fair to say that at this point in time, the case from normativism against reductive naturalism about meaning/content has not yet been fully made. To make their case, the semantic normativist could resort to adopting a metaethical approach: arguments in the tradition of Hume and Moore might well be adaptable to their case (cf. Miller 1998, 188ff; Hattiangadi 2007, 38ff; Gibbard 2012; Zalabardo 2012). As Hattiangadi argues, though, the semantic normativist’s case ends up being hostage to whatever controversial assumptions these arguments rely on (motivational internalism, for instance, might be such an issue), thus removing normativism further from being the pre-theoretical constraint on acceptable accounts of meaning/content that Kripke’s skeptic meant it to be. What’s more, one might worry that the topic of “reduction” is itself more nuanced than the normativist makes it to be. As we have seen in section 2.2, it is still possible to argue that some (set of) dispositions might play a role in meaning-determination. Alternatively, it is possible to endorse partially reductive accounts construing meaning/content as determined by a dispositional and a non-semantic, but normative, component.

Furthermore, even if normativism about meaning/content might exclude (fully) reductive naturalism about meaning/content, it should be noted that adopting normativism would not seem to be the only option for the anti-reductivist (cf. Mulligan 1999: 136f; Glüer & Wikforss 2009: 63ff). What the normativist construes as norms or rules of meaning/content, principles such as (CM) or inferential rules such as modus ponens, might also be construed in a very different way: As, or in analogy with what Frege called “laws of truth” (Frege 1918 [1986: 30]). In the same vein, Husserl called the “laws of logic” “ideal” (Husserl 1913: 56)). These “laws” are neither prescriptions for thinking, nor nomological generalities of our psychology. Their “validity” or necessity is sui generis; if anything, it is what we might today call metaphysical.[61]


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