Methodological Individualism

First published Thu Feb 3, 2005; substantive revision Wed Jun 12, 2024

This doctrine was introduced as a methodological precept for the social sciences by Max Weber, most importantly in the first chapter of Economy and Society (1922). It amounts to the claim that social phenomena must be explained by showing how they result from individual actions, which in turn must be explained through reference to the intentional states that motivate the individual actors. It involves, in other words, a commitment to the primacy of what Talcott Parsons would later call “the action frame of reference” (Parsons 1937: 43–51) in social-scientific explanation. It is also sometimes described as the claim that explanations of “macro” social phenomena must be supplied with “micro” foundations, ones that specify an action-theoretic mechanism (Alexander, 1987).

A contrast is often drawn, following J.W.N. Watkins (1952a), between methodological individualism and methodological holism. This is somewhat tendentious, since there are very few social scientists who describe themselves as methodological holists (see the entry on methodological holism in the social sciences). There are, however, forms of social-scientific explanation with more active adherents that methodological individualism precludes or downgrades. These include, most importantly, functionalism, many types of sociobiology, cultural-evolutionary explanation, psychoanalytic and “depth hermeneutic” methods, and any form of explanatory generalization grounded in purely statistical analysis.

Defenders of methodological individualism generally claim that it is an innocent doctrine, devoid of any political or ideological content. Weber himself cautioned that “it is a tremendous misunderstanding to think that an ‘individualistic’ method should involve what is in any conceivable sense an individualistic system of values” (Weber 1922: 18). Nevertheless, the doctrine of methodological individualism became embroiled in a number of highly politicized debates during the 20th century, largely because it was often invoked as a way of discrediting historical materialism. There were two distinct rounds of controversy on this score. The first occurred primarily during the 1950s, in response to the work of Friedrich von Hayek and Karl Popper. The second round occurred during the 1980s, in response to Jon Elster, this time as part of critical debates within the movement known as “analytical Marxism.” During the latter period, methodological individualism became widely associated with what many called “rational choice imperialism.”

1. Origins of the Doctrine

The phrase methodische Individualismus was actually coined by Joseph Schumpeter, in his 1908 work Das Wesen und der Hauptinhalt der theoretischen Nationalökonomie. The first use of the term “methodological individualism” in English was again by Schumpeter in his 1909 Quarterly Journal of Economics paper, “On the Concept of Social Value” (see Udehn 2001, 214). However, the theoretical elaboration of the doctrine is due to Weber, and Schumpeter used the term as a way of referring to the Weberian view.

In Economy and Society, Weber articulates the central precept of methodological individualism in the following way: When discussing social phenomena, we often talk about various “social collectivities, such as states, associations, business corporations, foundations, as if they were individual persons”(Weber 1922, 13). We talk about them having plans, performing actions, suffering losses, and so forth. The doctrine of methodological individualism does not take issue with these ordinary ways of speaking, it merely stipulates that “in sociological work these collectivities must be treated as solely the resultants and modes of organization of the particular acts of individual persons, since these alone can be treated as agents in a course of subjectively understandable action” (Weber 1922, 13).

For Weber, the commitment to methodological individualism is very closely related to the commitment to verstehende (or interpretive) patterns of explanation in sociology. The reason for privileging individual action in sociological explanation is that only action is “subjectively understandable.” Weber reserves the term “action” to refer to the subset of human behavior that is motivated by linguistically formulated or “meaningful” mental states. (Generally speaking: coughing is behavior, apologizing afterwards is action.) Updating the terminology somewhat, we can say that the defining characteristic of an action is that it is motivated by a mental state with propositional content, i.e., an intentional state. The importance of action for Weber is that we have interpretive access to it, by virtue of our capacity to understand the agent’s underlying motive. This permits the social scientist to “accomplish something which is never attainable in the natural sciences, namely the subjective understanding of the action of the component individuals” (Weber 1922, 15). Action-theoretic explanation is central to social-scientific analysis, therefore, because without knowing why people do what they do, we do not really understand why any of the more large-scale phenomena with which they are embroiled occur.

Thus methodological individualism is a slightly misleading term, since the original goal was not to privilege the individual over the collective in social-scientific explanation, but rather to privilege the action-theoretic level of explanation. This privileging of the action-theoretic level is methodological because it is imposed by the structure of interpretive social science, where the goal is to provide an understanding of social phenomena. Actions can be understood in a way that other social phenomena cannot, precisely because they are motivated by intentional states. Yet only individuals possess intentional states, and so the methodological privileging of actions entails the methodological privileging of individuals. Thus the “individualism” in methodological individualism is more a byproduct of its central theoretical commitment than a motivating factor. (In this context, it should be noted that proponents of group agency, who believe that it is appropriate to ascribe intentional states to collectivities [List and Pettit 2011], could subscribe to an interpretive methodology without it entailing a commitment to individualism. See entry on shared agency.)

It is worth emphasizing the difference between methodological individualism, in Weber’s sense, and the older traditions of atomism (or ontological individualism) in the social sciences. Many writers claim to find the origins of methodological individualism amongst economists of the Austrian School (especially Carl Menger), and doctrines articulated during the Methodenstreit of the 1880s (Udehn 2001). Others trace it back to Thomas Hobbes, and the “resolutive-compositive” method elaborated in the opening sections of the Leviathan (Lukes 1968, 119). Yet the distinctive character of this type of atomism was summed up quite clearly by Hobbes, with his injunction to “consider men as if but even now sprung out of the earth, and suddainly (like Mushromes) come to full maturity without all kind of engagement to each other” (1651, 8:1). The atomistic view is based upon the suggestion that it is possible to develop a complete characterization of individual psychology that is fully pre-social, then deduce what will happen when a group of individuals, so characterized, enter into interaction with one another. Methodological individualism, on the other hand, does not involve a commitment to any particular claim about the content of the intentional states that motivate individuals, and thus remains open to the possibility that human psychology may have an irreducibly social dimension. Thus one way of accentuating the difference between atomism and methodological individualism is to note that the former typically entails the possibility of reducing sociology to psychology, whereas the latter does not.

Finally, it should be noted that Weber’s commitment to methodological individualism is closely related to his more well-known methodological doctrine, viz., the theory of ideal types. Historical explanation may make reference to the actual content of the intentional states that motivated particular historical actors, but the sociologist is interested in producing much more abstract explanatory generalizations, and so cannot appeal to the specific motives of particular individuals. Thus sociological theory must be based upon a model of human action. And because of the constraints that interpretation imposes, this model must be a model of rational human action (Weber writes: “it is convenient to treat all irrational, affectually determined elements of behavior as factors of deviation from a conceptually pure type of rational action” [1922, 6].)

Thus one of the most important consequences of Weber’s methodological individualism is that it puts rational action theory at the core of social-scientific inquiry. This is why subsequent generations of social theorists, under Weber’s influence, sought to bring about the methodological unification of the social sciences by producing what came to be known as a “general theory of action” – one that would broaden the economic model of action in such a way as to incorporate the central action-theoretic insights of (primarily) sociologists, anthropologists, and psychologists. The work of Talcott Parsons in the first half of the century was the most important in this regard, with the unification movement reaching its apogee in the collaborative publication in 1951 of Toward a General Theory of Action, co-edited by Parsons and Edward Shils. Yet shortly thereafter, partly due to problems with the unification program, Parsons abandoned his commitment to both methodological individualism and action theory, adopting a purely systems-theoretic view. This led to a period of diminished enthusiasm for the project of producing a general theory of action, although there have been some efforts to revive it in recent years with an extended model of rational choice (Gintis 2007).

2. Austrian School and the Methodenstreit

It has never escaped anyone’s attention that the discipline that most clearly satisfies the strictures of methodological individualism is microeconomics (in the tradition of neoclassical marginalism), and that homo economicus is the most clearly articulated model of rational action. Of course, this tradition has not always been in the ascendancy within the economics profession. In particular, there are many who have felt that macroeconomics could be a completely self-standing domain of inquiry (reflected in the fact that the undergraduate economics curriculum is still often divided into “micro” and “macro.”) There have always been those who would like to plot the movements of the business cycle, or of the stock market, in a way that disregards entirely the motives that individual actors may have for doing what they do. Similarly, many have tried to discover correlations between macroeconomic variables, such as unemployment and inflation rates, without feeling the need to speculate as to why a change in one rate might lead to movement in the other. Thus there has always been a very lively debate within the economics profession about the value of the “rational actor” model that is at the heart of general equilibrium theory.

One of the earliest iterations of this debate occurred during the so-called Methodenstreit between members of the Austrian School in Economics and the German Historical School. However, members of the “first generation” of the Austrian School, such as Carl Menger, were atomists (Menger defended his individualistic method in terms of conceptual gains achieved by “reducing complicated phenomena to their elements” [Menger 1883, 93]). It was only members of the second generation, first and foremost Friedrich von Hayek, who would explicitly identify themselves with the Weberian doctrine of methodological individualism and defend it through reference to the demands of interpretive social science. The key text is Hayek’s paper, “Scientism and the Study of Society,” serialized in Economica (1942–44), and later published as the first part of The Counter-Revolution of Science (1955).

In Hayek’s view, the desire on the part of social scientists to emulate the physical sciences creates an exaggerated fear of teleological or “purposive” concepts. This leads many economists to eschew any reference to intentional states and to focus purely upon statistical correlations between economic variables. The problem with this focus is that it leaves the economic phenomena unintelligible. Take, for example, the movement of prices. One might notice a constant correlation between the date of the first frost and fluctuations in the price of wheat. But we do not really understand the phenomenon until it has been explained in terms of the rational actions of economic agents: an early frost reduces yields, leading to less intense price competition among suppliers, more among consumers, etc. Thus Hayek insists that, in effect, all macroeconomic analysis is incomplete in the absence of “micro” foundations.

It is important to note, however, that while Hayek has a model of rational action as the centerpiece of his view, his is most emphatically not a form of rationalism. On the contrary, he puts particular emphasis upon the way that various economic phenomena can emerge as the unintended consequences of rational action. Even though the outcomes that people achieve may bear no resemblance to the ones that they intended, it is still important to know what they thought they were doing when they chose to pursue to course of action that they chose – not least because it is important to know why they persist in pursuing that course of action, despite the fact that it is not producing the intended consequences.

Of course, part of Hayek’s motivation for endorsing methodological individualism and demanding that social-scientific explanations specify a mechanism at the action-theoretic level is that he wants to emphasize the limitations of the individual’s actor’s perspective. It’s fine to talk about macroeconomic variables like “the inflation rate,” but it is important to remember that individual actors (generally speaking) do not respond directly to such indicators. All that they can see are changes in the immediate prices that they must pay for production inputs or consumption goods, and this is what they respond to. The large-scale consequences of the choices they make in response to these changes are largely unintended, and so any regularity in these consequences constitutes a spontaneous order. This is a crucial element of Hayek’s information-based argument for capitalism: economic actors do not have access to the same information as economic theorists, thus it is only when we see the operations of the economy through their eyes that we can begin to see the advantages of a decentralized system of coordination like the market.

To illustrate the importance of the individual’s perspective, Hayek gives the example of the process that leads to the development of a footpath in the woods. One person works his way through, choosing the route that offers the least local resistance. His passage reduces, ever so slightly, the resistance offered along that route to the next person who walks though, who is therefore, in making the same set of decisions, likely to follow the same route. This increases the chances that the next person will do so, and so on. Thus the net of effect of all these people passing through is that they “make a path,” even though no one has the intention of doing so, and no one even plans out its trajectory. It is a product of spontaneous order: “Human movements through the district come to conform to a definite pattern which, although the result of deliberate decisions of many people, has yet not been consciously designed by anyone” (Hayek 1942, 289).

The problem with ignoring the agent’s perspective, in Hayek’s view, is that it can easily lead us to overestimate our powers of rational planning and control, and thus to fall into “rationalism.” By contrast, the central virtue of methodological individualism is that it helps us to see the limitations of our own reason (Hayek 1944, 33). Formulating theories that refer directly to the “interest rate,” or “inflationary pressures,” or “the unemployment rate” can mislead us into thinking that we can manipulate these variables, and thus intervene successfully in the economy. We forget that these concepts are abstractions, used not to guide individual action, but rather to describe the net effect of millions of individual decisions. The key characteristic of methodological individualism is that it “systematically starts from the concepts which guide individuals in their actions and not from the results of their theorizing about their actions” (1942, 286). It therefore encourages, in Hayek’s view, greater modesty with respect to social planning.

Hayek does not mention methodological individualism after the 1950s. Indeed, the role that evolutionary explanations come to play in his later work implies a tacit retraction of his commitment to the doctrine.

3. The Search for “Rock Bottom” Explanations

For many years, the term methodological individualism was associated primarily with the work of Karl Popper. This is due to the extensive debate triggered by Popper’s papers, “The Poverty of Historicism” (1944/45), and later his book, The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945). Popper, however, although making use of the term, did little to defend his commitment to it. Instead he left this job to his former student, J.W.N. Watkins. It was this debate between Watkins and his critics that (perhaps unfairly) solidified the association in many people’s minds between Popper and methodological individualism. (It was also this debate that brought the doctrine to the widespread attention of philosophers.)

Unfortunately, the version of methodological individualism that Popper bequeathed to his student Watkins was considerably more difficult to defend than the one he inherited from Hayek. Since the beginning, the precepts of methodological individualism were thought to have been imposed by the special requirements of the social sciences. For both Weber and Hayek, it was the reflection of a key difference between the Geisteswissenschaften and the Naturwissenschaften. Popper, however, denies that there are any significant methodological differences between the two. Indeed, his initial discussion of methodological individualism in “The Poverty of Historicism,” occurs in a section called “The Unity of Method,” in which he claims that both are simply in the business of “causal explanation, prediction and testing.”(1945, 78). He goes on to deny that “understanding” plays any special role in the social sciences.

The problem that this creates for the doctrine of methodological individualism is readily apparent. A social science that aims at interpretation, or that uses interpretation as part of the centerpiece of its explanatory strategy, has a very clear methodological reason for privileging explanations that refer to individual actions – since it is precisely the underlying intentional states that serve as the object of interpretation. But if social scientists are merely in the business of providing causal explanations, just like natural scientists, then what is the rationale for privileging individual actions in these explanations? There no longer appears to be any methodological reason for doing so. Thus critics like Leon Goldstein (1958), and later Steven Lukes (1968), would argue that methodological individualism was actually just an oblique way of asserting a commitment to metaphysical or ontological individualism. In other words, Popper’s “methodological individualism” was actually a claim about what the world “really” consisted of, little more than a fancy way of saying “there is no such thing as society.” Watkins went on to reinforce this impression by reformulating the thesis as the claim that the “ultimate constituents of the social world are individual people” (1957, 105).

Watkins also provoked doubts about the methodological status of the principle by distinguishing between “unfinished or half-way explanations” of social phenomena, which might not specify an action-theoretic or individualistic mechanism, and so-called “rock-bottom explanations,” which would (1957, 106). Yet in so doing, he grants that these half-way explanations (the example he gives is the relationship between inflation and the unemployment rate), while they may not tell us everything we would like to know, need not be meaningless or false. This creates problems, as Lars Udehn points out, since the mere fact that one can explain social phenomena in terms of individuals “does not imply the methodological rule that they should be explained this way” (2001, 216) – especially not if the “half-way” knowledge obtained is sufficient for our (extra-scientific) purposes.

Finally, it should be noted that Popper introduced a contrast between methodological individualism and “psychologism,” viz., the view that “all laws of social life must be ultimately reducible to the psychological laws of ‘human nature’”(1945, 89). Nevertheless, in Popper’s formulation, methodological individualism does appear equivalent to at least some form of psychological reductionism. At very least, his formulation – and later Watkins’s – left many commentators confused about how one could affirm the former without committing to the latter (Udehn 2001, 204). More generally, it created a great deal of confusion about the difference between methodological individualism and atomism (Hodgson 2007, 214).

4. The Rational Choice Revival

For both Hayek and Popper, the primary motivation for respecting the precepts of methodological individualism was to avoid “grand theory” in the style of Auguste Comte, G.W.F. Hegel and Karl Marx. Yet the motivation for avoiding this sort of grand theory was not so much that it promoted bad theory, but that it promoted habits of mind, such as “collectivism,” “rationalism,” or “historicism,” that were thought to be conducive to totalitarianism. Thus the sins of “collectivism,” and “collectivist” thought patterns, for both Hayek and Popper, were primarily political. Yet as time wore on, and the dangers of creeping totalitarianism in Western societies became increasingly remote, the fear of collectivism that underlay the debates over methodological individualism became increasingly attenuated.

Thus the concern over methodological individualism began to fade away, and might have disappeared completely had it not been for the sudden explosion of interest in game theory (or “rational choice theory”) among social scientists in the 1980s. The reason for this can be summed up in two words (and an article): the prisoner’s dilemma. Social scientists had always been aware that individuals in groups are capable of getting stuck in patterns of collectively self-defeating behavior. Paul Samuelson’s “The Pure Theory of Public Expenditure” (1954), Garrett Hardin’s “The Tragedy of the Commons,” (1968), and Mancur Olson’s The Logic of Collective Action (1965), had all provided very clear examples of cases where the mere existence of a common interest among individuals nevertheless failed to provide them with an incentive to perform the actions necessary to realize that interest. What the story of the prisoner’s dilemma – and more importantly, the accompanying game matrix – provided was a simple yet powerful model that could be used to represent the structure of all these interactions (see R. Hardin 1982).

This in turn gave renewed impetus to methodological individualism, because it allowed theorists to diagnose with greater precision the errors that social theorists could be (and often were) led into if they ignored the action-theoretic level of analysis. Methodological individualism became important, not as a way of avoiding the political thought-crime of “collectivism,” but rather as a way of avoiding demonstrably fallacious inferences about the dynamics of collective action. For example, the traditional “interest group” theory of democratic politics generally presupposes that groups who share a common interest also have an incentive to promote that interest, by lobbying politicians, funding research, and so on. Olson’s major contribution was to have driven home the point that the existence of such a common interest just as often generates a free-rider incentive. Individuals would benefit from acting to promote that interest, but they would benefit even more by sitting back while the other members of the group acted to promote it. As a result, no one may act to promote it. However, Olson confined this observation to large groups. The prisoner’s dilemma, on the other hand, demonstrated the ubiquity of this incentive structure.

Jon Elster’s contribution to the history of methodological individualism must be understood against this background. He presents the doctrine as part of a friendly yet trenchant critique of the use of functionalist explanations in the Marxist tradition; particularly those that seek to explain events as ones that “serve the interests of capital.” The problem with these explanations, Elster argues, is that they “postulate a purpose without a purposive actor” (1982, 452), and therefore (he claims) entail a commitment to some form of objective teleology. In itself, there is very little new in this criticism. As G.A. Cohen argued, in his response to Elster, there is no reason that the Marxian functionalist cannot provide “elaborations” (Cohen 1982, 131) of these explanations, ones that specify how the benefit produced evokes the phenomenon, without reference to any objective teleology. This could be done either by appealing to an intentional mechanism at the action-theoretic level or else a Darwinian “selection” mechanism (Cohen 1982, 132). In such cases, Elster’s critique of functional explanation becomes just another version of Watkins’s demand for “rock-bottom” rather than “half-way” explanations.

What made Elster’s attack so forceful was not the accusation of objective teleology in Marxist theory, but rather the suggestion that much of Marxian “class analysis” overlooked the potential for collective action problems among the various world-historical actors. Consider, for example, the familiar claim that capitalists retain a “reserve army of the unemployed” in order to depress wages. This means that individual capitalists must stop hiring new workers at a point where marginal benefits still exceed the marginal costs. What is their incentive for doing so? They have an obvious free-rider incentive to keep hiring, since the benefits stemming from depressed wages would largely be enjoyed by rival firms, whereas the benefits of further hiring would flow to the bottom line. In other words, the mere fact that it is in the “interests of capital” to have a reserve army of the unemployed does not mean that individual capitalists have an incentive to take the steps necessary to maintain such a reserve army.

An even more disturbing consequence of the “rational choice” perspective is the observation that the working class faces a major collective action problem when it comes to carrying out the socialist revolution (Elster 1982, 467). Fomenting revolution can be dangerous business, and so absent some other incentive (such as class solidarity), even workers who were convinced that a communist economic order would offer them a superior quality of life might still fail to show up at the barricades. Yet these possibilities were largely overlooked, Elster suggests, because the failure to respect the precepts of methodological individualism, along with the promiscuous use of functional explanation, had led generations of Marxian theorists simply to ignore the actual incentives that individuals face in concrete social interactions. Thus the primary effect of rational choice theory was to provide a set of cautionary tales, showing what can go wrong in social-scientific explanation when one ignores the action frame of reference.

Elster’s commitment to methodological individualism is closely tied to his insistence on the specification of “mechanisms” in social-scientific explanation (Elster 1989). Typically the mechanism that is sought will be framed in terms of individual action. If one considers, for example, Hayek’s example of travelers making a footpath, an observer who discovers the final outcome might find it puzzling that these people should possess this capacity. How did they coordinate on this specific route? Hayek’s suggestion that the passage of one person makes it slightly easier for the next to traverse along the same route answers this question, and in so doing, provides the mechanism through which coordination is achieved (Hayek 1942, 289). At the same time, there would appear to be no reason to insist that an explanatory mechanism must reference individual behavior or intentions (Kincaid 2014, 146). Thus the debate over mechanism, which is primarily responsible for the rise of so-called “analytical sociology” (Hedström 2005), is best seen as branching off from the debate over methodological individualism.

Beyond the critique of functional explanations, Elster does not advance any original argument in support of methodological individualism. He does, however, return to the earlier Weberian formulation of the position, with its emphasis on intentional action (Elster 1982, 463): “The elementary unit of social life is the individual human action,” he argues. “To explain social institutions and social change is to show how they arise as the result of the actions and interaction of individuals. This view, often referred to as methodological individualism, is in my view trivially true” (Elster, 1989, 13). Here one must assume that when he says “trivially true,” he is using the term in the vernacular sense of “platitudinous” rather than the philosophical sense of “tautologous,” since he goes on to derive a number of very substantive doctrines from his commitment to methodological individualism. For example, he goes on to claim at various points that methodological individualism commits him to psychologistic reductionism with respect to sociology (although he does not offer an argument for this claim).

Elster does not draw as sharp a distinction as he might have between the commitment to methodological individualism and the commitment to rational choice theory. Indeed, he also assumes that the latter flows directly from the former. The version of rational choice theory that Elster endorses, however, is one that is based upon a traditional instrumental (or homo economicus) conception of rationality, according to which “actions are valued and chosen not for themselves, but as more or less efficient means to the a further end” (Elster 1989, 22). He claims that this conception of rationality is implied by the fact that decision theorists are able to represent the rational actions of any agent possessing a well-behaved preference ordering as the maximization of a utility function. Yet whether utility-maximization implies instrumentalism depends upon the version of expected utility theory that one subscribes to. So-called “world Bayesian” versions of decision theory, such as Richard Jeffrey’s (1983) do not impose an instrumental conception of rationality, since they permit agents to have preferences over their own actions. Thus there is no entailment in Elster’s move from methodological individualism to an instrumental conception of rationality.

Nevertheless, as a result of Elster’s arguments, methodological individualism became synonymous in many quarters with the commitment to rational choice theory. Such an equation generally fails to distinguish what were for Weber two distinct methodological issues: the commitment to providing explanations at an action-theoretic level, and the specific model of rational action that one proposes to use at that level (i.e., the ideal type). There are multiple permutations. For instance, there is no reason that one cannot be a methodological individualist while choosing to employ Habermas’s theory of communicative action rather than rational choice theory as the model of rational action. In fact, this would make greater sense, since game theory, strictly construed, has never purported to offer a general theory of rational action. The Nash solution concept, which provides the standard definition of a game-theoretic equilibrium, specifically excluded all forms of communication between the players (and the solution does not work in cases where communication does intrude [Heath 2001]). Thus much of the furor over rational choice imperialism has been based upon a failure to appreciate the limitations of that model (in many cases both by its defenders and its critics).

5. Other Uses of the Term

In the philosophy of mind, the phrase “methodological individualism” is commonly associated with a claim made by Jerry Fodor concerning the individuation of psychological states (1980, 1987, 42). It is important to emphasize that Fodor’s use of the term has nothing in common with its traditional use in the philosophy of social science. Fodor introduces it by way of a distinction between “methodological individualism” and “methodological solipsism.” His goal is to deal with variations on the twin-earth problem, introduced by Hilary Putnam. The question is whether an individual with a belief about water on earth, where water is made up of H2O, has the same belief as an individual with a belief about water in a parallel universe, where water has the same appearance and behavior, but happens to be made up of XYZ. The “externalist” is one who says that they are not the same, whereas an “internalist” like Fodor wants to say that they are – speaking roughly, that the content of beliefs is determined by what is in the agent’s head, and not what is in the world.

The issue comes down to one concerning the individuation of mental states. How do we determine what is and is not the “same” belief? Fodor begins by introducing the constraint that he calls “methodological individualism,” viz., “the doctrine that psychological states are individuated with respect to their causal powers” (1987, 42). This implies, among other things, that if one psychological state is incapable of causing anything different to happen than some other psychological state, then the two must be the same. “Methodological solipsism” is the stronger claim that “psychological states are individuated without respect to the semantic evaluations” (1987, 42). This implies, among other things, that even if one state is “true” in some context and another is “false,” the two may still turn out to be the same. As Fodor goes on to point out, the semantic evaluation of a mental state will typically be relational, e.g. whether certain beliefs about water are true will depend upon how things happen to stand with water in the world; thus methodological solipsism has the consequence of precluding one type of relational property from playing a role in the individuation of mental states. It is therefore “individualistic” in the everyday sense of the term, since it suggests that what’s going on in the agent’s head does most or all of the work in the individuation of mental states. Methodological individualism, on the other hand, “does not prohibit the relational individuation of mental states; it just says that no property of mental states, relational or otherwise, counts taxonomically unless it affects causal powers”(1987, 42). Thus it is very unclear why Fodor chooses to call this a form of “individualism,” since these relations could also be relations to other speakers, and not just the physical word.

There is considerable infelicity in Fodor’s choice of terms. He is able to offer a cogent account of why methodological individualism counts as a methodological constraint. He argues that the desire to align terminological distinctions with objects having different causal powers is “one which follows simply from the scientist’s goal of causal explanation and which, therefore, all scientific taxonomies must obey” (1987, 42). Thus it is a methodological precept. (Although one can see clearly here the stark contrast between Fodor’s use of the term and that of Weber or Hayek, for whom the ability of the social scientist to provide something beyond merely causal explanation was what imposed the methodological commitment to the action-theoretic level of analysis.) It is simply unclear why Fodor chooses to call it individualism. With methodological solipsism, on the other hand, one can see why he calls it solipsism, but it is unclear what makes it methodological. Indeed, Fodor goes on to state that “solipsism (construed as prohibiting the relational taxonomy of mental states) is unlike individualism in that it couldn’t conceivably follow from any general considerations about scientific goals and practices. ‘Methodological solipsism’ is, in fact, an empirical theory about the mind.”(1987, 43). Thus in Fodor’s use of the terms, “methodological individualism” is not really individualistic, and “methodological solipsism” is not really methodological.

6. Criticism

Much of the critical discussion of methodological individualism in the philosophy of social science concerns the relationship between what Watkins called “rock-bottom” explanations and “half-way” ones – or those that do and those that do not specify an action theoretic mechanism (Zahle and Kincaid 2019, 657; Hedström and Bearman 2011). In general, there is no question that, given any particular half-way explanation of a social phenomenon, it would always be nice to know what agents are thinking, when they perform the actions that are involved in the production of that phenomenon. The question is whether the explanation is somehow deficient, or unscientific, in the absence of this information. The answer to that question will depend upon one’s broader commitments concerning the status and role of the social sciences. Nevertheless, it is worth noting three very common aspects of social-scientific explanation that fall short of providing the sort of rock-bottom explanations that the Watkins version of methodological individualism demands:

6.1 Statistical analysis

Consider the following example of a social-scientific debate: During the 1990s, there was a precipitous decline in violent crime in the United States. Many social scientists naturally began to apply themselves to the question of why this had occurred, i.e., they set out to explain the phenomenon. A number of different hypotheses were advanced: the hiring of more police, changes in community policing practices, more severe sentencing guidelines for offenders, decreased tolerance for minor infractions, an increase in religiosity, a decline in the popularity of crack, changes in the demographic profile of the population, etc. Since the decline in crime occurred in many different jurisdictions, each using some different combination of strategies under different circumstances, it is possible to build support for different hypotheses through purely statistical analysis. For example, the idea that policing strategies play an important role is contradicted by the fact that New York City and San Francisco adopted very different approaches to policing, and yet experienced a similar decline in the crime rate. Thus a very sophisticated debate broke out, with different social scientists producing different data sets, and crunching the numbers in different ways, in support of their rival hypotheses.

This debate, like almost every debate in criminology, lacks microfoundations. It would certainly be nice to know what is going through people’s mind when they commit crimes, and thus how likely various measures are to change their behavior, but the fact is we do not know. Indeed, there is considerable skepticism among criminologists that a “general theory” of crime is possible. Nevertheless, we can easily imagine criminologists deciding that one particular factor, such as a demographic shift in the population (i.e., fewer young men), is the explanation for the late-20th century decline in violent crime in the United States, and ruling out the other hypotheses. And even though this may be a “half-way” explanation, there is no question that it would represent a genuine discovery, one that we could learn something important from.

Furthermore, it is not obvious that the “rock-bottom” explanation – the one that satisfies the precepts of methodological individualism – is going to add anything very interesting to the “half-way” explanation provided by the statistical analysis. In many cases it will even be derived from it. Suppose that we discovered, through statistical analysis, that the crime rate varied as a function of the severity of punishment multiplied by the probability of apprehension. We would then infer from this that criminals were rational utility-maximizers. On the other hand, if studies showed that crime rates were completely unaffected by changes in the severity of punishments or the probability of apprehension, we would infer that something else must be going on at the action-theoretic level.

Results at the action-theoretic level might also prove to be random or uninteresting, from the standpoint of the explanatory variables. Suppose it turns out that the decline in crime can be explained entirely by demographic change. Then it doesn’t really matter what the criminals were thinking – what matters is simply that a certain percentage of any given demographic group has the thoughts that lead to criminal behavior, so fewer of those people translates into less crime. The motives remain inside the “black box” – and while it might to nice to know what those motives are, they may not contribute anything to this particular explanation. In the end, it may turn out that each crime is as unique as the criminal. So while there is a concrete explanation in terms of actual people’s intentional states, there is nothing that can be said at the level of a general “model” of rational action. (In this context, it is important to remember that methodological individualism in the Weberian sense explains actions in terms of a model of the agent, not the actual motivations of the real people.)

6.2 Subintentional states

Consider another social-scientific debate, this time the controversy over the data showing that stepparents have a far greater propensity to kill very young children in their care than biological parents. What would be involved in providing a rock-bottom explanation for this phenomenon, one that satisfied the precepts of methodological individualism? How informative would this be? It does not take much effort to imagine what people are thinking, when they shake a baby or hit a toddler. The motives are all-too familiar – almost everyone experiences episodes of intense frustration or anger when dealing with children. But that clearly does not explain the phenomenon. The question is why one group systematically fails to exercise control over these violent impulses, relative to some other group. Since very few people do it as part of a well-conceived plan, it is not clear that there is going to be an explanation available at the level of intentional states, or even that a complementary account of what is going on at this level will be in the least bit informative. The problem is that the behavior is generated by biases that function almost entirely at a subintentional level (Sperber, 1997). This suggests that an explanation in terms of intentional states is not really “rock bottom,” but that there are deeper layers to be explored.

It is not difficult to imagine how such an explanation might run. People experience a reaction to juvenile (or neotenous) characteristics of the young that is largely involuntary. This reaction is very complex, but one of its central characteristics is the inhibition of aggression. People are also quite poor at articulating the basis of this reaction, other than by repeated references to the fact that the child is “cute.” Of course, the overall strength of this reaction varies from individual to individual, and the particular strength varies with different children. Thus it is possible that biological parents simply find their own children “cuter” than stepparents do, and that this translates into a slightly lower average propensity to commit acts of aggression against them. Because they are unable to articulate the basis of this judgment, any analysis at the intentional level will simply fail to provide much in the way of an explanation for their actions.

Furthermore, it would seem that much “deeper” explanations of these behavioral tendencies are available. Most obviously, there is an evolutionary account available, which explains parental investment in terms of inclusive fitness (and also explains “new mate infanticide” in terms of sexual selection). Because of this, proponents of methodological individualism are open to the charge that they are promoting half-way explanations, and that the evolutionary perspective offers rock-bottom ones. More generally, any theory that purports to explain the origin of our intentional states in terms of deeper underlying causes, or that claims to explain much of human behavior without reference to intentional states (such as Freudianism, which treats many of our beliefs as rationalizations, our desires as sublimations), will be unmoved by the methodological individualist’s demand that pride of place be assigned to explanations formulated at the action-theoretic level.

6.3 Supervenient properties

Since Popper, proponents of methodological individualism have been concerned that social-scientific explanations that failed to respect this constraint would wind up positing ontologically suspect social entities. Increased facility with the concept of supervenience (see entry on supervenience) has led to considerable clarification of these issues, providing critics of methodological individualism a relatively straightforward way to distinguish their ontological from their explanatory claims (Zahle 2007). A level of description Y is said to supervene on some other level X if there cannot be a difference in Y without some difference in X, but there can be differences at the X level without any difference in Y. The standard way of articulating this is to say that states of Y can be realized in different ways in X. This became popular in the philosophy of mind as a way of articulating “non-reductive materialism” about the mental, wherein one and the same belief could be realized through different brain states, but where one belief could not change into some other without a change in the brain state that realizes it.

Many social theorists have felt that supervenience provides a natural way of articulating the relationship between social (or institutional) facts and individual intentional states. The thought is that if nothing has changed at the level of the individuals, then the social facts cannot have changed either, but things can change at the level of individuals (e.g. some people may leave and others take their place) without changing the social facts. One might then reject methodological individualism on the grounds that interesting explanatory relations may prevail among social states that supervene on individual-level descriptions. The language of supervenience is clarifying, in this context, because it makes clear that one can posit this sort of explanatory independence of the social without any ontological commitment to entities at this level (i.e. that one may subscribe to “non-reductive individualism”).

The most clear-cut cases of this arise when social states admit of multiple realizations (Kincaid 1997, 33–34). Christian List and Kai Spiekermann (2013), for example, suggest that methodological individualism will not be appropriate in cases where “social regularities are robust to changes in their individual-level realization” (629). They specify three “jointly necessary and sufficient conditions” (639) under which this will be so:

Multiple levels of description: The system admits lower and higher levels of description, associated with different level-specific properties (e.g. individual-level properties versus aggregate properties).

Multiple realizability of higher-level properties: The system’s higher-level properties are determined by its lower-level properties, but can be realized by numerous different configurations of them and hence cannot feasibly be redescribed in terms of lower-level properties.

Microrealization-robust causal relations: The causal relations in which some of the system’s higher-level properties stand are robust to changes in their lower-level realization.

An example they give is the “democratic peace hypothesis” (2013, 640), that democracies do not go to war with one another. This is typically explained in terms of internal structural features of democracies that privilege norms of cooperation and compromise. There are, however, so many ways of instantiating these features that an explanation at the lower level of description, such as that of the individual, would be unable to articulate the relevant causal relation.

6.4 Fallacies

The primary methodological reason, among social scientists, for adopting a commitment to methodological individualism was to caution against certain fallacies that were quite common in 19th century social science. Perhaps the greatest of these fallacies was the one based on a widespread tendency to ignore the potential for collective action problems in groups, and thus to move far too easily “down” from an identification of a group interest to the ascription of an individual interest. One way of avoiding such fallacies was to force social scientists to look always at interactions from the participant’s perspective, to see what sort of preference structure governed his or her decisions.

At the same time, it is worth noting that too much emphasis on the action-theoretic perspective can generate its own fallacies. One of the most powerful resources of sociological inquiry is precisely the capacity to objectivate and aggregate social behavior using large-scale data collection and analysis. The analysis of social phenomena at this level can often generate results that are counterintuitive from an action-theoretic perspective. Too much emphasis on the action-theoretic perspective, because of its proximity to common sense, can generate false assumptions about what must be going on at the aggregate level. As Arthur Stinchcombe observes in his classic work, Constructing Social Theories, constructing “demographic explanations” of social phenomena often requires a break with our everyday interpretive perspective. Too much focus upon individual attitudes can lead us to make illegitimate generalizations about the characteristics of these attitudes in groups (1968, 67). For example, the stability of a belief in a population only very rarely depends upon its stability in individuals. There can be considerable volatility at the individual level, but so long as it runs with equal force both ways, its prevalence in the population will be unchanged (68). If ten per cent of the population loses their faith in God every year, yet ten per cent have a conversion experience, then there will be no change in the overall level of religiosity. This may seem obvious, but as Stinchcombe observes, it is “intuitively difficult for many people” (67), and inattention to it is a common source of fallacious sociological thinking.

It is also worth noting that the action-theoretic level of analysis, with its focus on the intentional states of the agent, can generate considerable mischief when combined haphazardly with evolutionary reasoning. The most common fallacy arises when theorists treat the “self-interest” of the individual, defined with respect to his or her preferences, as a stand-in for the “fitness” of a particular behavior (or phenotype), at either the biological or the cultural level, then assumes that there is some selection mechanism in place, again at either the biological or cultural level, that will weed out forms of behavior that fail to advance the individual’s self-interest. The problem is that neither biological nor cultural evolution function in this way. It is an elementary consequence of “selfish gene” theory that biological evolution does not advance the interests of the agent (the most conspicuous example being inclusive fitness). For similar reasons, cultural evolution benefits the “meme” rather than the interests of the agent (Stanovich 2004). The evolutionary perspective imposes a much greater break with the rationality-based perspective than many social theorists appreciate. Thus methodological individualism can sometimes impede the sort of radical objectivation of social phenomena that the use of certain sociotheoretic models or tools requires.


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