The Epistemic Condition for Moral Responsibility

First published Wed Sep 12, 2018; substantive revision Tue Oct 4, 2022

Philosophers usually acknowledge two individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for a person to be morally responsible for an action, i.e., susceptible to be praised or blamed for it: a control condition (also called freedom condition) and an epistemic condition (also called knowledge, cognitive, or mental condition). The first condition has to do with whether the agent possessed an adequate degree of control or freedom in performing the action, whereas the second condition is concerned with whether the agent’s epistemic or cognitive state was such that she can properly be held accountable for the action and its consequences. While the first condition prompts us to ask “was this person acting freely when she did A?”, the second condition prompts us to ask “was this person aware of what she was doing (of its consequences, moral significance, etc.)?”[1]

The standard assumption used to be that the philosophically interesting condition was the one concerned with freedom and that, in comparison, the epistemic condition (henceforth, EC) was relatively straightforward and unproblematic. However, in the last twenty years or so it has become patent that the EC presents certain unique challenges for a correct understanding of moral responsibility—even distinctive skeptical threats to its possibility (see sect. 2)—quite independently of the issue of freedom and determinism. The main purposes of this entry are, first, to outline in general terms what the EC is—what its requirements are and what kinds of awareness are involved (sect. 1)—and, second, to present the main competing positions concerning the interpretation of those requirements and the different ways of satisfying them (sects. 2–3).

1. The Epistemic Condition

1.1 Contents of Awareness

We can start with this intuitive thought: for an agent to be praise-/blameworthy for an action, she must be aware of certain things. Thus, what the EC seems to require, at least initially, is awareness. As we will see, the debate revolves around three main issues. First, what the content of the requisite awareness is, i.e., of which things an agent needs to be aware of. Second, what kind of awareness is required, i.e., which mental states are involved and in what way these mental states must be entertained. Third, whether awareness is actually required at all or whether there can be, in Sher’s (2009) phrase, “responsibility without awareness”. For the moment we can bracket the third question and pursue the intuitive thought that responsibility does require awareness. In this subsection we focus on the question about the content of awareness and in the next one on the question about the kind of awareness relevant for moral responsibility.

Imagine that John presses a wall button that activates a treadmill in which Mary is standing still, causing her to fall to the ground and break an arm. Let’s assume that the action is objectively wrong, since it harmed Mary for no good reason, e.g., to save her from an incoming bullet. Now let’s try to determine what it would take for John to be blameworthy for it. Assume first that John satisfies all non-epistemic conditions on moral responsibility, like possessing whatever kind of freedom/control is required for blameworthiness. Now ask: of which things must John be aware at the time of action in order to be blameworthy for it and for the ensuing consequences? There are four plausible epistemic requirements involved: awareness of action, of moral significance, of consequences, and of alternatives. We’ll take them in turn.

First, the requirement of awareness of action (Mele 2010; Sliwa 2017). To be responsible for his action, John must be aware of what he is doing. If John falsely believes that the button is a light switch, then he isn’t aware that by pressing it he will start the treadmill and so it seems that he can’t be blamed for Mary’s fall and for her injuries. Similarly, if John correctly believes that pressing the button will start the treadmill but isn’t aware that Mary is standing on it, it seems that he isn’t blameworthy either. These seemings have to be refined, of course, since John’s ignorance of the button’s function or of Mary’s location can itself be blameworthy, in which case (most think) it fails to exculpate (Ginet 2000: 271). (For the classic discussion of what it takes for ignorance to be culpable see Holly Smith 1983 and sect. 2 below. For discussions of whether culpable ignorance excuses, see Holly Smith 1983 and 2017; Montmarquet 1995.) The lesson, then, is that for an agent to be directly blameworthy for an action—that is, blameworthy in a way that doesn’t derive from previous instances of blameworthiness, such as culpability for the ignorance from which she acts—she must be aware that she is performing the action in question, and be aware of it under an appropriate description (Anscombe 1963; Levy 2014: 37). In this case, John must be aware that by pressing the button he is activating the treadmill with Mary on it or, alternatively, that by pressing the button and activating the treadmill he is causing Mary to fall to the ground. (Recall that this is just a first pass on the epistemic requirements on responsibility. We’ll see later on (sect. 3.4) that many philosophers deny that one must be aware of what one is doing in order to be directly responsible for it.)

Second, the requirement of awareness of moral significance. For John to be blameworthy, he has to be aware of the action’s moral significance or moral valence. In other words, he must have a belief about the action’s being wrong or, alternatively, a belief about the presence of whatever features make the action wrong (its wrong-making features). The first kind of belief amounts to de dicto awareness of moral significance, because it involves awareness of the action’s wrongness so conceived (Haji 1997: 543; Zimmerman 2002a; 2008: 191–2; 2017: 85; Rosen 2004: 307; Levy 2011: 141; Sliwa 2017: 131–2). The second kind of belief amounts to de re awareness of moral significance, because it involves awareness of those features of the action that are in fact morally significant, regardless of whether the agent is also aware of the moral significance they actually have (Harman 2011: 465; 2015: 59–60, 67; Talbert 2013: 242; Littlejohn 2014: 144; Levy 2014: 37). If when John presses the button he entertains the belief that what he is doing is overall morally wrong, he has de dicto awareness of the action’s moral significance. (If, alternatively, he believes that his action is merely pro tanto morally wrong but not wrong all-things-considered, he lacks that awareness.) If, on the other hand, John lacks the belief about overall wrongness but has other beliefs about the action’s wrong-making features, e.g., that it will harm Mary, he has de re awareness of the action’s moral significance. The position according to which the relevant awareness is de dicto awareness entails that moral knowledge (or at least moral beliefs) is necessary for responsibility (Sliwa 2017), whereas the position according to which the relevant awareness is de re awareness denies the necessity of moral knowledge (Harman 2011 & 2015; Talbert 2013; Weatherson 2019: ch. 5). We’ll see below (sect. 3.3) that this is a key dispute concerning the epistemic requirements on praise-/blameworthiness.

Third, the requirement of awareness of consequences. In a natural description of the case, we would say that John is responsible for Mary’s breaking an arm, that is, that he’s blameworthy for the latter event.[2] Call this the consequence of John’s action. What kind of awareness is required for John to be blameworthy for it? The straightforward response is that he must have a belief about the event occurring as a result of his action (Zimmerman 1997: 420). However, there is disagreement about what the content of this belief must be. Some philosophers (Zimmerman 1986; Vargas 2005) think that it must be very specific, in the sense that the agent has to believe that an event of exactly the kind that occurred could result from her action, whereas others (Fischer & Tognazzini 2009; King 2017: 272; Nelkin & Rickless 2017a: 126) think that a belief with a more general content suffices. According to the former position, for John to be blameworthy for the consequence of his action he must have entertained the belief that Mary would (or might) break her arm as a result of her fall, whereas according to the latter position a belief that someone would (or might) be harmed is enough. It’s worth noting that the requirement of awareness of consequences is usually stated in terms of “reasonable foreseeability” rather than actual foresight (Vargas 2005; Fischer & Tognazzini 2009; Sartorio 2017; cf. Zimmerman 1986; Nelkin & Rickless 2017a). As will become patent later on, the dispute about how to understand this requirement is part and parcel of the broader dispute about whether the EC requires occurrent awareness (sect. 2) or, rather, the capacity to gain the requisite awareness (sects. 3.2, 3.4).

Fourth and finally, the requirement of awareness of alternatives. Some philosophers argue that an agent can’t be blameworthy for a wrong action unless she believes that there is at least one alternative (and permissible) course of action open to her. For instance, Levy writes (see also Wieland 2017a: 2; Guerrero 2007: 89):

Perhaps it need not be the case … that agents need genuine access to alternative possibilities when they choose and act, but they do need epistemic access to a range of alternatives: they can only appropriately be blamed for performing an action if they believed that alternatives were available to them, and understood the significance of these alternatives. (Levy 2011: 111)

Applying this idea to our example, John would be blameworthy only if he believed that he could have pursued an alternative and permissible course of action, such as refraining from pressing the button. However, not everyone agrees that this is a genuine epistemic requirement on responsibility. For instance, Sartorio (2017) argues—on the basis of a variation on the classic Frankfurt cases (Frankfurt 1969)—that an agent can be blameworthy even if she believes, or even knows, that she couldn’t have done otherwise, as long as this belief doesn’t interfere with her own deliberation about whether to perform the wrong action.

In sum, there are four different things awareness of which seems (at least initially) relevant for responsibility: awareness of one’s action under an appropriate description, of its moral significance, of its potential consequences, and of alternatives to it. Next we’ll consider different positions about what mental states amount to the requisite awareness.

1.2 Kinds of Awareness

In the previous section we identified several plausible epistemic requirements on moral responsibility. They constitute the content of the awareness that, at least initially, seems to be demanded by the EC. Now we’ll focus on the kind of awareness that is in question. We’ll pursue two questions. First, what mental states must the agent entertain in order to possess the relevant awareness? Second, how must the mental states in question be entertained (occurrently, dispositionally, etc.)?

Let’s begin with the first question. It was pointed out at the outset that one of the alternative labels for the EC is ‘knowledge condition’ and this may naturally suggest that awareness in this context is nothing but knowledge. Returning to the example, this would mean that John satisfies the EC just in case he knew what he was doing and knew about its moral significance, its potential consequences, etc. However, many philosophers have argued that knowledge proper isn’t required for blameworthiness (Rosen 2008: 596; Haji 2008: 90; Peels 2014: 493–4; Baron 2017: 58–9). To see why, consider this case presented by Rosen:

Dorfman poisons Mrs. Dorfman by putting what he takes to be arsenic in her tea. The stuff is indeed arsenic and Mrs. Dorfman dies as planned. But Dorfman does not know that the stuff is arsenic (or that his act subjects his victim to an unjustifiable risk of death) because: The chemist who sold Dorfman the arsenic is a famous liar … [G]iven the chemist’s well-known track record of selling sugar as arsenic to would-be poisoners, Dorfman had no business believing him. Dorfman’s pertinent beliefs are true, but they do not amount to knowledge because they are based on insufficient evidence. (Rosen 2008: 596)

The key point is that Dorfman’s lack of knowledge about the wrong-making features of his action is irrelevant for assessing his blameworthiness, for he is as blameworthy as he would be had he knew that the stuff was indeed arsenic. Therefore, whatever mental state Dorfman was in at the time of carrying out his plan, it must suffice for satisfying the EC. It’s natural to think that the relevant mental state is simply true belief (Peels 2014: 493). Dorfman truly believed that he was pouring arsenic into her wife’s tea and that by doing so she would die, and this seems enough for him to be blameworthy (assuming he also satisfied other non-epistemic conditions on responsibility). Some philosophers think that mere true belief isn’t enough, though, and claim that what is needed for satisfying the EC is reasonable or justified belief instead (Timpe 2011: 18; Ginet 2000: 270). This would entail that Dorfman satisfies the EC only if it was reasonable for him to believe, or if he was justified in believing, that what the chemist handed over to him was indeed arsenic and thus that he would poison his wife by pouring the substance in her tea (perhaps it was reasonable and justified if Dorfman had never heard about the chemist’s reputation as a liar).

However, still other philosophers think that not only the belief in question needn’t be reasonable, but that it needn’t even be true (Zimmerman 2008: 198; Haji 1997: 526; Levy 2014: 36). On this view,

blameworthiness is affiliated not with the objective wrongness of an action but with whether a person takes herself to be doing wrong in performing an action. (Haji 1997: 526)

This entails that an agent can be blameworthy for performing a morally neutral, or even a morally right action (Zimmerman 2008: 201), provided that she acts on the belief that her action is wrong (see the case of Huckleberry Finn in sect. 3.3 below). In defense of this position, it has been argued that there is a particular kind of culpability that one incurs when one knowingly defies what one takes to be the requirements of morality (Levy 2011: 142; Zimmerman 2017: 91), regardless of whether one gets them right.

Assuming that awareness involves some or another type of belief, let’s turn now to the second question broached above, namely how these beliefs must be entertained for the person to possess the relevant awareness. The main dispute here is between those philosophers who think that the pertinent beliefs must be occurrently entertained (Zimmerman 1997: 421–2; 2017: 79; Ginet 2000: 270; Rosen 2004: 309; Levy 2011: 141) and those who think that it’s enough if these beliefs are dispositionally entertained (Haji 1997: 531; Peels 2011: 580; Timpe 2011: 18; Levy 2013: 167; 2014: 34).[3] According to the ‘occurrentist’ camp, an agent satisfies the EC only if, at the time of action, she consciously believes that her action is right/wrong and consciously contemplates some of its possible consequences (Zimmerman 1997: 421). Otherwise, and for the purposes of attributions of responsibility, she is ignorant of relevant considerations and so, in principle (recall the possibility of culpable ignorance), she has an excuse for her wrongdoing (Zimmerman 2017: 79; see sect. 3.1 below for an argument in favor of this position). As we’ll see below (sect. 2), the occurrentist interpretation of the EC plays a central role in a revisionist argument against commonsense attributions of responsibility.

By contrast, the ‘dispositionalist’ camp argues that the occurrentist interpretation of the EC is too strict and would let too many intuitively blameworthy wrongdoers off the hook. For one, if one forgets a relevant piece of information and as a consequence does something wrong—if, say, one forgets about the dietary restrictions of the infant one is babysitting and then feeds her food to which she is allergic—one seems to be, absent excusing conditions, blameworthy (Peels 2011: 580; see also Husak 2011). Crucially, however, lack of occurrent belief concerning the relevant information doesn’t seem to be one of those excusing conditions (Amaya & Doris 2015: 267). Also, if the occurrentist position were right, one could shield oneself from blame simply by avoid thinking about the moral status of one’s action, and that’s implausible (Guerrero 2007: 74; Timpe 2011: 23; Robichaud 2014: 150; Levy 2014: 31). These considerations lead to the position that tacit, dormant, dispositional, or unconscious beliefs can, at least in many cases, amount to the kind of awareness that is required for moral responsibility (see sect. 3.1 below for more arguments in favor of this position).

2. The Epistemic Condition and Revisionism

So far we have pursued the intuitive idea that responsibility requires awareness and reviewed several positions concerning the content and kind of awareness that is in question. We’ll now see that this intuitive idea, coupled with a particular interpretation of the content and kind of the requisite awareness, leads to a regress that threatens to undermine attributions of responsibility quite generally. The following argument is originally due to Zimmerman (1997), who offered slight variations in his 2008 and 2017. Rosen (2004) and Levy (2011: ch. 5) have also advanced versions of it, as well as Ginet (2000), although the latter fails to note its revisionist implications. We’ll call the proponents of this argument ‘volitionists’, and the position they espouse concerning the EC ‘revisionism’. The volitionists’ argument sparked a big debate in which the three central questions concerning the EC mentioned at the outset—about the content, kind, and necessity of awareness—have been thoroughly explored. This section presents a reconstruction of the regress argument and the next one presents the main responses to it.

To appreciate how the regress is generated, consider the variation of our initial example in which John falsely believes that the wall button is a light switch. Since John isn’t aware that by pressing the button he is activating the treadmill, he fails to satisfy the requirement of awareness of action under an appropriate description and, a fortiori, he also fails to satisfy the requirements concerning awareness of moral significance and of consequences. Therefore, since John is unaware that pressing the button is wrong (or, alternatively, unaware of the action’s wrong-making features) and is also unaware of the potential consequences of doing so, we may think that, at least in principle, he is blameworthy neither for his action nor for Mary’s injuries. John’s unawareness or, as it’s often put, John’s ignorance would play the role of an excuse for his wrongdoing, where an excuse is a consideration that blocks the attribution of blame to an agent who has performed a wrong action (Austin 1957 [1962]; Kelly 2012; Franklin 2013. For detailed discussions of the ignorance excuse see Rosen 2008; Peels 2014; Baron 2017). As it was noted above, however, John’s ignorance can itself be blameworthy or culpable, and it’s widely—although not universally (cf. Holly Smith 2017; Ross 1939: 163–4)—accepted that culpable ignorance fails to exculpate (at least completely). Thus, it if turns out that John is culpable for his ignorance of the button’s true function, he might well be blameworthy for unwittingly activating the treadmill and for unwittingly causing Mary’s injuries. Notice that if this were the case, John’s blameworthiness for his unwitting action and its consequences would be derivative (or indirect) rather than original (or direct): it would derive from a prior instance of blameworthiness, namely his blameworthiness for his ignorant state (Zimmerman 1997: 414–5; Rosen 2004: 300). (See King 2017 for criticism of the idea that blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing must be explained in terms of the original/derivative distinction, and see Wieland and Robichaud 2017 for a thorough discussion of different ways of cashing out the idea that there is a “transfer” of blame in these cases.)

So now the crucial question becomes: What would it take for John to be blameworthy for his ignorance? John’s ignorance of the fact that his action is wrong is rooted in his mistaken belief that the button is a light switch, so it seems that if he is blameworthy for his ignorance it must be because he is blameworthy for having this belief or for lacking the correct belief about the button’s function.[4] So what would it take for John to be blameworthy for having certain beliefs or lacking others? In answering this question volitionists appeal to the thesis of doxastic involuntarism, according to which we lack direct control over our beliefs, that is, we can’t decide at will what to believe (Williams 1973; Alston 1988; Zimmerman 2002a; Rosen 2004: 302; Levy 2007; 2011: 128–31). So if John is blameworthy for having or lacking certain beliefs, this must be because there was something John did such that: i) he had direct control over it; ii) it caused him to have or lack certain beliefs; iii) doing such a thing is all-things-considered wrong; and iv) he is blameworthy for having done it. (Notice that, on this view, responsibility for ignorance is also derivative.) The natural candidate that satisfies clauses i to iii is what Holly Smith (1983) calls a “benighting act”: an action or omission the consequence of which is the lack of a true belief about the impermissibility of one’s conduct. In other words, by performing a benighting act the agent brings about her own ignorance about the wrongness of her subsequent action. In our example we can imagine several benighting acts John may have performed, such as discarding (without reading it first) the operational booklet that was given to him when he was hired at the fitness center, not asking a colleague to show him around before touching anything, not reading the conspicuous “Caution: activates treadmill” sign placed above the button, etc.

Any of these actions and omissions satisfies clauses i to iii above: i) John has direct control over keeping (and reading) a booklet or reading a sign or asking questions; ii) John’s failure to perform at least one of these actions caused him to lack a true belief about the button’s function; and iii) any of these actions and omissions is, in the relevant context, all-things-considered wrong, since John was under a ‘procedural epistemic obligation’ (Rosen 2004: 301) to inform himself about the functioning of the place. Wrongness, however, isn’t the same as blameworthiness, so we still need to know (clause iv) if John is blameworthy for any of these benighting acts (H. Smith 1983: 548). The natural thought at this point is that culpability for a benighting act requires exactly the same as culpability for any other act (Zimmerman 1997: 416). Therefore, if we started from the idea that responsibility requires awareness, we’ll conclude that one is blameworthy for a benighting act only if, at the time of performing it, one is aware of what one is doing, of its moral significance, of its potential consequences, and of alternatives to it. This entails that John is blameworthy for any of the benighting acts described above only if either he performed any of them in full awareness (including awareness of the probable consequence of leaving him ignorant of relevant considerations) or, if this wasn’t the case, he is in turn blameworthy for this further lack of awareness.

It becomes clear at this point that in trying to establish John’s blameworthiness for the original action we are facing a regress. John would be blameworthy for his unwittingly activating the treadmill and its consequences only if his ignorance of the button’s function was itself culpable, which in turn requires that such ignorance derives from a culpable action or omission (a benighting act). But culpability for a benighting act again seems to require awareness, so if John’s omissions to inform himself were also unwitting—if he was also ignorant or unaware of the need to read the operational booklet, say—we would need to search for further benighting acts to which we could trace back this extra piece of ignorance. For the regress to terminate, the agent’s ignorance must be at some point the causal upshot of an action or omission performed in full awareness of all the relevant facts (including the relevant moral facts. See below). As Rosen puts it,

He would have to know the pertinent facts about his contemplated act. He would have to know that it was wrong. And he would have to know that in the circumstances, all things considered, he should not do it. He would then have to act despite this knowledge. (Rosen 2004: 307)

An action performed in this way would be an akratic action, that is, an action performed while occurrently and de dicto (Rosen 2004: 309) believing that it’s all-things-considered wrong to do it. It thus follows from the regress argument that “the only possible locus of original responsibility is an akratic act” (Rosen 2004: 307), and this entails that every blameworthy action must be either itself an akratic action or the causal upshot of one (Zimmerman [2008: 176] calls the second disjunct ‘the Origination Thesis’). This is the ‘akrasia requirement’ on blameworthiness defended by volitionists. The akrasia requirement is a surprising result with troubling revisionist implications, because when we make ordinary judgments of blameworthiness we rarely (if ever) check to see whether it is met (Zimmerman 2017: 84). According to the argument, however, we should, for if it isn’t met attributions of blame are mistaken. And the problem isn’t merely that the soundness of the argument would force us to take extra steps before blaming others; rather, the problem is that it can be speculated that ignorant wrongdoing very rarely has such non-ignorant (or akratic) origins (Zimmerman 1997: 418; Levy 2011: 131). Moreover, it has been argued that it would be very difficult, or even impossible, for us to ascertain whether the akrasia requirement has been met on any particular occasion (Rosen 2004: 308). In either case, the upshot is that many, perhaps most, of our ordinary judgments of blameworthiness for ignorant wrongdoing are unwarranted.

And indeed things can get worse, for volitionists claim that this argument applies to all kinds of ignorance, not just factual ignorance as in John’s example (Zimmerman 1997: 423; Rosen 2003; 2004: 304; Levy 2011: 118–23).[5] Consider a variant of the case in which John is aware that pressing the button will activate the treadmill and foresees as well that doing so might cause Mary to fall and sustain an injury (and even intends this to be the case). But suppose that John doesn’t believe, and so isn’t aware, that harming Mary is wrong, perhaps because he was raised in an extremely sexist society in which it’s widely assumed that men are allowed to harm women in response to perceived threats to their manhood (think of the many places in which ‘honor killings’ against women are still considered acceptable). In this variant, John acts from moral ignorance, not factual ignorance, and yet volitionists claim that since John is unaware that what he’s doing is wrong, the argument applies to him in this variant as well: he is blameworthy for his action only if he is blameworthy for his (moral) ignorance, and he is blameworthy for the latter only if it derives from a blameworthy benighting act, such as knowingly refusing to question his sexist beliefs. If these conditions aren’t met, volitionists claim that John is excused, because according to them non-culpable ignorance, be it factual or moral, always exculpate. This is what Rosen (2003) calls the ‘Parity Thesis’. (Husak 2016 offers a book-length defense of the idea that legal ignorance also excuses, which has several points in common with the volitionists’ position. See Yaffe 2018 for criticism.)

Rosen (2004: 305–6; see also Levy 2011: 141) even claims that if an agent is aware that her contemplated act is morally wrong but fails to believe that it’s all-things-considered wrong, perhaps because she believes that sometimes self-interest trumps morality, she also acts from ignorance (in this case, ignorance of ‘the rational force of moral considerations’), which means that the regress argument also applies to her. Thus, volitionists think that ignorant wrongdoing is extremely widespread (especially because they think that lack of occurrent belief counts as ignorance), and this is why the regress argument applies to all wrongdoers except for akratic ones. Therefore, the argument ultimately threatens to undermine attributions of responsibility quite generally.[6]

It seems to most philosophers that something has gone awry at this point, for (the assumption seems to be) it can’t be the case that the requirements of the EC are so stringent that most ordinary wrongdoers, particularly morally ignorant ones (Schnall 2004: 308), fail to meet them and so turn out to be blameless after all (FitzPatrick 2008: 610; Peels 2011: 578; Clarke 2014: 162). The challenge is to articulate what exactly is wrong with the regress argument. It will be useful to spell out its four main theses:

  1. Derivative Blameworthiness for Actions. An agent is blameworthy for a wrongful action performed out of ignorance only if (and because) she is culpable for the ignorance from which she acts.[7]
  2. Derivative Blameworthiness for Ignorance. Ignorance is culpable only if it derives from a benighting act performed in full awareness.
  3. Awareness. Relevant awareness (for ordinary actions and benighting acts) involves occurrent and de dicto beliefs about the action’s overall wrongness.
  4. Parity. Theses i and ii apply to all kinds of ignorance.

In the next section we’ll survey the main responses to the regress argument. Each of these responses denies one or more of the argument’s main theses and, in so doing, develop alternative interpretations of the EC. (See Wieland 2017a for another presentation of the competing positions in this debate.)

3. Responses to Revisionism

Volitionists argue that the intuitive thought that responsibility requires awareness, pursued to its ultimate consequences, subverts ordinary judgments of blameworthiness. So, in order to respond to the revisionist interpretation of the EC, that intuitive thought needs to be reexamined. Responses to revisionism vary according to how much they are willing to depart from it. Some philosophers agree that responsibility requires awareness, but argue that the requisite awareness doesn’t necessarily involve an occurrent belief concerning the action’s overall wrongness (sect. 3.1, ‘Weakened internalism’). Other philosophers claim that, while awareness of wrongdoing is required for culpability for actions, such awareness isn’t required when it comes to assessing culpability for ignorance itself (sect. 3.2, ‘Ignorance and epistemic vices’). A third group maintains that the required awareness concerns only the factual aspects of one’s action, not the moral ones, at least not conceived in a de dicto way (sect. 3.3, ‘Quality of will’). Finally, some philosophers contend that in certain cases awareness isn’t required at all: agents can be blameworthy for fully unwitting acts provided that certain other conditions are met (sect. 3.4, ‘Capacitarianism’). Despite their differences, what these positions have in common is the goal of denying the akrasia requirement on blameworthiness.

3.1 Weakened Internalism

The most conservative strategy for attacking the revisionist interpretation of the EC accepts the bulk of the regress argument (theses i, ii and iv) but denies that occurrent awareness of wrongdoing (that is, clear-eyed akrasia) is necessary for blameworthiness (thesis iii). According to this position, a weaker kind of awareness—constituted by dispositional, dormant, tacit, or unconscious beliefs—is all that the EC requires (Haji 1997; Peels 2011; Timpe 2011; Husak 2011; Levy 2013 & 2014: ch. 2; Nelkin & Rickless 2017a: 127). Other proponents of this strategy deny that the content of the requisite awareness must involve a belief in the action’s overall wrongness and claim that a belief in there being sufficient reasons not to perform the action (Robichaud 2014), a belief in one’s acting from morally reproachable reasons (Sartorio 2017), or a belief in there being a non-negligible risk that one’s action is wrong (Guerrero 2007; Nelkin & Rickless 2017a), can be enough for blameworthiness. (See also Levy 2014 [ch. 2] who claims that responsibility requires awareness of the facts that give the action its moral valence rather than awareness of moral wrongness. Cf. Levy 2011 [ch. 6, esp. 141] and fn. 3 above.) We’ll call this position ‘weakened internalism’: ‘internalism’ because, like volitionism, it assumes that what the EC requires is the presence of certain mental states that track the action’s moral valence as it appears to the agent (Levy 2009); ‘weakened’ because, unlike volitionism, it allows for the possibility that non-occurrent mental states, as well as beliefs that fall short of full-blown akrasia, satisfy the EC.

In defense of the volitionist position, Zimmerman offers this argument:

if a belief is not occurrent, then one cannot act either with the intention to heed the belief or with the intention not to heed it; if one has no such intention, then one cannot act either deliberately on or deliberately despite the belief; if this is so, then the belief plays no role in the reason for which one performs one’s action; and one incurs culpability for one’s action only if one’s belief concerning wrongdoing plays a role in the reason for which one performs the action. (1997: 421–2)

In reply, the weakened internalist argues that it’s false that only occurrent beliefs play a role in the reasons for which one acts, and so it’s false that an occurrent belief concerning wrongdoing is necessary for knowingly doing wrong (Peels 2011: 581–2). Take a non-moral example first: one can decide to go to the park because one occurrently believes that a break from work is in order, while also (albeit dispositionally) believing that the park is a nice place, that one’s friends frequently gather at the park, that there are often amusing performances taking place there, etc. All these beliefs can play a role in the reasons for which one decides to go to the park, even though they are dispositional rather than occurrent. Something similar holds in cases of wrongdoing: returning to our example, suppose that while John is preparing his attack on Mary, the only beliefs he occurrently holds concern various aspects of his plan and ways of carrying it out undetected. Still, he may hold the dispositional belief that what he is planning to do is wrong and, just as in the park example, this belief can play a role in the reasons for which he does wrong (for instance, John may decide to proceed with this plan despite dispositionally believing it’s wrong to do so). It thus seems that John is blameworthy despite his belief about wrongdoing not being occurrent (Timpe 2011: 23; Levy 2014: 31). If this is correct, then clear-eyed akrasia isn’t necessary for blameworthiness.

This contention can be bolstered by appealing to cases of self-deception (Haji 1997: 537–9). Suppose that Susan is deliberating whether to pay her taxes. Lately she has been spending significant amounts of time with some libertarian (in the political sense) friends who try to convince her that she has no obligation to pay taxes because the government is illegitimate. Susan doesn’t find their arguments very convincing, but her strong desire to fit in leads her to form a conscious judgment that she shouldn’t pay her taxes. At the same time, however, she has an unconscious or dispositional belief that it’s all-things-considered wrong not to pay taxes. If Susan ends up not paying taxes, it seems correct to say that she did so despite her (dispositional) belief that her omission is all-things-considered wrong. So this belief did play a role in the reasons for which she acted, even though it was merely dispositional (recall that, according to Zimmerman, a belief plays a role in one’s reasons if one either acts on the belief or despite the belief). Susan was “unconsciously aware” (Haji 1997: 544) that not paying taxes is wrong and this, according to the weakened internalist, suffices for satisfying the requirement of awareness of moral significance and thus for Susan to be blameworthy. So, once again, clear-eyed akrasia isn’t necessary for blameworthiness. On the further assumption that dispositional beliefs about wrongdoing are much more common than occurrent ones, the weakened internalist position would have shown that the revisionist consequences of the regress argument aren’t as severe as originally thought.

Another line of argument exploited by weakened internalists denies that the content of the requisite awareness must involve a belief in the action’s overall wrongness. For instance, Guerrero (2007: 78) argues that if an agent is unsure whether the action she is planning to undertake is permissible or not, and so admits the possibility that it might well be wrong, she can be blameworthy for carrying it out even in the absence of clear-eyed akrasia and even if her ignorance (which is manifested here as lack of certainty) is blameless. (Thus Guerrero, unlike other weakened internalists, deny thesis i of the regress argument, since in his view ignorant wrongdoing can be culpable in the absence of culpable ignorance.) This is because there is an independently plausible moral principle that urges restraint in the face of uncertainty regarding the potential harms that our actions might bring about (2007: 79). Similarly, Nelkin and Rickless (2017a: 121–2) claim that being aware of doing something that poses a risk of forgetting relevant information can anchor responsibility for unwitting wrongdoing, even in the absence of an akratic decision to assume the risk.

In turn, Robichaud (2014) claims that a belief in there being sufficient (albeit not decisive) reasons to perform an action satisfies the requirement of awareness of moral significance, which entails that one can be blameworthy for performing an action one believes there are sufficient (albeit not decisive) reasons to avoid. (Relatedly, Sartorio [2017: 24–8] argues that one can be blameworthy if one is aware that one is acting from morally reproachable reasons, regardless of whether one is also aware that one’s action is overall morally wrong.) In so arguing, Robichaud denies an important implicit assumption in the regress argument, namely that an agent can rationally comply with an obligation (moral or epistemic), and thus can reasonably be expected to do so, only if she believes that she ought to comply with it and therefore believes she has decisive reasons in its favor (Levy 2009). On the contrary, Robichaud argues that for a course of action to be rationally open for an agent it isn’t necessary that she believes she has decisive reasons in its favor; a belief concerning sufficient reasons is enough (Robichaud 2014: 142). See Levy 2016 for criticism.

3.2 Ignorance and Epistemic Vices

The next position we’ll consider goes a step further in rejecting the idea that responsibility requires awareness. According to this position, ignorant wrongdoers can be culpable for their ignorance (and for actions performed out of it) even if the benighting acts that produced it were themselves performed out of ignorance of their wrongness. For this to be the case, it is claimed, is sufficient if in performing benighting acts agents exhibit epistemic vices that explain why they failed to improve their epistemic position. On this view, then, the regress in the volitionists’ argument doesn’t necessarily terminate in an episode of clear-eyed akrasia; it can also terminate in epistemically vicious conduct, regardless of whether the agent conceives it as such (Montmarquet 1995 & 1999; FitzPatrick 2008 & 2017). Notice that this position is less conservative than weakened internalism, since in the latter view culpability for ignorance requires awareness that one has sufficient reasons to comply with certain epistemic obligations (Robichaud 2014: 145). By contrast, in the position currently under review no such awareness is required: an agent’s epistemic vices might blind her to these reasons, and yet she can be blameworthy for ignorance resulting from her failure to comply with her epistemic obligations (Montmarquet 1999: 845; FitzPatrick 2008: 606).

Philosophers who espouse this position thus deny thesis ii of the regress argument (according to which ignorance is culpable only if it derives from a benighting act performed in awareness of its wrongness) and, consequently, also deny thesis iii (that responsibility requires occurrent and de dicto beliefs about the action’s overall wrongness), but only regarding benighting acts. So they in effect posit an asymmetry in the epistemic requirements on blameworthiness: while blameworthiness for ordinary actions does require awareness of wrongdoing, blameworthiness for benighting acts and subsequent ignorance doesn’t (FitzPatrick 2008: 609; see Levy 2009: 741 for criticism of this asymmetry). A further consequence is that they accept thesis i (that blameworthiness for actions performed out of ignorance is always derivative) for all actions except for benighting acts (FitzPatrick 2008: 609 n.37; 2017: 32); and accept thesis iv as well (that both factual and moral ignorance can exculpate) (FitzPatrick 2008: 602; 2017: 35).

FitzPatrick (2008) illustrates this position with the case of Mr. Potter, a powerful businessman who engages in ruthless business practices while thinking they are “permissibly aggressive”, therefore acting from ignorance of their wrongness. FitzPatrick (2008: 601, 609) agrees with volitionists that Mr. Potter is blameworthy for his ruthless business behavior only if (and because) he is blameworthy for the ignorance from which he acts; and also agrees that if it turned out that he’s blameless for the latter, he’d be blameless for the former as well (2008: 602). But FitzPatrick sharply disagrees with volitionists on the conditions that must be satisfied for ignorance to be culpable. In his view, ignorance is culpable when it results from the violation of epistemic obligations regarding which the agent could reasonably have been expected to comply given her cognitive capacities and the opportunities provided by her social context, and when such violation is due to the agent’s epistemic vices such as “overconfidence, arrogance, dismissiveness, laziness, dogmatism, incuriosity, self-indulgence, contempt, and so on” (2008: 609). According to FitzPatrick, when this is the case the agent bears direct responsibility for her ignorance even if her benighting acts—i.e., the acts that evinced the epistemic vices just listed —were themselves performed out of ignorance of their wrongness. (FitzPatrick’s position, according to which culpability for unwitting wrongdoing is partially explained by the fact that the ignorant agent should and could have known better has important similarities with the capacitarian view discussed in sect. 3.4 below.)

This conception of culpable ignorance has been criticized on the grounds that it isn’t reasonable to expect epistemically vicious agents like Mr. Potter to do anything substantial to avoid or remedy their ignorance, at least not in the sense of ‘reasonable expectation’ relevant for attributions of responsibility (Levy 2009; Talbert 2013: 230–3). Levy argues that agents are blameworthy only “if it is reasonable to expect them to conform their behavior to the appropriate normative standards” and this, in turn, requires that “conforming their behavior to normative standards is something they can do rationally (and not merely by chance or accident)” (2009: 735). However, Levy argues, the notion of rationality relevant here is a “thoroughly internalist one”, having to do with “what I can decide to do as the result of engaging in reasoning”, that is, by deliberating on the reasons I think I have for pursuing different courses of action (2009: 735). But in this internalist sense of ‘rational’, it isn’t rational for Mr. Potter to do anything to correct his moral outlook, given that by his lights the challenges to it that he encounters can rightly be dismissed as irrelevant. Levy concedes that in so thinking Mr. Potter exhibits epistemic vices, “but because he does not conceive of them as vices, he has no internal reason” for mending his ways and so it isn’t reasonable to expect him to do so (2009: 737). (See FitzPatrick 2017 for his response.)

In his arguments against the akrasia requirement on culpable ignorance, Montmarquet goes further than FitzPatrick in that he denies the thesis of doxastic involuntarism that plays an important role in the regress argument. While FitzPatrick’s objective is to establish direct culpability for “epistemically debilitating choices” (2008: 609, italics added), Montmarquet’s main claim is that culpability for beliefs themselves can be “fundamental and underived” (1995: 43). This is because, in his view, agents possess “direct (albeit incomplete) control” (1999: 844) over the formation of their beliefs. He agrees with volitionists that

if an agent is culpably ignorant of some fact, there will always have been some possible act or omission, but for which this ignorance would not have existed, (1995: 42)

but he thinks that talk of benighting acts distracts us from the true source of culpable ignorance, which is an “intellectually irresponsible attitude” and associated beliefs rather than “the acts and omissions to which that attitude and those beliefs led [the agent]” (1995: 43).

In order to support his contention that agents can be directly culpable for holding certain beliefs, Montmarquet (1999: 844) argues, against Zimmerman 1997, that agents can in fact directly control their beliefs by exercising direct control over the degree of care with which they form them. He offers the analogy of whistling carefully: one can directly control the care one exerts in whistling, but this doesn’t imply that the whistling itself is only indirectly in one’s control; on the contrary, one directly controls both. If the analogy holds, given that agents can directly control how careful they are in forming their beliefs, they can also directly control their beliefs themselves and so it would follow that agents can be directly blameworthy for forming beliefs carelessly and for the carelessly formed beliefs themselves. In response, Zimmerman (2002a; 2008: 183–9) points out a disanalogy between the cases of whistling carefully and forming beliefs carefully: while whistling is itself an action, believing something isn’t an action but a (mental) state, which can be the result of the action of taking care in forming beliefs. However, since we don’t have direct control over the results of our non-basic actions (taking care in forming beliefs being one of them), Zimmerman concludes that we lack direct control over our beliefs and so we can’t be directly responsible for them (2008: 188–9).

3.3 Quality of Will

We turn now to examine a family of views that resist the regress argument by appealing to Strawson’s (1962 [2003]) influential idea that praise-/blameworthiness tracks the agent’s quality of will. There are different ways of cashing out what exactly ‘quality of will’ means (Shoemaker 2013), but the basic idea is this: an agent is praiseworthy for an action or an attitude that accords with the demands of morality if the performance of the action or the holding of the attitude arises from proper regard or concern for another person’s morally significant interests. Conversely, an agent is blameworthy for an action or attitude that conflicts with the demands of morality if the performance of the action or the holding of the attitude arises from lack of proper regard or concern for those same interests. The key insight that quality-of-will theorists bring to bear on the debate over the EC is that an agent need not believe that her action is right/wrong (or that she has reasons in favor or against doing it, or that she is doing something morally risky) for the action to express the quality of her will and thus for her to be praise-/blameworthy in performing it. For example, when an ancient slaveholder beats her slave she clearly evinces lack of regard for the slave’s interests, quite irrespectively of what her owns views about the permissibility of slavery are or whether she has ever paused to consider the issue (Rosen 2003: 72). Thus, if an agent’s evinced quality of will is all that matters for blameworthiness (something that Rosen denies), the slaveholder is manifestly blameworthy. On this view, then, de dicto awareness of the action’s moral significance isn’t required for blameworthiness (Fields 1994; Arpaly 2003 & 2015; Harman 2011 & 2015; Talbert 2013 & 2017a; Littlejohn 2014; Mason 2015; Björnsson 2017b; Weatherson 2019: ch. 5), and the same goes for praiseworthiness (Arpaly 2003 & 2015).[8], [9]

What kind of awareness is required according to quality-of-will theorists? In their view, when assessing epistemic requirements on responsibility

we should consider what a wrongdoer needs to know in order for her actions to express the attitudes and judgments that make blame appropriate. (Talbert 2013: 242)

Quality-of-will theorists usually agree that for actions to express the relevant attitudes and judgments factual awareness is required: the agent has to be aware of what she is doing and what the probable consequences of her action are (Talbert 2017a: 47, 53; Harman 2011: 465; 2015: 67; Arpaly 2015: 151). (Angela Smith 2005 & 2017 disagrees, arguing that failures of factual awareness, such as forgetting a friend’s birthday, sometimes reveal inadequate moral concern and thus are blameworthy. See also Björnsson 2017b: 152. Cf. Holly Smith 2011; Talbert 2017b.) As we just saw, they also agree that de dicto moral awareness isn’t required. However, they disagree on whether de re moral awareness—awareness of the action’s right-/wrong-making features regardless of whether one conceives them as such—is required or not. Some think it is (Talbert 2013: 242; 2017a: 53; Harman 2011: 465; 2015: 67), while others think it isn’t.

The clearest advocate of the latter position is Arpaly (2003 & 2015). In her view, quality of will is essentially related to responsiveness to moral reasons, understood as

[wanting] noninstrumentally to take courses of action that have those features that are (whether or not [one] describes them this way) right-making and not to take courses of action that have those features that are (whether or not [one] describes them this way) wrong-making features. (Arpaly 2003: 79)

The key claim Arpaly defends is that responding in this sense to moral reasons doesn’t require awareness of the features to which one is responding. Her central example is the much-discussed case of Huckleberry Finn, who helps Jim the runaway slave to escape despite believing that he is acting wrongly in “stealing” from Jim’s “owner”. Huck does the right thing and, according to Arpaly, does it for the right reasons, namely in response to Jim’s humanity (Arpaly 2003: 77). At the same time, however, Huck is unaware that he is helping Jim because he is a person like himself (although he is aware that he is facilitating Jim’s flight). He “is not capable of bringing to consciousness his nonconscious awareness” of Jim’s humanity (Arpaly 2003: 77), and thus fails to acquire de re awareness of the central right-making feature of his action. Since Huck seems to be praiseworthy despite lacking moral awareness (both de dicto and de re), Arpaly concludes that this kind of awareness isn’t required for praiseworthiness, and something parallel holds for blameworthiness (Arpaly 2015: 151–2).

Not everyone agrees with Arpaly’s verdict on this case, however. Sliwa (2017) challenges the intuition that Huck is morally praiseworthy, arguing that praise is ordinarily bestowed only on those agents who intentionally do the right thing. Given that Huck doesn’t know what the right thing to do in his situation is, he can’t do the right thing intentionally (although he intentionally performs an action that is in fact right), because intentional action incorporates, quite generally, a “know how” requirement (Sliwa 2017: 128–30). Since in the case of morally significant actions the required know-how incorporates both non-moral and moral knowledge (2017: 131), this, on Sliwa’s view, supports the thesis that praise-/blameworthiness does require moral knowledge (and thus moral awareness). (Zimmerman 2008: 201 argues that Huck is actually blameworthy, given that he acts on the belief that his action is overall morally wrong.)

It’s important to emphasize the extent of the disagreement between quality-of-will theorists and volitionists. The former initially reject thesis iii of the regress argument, since they deny that de dicto awareness of the action’s moral significance is necessary for praise-/blameworthiness. But this rejection ultimately leads them to deny all four of the regress argument’s main theses. Since quality-of-will theorists maintain that moral knowledge isn’t required for praise-/blameworthiness, they thus hold that moral ignorance (even if blameless) doesn’t stand in the way of either praise or blame, therefore denying thesis iv (the Parity Thesis) (Harman 2011: 465; 2015: 65; Talbert 2013: 242; Arpaly 2015: 151; Weatherson 2019: ch. 5). Also, since in their view what matters for blameworthiness is whether the agent exhibits ill will in performing some action, blameworthiness for ignorant wrongdoing can be direct—it needn’t derive from culpability for ignorance. This amounts to a rejection of thesis i when moral ignorance is at stake (Harman 2011 & 2015; Talbert 2013; Arpaly 2015; Weatherson 2019: ch. 5). Finally, and in opposition to thesis ii, some quality-of-will theorists claim that moral ignorance can be directly blameworthy, given that one’s mistaken moral beliefs may reveal an inadequate degree of moral concern (Harman 2011: 460; 2015: 68; see also Adams 1985: 19. Cf. Arpaly 2003: 105–6). Thus, after rejecting all the basic theses of the regress argument, quality-of-will theorists conclude that culpability for ignorant wrongdoing (and for ignorance itself) is much more prevalent than volitionists think.

For instance, on Talbert’s (2013 & 2017a) account it will often be the case that morally ignorant wrongdoers are blameworthy, because

[e]ven if a wrongdoer is ignorant of the fact that her behavior is wrong, and even if this ignorance is not her fault, her actions may still express the contemptuous judgment that certain others do not merit consideration, that their interests do not matter, and that their objections can be overlooked. (Talbert 2013: 234)

Talbert concedes that if a wrongdoer’s moral ignorance isn’t her fault, it may well be the case that she’s unable to rationally do the right thing. But far from showing that she’s thus blameless, what this shows according to Talbert is that “having subjective rational access to avoiding an action is not a requirement on being properly blamed for that action” (Talbert 2013: 239; cf. Björnsson 2017b: 149). This stands in sharp opposition to one of the volitionists’ central convictions—a conviction that grounds their commitment to the importance of de dicto moral awareness—namely that “It is unfair to blame someone for doing something if he blamelessly believes that there is no compelling moral reason not to do it” (Rosen 2003: 74; see also Levy 2009: 738). Talbert responds to the charge of unfairness by claiming that there is nothing unfair in blaming someone who knowingly (in the factual sense) and deliberately has harmed us, even if we concede that it isn’t reasonable to expect her to have avoided her moral ignorance and acted rightly (Talbert 2013: 238; 2017a: 53. See also Scanlon 2008: 186–8; Arpaly 2003: 172–3; 2015: 155; Harman 2015: 66). However, by divorcing blameworthiness from reasonable expectations about avoiding wrongdoing, Talbert’s position, and that of other quality-of-will theorists, is vulnerable to the charge that it misses the crucial connection between blameworthiness and desert, namely that blameworthy agents deserve certain negative reactions and adverse treatment partly because, and only if, it was reasonable to expect them to do better (FitzPatrick 2017: 33; Levy 2011: 194–5).

It becomes apparent at this point that the disagreement between quality-of-will theorists and the rest concerning the EC is ultimately grounded on different conceptions of responsibility and blameworthiness (Wieland 2017a: 5; see the Conclusion below). On the one hand, philosophers of different persuasions regarding the EC—volitionists, weakened internalists, epistemic vice theorists, and capacitarians—appeal to elements associated with responsibility as accountability, such as the relevance of the agent’s capacities and opportunities to avoid wrongdoing and the concomitant reasonable expectations. (Of course, they disagree about how to characterize these elements, and this disagreement partly explains why they have different conceptions of the EC. See for instance the exchanges between FitzPatrick 2008 & 2017 and Levy 2009 & 2011: ch. 5; between Clarke 2017a and Levy 2017; and between Robichaud 2014 and Levy 2016.) On the other hand, quality-of-will theorists appeal to elements associated with responsibility as attributability, such as the centrality of the agent’s “moral orientation” (Talbert 2017a: 48) or “deep self” (Wolf 1987) for blameworthiness and the comparative irrelevance of historical factors about how the agent came to have the moral orientation or deep self she has (Arpaly 2003: 172–3; Harman 2011: 462; Talbert 2017b: 19) or whether she could have avoided wrongdoing (Scanlon 2008: 186–8; Talbert 2017a: 48). For the distinction between different types of responsibility see Watson 1996, Shoemaker 2011, and Zimmerman 2015.

3.4 Capacitarianism

The fourth type of response to the regress argument is the one that departs more radically from the idea that responsibility requires awareness. According to it, agents can be directly blameworthy not only for actions and omissions performed out of moral ignorance, but also for actions and omissions performed out of factual ignorance; that is, for fully unwitting wrongful conduct. (Recall that quality-of-will theorists restrict their claims to morally ignorant wrongdoing. Again, exceptions are Angela Smith 2005 & 2017 and Björnsson 2017b.) Since what all the adherents to this position have in common is the idea that blameworthiness in these cases is largely (though not exclusively) explained by the presence of certain capacities possession of which makes the agent capable of acquiring the relevant awareness, their position can be dubbed ‘capacitarianism’. In their view, the best formulation of the EC is disjunctive (Sher 2009: 87): agents satisfy the epistemic requirements on responsibility either if they are aware of the relevant factual and moral considerations or if they should and could be aware of them given the available evidence, the opportunity to adequately process it, and their cognitive capacities. Capacitarians differ on what else (if anything) has to be added to the second disjunct, but they all agree that a central element in the explanation of blameworthiness for ignorant wrongdoing is the fact that the agent should and could have known better than she did (FitzPatrick 2008 & 2017; Sher 2009; Clarke 2014 & 2017a, b; Murray 2017; Rudy-Hiller 2017; Amaya & Doris 2015; Murray & Vargas 2018 [Other Internet Resources]; Vargas 2018 [Other Internet Resources]).[10]

An important motivation for this view is to account for cases in which people seem to be blameworthy for unwitting omissions despite the fact that: i) the omissions and attendant failures of awareness aren’t explicable in terms of ill will; and ii) blameworthiness can’t be traced back to a previous failure to discharge some obligation (Sher 2017b). Staple cases of this sort are forgetting cases, such as this one (see also Clarke 2014: 164–5):

Hot Dog. Alessandra, a soccer mom, has gone to pick up her children at their elementary school. As usual, Alessandra is accompanied by the family’s border collie, Bathsheba, who rides in the back of the van. Although it is very hot, the pick-up has never taken long, so Alessandra leaves Sheba in the van while she goes to gather her children. This time, however, Alessandra is greeted by a tangled tale of misbehavior, ill-considered punishment, and administrative bungling which requires several hours of indignant sorting out. During that time, Sheba languishes, forgotten, in the locked car. When Alessandra and her children finally make it to the parking lot, they find Sheba unconscious from heat prostration. (Sher 2009: 24)

In this example, Alessandra is intuitively blameworthy for omitting to let the dog out of the van. But her wrongful omission is fully unwitting: she’s unaware not only of its wrongness but even of the fact that she’s omitting to do something she ought to do in the first place. Importantly, as the case is described there is no reason to think that Alessandra’s omission stems from ill will towards the dog or towards those who love the dog, such as her children (Sher 2009: 37, 91; see also Clarke 2017a: 246; King 2009: 584–5; Amaya & Doris 2015: 266; Murray 2017: 516). Rather, what explains her failure of awareness isn’t flawed character traits or lack of regard for morally significant interests, but simply the cognitive and emotional load placed upon her by the unusual situation at the school (Sher 2009: 131), which, by assumption, wasn’t overwhelming enough to excuse her for her omission (see Amaya & Doris 2015: 263). Finally, it’s implausible to try to account for Alessandra’s blameworthiness by positing a previous failure to discharge some obligation of due care—like setting the alarm on her phone to remind her of the dog—since the situation was unpredictable (Sher 2009: 35–6) and intending to let the dog stay in the car for a couple of minutes doesn’t seem to be wrong (cf. Nelkin & Rickless 2017a who claim that in this sort of cases there usually is a previous violation of an obligation related to preventing the episode of forgetfulness). The omission in question is just a regrettable but, according to capacitarians, culpable mistake (Amaya & Doris 2015; Murray 2017: 516). So if intuitions about responsibility in this sort of cases aren’t misleading, neither awareness nor ill will are necessary for blameworthiness. (Levy [2017] and Talbert [2017b] offer empirically-based error theories according to which intuitions in these cases are misleading because people tend to misattribute lack of moral concern to unwitting wrongdoers based solely on the consequences of their actions, and this mistaken attribution is then used as grounds for blaming them. But Murray et al. [2019] provide contrary empirical evidence suggesting that what drives ordinary people to assign responsibility in forgetting cases is mainly the presence of an adequate opportunity to remember rather than the level of concern the forgetful agent displayed toward what she was supposed to do.)

The challenge for capacitarians is then to explain three things: i) what norms support the claim that unwitting wrongdoers should have known better; ii) what capacities justify the assumption that unwitting wrongdoers could have known better; and iii) why its being true that an unwitting wrongdoer should and could have known better grounds responsibility for unwitting wrongdoing.[11]

Before going into the details of how capacitarians answer these questions, let’s see what theses of the regress argument are denied by them. All capacitarians (with the exception of FitzPatrick, see fn. 10) reject theses i and iii, since they are united in the beliefs that blameworthiness for unwitting conduct can be direct and needn’t trace back to culpable ignorance (against thesis i), and also that factual awareness—and a fortiori occurrent and de dicto moral awareness—isn’t necessary for direct responsibility (against thesis iii). Since capacitarians usually focus on factual rather than on moral ignorance, they usually leave thesis iv (Parity) untouched (but see Sher 2017a). However, they seem to be committed to accepting it, given that a crucial aspect of the capacitarian view is that agents are excused for their unwitting wrongdoing whenever isn’t reasonable to expect them to know better due to an unfavorable epistemic situation (Sher 2017a; Clarke 2017a: 242; Murray 2017: 515, 521; Rudy-Hiller 2017: 408). But since sometimes a situation is epistemically unfavorable for forming correct moral beliefs (FitzPatrick 2017: 34–6), it follows from the capacitarian view that at least in some such circumstances agents are excused for not knowing better in moral matters (FitzPatrick 2008: 602). Finally, there is disagreement among capacitarians whether thesis ii (that blameworthiness for ignorance is necessarily derivative) is true or not. Clarke (2014: 171, 173; 2017a: 245–6) tentatively accepts it, since he thinks that failures of awareness aren’t culpable if they don’t result from a culpable benighting action or omission. At the same time, he denies that culpability for ignorant wrongdoing necessitates culpability for the underlying ignorance (Clarke 2017a: 246), thus avoiding the regress in the volitionists’ argument. In Clarke’s view, then, an agent can be blameworthy for an unwitting wrongful action even if the ignorance from which she acts isn’t culpable, as long as such ignorance is substandard—and therefore faulty (Clarke 2017a: 245). (Note that the soundness of this move rests on the defensibility of the distinction between culpable and faulty ignorance. See Rudy-Hiller [2017: 416] for criticism.) By contrast, Rudy-Hiller (2017: 413) rejects thesis ii, since he claims that an agent is directly blameworthy for her ignorance if she is capable of gaining the required awareness and there is no significant impediment to the exercise of the relevant cognitive capacities.

Let’s return now to the three central questions capacitarians must answer to give plausibility to their view. The first concerns the nature of the norms of awareness supporting the claim that certain unwitting wrongdoers should have known better. The central function of these norms is to set a standard against which failures of awareness are evaluated to determine which ones are defective and which don’t. When failures of awareness aren’t defective, it isn’t the case that the involved agents should have known better and thus they are excused for their unwitting wrongdoing. Capacitarians agree that norms of awareness are sensitive to the agent’s cognitive capacities and circumstances (Sher 2009: 110; Clarke 2014: 167; Murray 2017: 516; Rudy-Hiller 2017: 413; FitzPatrick 2017: 37). They also agree that these norms are derivative, in the sense that both their content (the considerations agents should be aware of) and their normative force (their bindingness on agents) come from another set of norms, namely moral ones. In other words, it’s because awareness of certain considerations is necessary for fulfilling moral obligations that such awareness can be demanded of agents (Sher 2009: 111–2; Murray 2017: 515).

It’s crucial to note that the norms of awareness capacitarians rely on to substantiate should-have-known allegations aren’t duties of inquiry. While norms of awareness directly demand awareness of relevant considerations, duties of inquiry impose obligations to undertake information-gathering actions that contribute to the occurrence of such awareness (Rosen 2004: 302; 2008: 600–1; H. Smith 2014; Wieland 2017a: 6–8). In other words, while norms of awareness are concerned with agents’ states of mind, duties of inquiry are concerned with agents’ activities.[12] This naturally generates the following worry concerning norms of awareness: given that “becoming aware is not something we do but something that happens to us” (Sher 2009: 112; see also Rosen 2004: 302; 2008: 600), one might wonder whether the should-have-known criterion can be used to undergird blameworthiness after all. If failures of awareness escape the agent’s direct control, how could it be true that such involuntary failures partly explain direct responsibility for unwitting wrongdoing? (Nelkin 2011: 679–80; Nelkin & Rickless 2015).

Capacitarians have different responses to this worry. Sher (2009: 147–8) ultimately rejects the control condition on moral responsibility in favor of an origination requirement (see below). Clarke, who holds on to the control condition, denies that norms of awareness give rise to moral obligations; in his view, they merely set a standard for evaluating failures of awareness as faulty or not (2014: 167). Rudy-Hiller (2017: 418) advances a notion of control according to which agents do have responsibility-relevant control over their states of awareness and so they can be morally obligated to remember or notice morally significant considerations. Finally, Murray (2017) describes, and offers empirical evidence for, a distinctive ‘vigilance’ capacity that enables agents to become aware of relevant considerations and which, according to him, affords them direct control over the degree of awareness they display.

The second central question for capacitarians is which capacities make it true that an unwitting wrongdoer could have known better. Clarke offers the following characterization of them:

Some are capacities to do things that are in a plain sense active: to turn one’s attention to, or maintain attention on, some matter; to raise a question in one’s mind or pursue some line of inquiry; to make a decision about whether to do this or that. Others, though capacities to do things, aren’t capacities whose exercise consists in intentional action. These include capacities to remember, to think of relevant considerations, to notice features of one’s situation and appreciate their normative significance, to think at appropriate times to do things that need doing. (2017a: 242)

Capacitarians then appeal to the idea of unexercised capacities to explain why certain unwitting wrongdoers could have been aware of relevant considerations: it’s because those wrongdoers possess the requisite cognitive capacities, but failed to exercise them despite the absence of significant impediments, that they could have known better (Clarke 2017a: 242; 2017b: 67; Murray 2017: 520; Rudy-Hiller 2017: 407; Vargas 2018: 15 [Other Internet Resources]).

Several objections can be raised at this point. First, notice that even cognitive capacities that issue in intentional actions (such as raising a question in one’s mind) don’t provide direct control over awareness of relevant considerations but only favor its occurrence, which remains out of one’s control (Rosen 2004: 302; Montmarquet 1999: 845). So, under the assumption that control is required for responsibility, it remains unclear how failures of awareness contribute to explaining direct blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing (Nelkin & Rickless 2015. For a similar objection stated in terms of choice rather than control, see Moore & Hurd 2011: 164). Second, and relatedly, the claim that possession of these capacities ground reasonable expectations of the sort that are relevant for attributions of responsibility (Clarke 2017a: 242; 2017b: 67) can be disputed, for since the exercise of some of these capacities isn’t under our control, whether they are displayed or not is a chance occurrence and chance occurrences can’t ground reasonable expectations (Levy 2017: 255. Clarke 2017a: 249–50 offers a brief response to this objection).

Third and finally, it has been doubted whether capacitarians have a convincing story about what it takes to have the relevant unexercised cognitive capacities (Levy 2014: 124–5; Moore & Hurd 2011: 160–1). Sher, for instance, relies on a counterfactual account of capacities, according to which saying that someone was capable of noticing, remembering, thinking of something, etc., “is only to say that he would have remembered [noticed, thought of] in an appropriate range of alternative situations” (2009: 114, italics added). The crucial task is of course to define what the appropriate range is, since, intuitively, one doesn’t have a capacity to X if one would only very rarely successfully X in a range of relevant scenarios. For instance, it might be argued that Alessandra can’t be credited with the possession of the relevant cognitive capacity if we assume, plausibly, that she would only very rarely remember the dog in a range of similar situations to the one she actually confronted. If one were to respond that it suffices for attributing the relevant unexercised capacity that there is a counterfactual scenario in which Alessandra does remember the dog, this would objectionably lower the bar for attributing unexercised capacities, with the consequence that many intuitively blameless unwitting wrongdoers would turn out to be blameworthy after all (Levy 2014: 125). (See Vargas 2013 [ch. 7] and Vargas 2018 [Other Internet Resources] for a version of the counterfactual account that attempts to give more precision to the ‘appropriate range’ criterion for attributing unexercised capacities.)

Alternatively, some capacitarians attribute unexercised capacities by appealing not to counterfactual scenarios but to the agent’s past performances in similar situations (Clarke 2014: 166; 2017a: 244; Rudy-Hiller 2017: 407–8). This move raises problems of its own, however, since, on the one hand, an agent might possess a relevant cognitive capacity—for instance a quite good capacity to remember certain considerations—despite the fact that she often fails to exercise it perhaps because she doesn’t care much about those considerations (Nelkin & Rickless 2015; see also Nelkin & Rickless 2017a: 112–3). On the other hand, an agent’s past performances aren’t necessarily a good proxy for attributing her a certain unexercised capacity now, since despite her previous successes she might have lost the relevant capacity in the meantime and so it would be unfair to fault her for her current lack of awareness (Sher 2009: 109).

The third central question for capacitarians is why the truth of the should-and-could-have-known-better clause contributes to explaining blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing and what, if anything, has to be added to the explanation. Sher states the worry in this way:

the reason the agent’s actual awareness seems significant is that it implies that the act’s being wrong or foolish is among the total set of considerations in light of which he chose to perform it. To whatever extent his choice was in this way knowing as well as willing, the act, qua instance of wrong or foolish behavior, is in a suitably deep sense his own. However, and in stark contrast, when an agent merely should be aware that he is acting wrongly or foolishly, there is no comparably direct connection between the wrongness or foolishness of what he does and his informed will. Hence, where no actual awareness is involved, the standard rationale for holding him responsible does not appear to be available. (Sher 2009: 74)

Another way of putting the worry is this: since attributions of responsibility are usually anchored in some morally relevant feature of the agent to which awareness contributes, such as choice or good/ill will (Amaya & Doris 2015: 254), an account of responsibility for unwitting wrongdoing in which neither choice nor the agent’s quality of will are implicated runs the risk of appearing ad hoc (King 2009: 587). So the challenge for capacitarians is to show that their account isn’t ad hoc and, at the same time, to provide a “morally plausible desert basis for blame” in cases of unwitting wrongdoing (Moore & Hurd 2011: 160).

We’ll focus on Sher’s response to this challenge. Concerning the charge of ad hocness, Sher argues that, quite generally, the crucial morally relevant feature implicated in attributions of responsibility isn’t choice, control, or quality of will but origination, understood as an appropriate causal relation between the agent and her action’s right-/wrong-making features (Sher 2009: 147; 2017b: 9–10). So, in Sher’s view, in order to appropriately praise or blame an agent for an action it must be the case that its relevant moral features are suitably connected to her (Sher 2009: 82). One way in which this suitable connection occurs is when the agent is aware of those features and chooses to perform the action in light of them, thus making the action “in a suitably deep sense his own” (2009: 74). Another way (in the case of wrong acts)[13] in which the suitable connection occurs is when the agent’s unawareness of the action’s wrong-making features is defective in the sense indicated above and such unawareness is caused by the agent’s constitutive attitudes, dispositions, and traits. When this is the case, Sher claims, the action’s wrongness is suitably connected to the agent and so—assuming that she satisfies other non-epistemic conditions as well—she can justifiably be held responsible for her unwitting wrongdoing (2009: 86–8, 118). For instance, if we assume that Alessandra could have recalled the dog, and also that her failure to do so was caused by constitutive features of her psychology such as her solicitousness to her children and her anxiety about conflict (2009: 92), she satisfies Sher’s EC and so she’s blameworthy for her unwitting omission (assuming, again, that she satisfies other non-epistemic conditions as well). Thus, by appealing to a single notion—origination—that allegedly grounds responsibility both in cases of witting and unwitting wrongdoing, Sher meets the charge of ad hocness.

This isn’t enough, however, for it still must be shown that this purely causal origination relation is a morally plausibly desert basis for blame. Sher (2009) claims that it is, because the psychological features he classifies as constitutive of the agent—her cares, values, beliefs and emotional makeup, but also her patterns of mental association, “the speed and accuracy of [her] inferences and decision-making” (2009: 86) and even “the relevant neurophysiological mechanisms” (2009: 122) that produce her thoughts and actions—“sustain her normal patterns of intellectual functioning” (2009: 122) and make her a responsible agent (2009: 121), and so in reacting to her failures of awareness (and subsequent wrongdoing) caused by those psychological features we are reacting to the whole person as the source of those failures (2009: 92). Sher (2009: 91; 2017b: 10) emphasizes that the psychological features that cause failures of awareness and explain the agent’s blameworthiness needn’t be moral flaws themselves. For instance, Alessandra’s solicitousness to her children isn’t a moral flaw; it may even be a good trait, and yet it remains true that if it caused Alessandra’s unawareness it partially explains her blameworthiness for her omission. In sum, Sher’s view is that the origination relation explains why blaming unwitting wrongdoers is appropriate because it ensures that the whole person was implicated in the wrongdoing for which she is blamed.

However, many authors have found this aspect of Sher’s position problematic. Levy claims that while it’s very plausible that origination is a condition on moral responsibility, it isn’t plausible to think “that responsibility consists in origination” (2014: 127). The fact that an agent’s failure of awareness causally originates in her psychology doesn’t seem to warrant blaming her for the action or omission’s wrongness, since the latter isn’t linked to her in a way the shows anything about the quality of her will (Levy 2014: 128; see also Talbert 2017a: 57; Björnsson 2017b: 143). Similarly, while agreeing with Sher that agents can sometimes be held directly responsible for their failures of awareness and subsequent wrongdoing, Angela Smith (2010) argues that this is so only when those failures exhibit a rational connection to the agent’s evaluative judgments. By contrast, a purely causal connection of the sort Sher defends “cannot establish the right kind of connection between an agent and her wrongdoing” to justify blaming her for it (A. Smith 2010: 523). Finally, Moore and Hurd (2011: 184) object that while the moral relevance of conscious choice for blameworthiness is intuitively clear, it isn’t at all clear how the fact that the agent’s “psychophysical apparatus that characteristically causes her chosen actions also caused her on this occasion to do this unchosen action” could analogously make blame appropriate. They thus dispute Sher’s (2009: 140) contention that conscious choice and failures of awareness (caused in the way he indicates) are equally good ways of satisfying the origination relation and grounding blameworthiness.[14], [15]

4. Conclusion

We have surveyed the five main positions regarding the EC on moral responsibility. Intuitively, being morally responsible for some action or event requires awareness of certain things. As we have seen, however, there is great controversy about how to characterize the kind and content of the requisite awareness and, more fundamentally, about whether awareness is actually required at all or not. A natural question is: how can we adjudicate the dispute among the different positions? The structure of the discussion suggests focusing on two criteria (Wieland 2017a: 26): i) what position fits best with our intuitions about responsibility in different cases; ii) what position merges best with the right conception of responsibility.

Concerning the first criterion, many philosophers take it as a given that theorizing about moral responsibility must be constrained by our ordinary judgments and intuitions. So if an account of the EC clashes with those judgments and intuitions, that gives us a pro tanto reason to reject it and, conversely, being able to accommodate them is a point in its favor (Sher 2009: 17; Clarke 2014: 162; Schnall 2004: 308; FitzPatrick 2008: 610; Peels 2011: 578; Montmarquet 1999: 845; Arpaly 2015: 155). Other philosophers reject this “methodological conservatism” (Levy 2017) and take the opposite line of giving priority to what they take to be the correct theory of responsibility, even if it implies that a good many of our ordinary judgments and intuitions are misguided (Rosen 2004: 296; Zimmerman 2008: 205). In order to break the stalemate in the theory vs. intuitions dispute, some have advanced an error theory of intuitions of blameworthiness in cases of unwitting wrongdoing which, if correct, would entail that failing to accommodate them shouldn’t be hold against an account of the EC (Levy 2017; Talbert 2017b); while others have offered empirical evidence to support the very same intuitions (Murray et al. 2019). Yet other philosophers have presented empirical evidence concerning ordinary intuitions of praise-/blameworthiness in cases of moral ignorance that appears to support the quality-of-will theorists’ view that moral knowledge isn’t required for either (Faraci & Shoemaker 2014). Thus, one way of settling the debate on the EC is to pursue this discussion on the preeminence, reliability, and content of ordinary intuitions about responsibility.

Concerning the second criterion, it was noted at the end of section 3.3 that the disagreement between quality-of-will theorists and the rest is partially grounded on competing conceptions of responsibility, and this suggests that settling the debate on the EC partly depends on how this broader dispute is resolved. Some philosophers think that it can be shown that one conception is the only correct one (Levy 2005; A. Smith 2012), but the consensus seems to be that the different conceptions are all valid, since each of them captures different aspects of our responsibility practices (Watson 1996; Shoemaker 2011; Zimmerman 2015). If the latter view is correct, it’s entirely possible that certain epistemic requirements apply to some types of responsibility but not to others (Mason 2015; Zimmerman 2017) and, consequently, it might well be the case that there are different EC depending on the type of responsibility we focus on.


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I thank Miguel Ángel Sebastián and an anonymous referee for helpful comments and suggestions. This work was supported by a UNAM-PAPIIT grant IA400318.

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