The Natural Law Tradition in Ethics

First published Mon Sep 23, 2002; substantive revision Sun May 26, 2019

‘Natural law theory’ is a label that has been applied to theories of ethics, theories of politics, theories of civil law, and theories of religious morality. We will be concerned only with natural law theories of ethics: while such views arguably have some interesting implications for law, politics, and religious morality, these implications will not be our focus here.

This article has two central objectives. First, it aims to identify the defining features of natural law moral theory. Second, it aims to identify some of the main theoretical options that natural law theorists face in formulating a precise view within the constraints set by these defining features and some of the difficulties for each of these options. It will not, however, attempt to recount the history of the development of natural law thought. (For a very helpful detailed history of natural law thought up to the beginning of the modern period, see Crowe 1977. For a very helpful detailed history of natural law thought in the modern period, see Haakonssen 1996. For an article-length recap of the entire history of natural law thought, see Haakonssen 1992.)

1. Key Features of Natural Law Theories

Even though we have already confined ‘natural law theory’ to its use as a term that marks off a certain class of ethical theories, we still have a confusing variety of meanings to contend with. Some writers use the term with such a broad meaning that any moral theory that is a version of moral realism — that is, any moral theory that holds that some positive moral claims are literally true (for this conception of moral realism, see Sayre-McCord 1988)— counts as a natural law view. Some use it so narrowly that no moral theory that is not grounded in a very specific form of Aristotelian teleology could count as a natural law view. It might be thought that there is nothing that can be done to begin a discussion of natural law theory in ethics other than to stipulate a meaning for ‘natural law theory’ and to proceed from there. But there is a better way of proceeding, one that takes as its starting point the central role that the moral theorizing of Thomas Aquinas plays in the natural law tradition. If any moral theory is a theory of natural law, it is Aquinas’s. (Every introductory ethics anthology that includes material on natural law theory includes material by or about Aquinas; every encyclopedia article on natural law thought refers to Aquinas.)  It would seem sensible, then, to take Aquinas’s natural law theory as the central case of a natural law position: of theories that exhibit all of the key features of Aquinas’s natural law view we can say that they are clearly natural law theories; of theories that exhibit few of them we can say that they are clearly not natural law theories; and of theories that exhibit many but not all of them we can say that they are in the neighborhood of the natural law view but nonetheless must be viewed as at most deviant cases of that position. There remain, no doubt, questions about how we determine what are to count as the key features of Aquinas’s position. But we may take as the key features those theses about natural law that structure his overall moral view and which provide the basis for other theses about the natural law that he affirms.

For Aquinas, there are two key features of the natural law, features the acknowledgment of which structures his discussion of the natural law at Question 94 of the Prima Secundae of the Summa Theologiae. The first is that, when we focus on God’s role as the giver of the natural law, the natural law is just one aspect of divine providence; and so the theory of natural law is from that perspective just one part among others of the theory of divine providence. The second is that, when we focus on the human’s role as recipient of the natural law, the natural law constitutes the principles of practical rationality, those principles by which human action is to be judged as reasonable or unreasonable; and so the theory of natural law is from that perspective the preeminent part of the theory of practical rationality.

1.1 Natural law and divine providence

While our main focus will be on the status of the natural law as constituting the principles of practical rationality, we should consider for a moment at least the importance within Aquinas’s view of the claim that the natural law is an aspect of divine providence. The fundamental thesis affirmed here by Aquinas is that the natural law is a participation in the eternal law (ST IaIIae 91, 2). The eternal law, for Aquinas, is that rational plan by which all creation is ordered (ST IaIIae 91, 1); the natural law is the way that the human being “participates” in the eternal law  (ST IaIIae 91, 2). While nonrational beings have a share in the eternal law only by being determined by it — their action nonfreely results from their determinate natures, natures the existence of which results from God’s will in accordance with God’s eternal plan — rational beings like us are able to grasp our share in the eternal law and freely act on it  (ST IaIIae 91, 2). It is this feature of the natural law that justifies, on Aquinas’s view, our calling the natural law ‘law.’  For law, as Aquinas defines it (ST IaIIae 90, 4), is a rule of action put into place by one who has care of the community; and as God has care of the entire universe, God’s choosing to bring into existence beings who can act freely and in accordance with principles of reason is enough to justify our thinking of those principles of reason as law.

1.2 Natural law and practical rationality

When we focus on the recipient of the natural law, that is, us human beings, the thesis of Aquinas’s natural law theory that comes to the fore is that the natural law constitutes the basic principles of practical rationality for human beings, and has this status by nature (ST IaIIae 94, 2). The notion that the natural law  constitutes the basic principles of practical rationality implies, for Aquinas, both that the precepts of the natural law are universally binding by nature (ST IaIIae 94, 4) and that the precepts of the natural law are universally knowable by nature (ST IaIIae 94, 4; 94, 6).

The precepts of the natural law are binding by nature: no beings could share our human nature yet fail to be bound by the precepts of the natural law. This is so because these precepts direct us toward the good as such and various particular goods (ST IaIIae 94, 2). The good and goods provide reasons for us rational beings to act, to pursue the good and these particular goods. As good is what is perfective of us given the natures that we have (ST Ia 5, 1), the good and these various goods have their status as such naturally. It is sufficient for certain things to be good that we have the natures that we have; it is in virtue of our common human nature that the good for us is what it is.

The precepts of the natural law are also knowable by nature.  All human beings possess a basic knowledge of the principles of the natural law (ST IaIIae 94, 4). This knowledge is exhibited in our intrinsic directedness toward the various goods that the natural law enjoins us to pursue, and we can make this implicit awareness explicit and propositional through reflection on practice. Aquinas takes it that there is a core of practical knowledge that all human beings have, even if the implications of that knowledge can be hard to work out or the efficacy of that knowledge can be thwarted by strong emotion or evil dispositions (ST IaIIae 94, 6).

If Aquinas’s view is paradigmatic of the natural law position, and these two theses — that from the God’s-eye point of view, it is law through its place in the scheme of divine providence, and from the human’s-eye point of view, it constitutes a set of naturally binding and knowable precepts of practical reason — are the basic features of the natural law as Aquinas understands it, then it follows that paradigmatic natural law theory is incompatible with several views in metaphysics and moral philosophy. On the side of metaphysics, it is clear that the natural law view is incompatible with atheism: one cannot have a theory of divine providence without a divine being. It is also clear that the paradigmatic natural law view rules out a deism on which there is a divine being but that divine being has no interest in human matters. Nor can one be an agnostic while affirming the paradigmatic natural law view: for agnosticism is the refusal to commit either to God’s existence or nonexistence, whereas the paradigmatic natural law view involves a commitment to God’s existence. On the side of moral philosophy, it is clear that the natural law view is incompatible with a nihilism about value, that is, the rejection of the existence of values. It is also incompatible with relativist and conventionalist views, on which the status of value is entirely relative to one’s community or determined entirely by convention. It is also incompatible with a wholesale skepticism about value, for the natural law view commits one to holding that certain claims about the good are in fact knowable, indeed, knowable by all.

1.3 The substance of the natural law view

The center of Aquinas’s natural law view as described thus far concerns what we might call the metaphysics of morals: its role in divine providence and the universally authoritative character of its norms. What, though, of the normative content of Aquinas’s natural law position?  Is there anything distinctive about the normative natural law position?  Here it is difficult to say much that is uncontroversial, but we can say a sufficient amount about Aquinas’s natural law theory to make clear that it is an interesting alternative to utilitarian (and more generally consequentialist) ethics, Kantian views, and standard Aristotelian positions. (For a magisterial treatment of Aquinas’s natural law ethic, see Rhonheimer 2000.)

Aquinas says that the fundamental principle of the natural law is that good is to be done and evil avoided (ST IaIIae 94, 2). This is, one might say, a principle of intelligibility of action (cf. Grisez 1965): only action that can be understood as conforming with this principle, as carried out under the idea that good is to be sought and bad avoided, can be understood as an intelligible action. But no one can in acting simply pursue good — one has to pursue some particular good. And Aquinas holds that we know immediately, by inclination, that there are a variety of things that count as good and thus to be pursued — life, procreation, knowledge, society, and reasonable conduct (ST IaIIae 94, 2; 94, 3) are all mentioned by Aquinas (though it is not clear whether the mentioned items are supposed to constitute an exhaustive list).

So on Aquinas’s view it is the good that is fundamental: whether an action, or type of action, is right is logically posterior to whether that action brings about or realizes or is some good. The good is, on Aquinas’s view, prior to the right. But on Aquinas’s view we are, somehow, able to reason from these principles about goods to guidelines about how these goods are to be pursued. Aquinas’s thoughts are along the following lines: first, there are certain ways of acting in response to the basic human goods that are intrinsically flawed; and second, for an act to be right, or reasonable, is for it to be an act that is in no way intrinsically flawed (ST IaIIae 18, 1).

The important task, then, is to identify the ways in which an act can be intrinsically flawed. Aquinas does not obviously identify some master principle that one can use to determine whether an act is intrinsically flawed (though for an attempt to identify such a master principle in Aquinas’s work see Finnis 1998, p. 126), though he does indicate where to look — we are to look at the features that individuate acts, such as their objects (ST IaIIae 18, 2), their ends (ST IaIIae 18, 3), their circumstances (ST IaIIae 18, 4), and so forth. An act might be flawed through a mismatch of object and end — that is, between the immediate aim of the action and its more distant point. If one were, for example, to regulate one’s pursuit of a greater good in light of a lesser good — if, for example, one were to seek friendship with God for the sake of mere bodily survival rather than vice versa — that would count as an unreasonable act. An act might be flawed through the circumstances: while one is bound to profess one’s belief in God, there are certain circumstances in which it is inappropriate to do so (ST IIaIIae 3, 2). An act might be flawed merely through its intention: to direct oneself against a good — as in murder (ST IIaIIae 64, 6), and lying (ST IIaIIae 110, 3), and blasphemy (ST IIaIIae 13, 2) — is always to act in an unfitting way. Aquinas has no illusions that we will be able to state principles of conduct that exhaustively determine right conduct, as if for every situation in which there is a correct choice to be made there will be a rule that covers the situation. He allows for the Aristotelian insight that the particulars of the situation always outstrip one’s rules, so that one will always need the moral and intellectual virtues in order to act well (Commentary on NE, II, 2, 259). But he denies that this means that there are no principles of right conduct that hold everywhere and always, and some even absolutely. On Aquinas’s view, killing of the innocent is always wrong, as is lying, adultery, sodomy, and blasphemy; and that they are always wrong is a matter of natural law. (These are only examples, not an exhaustive list of absolutely forbidden actions.)

Part of the interest of Aquinas’s substantive natural law ethic lies in its not falling into the neat contemporary categories for moral theories. His natural law view understands principles of right to be grounded in principles of good; on this Aquinas sides with utilitarians, and consequentialists generally, against Kantians.  But Aquinas would deny that the principles of the right enjoin us to maximize the good — while he allows that considerations of the greater good have a role in practical reasoning, action can be irremediably flawed merely through (e.g.) badness of intention, flawed such that no good consequences that flow from the action would be sufficient to justify it — and in this Aquinas sides with the Kantians against the utilitarians and consequentialists of other stripes. And while Aquinas is in some ways Aristotelian, and recognizes that virtue will always be required in order to hit the mark in a situation of choice, he rejects the view commonly ascribed to Aristotle (for doubts that it is Aristotle’s view; see Irwin 2000) that there are no universally true general principles of right. The natural law view rejects wholesale particularism.

1.4 Paradigmatic and nonparadigmatic natural law theories

To summarize: the paradigmatic natural law view holds that (1) the natural law is given by God; (2) it is naturally authoritative over all human beings; and (3) it is naturally knowable by all human beings. Further, it holds that (4) the good is prior to the right, that (5) right action is action that responds nondefectively to the good, that (6) there are a variety of ways in which action can be defective with respect to the good, and that (7) some of these ways can be captured and formulated as general rules.

Aquinas was not the only historically important paradigmatic natural law theorist. Thomas Hobbes, for example, was also a paradigmatic natural law theorist. He held that the laws of nature are divine law (Leviathan, xv, ¶41), that all humans are bound by them (Leviathan, xv, ¶¶36), and that it is easy to know at least the basics of the natural law (Leviathan, xv, ¶35). He held that the fundamental good is self-preservation (Leviathan, xiii, ¶14), and that the laws of nature direct the way to this good (Leviathan, xiv, ¶3). He offered a catalog of laws of nature that constitute the “true moral philosophy” (Leviathan, xv, ¶40). There are also a number of contemporary writers that affirm the paradigmatic view. These writers, not surprisingly, trace their views to Aquinas as the major influence, though they do not claim to reproduce his views in detail. (See, for example, Grisez 1983, Finnis 1980,  MacIntyre 1999, and Murphy 2001.)

It is also easy to identify a number of writers, both historical and contemporary, whose views are easily called natural law views, through sharing all but one or two of the features of Aquinas’s paradigmatic position. Recently there have been nontheistic writers in the natural law tradition, who deny (1): see, for example, the work of Michael Moore (1982, 1996) and Philippa Foot (2001). There were a number of post-Thomistic writers in the medieval and modern periods who in some way denied (2), the natural authority of the natural law, holding that while the content of the natural law is fixed either wholly or in part by human nature, its preceptive power could only come from an additional divine command: the views of John Duns Scotus, Francisco Suarez, and John Locke fit this mold.    Arguably the Stoics were natural law thinkers, but they seem to deny (4), holding the right to be prior to the good (see Striker 1986). Some contemporary theological ethicists called ‘proportionalists’ (e.g. Hallett 1995) have taken up the natural law view with a consequentialist twist, denying (6). (For a discussion of the relationship between proportionalism and natural law theory see Kaczor 2002.) And while some see Aristotle as being the source of the natural law tradition, some have argued that his central appeal to the insight of the person of practical wisdom as setting the final standard for right action precludes the possibility of the sort of general rules that would (at least in a theistic context) make Aristotle’s ethics a natural law position. There is of course no clear answer to the question of when a view ceases to be a natural law theory, though a nonparadigmatic one, and becomes no natural law theory at all.

2. Theoretical Options for Natural Law Theorists

Even within the constraints set by the theses that constitute the paradigmatic natural law position, there are a number of variations possible in the view. Here we will consider several issues that must be addressed by every particular natural law view, and some difficulties that arise for possible responses to these issues.

2.1 Natural goodness

It is essential to the natural law position that there be some things that are universally and naturally good. But how is universal, natural goodness possible?  Given the variability of human tastes and desires, how could there be such universal goods?

Natural law theorists have at least three answers available to them. The first answer is Hobbesian, and proceeds on the basis of a subjectivist theory of the good. On subjectivist theories of the good, what makes it true that something is good is that it is desired, or liked, or in some way is the object of one’s pro-attitudes, or would be the object of one’s pro-attitudes in some suitable conditions. One might think that to affirm a subjectivist theory of the good is to reject natural law theory, given the immense variation in human desire. But this is not so. For one might hold that human beings’ common nature, their similarity in physiological constitution, makes them such as to have some desires in common, and these desires may be so central to human aims and purposes that we can build important and correct precepts of rationality around them. This is in fact what Hobbes claims. For while on the Hobbesian view what is good is what is desired, Hobbes thinks that humans are similarly constructed so that for each human (when he or she is properly biologically functioning) his or her central aim is the avoidance of violent death. Thus Hobbes is able to build his entire natural law theory around a single good, the good of self-preservation, which is so important to human life that exceptionlessly binding precepts can be formulated with reference to its achievement.

The second answer is Aristotelian. The idea here is to reject a subjectivism about the good, holding that what makes it true that something is good is not that it stands in some relation to desire but rather that it is somehow perfective or completing of a being, where what is perfective or completing of a being depends on that being’s nature. So what is good for an oak is what is completing or perfective of the oak, and this depends on the kind of thing that an oak is by nature; and what is good for a dog is what is completing or perfective of the dog, and this depends on the kind of thing that a dog is by nature; and what is good for a human depends on what is completing or perfective of a human, and this depends on the kind of thing a human is by nature. So the fact of variability of desire is not on its own enough to cast doubt on the natural law universal goods thesis: as the good is not defined fundamentally by reference to desire, the fact of variation in desire is not enough to raise questions about universal goods. This is the view affirmed by Aquinas, and the majority of adherents to the natural law tradition.

The third answer is Platonic. Like the Aristotelian view, it rejects a subjectivism about the good. But it does not hold that the good is to be understood in terms of human nature. The role of human nature is not to define or set the good, but merely to define what the possibilities of human achievement are. So one might think that some things — knowledge, beauty, etc. — are just good in themselves, apart from any reference to human desire or perfection, but hold that the pursuit of these are only part of the natural law insofar as they fall within the ambit of human practical possibility. This view of the good is not much defended — in part because of the scathing criticism offered of Plato’s view by Aristotle in the Nicomachean Ethics (NE I, 6) — but it was affirmed by Iris Murdoch (1970), and forms part of the natural law view defended by Michael Moore (1982).

None of these answers is without difficulties. While there are contemporary defenders of Hobbesian moral theories (see Gauthier 1986), there is no one who is on record defending Hobbes’s interesting combination of a thoroughgoing subjectivism about the good along with an account of a dominant substantive good around which the moral rules are formulated. The basic reason for this just seems to be that Hobbes’s arguments that the human desire for self-preservation is such an entirely dominant desire are implausible, and there do not seem to be any better arguments available. The Platonic version of the view has struck many as both too metaphysically ornate to be defensible, on one hand, and as not fitting very well with a conception of ethics grounded in nature, on the other. While the Aristotelian version of the view has also been charged with some of the metaphysical excesses that the Platonist view allegedly countenances, most contemporary natural law theory is Aristotelian in its orientation, holding that there is still good reason to hold to an understanding of flourishing in nature and that none of the advances of modern science has called this part of the Aristotelian view into question. (For defenses of such Aristotelian accounts of the good, see Foot 2001, Thompson 1995, and Thompson 2004.)

2.2 Knowledge of the basic goods

Another central question that the natural law tradition has wrestled with concerns our knowledge of the basic goods. How can we come to know these fundamental goods?

Return to Aquinas’s paradigmatic natural law position. His account of our knowledge of the fundamental goods has been understood in different ways (Murphy 2001, ch. 1). Some have understood Aquinas as affirming a theory of our knowledge of the fundamental precepts of the natural law that we can label ‘derivationism.’  The idea here is that we can derive from a metaphysical study of human nature and its potentialities and actualizations the conclusion that certain things are good for human beings, and thus that the primary precepts of the natural law bid us to pursue these things (cf. Lisska 1996). One can imagine a Hobbesian version of this view as well. One might say that by a careful study of the human being’s desire-forming mechanisms, one can see that there are certain things that would be necessarily desired by biologically sound human beings, and thus that the human good includes these items. (Hobbes in fact produces such arguments at [EL], I, 7.)  While a natural law theorist might downplay the importance of derivationist knowledge of the natural law, it is hard to see how a consistent natural law theorist could entirely reject the possibility of such knowledge, given the view that we can provide a substantial account of how the human good is grounded in nature: for to show that the human good is grounded in nature is to show that human nature explains why certain things are goods, and it is hard to see how one could affirm that claim while entirely rejecting the possibility of derivationist knowledge of the human good (see Murphy 2001, pp. 16–17). Some have thought, echoing criticisms of natural law theory by those entirely hostile to it, that derivationist theories of practical knowledge fall prey to ‘Hume’s Law,’ that it is impossible to derive an ‘ought’ from an ‘is,’ that is, any normative truth from any set of nonnormative truths. The most that this can show, though, is that the natural law theorist needs an account of those bridge truths that enable us to move between claims about human nature and claims about human goods.

It must be conceded, however, that a consistent natural law theorist could hardly hold that derivationist knowledge of the human good is the only such knowledge possible. For it is part of the paradigm natural law view that the basic principles of the natural law are known by all, and the sort of arguments that would need to be made in order to produce derivationist knowledge of the human good are certainly not had (or even have-able) by all. (Recently Jensen (2015) has offered a thorough defense of a derivationist account that aims to take such worries into account.) Another way that Aquinas’s account of knowledge of the fundamental goods has been understood — and it is an understanding better able to come to grips with the widespread knowledge of fundamental goods — can be labeled ‘inclinationism.’  On this view, one’s explicit grasp of the fundamental goods follows upon but is not derived from one’s persistent directedness toward the pursuit of certain ends, which directedness involves an implicit grasp of these items as good. So human beings exhibit a tendency to pursue life, and knowledge, and friendship, and so forth; and reflection on this tendency occasions an immediate grasp of the truth that life, and knowledge, and friendship, and so forth are goods. The affirmation of the claims ‘life is good,’ ‘knowledge is good,’ ‘friendship is good,’ etc. makes intelligible the persistent pursuit of these ends by rational beings like us.

While inclinationism and derivationism are distinct methods, they are by no means exclusive: one can hold that knowledge of fundamental goods is possible in both ways. Indeed, it may well be that one way of knowing can supplement and correct the other. There may be some goods that are easier to recognize when taking the speculative point of view, the point of view of the observer of human nature and its potentialities, and some that are easier to recognize when taking the practical point of view, the point of view of the actively engaged in human life. Indeed, by connecting nature and the human good so tightly, the natural law view requires that an account of the good reconcile these points of view.

There are, of course, reasons to be worried about both of these ways of knowing basic goods — worries that go beyond general skeptical doubts about how we could know any normative truths at all.  Derivationists have to explain how we come to know what counts as an actualization of a human potency, and have to explain how we connect these via bridge principles with human goods. Inclinationists have their own troubles. In particular, they need to deal with the fact that, even if they are not in the business of deriving goods from inclinations or identifying the goods precisely with what we tend to pursue, they take as their starting point human directedness.   And it has been rightly noted that human directedness is not always a lovely thing. Power and prestige seem to be a matter of human directedness — at least as much so as, say,  aesthetic enjoyment and speculative knowledge — but they do not make it to the natural law theorist’s catalog of goods (though they do appear to be part of the good in Aristotle’s picture; cf. the discussion in Hare 2001, p. 14). While these difficulties persist for inclinationist and derivationist accounts of knowledge of the basic goods, they may well be eased if one affirms both accounts: one might be able to use inclinationist knowledge to provide some basis for bridge principles between knowledge of human nature and knowledge of human goods, and one might be able to use derivationist knowledge to modify, in a non-ad-hoc way, the objectionable elements of the account that one might be bound to give if proceeding on an inclinationist basis alone. (Reconciling the inclinationist and derivationist approaches is a theme in Murphy 2001 and Wall 2010.)

The dialectic between inclinationist and derivationist accounts of knowledge of the first principles of the natural law is central to natural law epistemology, but there are other accounts of knowledge of the natural law that focus on its social dimension. Alasdair MacIntyre has argued, for example, that the first precepts of the natural law are to be understood as those that make possible communal inquiry into the nature of the good: both the positive and the negative precepts are enabling rules, norms that enable humans to engage in common pursuit of knowledge of what is valuable. The norms of the natural law preclude our acting toward other potential partners in inquiry in way that would undermine the possibility of common pursuit of the good (MacIntyre 1994, 183–184). To come to know the primary precepts of the natural law, then, is a matter of coming to know what sorts of social relationships make possible common pursuit of common goods.

A distinct sort of social emphasis on knowledge of the natural law asks why we should think of knowledge of the natural law as arising exclusively or even predominantly either from one’s own immediate rational insight into what is implicit grasped or from some sort of derivation from the fact that one’s own inclinations of the will have certain determinate objects. One might hold that we have excellent reason to believe that knowledge of the natural law unfolds historically. Jean Porter, for example, argues that by close attention to the various sorts of social structure exhibited cross-culturally, we can extract the necessary “starting points” (Porter 2005, p. 132) to begin assessing various proposed norms of action. And Jonathan Crowe emphasizes knowledge of the natural law as the outcome of the attempt to interpret human practices, and will be an historically-extended process that will be necessarily an unfinished task (Crowe 2019, pp. 6-7; there is also discussion of interpretation of social practices as a means to knowing the natural law in Murphy 2007).

2.3 The catalog of basic goods

A developed natural law theory includes within it a catalog of the fundamental goods, the basic values upon which the principles of right are founded. Suppose that we follow at least the inclinationist line, taking it to be faithful to the natural law idea that knowledge of the basic goods is widely distributed. Our task then is to provide an explicit account of those goods implicit knowledge of which is manifested in human inclination toward certain ends. What are the goods affirmation of which makes intelligible these inclinations?

It is clear from this way of putting the question that even if natural law theorists are right that this implicit knowledge is widely distributed, it would be easy for natural law theorists to disagree in their catalogs of basic goods. For the task here is that of formulating propositionally, and in as illuminating a way as possible, what items need be affirmed as intrinsically good in order to make sense out of our inclinations. And there are, unsurprisingly, disagreements in catalogs of basic goods. The goods that Aquinas mentions in his account include life, procreation, social life, knowledge, and rational conduct. Grisez 1983 includes self-integration, practical reasonableness, authenticity, justice and friendship, religion, life and health, knowledge of truth, appreciation of beauty, and playful activities (pp. 121–122). Finnis 1980 includes life, knowledge, aesthetic appreciation, play, friendship, practical reasonableness, and religion (pp. 86–90). Chappell 1995 includes friendship, aesthetic value, pleasure and the avoidance of pain, physical and mental health and harmony, reason, rationality, and reasonableness, truth and the knowledge of it, the natural world, people, fairness, and achievements (p. 43). Finnis 1996 affirms a list much like Grisez 1983, but includes in it “the marital good” (p. 5). Murphy 2001 includes life, knowledge, aesthetic experience, excellence in work and play, excellence in agency, inner peace, friendship and community, religion, and happiness (p. 96). Gomez-Lobo 2002 includes life, the family, friendship, work and play, experience of beauty, theoretical knowledge, and integrity (pp. 10–23). Crowe (2019) includes life, health, pleasure, friendship, play, appreciation, understanding, meaning, and reasonableness (p. 35).

Aside from the inevitable differences in lists of goods produced by natural law theorists, there are also more focused debates about the inclusion of particular alleged goods within the natural law theorists’ lists. Note, for example, that of the lists above, only Chappell’s includes pleasure and the absence of pain. Whatever else we say here, it seems that common sense is initially on Chappell’s side: what seems more obvious than that pleasure and the avoidance of pain are basic reasons for action?  The reasons for rejecting pleasure and the absence of pain from the list of goods are various: some writers argue, following Aristotle, that pleasure is not a good in abstraction from the activity in which pleasure is taken; some that the absence of pain is not a completion or a fulfillment of human nature, and thus cannot be among the basic goods; some that the avoidance of pain is simply an instance of some other basic good, such as inner peace. What this debate illustrates is the extent to which the formulation of a catalog of goods is not a straightforward matter. Everyone agrees that one who avoids touching a hot stove in part to avoid the awful pain has some reason to avoid touching the stove. The difficulty is to bring together our various sources of knowledge about the good to formulate an account that explains well precisely why it is that such an act is reasonable. These sorts of debates reappear with respect to goods like life (is life intrinsically or instrumentally good?  is merely being alive intrinsically good, or is life only intrinsically good when one is enjoying a certain level of vitality?), religion (is harmony with God really a human good?  is it merely a kind of friendship?  does its status as a good depend on whether there is a being such as God?), and what Finnis and Grisez now call the ‘marital good’ (is the good of marriage simply an amalgam of various other goods, as friendship, procreation, rational agency, or is it really a distinct, analytically separable value?). Thus Echeñique denies that life can be a basic good in the way that natural law theorists typically take it to be (Echeñique 2016); Cuneo has rejected religion as a basic good (Cuneo 2005, pp. 116–118); and Macedo has argued against the marital good (Macedo 1995).

2.4 From the good to the right

Suppose that we were to have in hand satisfactory accounts of natural goodness and our knowledge of it, along with a rationally defensible account of the basic goods that are the fundamental reasons for action. All that we would have so far is the natural law theorist’s account of what we might call minimally rational action — action that seeks to realize some good. What we would not have yet is a full account of right action. For we are frequently in situations in which there are various different courses of action that we might pursue, each of which promises to realize some good; are there no guidelines to which we might appeal in order to show some of these choices superior to others?  After all, some of even the most obviously morally wrong actions can be seen to promise some good — a robber might kill in order to get the money he needs to pursue genuine goods — and the natural law theorist wants to be able to say why these obviously morally wrong actions are morally wrong. As we have seen, the paradigmatic natural law view holds that there are some general rules of right that govern our pursuit of the various goods, and that these rules of right exclude those actions that are in some way defective responses to the various basic goods. How, though, are we to determine what counts as a defective response to the goods?

There are at least three possibilities. One might appeal to a master rule of right that can be used to generate further rules; call this the master rule approach. One might appeal to a methodological principle by which particular rules can be generated; call this the method approach. Or one might appeal to some standard for distinguishing correct and incorrect moral rules that is not understandable as a method; call this (for reasons we shall see shortly) the virtue approach.

On the master rule approach, the task of the natural law theorist is to identify some master rule which bears on the basic goods and, perhaps in conjunction with further factual premises, is able to produce a stock of general rules about what sorts of responses to the basic goods are or are not reasonable. While it is far from clear whether there was a single way that Aquinas proceeded in establishing moral norms from the primary precepts of the natural law in the Summa Theologiae, John Finnis has argued (Finnis 1998, p. 126) that Aquinas employed this master rule approach: on his view, Aquinas held that this master rule is the rule of universal love, that one should love one’s neighbor as oneself. This rule bids us to respond to the good lovingly wherever it can be realized, and from it we can see that certain ways of responding to the good are ruled out as essentially unloving. Grisez clearly employs this approach: he writes that the first principle of morality is that “In voluntarily acting for human goods and avoiding what is opposed to them, one ought to choose and otherwise will those and only those possibilities whose willing is compatible with a will toward integral human fulfillment” (Grisez 1983, p. 184). This first principle, Grisez says, contains implicitly within it various “modes of responsibility” from which particular moral rules can be derived.

The central difficulty with this employment of the master rule approach is that of explaining how we are to grasp this first principle of morality as correct. What is the relationship between our knowledge of the basic goods and our knowledge of the master rule?  When Grisez defends his master rule, he writes that its status is due to a certain function that a first principle of morality must perform:  “It must provide the basis for guiding choices toward overall human fulfillment. As a single principle, it will give unity and direction to a morally good life. At the same time, it must not exclude ways of living which might contribute to a complete human community” (Grisez 1983, p. 184). But this presupposes an awful lot: why should we assume in advance that a proper response to the basic goods must be one that is oriented toward a “complete human community”?

On the method approach, by contrast, there is no need for a master principle that will serve as the basis for deriving some particular moral rules. The idea here is the natural law theorist needs not a master rule but a test for distinguishing correct moral rules from incorrect ones. We know from our earlier consideration of the paradigmatic natural law view that the test for distinguishing correct moral rules from incorrect ones must be something like the following: if a moral rule rules out certain choices as defective that are in fact defective, and rules out no choices as defective that are not in fact defective, then it is a correct moral rule. What would distinguish different employments of the method approach is their accounts of what features of a choice we appeal to in order to determine whether it is defective. The knowledge that we have to go on here is our knowledge of the basic goods. If a certain choice presupposes something false about the basic goods, then it responds defectively to them. So a moral rule can be justified by showing that it rules out only choices that presuppose something false about the basic goods.

This is very abstract. Here is an example of an employment of this approach. While Finnis now affirms Grisez’s master rule approach, in his 1980 work he defends various principles of practical reasonableness without adverting to a master rule. He argues, for example, that it is always wrong to intend the destruction of an instance of a basic good (Finnis 1980, pp. 118–123). (So, no lying, for lying is an intentional attack on knowledge; no murder, for murder is an intentional attack on life, and so forth.)  Why is it always wrong to do so?  It would be unreasonable simply to try to destroy an instance of a basic good, for no further purpose: for that would treat an instance of a basic good as something that it is not — that is, as valueless. And it would be wrong to destroy an instance of a basic good for the sake of bringing about some other instance of a basic good: for that would make sense only if the good brought about were more valuable than the good destroyed, but on Finnis’s view all distinct instances of basic goods are incommensurable — none is of more, less, or equal value with any other. So the rule forbidding intentional destruction of an instance of a basic good is justified because it rules out only choices that presuppose something false about the nature of the basic goods. (For a working out of the method approach, see Murphy 2001, ch. 5.)

The method approach presupposes less of substance about morality than the master rule approach presupposes. But it requires us to draw upon an interesting and rich knowledge of the features of the basic goods. Whether this information is available is a matter for debate. But the method approach has the advantage of firmly rooting natural law arguments for moral principles in the goods the pursuit of which those moral principles are supposed to regulate.

Neither the master rule nor the method approach implies that the natural law theorist must hold that all right action can be captured in general rules. The natural law view is only that there are some such rules. It is consistent with the natural law position that there are a number of choice situations in which there is a right answer, yet in which that right answer is not dictated by any natural law rule or set of rules, but rather is grasped only by a virtuous, practically wise person. It is, however, open to the natural law theorist to use this appeal to the judgment of the practically wise person more widely, holding that the general rules concerning the appropriate response to the goods cannot be properly determined by any master rule or philosophical method, but can be determined only by appeal to the insight of the person of practical wisdom. If it really is wrong in all cases to tell lies, as Aquinas and Grisez and Finnis have argued, our grasp of this moral truth is dependent on our possessing, or our being able to recognize the possessor of, practical wisdom. If such a person never tells lies, because she or he just sees that to tell lies would be to respond defectively to the good, then that lying is always wrong is a rule of the natural law.

It may be true that by the virtue approach we can learn of some general rules of the natural law. What is more interesting is whether a defender of the virtue approach would be right to dismiss the claims of the master rule or method approaches. (For, after all, one might be able to learn that lying is wrong either through moral argument or through the perceptive insight of practical wisdom.)  And it does not seem that the defender of the master rule or method approach should be particularly concerned to discredit the virtue approach. For if defenders of the master rule or method approach recognize the existence of a capacity of judgment like practical wisdom, then it would be strange to allow that it can be correctly exercised on a number of particular occasions while denying that we might learn of general rules from observing patterns of its exercise on various occasions.

One challenge to these various natural law attempts to explain the right in terms of the good denies that the natural law theorist can provide adequate explanations of the range of norms of right conduct for which moral theories ought to be able to provide explanations. That is, one might allow for the sake of argument the natural law theorist’s identification of some range of human goods, while denying that he or she can identify, and justify in natural law terms, adequately concrete modes of appropriate response to those goods. This challenge cannot be profitably addressed here; what would be required would be a close examination of the merits of particular natural law explanations of particular moral norms (a task taken up in, for example, Grisez 1993). One might also look to recent attempts to apply the natural law view to pressing contemporary moral problems — those of research ethics (Tollefsen 2008), economic justice (Chartier 2009), environmental ethics (Davison 2009), business ethics (Gonzalez 2015), the ethics of suicide and euthanasia (Paterson 2015), and population ethics (Delaney 2016), for example — as tests of the fruitfulness of that position.

A more radical critique of the paradigmatic natural law account of the connection between the good and the right calls into question the very idea that one can get principles of moral rightness merely from what constitutes a defective response to the good. According to this critique, while it is true that one might be able to come up with some notion of unreasonableness by appeal to the notion of what is defective response to the human goods, the notion of moral rightness belongs to a family of concepts distinct from that to which the notion of reasonableness belongs. On this view, moral rightness belongs to the obligation family, and the concept of obligation is irreducibly social: one is under an obligation only if one is subject to some sort of demand in the context of a social relationship (see, for an example of this view from a theological voluntarist perspective, Adams 1999, pp. 238–241; see, for an example of this view with a Kantian twist, Darwall 2006). It is part of the logic of obligation that when one is under an obligation, that condition has resulted from a demand imposed on him or her by some other party. So, according to this line of criticism, the paradigmatic natural law view is unable to show that the natural law is intrinsically morally authoritative: the precepts of the natural law can be rules that all of us human beings are obligated to obey, that it would be wrong for us to disobey, and that we would be guilty for flouting only if these precepts are imposed upon us by an authoritative being — perhaps a being like God.

The intrinsic moral authority of the natural law has been a matter of debate since Aquinas: it was a central issue dividing Aquinas’s view from those of Scotus, Ockham, and Suarez. It continues to be an issue between natural law theorists like Grisez (1983) and Finnis (1980) on one hand and theological voluntarists like Adams (1999) and Hare (2001) on the other. Natural law theorists have several options: they can argue against any meaningful distinction between morality and the reasonable more generally (Foot 2000, pp. 66–80); or they can embrace the distinction, but hold that on the clearest conception of the moral that we possess, the natural law account of reasonableness in action adequately satisfies that conception (Murphy 2001, pp. 222–227); or they can hold that the notion of ‘morally right’ is so muddled that it should be jettisoned, leaving in its stead the notion of the reasonable (cf. Anscombe 1958). It is at present far from clear which of these avenues of response the natural law theorist has most reason to embrace.


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