First published Thu Jul 6, 2006; substantive revision Mon May 8, 2023

Pacifism is a commitment to peace and opposition to war. Our ordinary language allows a diverse set of beliefs and commitments to be held together under the general rubric of pacifism. This article will explain the family resemblance among the variety of pacifisms. It will locate pacifism within deontological and consequentialist approaches to ethics. It will consider diverse cultural and religious sources of pacifism. And it will consider and reply to objections to pacifism.

The word “pacifism” is derived from the word “pacific,” which means “peace making” [Latin, paci- (from pax) meaning “peace” and -ficus meaning “making”]. Modern usage has been traced to 1901 and Émile Artaud’s usage of the French term pacifisme. But the basic commitment to peace is an old idea. Pacifist sentiment can be found, for example, in the West in early Christianity. Perhaps the most famous use of the word pacifism is found in the Sermon on the Mount (Matthew 5), where Jesus claims that the “peacemakers” are blessed. In this passage, the Greek word eirenopoios is translated into Latin as pacifici, which means those who work for peace. The Greek eirenopoios is derived from the Greek eirênê [peace] in conjunction with poiesis [to make].

Philosophical discussions of pacifism have clarified the concept by distinguishing the more general commitment to nonviolence from a narrower anti-war position. A related term, “nonviolentism,” has been coined by Holmes (Holmes 2013: 157), to describe a position that goes beyond anti-war pacifism in its opposition to violence in all of its forms. Pacifism has often been defined dialectically in relation to the idea of justified violence that is found in the Western just war tradition.[1] Pacifism is often located on a continuum for assessing the morality of war that includes realism, just war theory, and pacifism. The fundamental question here is “can war be justified?” (see Fiala and Kling, 2023). Indeed, there is an ongoing debate about the proper relation between just war theory and pacifism that focuses on the question of whether the just war theory begins with a pacifist presumption against war. Some authors have used the just war theory to derive a version of pacifism described as “contingent pacifism” (May 2015, for example) or “just war pacifism” (Sterba 1998). Authors such as Cheyney Ryan and Robert Holmes more strongly maintain that the just war framework is flawed. Holmes argues that the just war tradition typically ignores the central moral issue in war, which is about the presumptive immorality of the “massive, systematic and deliberate killing of human beings” that occurs in war (Holmes 2017a: xvii). Ryan argues that although the just war tradition and pacifism developed through “mutual critique” pacifism has often been marginalized as an “outcast tradition” (Ryan 2017: 125). And yet, the “pacifist tradition” includes a robust historical dialogue involving important authors and movements (Fiala 2018b; Fiala and Kling 2023).

Some have tried to distinguish “pacific-ism” from pacifism, where pacific-ism is a commitment to peace and peacefulness that is not strictly opposed to war while pacifism is a more principled or absolute rejection of violence. But this distinction is not widely accepted (although Dower 2009 employed it). William James used the term “pacific-ism” in 1910 to describe his rejection of militarism (James 1910). The shorter term, “pacifism,” has become more common in English usage to describe a variety of views that are critical of war.

Generally pacifism is thought to be a principled rejection of war and killing. Oddly enough, terminology related to pacifism has occasionally been used to describe a pragmatic commitment to using war to create peace. Thus a term like “pacification” can be employed in military usage to describe a violent process of suppressing violence, as when an enemy territory is “pacified” by killing or disabling the enemy. While George Orwell (2002) complained about such euphemistic descriptions of violence, the just war tradition does hold that war can be a suitable means to bring about peace. Despite these complications, pacifism generally connotes a commitment to making peace that rejects violent means for obtaining this end. One reason to reject violent means is the fact that might does not make right. While violence can destroy an enemy, victory does not amount to justification.

Pacifism, as it is understood in ordinary discourse today, includes a variety of commitments on a continuum from an absolute adherence to nonviolence in all actions to a more focused or minimal sort of anti-warism. In contrast to the just war tradition, pacifism rejects war as an acceptable means for obtaining peace. Pacifists will often refuse to serve in the military. And some refuse to support political and social systems that promote war by, for example, withholding their taxes. Pacifists have been associated with quietistic withdrawal from political life and even outright anarchism. But pacifists need not be “passive”: many committed pacifists have been actively involved in nonviolent social protest. Pacifism can be used to describe a commitment to nonviolence in one’s personal life that might include the attempt to cultivate pacific virtues such as tolerance, patience, mercy, forgiveness, and love. It might also be extended to include nonviolence toward all sentient beings and thus result in a commitment to vegetarianism and what Albert Schweitzer (1967) called, “reverence for life.” Pacifism can be connected to a larger project of spiritual transformation, as in Gandhi’s commitment to ahimsa or nonviolence. And as the author of the present entry has argued, pacifism can be understood as offering a comprehensive normative framework (Fiala 2018a).

1. Defining Peace

Pacifism is the broad commitment to making peace. The idea is complicated by the fact that peace is a family resemblance term: there are many varieties of peace. Peace is easiest to define dialectically as the opposite of war or violence. Pacifism has thus been described simply as anti-warism or as commitment to nonviolence. One conceptual difficulty here is that when peace is defined negatively, pacifism appears as a reactionary response to war and violence. Discussions of peace thus often employ negative terms and creative neologisms to express the concept of peace: “nonviolence,” “nonwar,” “nonkilling,” “nonconflict,” or “nonwar.” Peace advocates will however insist that peace should be understood as a primary concept connected to cooperation, harmony, and positive human relations and that it is a mistake to understand peace in merely negative terms (see Fox 2014). At any rate, peace scholarship has long emphasized the distinction between negative peace and positive peace: negative peace is the absence of violence or war while positive peace encompasses cooperative, tranquil, and harmonious relations and the broader concerns of human flourishing and integration (see Galtung 1969; Boersema 2017). A related distinction is that between what Sims et al (2014) call “personal peacefulness,” involving small groups of people, and peace at a larger international scale, up to and including “world peace” (see Bellamy 2019).

When pacifism is defined as anti-warism, we encounter the difficulty of defining war. War is usually thought of as violence between states or, more broadly speaking, political communities. But the term “war” can also be applied to violent conflicts among individuals, as in Hobbes’ idea that the state of nature is a state of war. Similarly, although peace is usually thought of as a political condition of amicable relations between states, terms like “peace” or “peaceful” can also be used to describe a relation between individuals or even a person’s state of mind.

If pacifism is defined as a commitment to nonviolence, we encounter the same problem of definition. Violence usually has a normative value and is defined as something like “an unjustified injury or harm.” But it is possible to speak of justified violence—as in the just war theory. And so, the normative value of violence remains an open question. The concept of violence can also be extended metaphorically and used as an adjective—“violent”—to mean something like unbridled, uncontrolled, rough, or intense. Thus we speak of “violent storms” or “violent emotions.” A commitment to nonviolence is, at least, a commitment to avoiding unjustified intentional injury. Pacifists will tend to think that most intentionally caused harms are unjustifiable. But the ideal of nonviolence might be extended to include the idea of controlling rough and intense emotions. In his essay, “Journey to Nonviolence,” for example, Martin Luther King Jr. claimed that a commitment to nonviolence required overcoming the “internal violence” of hatred and anger by cultivating love and compassion (King 1986, 46).

There are a variety of possibilities for thinking about the nature of peace and thus for understanding what pacifism aims at creating.

1.1 Peace as Slavery or Submission

Peace can result from submission to power; and war can end with unconditional surrender. Rousseau maligned this sort of peace by calling it the “peace of Ulysses and his comrades, imprisoned in the cave of the Cyclops and waiting their turn to be devoured” (Rousseau 1917, 125). We might claim that absolute rule and absolute submission produce a sort of peace. But this is peace conjoined with injustice. So it is clear that the sort of peace that is worth pursuing is peace that is also linked to justice. The idea of justice is at the heart of the just war tradition, which claims that we are entitled to fight back against injustice. As Patrick Henry asked in his famous “Give me Liberty or Give me Death Speech”: “Is life so dear, or peace so sweet, as to be purchased at the price of chains and slavery?” One might claim that the peace of the Cyclops’ cave is not peace at all but a state of war.

Most pacifists will claim that the false peace of slavery is not what they have in mind. Rather, for the majority of pacifists, pacifism is not simply acquiescing passively to evil—pacifism is not passive-ism. Rather, pacifism involves actively but nonviolently resisting evil. Nonetheless, some pacifists, such as Tolstoy, do appear to advocate nonresistance. Tolstoy said, for example, “the only means of deliverance from violence is the submissive and peaceful endurance of it” (Tolstoy 1906, 36; see Christoyannopoulos 2020). Nonresistant pacifists in the Christian tradition often base the idea of submitting to evil on Jesus’ ideas as expressed in the Sermon on the Mount. “Do not resist one who is evil” and “love your enemies and pray for those who persecute you” (Matthew 5.39 and 5.44; Luke 6.27–30). Some Christian martyrs take this ideal seriously and look to Jesus’ life and execution as a model of pacific virtue.

1.2 Peace as Modus Vivendi or Truce

The dialectical definition of peace as the absence of war can encompass the idea of the armed peace of the Cold War. Peace as the absence of war may be a mere modus vivendi in which armed opponents refrain from attacking one another out of fear. This sort of peace is the peace of a truce or stalemate. While it is true that in such conditions, there is no overt damage done, the opponents have not been reconciled and hostile intentions have not been eliminated. Some may claim that the best we can do to make peace is to reach a state of detente that is made possible by mutual deterrent force. Related to this is what might be called, following Raymond Aron, “peace by impotence” or peace by exhaustion (Aron 1966, 159 ff). In this sort of peace, the antagonistic parties are simply no longer willing to fight. Hostile intentions may persist; but the will to fight can no longer be actualized. Kant rejected this sort of peace, claiming that peace means “an end to all hostilities” (Kant 1991, 93). This is why Kant maintains that the first principle of perpetual peace is that states should not make “secret reservation of the material for future war” (93).

Those who call themselves “pacifists” will usually agree with Kant that a mere modus vivendi produced by impotence or exhaustion is not actually peace, since hostile intent remains. And pacifists will argue that the peace of deterrence and detente are not really peace either, because they are the result of an increase in armaments and the threat of escalating violence.

1.3 Peace of a Just and Tranquil Order

Opposed to peace as modus vivendi is what Aron calls, “peace by satisfaction” (Aron 1966, 160 ff). This is a peace that results from a lack of grievances and hostility. In the history of the West, this sort of peace is often linked to what Augustine called the “tranquility of order” (Augustine 1958, Book 19, Chapter 13) In recent Western thought, this idea often follows Kant in claiming that liberal democracy is the key to such a tranquil order.

Francis Fukuyama’s Hegelian idea about the “end of history,” for example, hoped that the end of the Cold War would bring about the end of war in general, as liberal-democracy spread (Fukuyama 1992). Similarly, Michael Doyle has claimed that democracies do not go to war with one another (Doyle 1997; see Gursozlu 2017). John Rawls has explained the stability of well-ordered democratic states as follows: “There is true peace among them because all societies are satisfied with the status quo for the right reasons” (Rawls 1999, 47). More recently, this idea about the stabilizing and peace-making power of democracy has influenced neo-conservative ideas in U.S. foreign policy, where the hope is that peace will occur as democracy is spread.

The idea that peace is founded in a just political order is connected to the ideas of the just war tradition. Defenders of the just war tradition—from Augustine to Walzer—argue that occasionally it is necessary to make war in order to establish such a tranquil and just social condition. More recent defenders of the just war idea have argued that interventionist wars should be fought in order to create stable conditions by defending human rights (see footnote 1).

Pacifists will disagree with those who claim that wars should be fought in pursuit of the ideal of a just and stable social order. Proponents of humanitarian intervention maintain that war is a suitable means for attaining the goal of respect for human rights and satisfaction of human needs; but pacifists will argue that only nonviolent means are coherent with the these intended ends.

1.4 Positive Peace

Positive definitions of peace go beyond merely dialectical definitions of peace as the opposite of war and instead focus on peace as a state of rest, wholeness, or completion. The peace of a just and tranquil order points toward something like a condition of wholeness in which there is solidarity, mutual respect, and satisfaction of needs. In this vision of peace there is genuine community and human flourishing. This includes not only the absence of direct violence but also the absence of structural violence (Galtung 1969). The concept of structural violence has been widely discussed in recent years in connection with racism, sexism, and other forms of oppression. Structural violence involves very generally practices and institutions that undermine human flourishing and create social tension. One central concern from the standpoint of positive peace is the project of criticizing and remediating structural violence. This may include what Llewellyn (2018) has called “emancipatory peace,” i.e., peace related to liberation or emancipation from structures of oppression. This also includes the work of peace education, as well as work on nonviolent conflict resolution and mediation (see Fitz-Gibbon 2010). Related concerns point toward the importance of justice, with a special focus on restorative justice and community building. However, recent work (Davenport, Melander, and Regan, 2018) in the field of peace studies has argued that positive peace is both too broad and too vague to be of use for empirical work in peace studies. The worry is that the notion of positive peace includes a broad range of social and political concerns (equality, economic justice, environmental sustainability, and so on) that stray far from the core idea of peace as the absence of direct violence. Despite this criticism, the notion of positive peace remains in use.

The positive ideal of peace can be found in religious conceptions of peace. Stanley Hauerwas has explained that some Christian pacifists claim that the concept of shalom (Hebrew for “peace”) is focused on positive peace: it is more than the absence of war; rather, it is “harmony, health, and well-being in all human relations” (Hauerwas 155). Shameer Mondongal maintains that something similar is found in Islam, where salaam is more than the absence of war, “it also requires the presence of justice and an atmosphere that promotes self-actualization” (Mondongal 2023, 18). In some traditions, this appears to point beyond the merely political realm and aim toward spiritual transformation. In Christian contexts this is related to the peace of God that surpasses all understanding (as in Philippians 4.7). In Buddhism, this is related to the idea propounded by Thich Nhat Hanh (1987) of “being peace” that is connected to Buddhist practice. The Dalai Lama claims that peace is more than the absence of war and he connects his vision of world peace to peacefulness as a state of mind: “peace is a state of tranquility founded on the deep sense of security that arises from mutual understanding, tolerance of others’ point of view, and respect for their rights” (Dalai Lama, 202). This is closely related to the ideal of social stability; but the Dalai Lama also connects it to the deeper process of personal transformation.

1.5 Peace as a Virtue and Intrinsic Value

Building upon these ideas, Michael Fox has described “peace as a way of life”: “a peaceful way of life will be such as to incorporate nonviolence toward oneself and others, and will be guided by cooperation, mutual respect, creative problem-solving, negotiation of differences, and caring concern or compassion” (Fox 2014, 202).This conception of peace is not mere quietism or passivity. Jay McDaniel (2005) has argued in favor of a notion of “creative peace” in which there is tension and activity as individuals and cultures must learn to listen to and interact with one another. This notion of peace as a way of life can be understood in connection with virtue ethics, where peacefulness is understood as a virtue that is connected to other virtues such as modesty, tolerance, and mercy (virtue ethics is discussed further below).

As we conclude this consideration of what peace means in pacifism, it is important to note that pacifists often view peace as an end-in-itself or as a having a kind of intrinsic value. This is expressed in a variety of ways by pacifists. Pope Francis has said, for example, “Peace alone is holy. Peace alone is holy, not war” (Francis 2017). This idea has roots in Augustine, who says in The City of God that peace is the summum bonum(Augustine 1958, book 19, chapter 11). This is connected to Augustine’s idea that we should only go to war if we are aiming at peace. Of course, that idea is central to the just war tradition that develops after Augustine. Pacifists have responded by arguing that there ought to be a unity of means and ends and stipulating that only nonviolent means may be employed in pursuit of peace. This notion of peace as the summum bonum has been developed in Islamic thought by Wahiduddin Khan (2015), who suggests that peace is like the soil that provides a foundation for all other good things.

This conception of peace as having intrinsic value helps explain how pacifists may respond to the question of what peace is good for. If peace is conceived as having intrinsic value, it is not good for anything else; it is simply good in itself. In understanding peace in this way, pacifists may rely on a kind of intuitionism that holds that peace and its value are known through a kind of moral intuition. Fiala has developed this account of pacifist metaethics (Fiala 2022b), building on work in pacifist metaethics done by Holmes (Holmes 2017a and 2015). Those who hold that peace is an end-in-itself with intrinsic value may question the idea that peace should be understood in instrumental terms. For example, some will argue that peace is good because it produces prosperity (see Pinker 2011). But for pacifists who hold that peace has intrinsic value, we should do not pursue peace because it leads to prosperity; rather, we ought to pursue peace for its own sake.

Positive peace can be best understood from the tradition of virtue ethics, where peacefulness is understood as a virtue that is connected to other virtues such as modesty, tolerance, and mercy. It is important to note that peace is not mere quietism and the passivity of meditation or contemplation. Jay McDaniel (2005) has argued in favor of a notion of “creative peace” in which there is tension and activity as individuals and cultures must learn to listen to and interact with one another.

2. Varieties of Pacifism

Pacifism includes a wide variety of ideas and commitments. Pacifism has typically been understood as a critical or negative argument against war (or violence), even though Fiala has argued that pacifism could be understood as a comprehensive normative theory that postulates peace as the highest good (Fiala 2018a). Pacifism in its broadest sense can be distinguished from application of pacifist critique to particular issues such as: domestic violence (Hall Fitzgibbon 2017), environmental issues (Woods 2017), the death penalty (Steffen 2017), nonhuman animals (Chapple 2017), and so on. This article will not focus on those applications. Rather, it organizes the variety of pacifisms in several ways according to interrelated conceptual distinctions: absolute and contingent pacifism; maximal and minimal pacifism; universal vs. particular pacifism. These distinctions overlap, as we shall see here.

2.1 Absolute vs. Contingent Pacifism

This distinction organizes different answers to the question of how obligated we are to reject violence and war. Absolute pacifism is understood as a maximal and universal rejection of violence and war. Absolutism in ethics (or moral absolutism) holds that moral principles are eternal and unchanging and that they admit no exceptions. So, absolute pacifism holds that war and violence are always wrong. One recent proponent of a version of absolute pacifism is Michael Allen Fox. Fox argues that war is inconsistent with morality and with human well-being. He concludes by asserting a “very strong form of pacifism” and admits that this results in some uncomfortable conclusions, such as that “even military action aimed at protecting people against acute and systematic human-rights violations cannot be justified” (Fox 2014, 126). Fox explains that pacifism results in a difficult dilemma that is reminiscent of the question of whether two wrongs can make a right. Fox asks, “Should immoral actions be used to stop other (perhaps gravely more) immoral actions?”(Fox 2014, 127). He answers “No,” and maintains that this shows us that we have to work to find ways to move beyond our reliance on war as the solution to social and political problems. A similar conclusion has been argued by Holmes who concludes that morality and warfare are “antithetical” (Holmes 2017a p.25).

Non-absolute pacifism may be called contingent pacifism. While absolute pacifism admits no exceptions to the rejection of war and violence, contingent pacifism is usually understood as a principled rejection of a particular war. A different version of contingent pacifism can also be understood to hold that pacifism is only an obligation for a particular group of individuals and not for everyone. Contingent pacifism can also be a principled rejection of a particular military system or set of military policies. Contingent pacifists may accept the permissibility or even necessity of war in some circumstances and reject it in others, while absolute pacifists will always and everywhere reject war and violence.

Absolute pacifism is often connected with a religious standpoint in which nonviolence is seen as a religious commandment. Thomas Merton explains that Gandhi and most other absolute pacifists have a larger metaphysical view: “as Gandhi saw, the fully consistent practice of nonviolence demands a solid metaphysical basis both in being and in God” (Merton 1971, 209). There is an open question about how “absolute” Gandhi was in his pacifism (Fiala 2022a), but it is clear that he is often viewed as a paradigmatic figure of what we Allen calls “absolute nonviolence” (Allen 2022). In the West, absolute pacifism is often derived from the Christian ideal of nonresistance to evil as required by Jesus’ pronouncements about nonresistance in the Sermon on the Mount (in Matthew) or the Sermon on the Plain (in Luke). In Indian traditions, it is grounded in the commitment to ahimsa or nonviolence that is derived from a larger metaphysical picture which emphasizes karmic interdependence, ascetic self-abnegation, and compassion. The religious foundation of absolute pacifism is often tied to the idea that there is merit in suffering violence without retaliating. As Martin Luther King Jr. puts this, “unearned suffering is redemptive” (King 1986, 18).

Absolute pacifism is an ideal. Some versions of absolute pacifism go so far as to abjure the idea of personal self-defense. Other absolute pacifists may allow for personal self-defense while rejecting the impersonal and political violence of war. Almost every defender of absolute pacifism recognizes the difficulty of attaining to the absolute idea. Gandhi writes the following in his autobiography: “Man cannot for a moment live without consciously or unconsciously committing outward himsa (violence)… A votary of ahimsa (nonviolence) therefore remains true to this faith if the spring of all his actions is compassion, if he shuns to the best of his ability the destruction of the tiniest creature, tries to save it, and thus incessantly strives to be free from the deadly coil of himsa. He will be constantly growing in self-restraint and compassion, but he can never become entirely free from outward himsa” (Gandhi 1993, 439). The absolute ideal is nearly impossible to achieve because we must harm other beings in order to survive: we must kill in order to eat. And the world often presents us with difficult “kill or be killed” choices as in the question of self-defense or war. Absolute pacifists may hold that it is better to be killed than to kill. But such a choice may be impossible for many of us to make. Pacifists will often argue that this way of describing a situation—as one where the choice is “kill or be killed”—usually presents us with a false dilemma: often there are other nonviolent alternatives to either killing or being killed. But when presented with such a stark choice, absolute pacifism may require self-sacrifice.

Contingent or conditional pacifism qualifies such an uncompromising condemnation of violence and warfare. Albert Einstein and Bertrand Russell, for example, were both supporters of the war against Nazi Germany, despite the fact that each considered himself to be a pacifist. Russell identified his position as what he called “relative political pacifism” (Russell 1943). Russell uses the word “relative” to describe the contingent nature of the commitment to peace: one’s commitment to pacifism depends upon or is relative to the nature of the war. Relative pacifism means, for Russell, “that very few wars are worth fighting, and that the evils of war are almost always greater than they seem to excited populations at the moment when war breaks out” (Russell 1943, 8). Russell calls his position “political” because his emphasis is on war and political institutions, not on a personal commitment to nonviolence.

Along these lines, David Cortright has described what he calls “realistic pacifism.” Cortright claims that in the realm of nuclear war, pacifism is absolute. But in other sorts of conflict, pacifism is “conditional and pragmatic” and “predicated on a presumption against armed violence, but it acknowledges that the use of force, constrained by rigorous ethical standards, may be necessary at times for self-defense and the protection of the innocent” (Cortright 2008, 334). Such an idea is clearly related to just war theory. Indeed, some authors (such as Larry May) have derived contingent pacifism from just war thinking.

There are several varieties of contingent pacifism. A basic distinction to be made here is whether one’s argument against a given war is is merely occasional or situational (what we might call a contingently pacifist argument against a given war); or whether one is offering a broader argument against wars of a certain type or wars that are generally fought under certain conditions (see Fiala 2014; Morrow 2017).

First, pacifism may not be required of all moral agents. Thus pacifism may only be required for members of particular professions. Pacifism is often thought to be a professional obligation of certain religious vocations. But such a vocation may be thought of as a choice of conscience that is not universally required. In this version of contingent pacifism, the prohibition against violence only applies to those who take a vow or make a pledge to renounce violence and war. Within this two-tiered approach, the vow of peacefulness might be considered as a sort of supererogatory ideal that is not required of others. But it is also possible for the two-tier approach to contain an implicit condemnation of those who do not take up the higher calling of pacifism.

A second sort of contingent pacifism holds that if a particular war or military policy is prudentially unwise it should be resisted. Such prudential pacifism is based upon cost-benefit analyses focused on the facts of particular conflicts. A more principled sort of prudential pacifism can be based upon the general claim that war usually causes more harm than good.

A third sort of contingent pacifism will appeal to the just war theory and claim that a given war is unjust according to this theory. As John Rawls says of what he calls “contingent pacifism,” “the possibility of a just war is conceded but not under present circumstances” (Rawls 1971, 382). This idea is closely related to “just war pacifism” as developed in the last couple of decades by critics of the just war tradition: just war pacifism maintains that modern wars are not fought according to the standards of the just war theory because, for example, they make use of aerial bombardment and other means that do not adequately discriminate between combatants and noncombatants. Such a claim may result in a nearly absolute proscription against war under present circumstances. And it may contain an absolute prohibition against certain sorts of war, such as nuclear war. Most so-called “just war pacifists” are contingent pacifists in this sense: they object to the way modern wars are fought.

With the just war theory in mind, contingent pacifism may focus either on the basis for war (as in the just war idea of jus ad bellum), on the way that the war is being fought (as in the just war idea of jus in bello), or on the expected outcome of the war (as in the idea of jus post bellum). With regard to jus ad bellum, contingent pacifists may reject the legitimacy of the authority who is fighting, they may claim that war is not being fought as a last resort, or they may deny that the war is being fought for a just cause. With regard to jus in bello, contingent pacifist may worry that innocent noncombatants are being harmed or that soldiers are employing means mala in se (such as rape or torture). Finally, with regard to jus post bellum, contingent pacifists may object to wars that will undermine long-term peace, justice, and stability.

A fourth form of contingent pacifism might be called “political pacifism.” This approach adheres to pacifism as a strategic political commitment within an adversarial system. In political discourse, the so-called “doves” are usually not absolute pacifists. Rather, they define themselves in opposition to the “hawks” who advocate war and funding for the war-system. Political pacifists need not have an absolute commitment to nonviolence; nor need they have a principled commitment to the ideas of the just war theory. Rather, they can reject militaristic policies for strategic political purposes that have to do with budget priorities or other issues. Political pacifism may seem to be merely opportunistic; but opposition parties who offer critical perspectives on militarism are an important component of adversarial democracy. Moreover, political pacifists can end up forming useful coalitions with other more principled pacifists and absolute pacifists.

Finally, another version of contingent pacifism can be called, following Robert Holmes, “liberal-democratic” or “liberal pacifism.” Holmes argues that modern warfare runs counter to the values of liberal-democracy. Thus those who are committed to liberal values should not support war. Essential for this claim is the idea that “no one has a right to command others to kill, and no one is justified in killing on command” (Holmes 1999, 398). The sort of pacifism that is derived from this claim is contingent upon the fact that modern warfare involves a hierarchically organized military system and mass conscription. It is possible that war could be fought without conscription or without military hierarchy; but Holmes argues that this is unlikely in the modern world. Moreover, this sort of pacifism is contingent upon our social and political commitments. Those who are committed to other social and political ideologies may find that war and the war system are morally and politically acceptable.

Contingent pacifism is often based upon empirical and historical judgments about the way wars are fought. Such judgments will vary depending upon changing circumstances. And these judgments are also contingent upon the availability of information about why and how wars are fought. It is possible, then, that contingent pacifists can admit that there may be conflicting judgments about the justice of a particular war. Unlike contingent pacifism, absolute pacifism rejects war in an a priori fashion: one of the first principles of absolute pacifism is that war (or violence more generally) is always wrong. Thus absolute pacifism will claim that any judgment that leads to the justification of war is wrong.

2.2 Maximal vs. Minimal Pacifism

The difference between maximal (or broad) and minimal (or narrow) pacifism has to do with the extent of the commitment to nonviolence. This difference can be explained with reference to the questions of what sorts of violence are rejected, and who is the recipient or beneficiary of nonviolent concern. Pacifists reject violence and war. But there is an open question about how war and violence are defined and thus about what sorts of actions are rejected by pacifists. There is, of course, a continuum between maximal and minimal pacifism, with maximal pacifism rejecting all forms of war and violence. Minimal versions of pacifism fall away from this in various directions. Maximal pacifism is closely related to absolute and universal formulations of pacifism; minimal pacifism has more in common with contingent and particular versions of pacifism.

There are a variety of actions that can be described as “war”: terrorism, insurgency, civil war, humanitarian intervention, full-fledged inter-state conflict, and world war that includes the possible employment of nuclear weapons. Most pacifists will reject nuclear war and full-fledged inter-state conflict. But there are differences about whether, for example, civil war or humanitarian intervention can be justified. For example, some who could be described as pacifists supported the use of military force during the American Civil War (William Lloyd Garrison, for example, compromised his pacifist beliefs to support the cause of emancipating the slaves). At issue in thinking about these differences are questions about the importance of key values such as sovereignty and human rights, as well as the question of how best to create stability in the face of social unrest. One difficult issue for some pacifists is the question of using violence in defense of human rights or in opposition to tyranny. Maximal pacifists will reject all use of military force, even in defense against dictators or in response to human rights violations.

Maximal versions of pacifism will condemn all taking of life. Pacifists may also extend their rejection of violence to include a rejection of the death penalty, meat-eating, and abortion. More narrow versions of pacifism may take into account the distinction between the innocent and the guilty, holding only that the innocent may not be harmed. This distinction is important for thinking about the question of noncombatant immunity in war, with many pacifists arguing that war is wrong because it puts the innocent at risk. Some opponents of the death penalty will make a similar argument about the death penalty and the risk of executing the innocent. And opponents of abortion will also claim that it harms the innocent. The connection between war, the death penalty, and abortion is made in the Catholic “seamless garment” approach to the problem of developing a “consistent ethic of life.” This approach condemns all actions that harm innocent persons; and it is often extended toward a rejection of all harm, without regard for the distinction between innocence and guilt. Such a view has been defended most famously by Pope John Paul II, who rejected (or was skeptical toward) all sorts of violence including war, the death penalty, suicide, euthanasia, and abortion. Pacifists may also extend moral concern to include concern for all sentient beings; and thus pacifists may also condemn meat-eating and animal cruelty. Gandhi, for example, extended ahimsa maximally to include avoiding harm to sentient beings.

2.3 Universal vs. Particular Pacifism

This distinction has to do with the issue of whether everyone is required to be a pacifist or whether pacifism can be a moral choice of some particular individuals. This is related to the question of whether pacifism is a duty for all or whether it supererogatory. While the distinction between universal and particular pacifism is related to the distinction between absolute and contingent pacifism, it is primarily focused on the question of who is obligated by pacifism. Universalism in thinking about pacifism will hold that if war is wrong, it is wrong for everyone and thus that soldiers who fight are wrong, as are those who support the war system that encourages them to fight. Particular pacifists articulate their position as merely personal and do not condemn the war system or soldiers who choose to fight. Universal pacifism is closely connected with absolute and maximal versions of pacifism; particular pacifism is related to contingent and minimal pacifisms.

One way that this distinction between universal and particular pacifism has been enacted in history is through the idea of vocational pacifism discussed above Vocational pacifism holds that pacifism is a special obligation of a particular vocational service; but that it is not required of all. In this sense, pacifism is a supererogatory obligation. Religious clerics may thus be required to renounce violence, while ordinary members of their congregations may not be so obliged. Particular pacifism is thus connected to contingent pacifism: the moral demand of pacifism may be contingent upon one’s social position.

This distinction can be understood by considering whether pacifism is morally necessary or whether it is merely morally permitted. The universalist answer to this question is: if war and violence are wrong, then pacifism is morally necessary and those who fight are wrong. But some pacifist appear to hold that it is not wrong to fight (or that some persons are permitted to fight), even though the pacifists herself may choose (or is obliged by some vocational commitment) not to fight. A conscientious objector may thus choose not to fight while not condemning those who do. Conscientious refusal may be articulated as a personal belief about pacifism that does not apply to others. This is one way pacifists who refuse to fight may avoid the charge that they are traitors who are opposed to their compatriots who fight: they may deny that their refusal has any universal moral significance or application. Eric Reitan has argued that one may adopt a sort of “personal pacifism” that need not be universally applied. One way of understanding this is to connect it with the idea of tolerance. A personal pacifist may believe that pacifism is the right choice; but she may choose to tolerate others who do not make the same choice. A personal pacifist may also espouse a sort of relativism that holds that a commitment to pacifism is merely a personal commitment that cannot be used to condemn others who make different commitments.

This idea of particular pacifism is a subtle one. And critics will argue that it is incoherent, especially if it is understood as a sort of relativism. Those who claim that conscientious objectors are traitors may argue that pacifism cannot be a particular or personal choice. Critics of pacifism will argue that pacifism is morally wrong because they think that patriotism or justice requires fighting or at least supporting the war effort. This objection would hold that if a war is justified, then conscientious objectors are wrong to reject it. Particularists may reply by claiming that their rejection of war is a personal choice without universal significance.

2.4 Skeptical and Prima Facie Pacifism

Arguments in defense of pacifism are usually based on assertions about the immorality of violence and war. Thus pacifism is usually derived by negation. Pacifism, primarily, tells us what not to do. As Cheyney Ryan has argued, pacifism is a “skeptical position.” As Ryan puts this: “its general claim is that the proponent of killing cannot produce a single compelling argument for why killing another person is permissible” (Ryan 1983, 509). One of the skeptical problems that Ryan addresses is the problem that occurs in killing in self-defense. When a Victim kills an Aggressor in self-defense, this killing occurs before the Aggressor has actualized his malicious intention. In this case, killing in self-defense is out of proportion to the harm done, since the Victim who kills in self-defense was not himself killed. A skeptical version of pacifism can thus develop from the worry that when we choose to kill in self-defense, we never know whether this killing is in fact justifiable.

This sort of skeptical position can be linked to the just war tradition’s concern with the question of “last resort” in thinking about jus ad bellum. Skeptical pacifists wonder how we would know that we ever reach the stage of last resort, when violence becomes necessary. One way that pacifists articulate this concern is to focus on the variety of nonviolent measures that could be employed before it becomes necessary to resort to force. Indeed, it may be argued that to resort to violence is to admit to a failure of imagination and to give up hope that more humane forms of problem solving and conflict resolution can be effective. Moreover, pacifists will note that it is not sufficient to try nonviolent methods once and then disregard them. Rather, one must engage in a variety of nonviolent actions; and one must try these nonviolent alternatives more than once.

A somewhat different version of skeptical pacifism can be found in critiques of militarism and the ideology and propaganda that lead people to support war. This skeptical stance has been defended by Fiala (Fiala 2008 and 2010). In this approach, skepticism produces a practical political pacifism that is based upon the fact that citizens have no good reason to trust that their governments are telling them the truth about war and its justification. This skepticism is derived from historical judgments about the tendency of governments to manipulate information in order to provoke the citizenry toward war. In light of such skepticism, the burden of proof for the justification of war is placed upon the government, who must prove that the dangerous and presumptively immoral activity of war can in fact be justified.

This sort of skepticism might also be called “prima facie pacifism”: this is the idea that war is usually wrong except in certain extraordinary circumstances when it is compellingly shown that the evil of war is a sort of lesser evil that is necessary for some greater good. Prima facie pacifism presumes that war is wrong but allows for exceptions. Prima facie pacifism places the burden of proof upon the proponent of war: it is up to the proponent of war to prove, in a given circumstance, that war is in fact morally necessary.

2.5 Transformational Pacifism

Transformational pacifism is understood as aiming at a transformation of psychological, cultural, social, and moral sensibility away from acceptance of violence and war. Transformational pacifism articulates a broad framework of cultural criticism and includes an effort to reform educational and cultural practices that tend to support violence and war. The goal of transformational pacifism is a world in which war and violence appear to be archaic remnants of less civilized past. The author of the present entry has contributed to the idea of “transformative pacifism” as a critical theory of society that critiques militarism and the assumptions of warrior culture while offering a more peaceful ethical alternative (Fiala 2018).

One traditional version of transformational pacifism can be found in pacifist religious traditions. For example, Jesus articulated a revaluation of values from the standpoint of a more pacific understanding of God’s commandments. Instead of retaliation and the logic of “an eye for eye,” Jesus claimed that we must evolve a new idea—of not returning evil for evil. Transformational pacifism is often connected to a progressive interpretation of history that points toward a pacifist goal for human evolution. Gandhi thought that such progress was already underway and that history “has been steadily progressing towards ahimsa (nonviolence)” (Gandhi 1972, 310–11).

Transformational pacifism has been described by Joseph J. Fahey—who also calls it “reconstructionist” pacifism—as follows: “transformational pacifists stress the spiritual unity of all people… they seek not only the abolition of war, but also the creation of an international juridical, political, and economic order that will promote the rights of all species” (Fahey 1997, 393). War resistance can be located under this general rubric—insofar as war resistance is linked to a general criticism of those structures of authority, economic and political choices, and institutional frameworks that support what is often called “the war system” (see Atack 2001).

Transformational pacifism can also be linked to feminism and feminist critiques of the masculine values found in warrior cultures and the war system (see Poe 2017. Nobel Peace Prize winner Jane Addams is a prominent figure here. Addams connected her pragmatic hope for peace to democracy and the empowerment of women and the oppressed masses, who had in the past silently suffered from the horrors of war. During World War I, Addams and her Women’s Peace Party worked to end the war and eventually ended up creating the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. More recently authors such as Sara Ruddick and Nel Noddings have connected feminist criticism with pacifism and the ethics of care. Ruddick notes that military thinking utilizes a variety of conceptual strategies that create a myth of “the manly just warrior, which interlocks myths of masculinity, sacrifice, and heroic death” (Ruddick 1995, 202). Noddings has noted that “care ethics” does not support absolute pacifism, since care-givers may in rare circumstances kill in order to defend those they love. Nonetheless, Noddings argues that care ethics and feminism are concerned with a general critique of the militaristic and violent assumptions of male-dominant culture. Noddings contends that our culture “puts a high value on the aggressive tendencies of males” (Noddings 2010, 215). Her solution is to re-create culture and education in such as way as to devalue aggression and provide support for love, nurturance, solidarity, and care.

3. Consequentialist Pacifism

Deontological prohibitions against war are usually absolute, while consequentialist prohibitions against war are for the most part contingent.

Consequentialist pacifism is usually grounded in some sort of rule-utilitarianism. A utilitarian pacifist may argue that a rule against war or other sorts of violence will tend to promote the greatest happiness for the greatest number. A broader prohibition against violence other than war can extend the “greatest happiness” concept to take into account the happiness of sentient beings other than humans.

Utilitarian pacifists must appeal to empirical and historical data to support this rule. A utilitarian argument for pacifism could be grounded in the claim that history shows us that wars tend to produce more harm than good. As Bentham put it, “The happiest of mankind are sufferers by war; and the wisest, nay, even the least wise, are wise enough to ascribe the chief of their sufferings to that cause” (Bentham 1789, Fourth Essay) One of the problems for consequentialist arguments against war is that judgments vary about whether war always causes more suffering than it prevents. Utilitarian defenders of the just war theory will argue that some wars help alleviate suffering, as for example, in the case of humanitarian wars in defense of human rights.

Utilitarian pacifists may articulate a rule-based argument that holds that a general rule against war will, in the long run, produce more happiness. A utilitarian might support such an argument by also arguing that economic and other resources that are spent on war and preparation for war could produce more happiness if spent on peaceful goods such as education, hunger relief, and so on. And a rule-utilitarian might argue that a rule against humanitarian intervention would produce more happiness in the long run by protecting international stability and preserving important values like national sovereignty.

It is important to note that, unlike deontological pacifism, consequentialist pacifism is not opposed to killing per se. Nor is the consequentialist approach especially concerned with the distinction between combatants and noncombatants, since the “greatest happiness” principle adopts a perspective that includes both combatants and noncombatants. Indeed, the combatant/noncombatant distinction is better understood as a deontological principle, as discussed below. It is difficult to see how absolute pacifism can develop from act-utilitarianism that is devoid of side-constraints against killing. The rule-utilitarian approach can, however, allow for general rules that allow killing in certain circumstances, say in self-defense. The idea of proportionality in just war theory is an example of such a rule: killing in war is justifiable if it promotes general long-term happiness.

The claim that war produces more harm than good is disputable; at least, it requires empirical research to decide if it is true. Empirical research into the consequences of war provides mixed results depending upon contexts and circumstances in which wars are fought and the range of consequences considered (whether short-term or long-term). Some authors (Pinker and Goldstein) suggest that the use of judicious military power during the last several decades has produced good results. But other authors reach different conclusions. Ian Bickerton concludes that the wars of the past 200 years have produced ambiguous results: “victory did not achieve its desired results and war sacrifices were largely in vain. The reality is that the costs of war are rarely, if ever, worthwhile” (Bickerton 2011, xi).

Given the difficulty of assessing the empirical data, consequentialist pacifism will usually be a sort of contingent pacifism. But this is not always true, since absolute pacifism might be justifiable on consequentialist grounds as a rule that will in the long run produce good consequences. There may be variable judgments among consequentialists about whether some wars produce more harm than good. Thus pacifists such as Einstein and Russell could agree that the First World War was wrong, while admitting that the Second World War could be justified. The Second World War is in fact often used as an example of a war that can be justified in consequentialist terms: the good produced by the war—the defeat of Nazism in Europe, for example—is thought to outweigh its negative consequences, especially the massive numbers of persons killed in the war. In response, consequentialist pacifists might emphasize the negative utility of the deaths caused by the war while also arguing that the Second World War produced long-term negative consequences with the introduction of nuclear weapons, the partition of Europe, and the madness of the Cold War. Consequentialist defenders of pacifism will also argue that creative and coordinated nonviolent action can produce good consequences that are at least as good as the consequences of war.

One of the issues that consequentialists must consider is the temporal and spatial scope of our concern for consequences. It is possible that wars may produce short-term benefits for some and long-term disadvantages for others. Judgments about benefits and harms are thus complex and we must clarify our understanding of what matters in thinking about consequences. Often consequentialist arguments for pacifism emphasize the short-term damage of war. It is obviously true that wars kill people. But the further question to be asked from the standpoint of consequentialism is whether the harms that occur in the near-term are outweighed by the long-term benefits of the war. Just war theorists believe that some wars do have positive long-term consequences. Pacifists do not think that long-term benefits outweigh such near-term harms. Consequentialist pacifists often also consider the broad and long-term negative effects of war on the economy, on culture, on political life, and on the environment. Moreover, pacifists worry that war contributes to long-term international instability.

When thinking about the negative consequences of war it is important to recognize that we are engaged in comparative cost-benefit analysis. Critics of consequentialist pacifism often skew the results of such cost-benefit analysis by comparing war to passivity or inaction. But most forms of pacifism do not advocate complete passivity. It is a mistake to compare the consequences of going to war to the consequences of doing nothing. Rather, the cost-benefit analysis must compare the costs and benefits of going to war against those of creative, organized, and sustained nonviolent action.

A further consequentialist argument claims that cultures and states that fight wars tend to become militaristic and expansionist. This argument focuses on the long-term negative consequences of a social and political system that is committed to militarism. One of these negative consequences is the rise of the so-called “military-industrial complex” in which social capital is expended on military infrastructure at the expense of other social projects. A negative consequence of militarism is the tendency of militarist states to become centralized, secretive, and imperial. This critique of military expansionism can be connected to a general critique of the potential negative consequences of imperial power. One such negative consequence is found in the illiberal tendencies of military power. Another negative consequence can be found in the possibility of “blow-back” or retaliation in which those who are subjugated turn against the colonial power. And other negative consequences include the danger of an arms races and the wasted money and energy that are spent on preparing for war.

Empirical research is required to say whether it is true that what pacifists often call “the war system” does produce these negative political consequences. Judgment about these empirical facts will likely vary in accord with historical, geographical, and political differences, as well as in light of which consequences we chose to emphasize. Thus while pacifists argue that resources are squandered in war and environmentalists will point out the military is one of the largest polluters on the planet, proponents of war argue that war and the military produces goods and technologies, such as airplanes, satellites, and so on, that are useful for civilians (Ruttan 2006).

Another consequentialist argument can be located in the idea of the sort of “just war pacifism” that developed during the late 20th Century (see Sterba 1998 and Neu 2011). One significant worry of just war pacifism is that modern wars fought with weapons of mass destruction can never be justified. There are deontological concerns behind this sort of pacifism—with regard to concern for noncombatants. But there are also consequentialist reasons to be skeptical of wars fought with weapons of mass destruction, most notably the problem of escalation. Nuclear deterrent strategy relies upon the threat of escalation to keep antagonists in check. The idea of deterrent strategy is to make the negative consequences of war for the enemy so horrifying that war will not occur. But if the threat of escalation is real and the results of war are really so atrocious, then there are good consequentialist reasons to be opposed to war: wars fought with weapons of mass destruction will tend to produce horrifying consequences including the potentially total devastation of what was called during the Cold War, “mutually assured destruction.” During the Cold War, this concern was located in the worry about “nuclear winter,” which was the catastrophic destruction of the earth’s climate and biosphere that would occur if an all out nuclear war had erupted. Even more limited conflicts that occur among states that possess weapons of mass destruction could produce horrible consequences. Nuclear proliferation remains a concern along with the general threat of terrorists in possession of weapons of mass destruction.

Just war pacifists generally claim that the negative consequences of modern war make war unjustifiable. Just war pacifism might be more narrowly focused on the immorality of nuclear war and nuclear deterrence strategy. But those who reject nuclear warfare might still allow that limited defensive or even humanitarian wars can be fought provided we could be sure that just war principles were respected. Perhaps the most important conclusion of just war pacifism is that the burden of proof rests on the proponent of war: for just war pacifists who base their conclusions on consequentialist reasoning, war is presumed to produce negative consequences until is proved otherwise.

3.1 Active Nonviolence

Related to these consequentialist arguments against war is a more positive consequentialist argument about the positive power of nonviolence as a social force. This is grounded in a consequentialist argument that active nonviolence can produce social goods like respect for human rights as well as peace and reconciliation.

The basic theory and strategy of nonviolent action were worked out by Mohandas Gandhi, Martin Luther King Jr., Cesar Chavez, Gene Sharp, and others who were engaged in nonviolent social protest in the 20th Century. Although the roots of this approach can be found in the long history of pacifism from Jesus onward, the Gandhi-King approach both clarified the basic principles of nonviolent resistance and successfully put these principles into action in the Indian struggle for self-determination and in the American civil rights movement. One of the important contributions of this approach is the idea that there should be a coordination between means and ends. Peaceful means should be employed in pursuit of the end of peace and justice.

For peaceful means of social change to be effective, they must be coordinated and organized. Gandhi and King thought that the power of nonviolence was linked to its ability to motivate and move large numbers of people. Pacifism as a personal stance will not be effective at creating social change: it requires a coordinated social effort.

Proponents of active nonviolence will claim that coordinated nonviolence can be successful even in the face of aggression. Advocates of this position will point to the successes of Gandhi and King. They will also point to the “velvet revolutions” that occurred in Eastern Europe in the late 1980’s and early 1990’s. And they will point to the example of Lithuania in 1990–91, when unarmed civilians succeeded in turning back Soviet troops. Some initially viewed the so-called “Arab Spring” that began in late 2010 as an example of the power of nonviolence. However, subsequent oppression by military and police forces remind us of the fragility of nonviolent social movements. Proponents of nonviolent action argue that nonviolence could be even more effective if society focused its resources on training citizens for nonviolent resistance and on coordinating nonviolent action. The ideal here would be a sort of nonviolent “army” that is funded, trained, and coordinated for national self-defense in a way that mimics military training. For pacifism to be effective, the social resources—money, technology, and investment of labor and creative power—that are currently used for military training would have to be converted to nonviolent applications. This idea draws on what James called “the moral equivalent of war” and what Gandhi called the “nonviolent army.”

4. Deontological Pacifism

Deontological pacifism is closely related to absolute pacifism. Deontological approaches to morality focus on duty and right. One typical idea for deontological pacifism is that there is a basic law or principle that prohibits killing, such as “thou shall not kill.”

The most famous theory of deontological ethics is Kant’s. Kant’s categorical imperative is formulated as follows: “Act according to that maxim by which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law” (Kant 1990, 38). It is difficult to supply content to this imperative. Thus, it is not clear that the Kantian imperative can be used to rule out war. Indeed, Kant is a defender of a version of the just war theory, in part because he believes that states have a duty to defend their citizens. Although Kant is not himself a pacifist, one might be able to ground pacifism in Kant’s alternative version of the moral law: “Act so that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in that of another, always as an end and never as a means only” (Kant 1990, 46). Some pacifists use the second formulation of the categorical imperative to support their position by claiming that war treats persons as means and does not respect them as ends in themselves. One version of this idea has been defended by Soran Reader, who argues that the basic presumption of the “moral status of persons” leads to pacifism. Although Reader argues that one can arrive at this perspective from both a consequentialist approach and a Kantian one, she relies on the basic intuition that respect for persons as ends in themselves requires us not to kill them. It is possible to use this deontological principle to support a maximal extension of pacifism such that the prohibition against killing might be extended to include a prohibition against killing non-human persons. This interpretation would obviously require a further analysis of the notion of personhood. Another version of deontological pacifism has been defended by Robert Holmes who claims that morality, properly speaking, focuses on individuals, while war focuses on defending collectives, which are not the proper focal point of morality (Holmes 2017b).

In addition to killing human persons, war violates the moral status of persons when, for example, soldiers are viewed as interchangeable cogs in the war machine. One might then criticize the apparent “herd mentality” of militarism, as Albert Einstein did when he called the militaristic patriotism of the masses a sort of “loathsome nonsense” (Einstein 1954, 8) The idea of conscription seems to run counter to the idea of respect for persons. And pacifists may argue that it is somehow disrespectful to require soldiers to conform to military virtues such as obedience to authority. Arguments against militarism along these lines were made famous by Thoreau who claimed that in military service “the mass of men serve the State thus, not as men mainly, but as machines, with their bodies” (Thoreau 2000, 669)

The more important critique of the way that war betrays human dignity can be found in the pacifist critique of the killing that happens in war. Pacifists might claim that war is a violation of human rights. More concretely the pacifist may claim that all human beings have a right to life and that killing in war violates this right.

This idea has been rejected by Anscombe, Narveson, and others who argue that the idea of human dignity or human rights can necessitate the use of violence in defense of these rights. This sort of objection holds that it is both inconsistent and immoral for pacifists to reject the use of violence in defense of human rights. As David Luban puts this: “Such rights are worth fighting for. They are worth fighting for not only by those to whom they are denied but, if we take seriously the obligation which is indicated when we speak of human rights, by the rest of us as well” (Luban 1980, 170).

One of the ways that pacifists can reply to this objection is to emphasize the difference between personal nonviolence and war. Pacifists may accept that personal self-defense is acceptable; and they may accept the idea of using violence in defense of the innocent in concrete personal encounters. (Of course, absolute pacifists who emphasized complete nonresistance will not accept such violence at all). But pacifism as anti-warism will argue that the violence of war is of a different kind. War is dehumanizing violence that kills masses of persons without any concern for them as persons. Along these lines, Thomas Nagel claims that we should be able to justify to the victim what is being done to them, in light of morally relevant facts about them. At the level of personal violence, it is possible to say that an aggressor deserves the violence that is inflicted upon him. But at the level of war, this personal element is lost and instead we have killing en masse, which is an assault on human dignity.

4.1 Killing Combatants and Killing “The Guilty”

One aspect of the deontological condemnation of war focuses on the killing of combatants, although the killing of combatants has also been connected to contingent pacifism by way of just war theory’s proportionality constraint (Bazargan 2014). A pacifist might argue that it is wrong to kill enemy combatants because killing is always wrong. Such an argument runs counter to the just war ideal that combatants can be killed. Critics will argue that pacifism thus fails to distinguish between “innocence” and “guilt.” As Anscombe puts this, “pacifism teaches people to make no distinction between the shedding of innocent blood and the shedding of any human blood” (Anscombe 1981a, 58) The just war tradition holds that it is permissible to kill enemy combatants because these combatants are, in some sense, no longer innocent. Those who claim that it is acceptable to kill enemy combatants claim that enemy soldiers deserve to die; or at least that it is not wrong to kill them. There are open questions in just war theory about how this notion of desert functions. One of the problems is that young conscripted soldiers may not fully support the war into which they are drafted; and thus it may seem odd to claim that such soldiers are guilty for or deserve to be killed in a war for which they hold no personal responsibility (see McMahan 2009). But the most obvious way to justify killing combatants is to link such killing to the notion of self-defense. In war, soldiers are confronted with enemy combatants who will kill them and their comrades, if they aren’t killed first. In the language of just war theory, an enemy combatant is guilty of the crime of aggression; and in the context of war, this crime is punishable by death.

This notion of killing as punishment can easily be connected to the issue of the death penalty. For deontological proponents of the death penalty, murderers can be executed because the nature of their crime merits death. While consequentialists add in other considerations such as the deterrent value of the death penalty, the deontological approach focuses on the moral desert that is connected to the guilt of the murderer. This notion of guilt—as a moral quality that adheres to an individual in light of his past actions—is also found in the idea that enemy combatants may be killed. Those individuals who are engaged in fighting have done something (or have adopted some characteristic) that makes it permissible to kill them.

Absolute and maximal versions of deontological pacifism maintain that killing is never permitted, even the killing of enemy soldiers. They may also claim that the death penalty is wrong; and they may deny that killing in self-defense is ever justifiable. Opponents of war may also deny that international aggression is punishable by death.

A more subtle argument along these lines will claim that it is wrong to kill enemy combatants because enemy combatants are occasionally (or usually—depending on the strength of this particular claim) not responsible for their participation in war. This is especially true of conscript armies who are forced to fight. A pacifist might want to make an exception for killing soldiers who have malicious intent; but they may argue that it is immoral to kill soldiers who are forced to fight.

4.2 Killing Noncombatants

Although some maximal versions of deontological pacifism will claim that it is wrong even to kill combatants in war, other versions will argue that war is wrong primarily because of the risk to noncombatants. A cherished principle of the just war tradition is the idea of noncombatant immunity. This idea holds that those not actually engaged in the fighting should not be put at risk and should not be deliberately targeted. This idea is often connected to the idea that the innocent should not be killed. Noncombatants are presumed to be innocent and thus immune from being killed. There is an open question as to whether all noncombatants are really innocent. But the just war tradition stipulates that noncombatants should be immune from intentional harm. A version of pacifism can thus be derived from this principle of the just war tradition by arguing against wars that do in fact end up killing innocent noncombatants. Just war pacifists will argue that this is especially true given the nature of modern warfare, which includes the use of mechanized weapons, aerial bombardment, and weapons of mass destruction. Such weaponry does not adequately discriminate between combatants and noncombatants. Thus modern war cannot be just, according to the pacifist interpretation of the just war tradition.

The just war tradition, however, allows that innocent noncombatants may be killed according to the principle of double effect. This idea is derived in the Christian tradition from Aquinas, who holds that a single act may have two effects. Aquinas uses an example of killing in self-defense: the act has one effect of saving a life but another effect of killing the aggressor. Killing an aggressor in self-defense may be permitted, if the death of the aggressor is not the primary intention of the defensive act. It is significant that Aquinas does not expand this discussion to make it permissible to kill an innocent third party. But the just war tradition has employed this idea in a way that makes it permissible to kill innocent third parties (i.e., noncombatants) in war, so long as the primary intention is to accomplish a legitimate war aim and so long as the killing of innocents is merely a foreseen but unintended secondary effect. Absolute pacifists will argue against this employment of the doctrine of double effect and will claim that the killing of the innocent in war is always wrong, even if it is an unintended effect.

Indeed, some pacifists may also claim that since we know that war will kill noncombatants, it is disingenuous to claim that the deaths of innocent noncombatants are not intended. The pacifist may claim that the real problem of war is that noncombatants are killed intentionally as a means of warfare. Although Anscombe argued against pacifism, she made a similar argument in her criticism of the attacks on Hiroshima and Nagasaki, “it is nonsense to pretend that you do not intend to do what is the means you take to your chosen end” (1981a). Anscombe thought that war could be justified—if it did not directly intend to kill noncombatants. And Anscombe thought that pacifists were wrong to ignore the distinction between shedding innocent blood and shedding blood in just warfare. But pacifists might argue in response that war is wrong because innocent noncombatants are killed—whether intentionally or not.

5. Religious and Cultural Basis

5.1 Religion and Virtue Ethics

Pacifism that is absolutist and deontological is often grounded in religious belief. Christian philosopher Stanley Hauerwas has claimed that pacifism is a theological position because it is as much about eschatological faith as it is about ethics and politics (Hauerwas 2006). A variety of religions have supported pacifist positions. Hindus, Jains, and Buddhists share a concern for ahimsa or nonviolence as a basic moral virtue. Likewise, Christians also find a commitment to nonviolence at the heart of their tradition. One reason that absolutist and deontological pacifism appears to require a religious foundation is that the commitment to peace can lead to suffering in the ‘real’ world of political life. But for some religious believers the world of political life is only an apparent world and not the real world at all. In the Buddhist tradition, the world of dependent arising is a world of appearances in which suffering is ubiquitous. One of the ways to overcome this suffering is to see through the veil of maya and the illusions of this world. Ahimsa or nonviolence is a virtue that renounces the ubiquitous violence of the ‘real’ world. In a different way, the Christian tradition holds that the ‘city of God’ or divine providence is a mysterious reality that is infinitely more important than the reality of the ‘city of Man.’

The structure of this sort of religious belief is closely related to the absolute, deontological, and transformational nature of religious pacifism. In Christian pacifism, it is God’s commandments as articulated by Jesus that necessitate a commitment to pacifism. Of course, this is a contentious point; and some deny that Christianity requires pacifism (see Fiala 2007). But Christian pacifists maintain that Christians should refuse to kill regardless of the consequences in the ‘real’ world. Related to this is the faith that God will provide both the strength to endure suffering and a final reward for those who remain committed to principles of nonviolence. Even though pacifism may seem imprudent or even idiotic from the standpoint of consequentialism or political realism, these consequences have no lasting significance from the standpoint of Providence. Indeed, religious pacifists are not averse to the pain that they might suffer as a result of their refusal to take part in violence because they believe that this suffering will be redeemed in the larger structure of divine justice.

A further variety of religious pacifism is closely connected with the ideas of virtue ethics. Virtue ethics emphasizes the cultivation of virtues over the course of a lifetime. Virtue ethicists are reluctant to judge actions in isolation from the total context of an individual’s life. Religious pacifism has a virtue ethics component when the commitment to peace is conceived as a lifelong project of personal transformation. In the Christian tradition this is understood as a project in which human beings learn to imitate Jesus in order to become closer to God. The Christian model of virtue is Jesus, and Jesus’ practice of nonviolence culminated in his crucifixion. Christian martyrs have looked to this paradigm for millennia.

However, it is important to note that virtue ethics need not be reduced to a merely religious idea: there are important non-religious articulations of virtue ethics. And there are authors who defend versions of pacifism based upon claims grounded in humanistic virtue ethics. David K. Chan has argued, for example, that while virtuous individuals would generally be averse to killing, they would not be absolute pacifists (Chan 2017 and 2012). A different argument for pacifism, based in virtue ethics, has been made by Trivigno (2013), who argues that training soldiers to kill turns them into bad persons.

A similar idea about the practical impact of violence or nonviolence is found in the Indian traditions. Gandhi’s practice of self-renunciation (brahmacharya) including his vow of poverty and his fasts were closely tied to his commitment to ahimsa. For Gandhi, nonviolence is part of a total practice of virtue. In the Buddhist tradition this is developed for example, in Thich Nhat Hanh’s (1987) idea of “being peace.” The virtue approach emphasizes that pacifism is a lifelong project that requires discipline and practice. This is true because we are not born virtuous. Rather, we learn to cultivate the virtue of peacefulness by gradually learning habits that help us control and resist anger, hatred, pride, competitiveness and the other emotions that lead to violence. In the Christian tradition this is linked to the idea of original sin: we are born in violence and have to learn to overcome violence. Theological questions arise in Christianity about whether human beings can overcome violence by themselves or whether grace is needed in order to cultivate the virtue of peace.

It is possible to develop a version of virtue-pacifism from a non-religious standpoint. In the ancient world, some versions of Stoicism and Epicureanism come close to this. Stoics, for example, emphasize the virtue of tranquility or undisturbedness. One attains this state by learning proper discipline and by cultivating the other virtues that are essential for reigning in hubris. Hubris is wanton violence or pride run amok. Since Plato, the Greek tradition has claimed that justice, courage, moderation, and wisdom were needed to overcome hubris. It is conceivable that these virtues would conjoin in a sort of peacefulness. Indeed, one can see the roots of nonviolent social protest in Socrates’ nonresistance to the Athenian state. It should be noted, however, that although Socrates refused to carry out unjust orders, he did serve the state in battle.

A non-religious version of virtue-pacifism can be found in the ideas of 20th Century humanists such as William James. At the beginning of the 20th Century, James acknowledged that war and military service did produce certain virtues, such as courage and discipline. But James hoped that there could be a non-military way of producing these virtues. This was the basic idea behind his proposal for a “moral equivalent to war,” which was an attempt to find a way to produce virtues without connecting them to militarism (James 1910).

5.2 Diverse Religious and Cultural Sources

The general rejection of war has a long history that parallels the just war tradition and its idea that wars should be fought for the sake of peace and justice. In the West, pacifism and the just war tradition have roots in both Christian and non-Christian sources. For Christian thinkers, one of the primary problems is trying to reconcile the pacific commandments of Jesus with the apparent moral necessity of using war to defend the innocent. This problem is acute for Christians since Jesus seems to advocate an ethic of nonviolence both in the Sermon on the Mount and in his submission to violence, while Augustine and others use both Biblical sources (such as Paul’s letter to the Romans) and natural law to argue in favor of the just war idea. In the European tradition, pacifism is an ideal that develops alongside of and in contrast to the just war tradition, with adherents of pacifism including the Mennonites and Quakers, as well as Christian humanists such as Erasmus.

The problem of justifying war is also found in Greek thinkers, such as Plato, who argued in the Laws that war should only be waged for the sake of peace and that “it is peace in which each of us should spend most of his life and spend it best” (803d). And in the Crito, Socrates considers the problem of whether it is ever justified to return evil for evil. Socrates begins with the assumption that we must do no harm; and he and Crito agree at one point that one “ought not retaliate or render evil for evil to anyone, whatever evil we may have suffered from him” (49d). It seems that this idea is behind Socrates decision to remain in prison and allow himself to be executed.

Pacifism shows up in non-European traditions as well. Jains, Buddhists, and others in the Indian tradition share a commitment to ahimsa or nonviolence as a cardinal virtue (see Howard 2017). The ideal in these traditions is a sort of selflessness in which, through the dissolution of the self, a larger truth emerges. For Buddhists this is based upon the idea of nonattachment: war, violence, anger, and hatred result from our attachment to material things. Ahimsa is also linked to the idea that all sentient beings are interdependent. Thus nonviolence is extended toward a rejection of violence toward sentient beings in general and a commitment to vegetarianism. Mohandas Gandhi is perhaps the most famous adherent of ahimsa of the last century. Gandhi based his commitment to nonviolence on a spiritual foundation that emphasized self-renunciation (brahmacharya) and the positive action of the force of love or force of truth that he called satyagraha.

While Indian traditions are often cited as sources of pacifism, it is also important to note that pacifism and nonviolence can be found in Islamic traditions and in African religious and philosophical traditions. Ramin Jahanbegloo (2017) argues, for example, that Islam (whose root is salaam, which means peace) includes a rich conversation about violence and peace. In the South Asian context of the 20th Century, Muslims such as Maulana Abul Kalam Azad and Khan Abdul Ghaffar Khan joined Gandhi in affirming the power of nonviolence. There has been discussion among some Western politicians and journalists in the past couple of decades about whether there is something inherently violent about Islam and its notion of jihad. But scholars such as Cole (2021) and Shadi (2017) show that the diverse Muslim tradition includes a number of pacifist thinkers. And Alvi (2021) explains that a notion of nonviolent jihad can be found in Islam in relation to the idea of jihad as spiritual struggle, and with regard to the role of nonviolent activism in Islamic contexts.

A similar kind of diversity can be found across the world’s traditions. This includes pacifist ideas found in a variety of indigenous traditions. And often this involves a kind of syncretism that results from colonialism. One example in North America is worth noting: the case of Papunhank, a native American convert to Quaker religion in Pennsylvania during colonial times, who has been cited as a “pacifist prophet” (see Pointer 2020). In African thought this syncretism also includes the influence of Christianity and Islam. For example, the Jahkanke pacifists of West Africa were an Islamic sect (see Sanneh 2016). And it is important to note that Gandhi was also at work in South Africa, where Nelson Mandela and Archbishop Desmond Tutu are now seen as important figures in the history of nonviolence. While Tutu works in the Christian tradition, we also see an emphasis on nonviolence in indigenous African contexts. Gail Presbey has traced out numerous examples of this, including the way that nonviolence is related to concepts such as ubuntu (Presbey 2017).

It is to note that the distinction between European and non-European traditions breaks down in the 20th Century: Gandhi was inspired by Thoreau and by Tolstoy; and Gandhi in turn inspired Western pacifists such as Albert Einstein, Bertrand Russell, and Martin Luther King Jr. Gandhi and King both claim that one of the most important ideas underlying this sort of pacifism is love, especially the disinterested brotherly love that is described in the Greek New Testament using the word agape. King explains it this way: “In the final analysis, agape means recognition of the fact that all life is interrelated. All humanity is involved in a single process, and all men are brothers. To the degree that I harm my brother, no matter what he is doing to me, to that extent I am harming myself” (King 1986, 20) This idea represents the extension of Christian pacifism in light of Gandhian principles.

Further discussions should more systematically consider how such ideas have spread to Latin America, East Asia, and the Muslim world, as well as the ways that nonviolence shows up in the religious and philosophical traditions of the rest of the world. Research projects in pacifism and peace studies should continue to explore ideas found in the variety of world traditions including Taoism, African thought, and indigenous American philosophies.

6. Objections to Pacifism and Possible Replies

Here we will summarize briefly several objections to pacifism and pacifist replies to these objections. These objections and replies will, of course, vary according to the different sorts of pacifism being attacked or defended.

6.1 Pacifism is for Cowards, Free Riders, Traitors, and Other Vicious Persons

Objection: This objection holds that the reason pacifists advocate nonviolence is that they are afraid of suffering from violence; or that they are too lazy or self-interested to take up arms to fight. This objection focuses on the motivation and psychology of pacifists and accuses pacifists of the vice of cowardice. Moreover, such an objection may also argue that pacifists are egoists who are too selfish to do what is required to serve justice, protect the innocent, and defend the nation. The free rider objection adds that pacifists benefit from social goods that are produced through military power, while they contribute nothing substantial to the production of these goods. This objection thus claims that pacifism is unjust since pacifists share in social benefits, without also taking up the burdens and obligations that are tied to these benefits. Related to this is the charge that pacifism is unpatriotic and even treasonous. The concern here is that if pacifists are unwilling to fight to defend the nation, then they effectively betray the nation and help the enemy. As Jan Narveson once put this, pacifists have “too many friends” (Narveson 2003; also Narveson 2017) since they are unwilling to take up arms against their enemies. A more forceful ad hominem argument against pacifism can be found in Ward Churchill’s idea that pacifism is a pathology of the privileged, a point that has been reiterated by Derek Jensen. This objection holds that it is easy for those who are not oppressed to advocate nonviolence and indeed, that the powerful can use the ideology of pacifism as a tool with which to further oppress those who are unwilling to take up arms in defense of human rights. This idea can be traced back to ideas found in Marcuse, who argued that the weaker parties in social conflict are forced by the stronger party to employ nonviolence and thus that resort to nonviolence is both ineffective and an admission of weakness.

Reply: One way that a pacifist might reply to this objection is to argue that pacifism results from noble motives and not vicious ones. To support this reply, pacifists might show examples of the virtuous individuals who have advocated pacifism, while also emphasizing the ethical basis on which pacifism is grounded. Indeed, pacifists can avoid the cowardice objection by stressing that pacifists are willing to suffer violence even though they refuse to participate in it. With regard to the free rider problem, a principled pacifist can argue that her moral principles require that she be a pacifist and that these principles also require that she work to transform society. Moreover, pacifists can engage in productive social endeavors that do not necessitate the use of violence or war. This sort of compromise occurs when military states find ways to employ the talents of conscientious objectors. Pacifists who refuse to fight can volunteer their talents and energies in nonviolent activities that support the common good. With regard to the accusation of treason, a pacifist might claim that there are higher goods than the state. Indeed some pacifists—such as Tolstoy or Hauerwas—are also anarchists who claim that Christian faith requires that one overcome one’s attachment to the state as well as one’s hatred of enemies. A similar argument can be made against Churchill’s “pacifism as pathology” objection, with principled pacifists claiming that nonviolence is a moral requirement that transcends class and national ideology. Finally, a consequentialist pacifist can reply that she is concerned with the long-term interests of the community and not with the short-term question of winning a war or staging a revolution. While violence may create short term benefits, the long term project of creating a stable peace will require nonviolent means and projects focused on reconciliation and restorative justice. Contra the Churchill/Jensen objection, pacifists will emphasize the moral and political importance of unifying means and end. And, as José-Antonio Orosco has argued, nonviolent activism can be an effective means of countering oppression (Orosco 2017).

6.2 Pacifists are Wrong to Aspire for the Purity of “Clean Hands”; and Pacifism is Based on Bad Theology

Objection: The clean hands objection holds that pacifists are so committed to keeping their hands clean that they fail to act on other requirements of life. The clean hands objection holds that pacifists are disconnected from the world of concrete human reality. As Anscombe puts this in her critique of pacifism, the pacifist holds “withdrawal from the world as man’s only salvation” (Anscombe 1981a, 52). This is tied to a theological objection that holds that pacifists incorrectly believe that they can overcome the limits of human nature. A version of this objection that is often directed against Christian pacifism holds that war will remain necessary because of the fallen and sinful nature of human beings. This objection also reminds Christian pacifists that there is explicit advocacy for war in the Old Testament and that Paul’s letter to the Romans allows the sovereign to use the sword to execute God’s wrath. The objection holds that since we are not perfect, we must employ the imperfect means of war and violence to attain moral ends. From this standpoint, defenders of the idea of a just war argue that love of the neighbor and the need for a just social order will occasionally necessitate just wars.

Reply: Pacifists might reply to this sort of objection by delving deeper into the requirements of both religious faith and ethics. This objection is tied to a much larger problem of coordinating the demands of ordinary political life with the requirements of morality and religion. Christian pacifists will reply to the “bad theology” objection by focusing on the message of Jesus in the Gospels; and they will argue, as John Howard Yoder does, that just war theory is a later development of a lapsed sort of “Constantinian” (or Augustinian) Christianity. Moreover, Christian pacifists will argue that pacifism is part of a religious worldview that looks beyond a materialistic defense of the finite goods of this world. For religiously oriented pacifists in many traditions, a commitment to nonviolence is tied to the attempt to see through the vanity of temporal things. Nonreligious pacifists will reply to this objection by clarifying the importance of clean hands in morality. Absolutists will claim that we have an obligation to uphold the requirements of morality and keep our hands as clean as possible. They will also claim that the world would be a better place if everyone took this obligation seriously and refused to compromise with evil.

6.3 Pacifism is Self-contradictory, Unjust, and Not Effective

Objection: This objection claims that pacifism results in a performative contradiction because an absolute pacifist who is unwilling to defend himself simply ends up dead. A more subtle version of this argument has been articulated by Jan Narveson (Narveson 1965) who argued that pacifism involves an internal contradiction that is related to the idea of justice and human rights. Pacifists are unwilling to use violence to defend against aggression because they respect life or respect persons. But a contradiction occurs when the pacifist who claims that life is an absolute good is unwilling to take the necessary steps to defend lives that are threatened by aggression. This objection shares something with those defenders of the just war idea who, like George Weigel, are inspired by the Augustinian ideal of using war to defend a tranquil and just social order. The objection holds that it is immoral to avoid war, when war could be used to defend the innocent, protect sovereignty, and uphold a just international order. This objection can be applied both to defensive wars, in which the state has an obligation to protect its own citizens, and to wars of humanitarian intervention, in which military power is used to defend the human rights and to establish domestic tranquility and social order in pursuit of peace. Related to this is the claim that nonviolent means of producing social change are ineffective. Critics will claim, for example, that although there appear to be cases of successful nonviolent action in India or in the American civil rights movements, these movements were successful because of unique set of historical circumstances. Critics will argue that Gandhi’s success was made possible by British exhaustion from the World Wars; and they will argue that the success of Martin Luther King Jr. was made possible by the threat of violence from radicals such as the Black Panthers. Moreover, critics will argue that Gandhi and King were successful because their opponents were for the most part sympathetic to their cause from the beginning. But such critics will argue that non-violence will simply not work against Nazis or terrorists; and that those who think so are dangerously deluded. President Barack Obama articulated this sort of objection to pacifism in his Nobel Peace Prize acceptance speech (Obama 2009). Obama expressed respect for pacifists such as Gandhi and King. He said, “there is nothing weak, nothing passive, nothing naive in the creed and lives of Gandhi and King.” But he claimed that a head of state cannot be guided by pacifism. And he concluded: “A nonviolent movement could not have halted Hitler’s armies. Negotiations cannot convince al-Qaeda’s leaders to lay down their arms.” A similar argument about the efficacy of violence has been made by defenders of insurrectionary violence such as Marcuse, Fanon, and Sartre.

Reply: One way that a pacifist may reply to this objection is to focus on pacifism as a skeptical political stance about war. Some political pacifists do allow for personal self-defense and defense of loved-ones while remaining skeptical of war as a social movement. Another way that a pacifist may reply is to focus on consequences and argue that war produces more negative consequences than nonviolence. Against Narveson, the pacifist might argue that pacifism is no more contradictory than the idea that we might kill in order to defend life. Deontological pacifists will also reply that while they do value a just and tranquil social order, and may even be willing to die in defense of such as just order, their basic principles prohibit them from killing in its defense. A pacifist might further reply to this objection by arguing that the idea that war can be used to defend the innocent is also imprudent and unwise. Pacifists will argue that nonviolent means of defending the just political order are the best means to be employed in practice because they remain consistent with the ideals of justice and order that are to be defended. This claim about the unity of means and ends can be used to argue against the Fanon/Marcuse justification of violence in insurrection by noting a contradiction in revolutionaries using violence to oppose the violence of oppressive states. A pacifist might add that history shows that violent revolution often either escalates or provokes more oppression. With regard to humanitarian intervention, some deontological pacifists will worry that interventions by outsiders will run counter to the national right to self-determination. And more prudentially minded pacifists will worry that humanitarian intervention will produce resistance and an escalation of violence that will undermine the long-term goals of political stabilization, justice, and reconciliation. Finally, the pacifist might also appeal to the tragic element in human life: that we often have to make tragic choices in which there is no genuinely good alternative. When confronted with such tragic conflicts, the pacifist will argue that we should err on the side of peace and take care that we do no harm. The examples of King and Gandhi may in fact require careful historical analysis; and different historical circumstances will require different sorts of nonviolent action. But, for the pacifist, history shows us the horror of war; and the success of Gandhi and King reminds us that there is an alternative. Finally, a pacifist might also point out that the long term goal of a transformation beyond war is shared by a variety of people, including those who are reluctant to call themselves pacifists. As Obama pointed out in his Nobel Peace Prize speech, even if war may be necessary, it is also “at some level an expression of human folly.” Pacifists usually deny that war is necessary. But they agree that war is usually an expression of human folly.

6.4 Pacifism is Unscientific, Apolitical, and Unhistorical

Objection: This objection is often implicit in the work of scholars in international relations and politics, who do not take pacifism seriously as possible political commitment. Sometimes this depends upon a narrow definition of pacifism. Howes suggests, for example, that “pacifism” remains an extreme, minority position, even though “nonviolence” is widely accepted (Howes 2013). His point depends upon viewing pacifism as a political ideology similar to fascism or liberalism. Howes maintains that it is not the case that large numbers of people have ever adopted pacifist principles, which makes it unsuitable as an explanatory theory of political action and organization. Similarly, Kusterman and co-authors claim that “committed pacifism remains a minority position” (Kusterman 2019, 2). Jackson has explained further that pacifism and nonviolence have been dismissed and even “subjugated” in the field of international relations (Jackson 2018). Jackson also maintains that many scholars in international relations consider pacifism to be “unscientific, naïve, and of limited relevance” (Jackson 2021, 107). This sort of concern is connected to the implicit assumption of something like “realism” in international affairs and a view of history and politics that is focused on war and violence. One assumption here is that states and statecraft are fundamentally oriented toward military power and war, in their function of preserving order through a “monopoly on violence.” This may be linked to an empirical analysis of states and international relations that focuses on military balances of power, the use of violence in domestic policing, and more generally on the ways that violence is used to create, organize, and maintain political entities. From this point of view, pacifism is at best a hopeful utopianism that ignores political reality. At worst, from this critical point of view, pacifism seriously misunderstands the way that political power works.

Reply: In reply, one could note that pacifist principles have in fact been used to organize and mobilize people. There are religious (and non-religious) communities who organize themselves around a commitment to peace, and who are efficacious in political life despite (or because of) their commitment to pacifism. Sometimes this results in separatism, as when pacifist communities opt out of mainstream politics (the Amish, for example). Furthermore, nonviolent movements are able to mobilize political power. The basis for this claim can be grounded in the historical efficacy of nonviolent liberation movements such as that of Gandhi or King. There is a growing body of scientific studies that focus on nonviolence and its political efficacy in a wide range of cases (see Ackerman and Duvall, Chenoweth and Stephan, and Hallward and Norman). Indeed, following the work of these authors as well as Howes, Jackson, Atack, and others, one could argue that there is growing interest in the empirical study of nonviolence and its efficacy. Of interest here is the question of whether the strategic use of nonviolence is in fact pacifism. This question returns us to the question with which this article began about how we define pacifism and nonviolence. Finally, in reply one could suggest as Jackson has (Jackson 2021) that a major virtue of pacifism is that it is not focused on a “top-down” or “state-centric” conception of power that takes violence for granted as the focal point of political power. A pacifist conception of power is not focused on physical strength and superiority. Rather, pacifists tend to hold that might does not make right and that power relies upon a more positive set of virtues such as truth, compassion, justice, and peacefulness.


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