Plato on Rhetoric and Poetry

First published Mon Dec 22, 2003; substantive revision Tue Feb 20, 2024

Plato’s discussions of rhetoric and poetry are both extensive and influential. As in so many other cases, he sets the agenda for the subsequent tradition. And yet understanding his remarks about each of these topics—rhetoric and poetry—presents us with significant philosophical and interpretive challenges. Further, it is not initially clear why he links the two topics together so closely (he suggests that poetry is a kind of rhetoric). Plato certainly thought that matters of the greatest importance hang in the balance, as is clear from the famous statement that “there is an old quarrel between philosophy and poetry” (Republic, 607b5–6). In his dialogues, both this quarrel and the related quarrel between philosophy and rhetoric amount to clashes between comprehensive world-views—those of philosophy on the one hand, and of poetry or rhetoric on the other. What are these quarrels about? What does Plato mean by “poetry” and “rhetoric”? The purpose of this article is to analyze his discussions of rhetoric and poetry as they are presented in four dialogues: the Ion, the Republic, the Gorgias, and the Phaedrus. Plato is (perhaps paradoxically) known for the poetic and rhetorical qualities of his own writings, a fact which will also be discussed in what follows.

1. Introduction

A good poem helps to change the shape and significance of the universe, helps to extend everyone’s knowledge of himself and the world around him —Dylan Thomas[1]

When we think of a philosophical analysis of poetry, something like a treatise on aesthetics comes to mind. At a minimum, we would expect a rigorous examination of the following: the characteristics that define poetry; the differences between kinds of poetry (epic, tragic, lyric, comic, and so forth); and the senses in which poetry is and is not bound to representation, imitation, expression (which are possible meanings of the classical Greek word “mimesis”) and fiction.[2] These complicated terms themselves require careful definition. Equally rigorous and systematic remarks about the differences between poetry and other art forms, such as music and painting, would be in order, as would reflection on the relation between orally delivered poetry (indeed, if we are to include performance, poetry that is in one way or another enacted) and poetry communicated through the written word. Aristotle’s Poetics is an early, and now classic, philosophical exploration of poetry along these sorts of lines.

Plato’s extensive discussions of poetry frustrate these expectations. He did not write a treatise on the subject—indeed, he wrote no treatises, and confined his thought to “dramatic” dialogues that are themselves shaped poetically—and the remarks he offers us both meander unsystematically, even within a single dialogue, and branch off in what seem like strange directions, such as into discussions about the corruption of self to which poetry allegedly exposes its audience. And yet Plato clearly thought that something of enormous importance hangs on his assessment of poetry, something that goes significantly beyond getting the details of the subject pinned down in a philosophically respectable fashion. One of the most famous lines in the culminating sections of one of his most famous dialogues announces that “there is an old quarrel between philosophy and poetry” (Rep. 607b5–6), in support of which Plato quotes bits of several obscure but furious polemics—presumably directed by poets against philosophers—such as the accusation that the opponent is a “yelping bitch shrieking at her master” and “great in the empty eloquence of fools”. [3] Indeed, much of the final book of the Republic is an attack on poetry, and there is no question but that a quarrel between philosophy and poetry is a continuing theme throughout Plato’s corpus.

The scope of the quarrel, especially in the Republic, also indicates that for Plato what is at stake is a clash between what we might call comprehensive world-views; it seems that matters of grave importance in ethics, politics, metaphysics, theology, and epistemology are at stake. He leads up to the famous line about the quarrel by identifying the addressees of his critique as the “praisers of Homer who say that this poet educated Greece, and that in the management and education of human affairs it is worthwhile to take him up for study and for living, by arranging one’s whole life according to this poet” (606e1–5). The praisers of Homer treat him as the font of wisdom. Plato agrees that Homer is indeed the educator of Greece, and immediately adds that Homer is “the most poetic and first of the tragic poets.” Plato is setting himself against what he takes to be the entire outlook—in contemporary but not Plato’s parlance, the entire “philosophy of life”—he believes Homer and his followers have successfully propagated. And since Homer shaped the popular culture of the times, Plato is setting himself against popular culture as he knew it. Not just that: the quarrel is not simply between philosophy and Homer, but philosophy and poetry. Plato has in his sights all of “poetry,” contending that its influence is pervasive and often harmful, and that its premises about nature and the divine are mistaken. He is addressing not just fans of Homer but fans of the sort of thing that Homer does and conveys. The critique is presented as a trans-historical one. It seems that Plato was the first to articulate the quarrel in so sweeping a fashion.[4] It is noteworthy that in the Apology (23e), Socrates’ accusers are said to include the poets, whose cause Meletus represents.

It is not easy to understand what Plato means by poetry, why it is an opponent, whether it is dangerous because of its form or content or both, and whether there is much of ongoing interest or relevance in his account. Would his critique apply to, say, Shakespeare’s tragedies? To E. E. Cummings’ or T. S. Eliot’s poetry? These questions are complicated by the fact that Plato was not (or, not primarily) thinking of poetry as a written text read in silence; he had in mind recitations or performances, often experienced in the context of theater. Still further, when Socrates and Plato conducted their inquiries, poetry was far more influential than what Plato calls “philosophy.” Given the resounding success of Plato’s advocacy of “philosophy,” it is very easy to forget that at the time he was advocating a (historically) new project in a context swirling with controversy about the relative value of such projects (and indeed about what “philosophy” means). By contrast, poetry seems relatively marginal in today’s large commercial and liberal societies, in spite of the energetic efforts of figures such as the recent American national Poet Laureate Robert Pinsky, whereas media of which Plato knew nothing—such as television, videos, and the cinema, literary forms such as the novel, and information systems such as the World Wide Web—exercise tremendous influence. Television and movie actors enjoy a degree of status and wealth in modern society that transcends anything known in the ancient world. Is Plato’s critique marginalized along with poetry?

In spite of the harshness, and in some ways the bluntness of Plato’s critique of poetry, he not only put his finger on deep issues of ongoing interest, but also leavened his polemic in a number of intriguing and subtle ways—most obviously, by writing philosophy in a way that can, with proper qualifications, itself be called poetic. The “quarrel between philosophy and poetry” is justly famed and pondered: what is it about?

When we turn to the second theme under consideration, viz., rhetoric, we find ourselves even more puzzled initially. What do philosophers have to say about rhetoric? Generally speaking, very little qua philosophers. Like all reflective people, philosophers dislike rhetoric as it is commonly practiced, bemoan the decline of public speech into mere persuasion and demagoguery, and generally think of themselves as avoiding rhetoric in favor of careful analysis and argument. “Rhetoric” tends to have a very negative connotation, and for the most part means “mere rhetoric.” As an object of academic study, the subject of rhetoric seems best left to English professors who specialize in the long history of manuals on techniques of persuasion and such. Consequently, philosophers, especially in modernity, have had little to say about rhetoric. By contrast, Aristotle devoted a book to the topic. And Plato struggles with rhetoric—or sophistry as it is sometimes also called, although the two are not necessarily identical—repeatedly. We recall that Socrates was put to death in part because he was suspected of being a sophist, a clever rhetorician who twists words and makes the weaker argument into the stronger and teaches others to do the same.[5] Plato’s polemic against the sophists was so persuasive that, in conjunction with a well established and ongoing popular hostility towards sophistry (a hostility of which Socrates was, ironically, also the object), we have come to use “sophist” as a term of opprobrium meaning something like “mere rhetorician.” In Plato’s dialogues there is unquestionably an ongoing quarrel between philosophy on the one hand and rhetoric and sophistry on the other, and it too is justly famed and pondered. What is it about?

Once again, the question is surprisingly difficult. It is not easy to understand why the topic is so important to Plato, what the essential issues in the quarrel are, and whether rhetoric is always a bad thing. We do recognize commendable examples of rhetoric—say, Pericles’ Funeral Oration, Lincoln’s Gettysburg Address, or Churchill’s rousing speeches during World War II. These were rhetorical, but were they merely rhetorical, let alone sophistical? Still further, Plato’s Socrates is not above speaking to his interlocutors rhetorically at times, even sophistically (some of his arguments against Thrasymachus in book I of the Republic have been suspected of falling into the latter category, and Socrates’ interlocutors are occasionally reported as feeling that he has played some kind of verbal trick on them). And are not Plato’s dialogues themselves rhetorical in significant senses of the term?

These remarks prompt yet another question. However interesting the topics of poetry and rhetoric may be, when we read Plato, why group them together? Few people today would imagine that there is any interesting relation between poetry and rhetoric. To think of great poets as “rhetoricians” seems bizarre; and most (popular) rhetoricians do not seem to know the first thing about poetry. Yet Plato himself associates the two very closely: at Gorgias 502c he characterizes poetry as a kind of rhetoric. Thus Plato provides our warrant for investigating the topics together. This linkage between poetry and rhetoric is of course controversial, and will be discussed below.

Quite clearly, our themes are very large in scope, and indeed nearly every one of Plato’s dialogues is relevant to one or more of them. The present essay will confine itself to just four dialogues, the Ion, Republic, Gorgias, and Phaedrus. I will discuss them in that order, and in the final section of the essay shall briefly examine the famous question of the poetic and rhetorical dimension of Plato’s own writings.

I shall look for connections between our four dialogues, though I do not believe that our chosen texts present a picture of poetry and rhetoric that is altogether unified (indeed, this could not be claimed even of the Republic taken by itself). I will put aside the question about which dialogue Plato composed at which time, along with assumptions about the possible “development” of Plato’s views from “earlier” to “later” dialogues. This is an example of an interpretive (or as it is sometimes called, a “hermeneutical”) assumption; every reader of Plato necessarily commits to interpretive assumptions. The debate about which assumptions are best is an ongoing one, but not germane to the present discussion.[6] It suffices here to state the relevant assumptions made in this discussion.

The identity of “Socrates” is contested; we have no writings by the historical figure, only writings by a number of authors that in some sense or other—and the senses vary a great deal—are either about him or creatively adapt his name and aspects of his story. In referring to Socrates, I shall mean only the figure as represented by Plato; nothing follows, for present purposes, about the historical accuracy of Plato’s depiction. Further, it is not the case that the views Plato puts into the mouth of his Socrates are necessarily espoused by Plato himself; they may or may not be those of Plato. Since Plato did not write a treatise in his own voice, telling us what his views are, it is impossible to know with certainty which views he espouses (at least on the basis of the works he composed). In several cases, one of which will be examined in the final section of this essay, it seems reasonably clear that Plato cannot be espousing without qualification a view that his Socrates is endorsing. With these principles firmly in mind, however, I shall occasionally refer (as I already have) to Plato as presenting this or that view. For as author of all the statements and drama of the dialogues, he does indeed present the views in question; and on occasion it is convenient and simpler to say he is advocating this or that position (for example, the position that there is an ancient quarrel between philosophy and poetry).

2. Ion

Ion is a prize-winning professional reciter of poetry—a “rhapsode”—and of Homer in particular.[7] Though he speaks his lines with the requisite conviction and emotion, he does not “imitate” his subjects in the sense of act their parts (of course, Homer did not write for the stage). He is a performer but not a (stage) actor. Ion is depicted as superb at making the Iliad and Odyssey come alive, at communicating their drama to his audience and at involving them intimately. We might say that he “represents” or “expresses” the characters, action, and narrative of Homer’s epic poems, and thus in some sense both identifies with his subject and leads his audience to do the same. As he puts it in the dialogue that bears his name: if he has done his job well, he will find himself weeping when reciting sorrowful lines, and expects to see his audience weep along with him (535b1–e6). Both are somehow transported, thanks to Ion’s superb narrative capacity, into the original scene (as Socrates says, Ion is “beside himself” and in the enthusiasm of the moment thinks he is present at the scene he is describing; 535b7–c3).

But Ion thinks himself capable of yet more, for he also claims to be an expert in explaining what Homer means. He’s an exegete (see 531a7) or interpreter par excellence, and this claim especially intrigues Socrates. He does not permit Ion to actually exhibit his skills as a rhapsode, and instead insists that he engage in give-and-take about the abilities Ion claims to possess. This is typical of Socrates’ method; he forces his interlocutor to give an account of his commitments and way of life. As both reciter and exegete, the rhapsode has no exact analogue today. Nonetheless, the implications of the Ion are broad; while Ion is not a poet himself, he bears important traits in common with the poet.

The thrust of Socrates’ initial questioning is revealing. Essentially, he attempts to show that Ion is committed to several theses that are not compatible with one another, unless a rather peculiar, saving assumption is introduced. Ion claims that he is a first rate explicator of Homer; that he is a first rate explicator only of Homer, and loses interest as well as competence if another poet (such as Hesiod) is brought up (531a3–4, 532b8–c2; 533c4–8); and that Homer discusses his subjects much better than do any other poets (531d4–11, 532a4–8). Ion may justly be thought of as one of the “praisers” of Homer referred to in Republic X (see above, and Ion 542b4). Notice that Socrates’s first order of business is to get Ion to agree that a number of claims are being made by him; while this may seem obvious, it is an essential condition for Socrates’ inquiry, and is a distinctive characteristic of the sort of thing Socrates does as a philosopher.

If Ion is an exegete or explicator of Homer’s poems, he must surely understand what the poet means, else he could not explain the poet’s thoughts. This seemingly commonsensical point is asserted by Socrates at the start (530c1–5), and happily accepted by Ion. However, if Ion understands what the poet says about X, and judges that the poet speaks best about X, he must be in a position to assess other poets’ pronouncements about the subject in question. For example, Homer talks a great deal about how war is waged; as an expert on Homer who claims that Homer spoke beautifully about that subject (in the sense of got it right), Ion must be in a position to explain just how Homer got it right and how Hesiod, say, got it wrong, as a series of simple analogies show. If you can knowledgeably (531e10) pick out a good speaker on a subject, you can also pick out the bad speaker on it, since the precondition of doing the former is that you have knowledge of the relevant subject matter. But this seems to contradict Ion’s assertion that he can explain only Homer, not the other poets.

Let us recapitulate, since the steps Socrates is taking are so important for his critique of poetry (it is noteworthy that at several junctures, Socrates generalizes his results from epic to dithyrambic, encomiastic, iambic, and lyric poetry; 533e5–534a7, 534b7–c7). To interpret Homer well, we have to understand what Homer said; to do that, and to support our judgment that he spoke superlatively well, we have to understand the subject matter about which Homer speaks (just as we would in, say, evaluating someone’s pronouncements about health). Further, Homer himself must have understood well that about which he speaks. As interpreters or assessors, we are claiming to be experts judging a claim (in this case Homer’s) to expertise, just as though we were members of a medical examination board considering an application to the profession. So as interpreters we are making claims about the truth of Homer’s teachings about XYZ; and thus we are assuming that Homer sought to state the truth about XYZ. Given that he discusses the central topics of human and godly life (531c1–d2), it would seem that Homer claims to be wise, and that as his devoted encomiasts we too must be claiming to be wise (532d6–e1). But claims to wisdom are subject to counter-claims (the poets disagree with each other, as Socrates points out); and in order to adjudicate between them, as well as support our assessment of their relative merits, we must open ourselves to informed discussion both technical and philosophical. Technical, because on subjects such as (say) war-making, the general should be consulted about the accuracy of Homer’s description thereof; philosophical because both the method of assessing the whole (the “Socratic method”) and the comprehensive claims about the truth made by interpreter and poet, are properly philosophical preoccupations for Plato.

It is but a step from there to the proposition that neither Ion nor Homer can sustain their claims to knowledge, and therefore could not sustain the claim that the poems are fine and beautiful works. In passage after passage, Homer pronounces on subjects that are the province of a specialized techne (art or skill), that is, a specialized branch of knowledge. But neither the rhapsode nor Homer possesses knowledge of all (or indeed perhaps any) of those specialized branches (generalship, chariot making, medicine, navigation, divination, agriculture, fishing, horsemanship, cow herding, cithara playing, wool working, etc.). Ion attempts to resist this by claiming that thanks to his study of Homer, he knows what a general (for example) should say (540d5). Since he has accepted that this would involve possessing the art of generalship (541e2, techne kai episteme), his claim is patently indefensible, and Socrates charges that he has failed to make good on his assertion to be “wonderfully wise … about Homer” (542a1).

So Ion, and by extension Homer, are faced with a series of unpalatable alternatives:

  1. They could continue to defend the claim that they really do know the subjects about which they discourse—in the sense of possess the techne kai episteme of them, i.e., a mastery of the subject matter. Yet if they do defend that claim they will be liable to examination by relevant experts.
  2. They could admit that they do not know what they are talking about. This admission could be understood in several ways:

    (b.1) one would amount to saying that while lacking in technical knowledge (knowledge of this or that craft or skill), they do have knowledge of human affairs—something like knowledge of human nature, of how human life tends to go, of the relation between (say) virtue and happiness, as well as of the natures of both virtue and happiness. To this might be added the claim that the poets and their exponents know the nature of the cosmos and of the divine. In the Republic Socrates in effect allows them comprehensive claims to knowledge along those lines, and then attacks across the board, seeking to show that the poets have got it wrong on all important counts.

    (b.2) alternatively, they could admit that they do not have either technical or non-technical knowledge of any of the topics about which they sing; rather, they possess the skill (techne) of creating beautiful, persuasive, and moving images of the subjects in question. So when Ion claims that Homer speaks beautifully about X, he just means that Homer speaks beautifully in a rhetorical sense even though he (Homer) does not necessarily know what he is talking about. By extension, poets would (on this interpretation) make the same claim about themselves. That would seem to reduce them to rhetoricians, which in effect is what Socrates argues in the Gorgias, with the further proviso that rhetoric as popularly practiced is not even a techne. Poetry-as-mere-rhetoric is not a promising credential for authority either to educate all of Greece or to better one’s audience; (b.2) is not a position that poets or their rhapsodes would, presumably, be eager to adopt.

    (b.3) Ion could admit that he knows nothing about the topics Homer addresses, withdrawing his claim to be a knowledgeable exegete, but maintain that Homer himself knows what he’s talking about. Ion would be liable to the question as to how he knows all that, however; and in any case would at best shift Socrates’ attack to the real target, viz. Homer.

    (b.4) Socrates provides a seemingly more palatable alternative in the Ion, one that is echoed in the Phaedrus (245a); this is the “peculiar, saving assumption” mentioned above. It consists in the thesis that Ion recites (and Homer composes) not from knowledge but from divine inspiration. Neither knows what he is saying, but is nonetheless capable of speaking or composing beautifully thanks to the divine. They are like the worshippers of Bacchus, out of their right minds (534b4–6). This creative madness, as we might call it, they share with other Muse-inspired artists as well as prophets and diviners (534b7–d1). This is supposed to explain why Ion can recite only Homer beautifully; he’s been divinely inspired only in that area, and that is all he means when he says that Homer is better than his rival poets. Ion has no argument to support what looks like a comparative assessment; it is just a report to the effect that he is “possessed” by Homer’s magic thanks to the work of a god. A poet, further, is not a knower, but a kind of transmitter of a divine spark; he or she is “an airy thing, winged and holy” (534b3–4). The spark is generated by the god, and is passed down through the poet to the rhapsode and then to the audience. In Socrates’ unforgettable simile, the relationship of the god to poet to rhapsode to audience is like a magnetized sequence of rings, each of which sticks to the next thanks to the power of the divine magnet at the start (535e7–536b4), as though they were links in a chain (as we might put it).

This simile helps to answer an important question: why should we care whether or not the poets know what they are talking about, if we enjoy their compositions? Socrates’ answer is that as the last link on this chain of inspiration, we are capable of being deeply affected by poetry. We “spectators” at the recital too lose our minds, to some degree, weeping or laughing as we enter into the narrated scene, seemingly forgetting our real selves and lives (535b2–d9). In the Ion he doesn’t offer a further explanation of how this effect is supposed to happen—for that, we will turn to the Republic—but the important point is that it does happen. It would seem that the audience is transformed by the experience in a way that momentarily takes them out of themselves. Perhaps it does not leave them as they were, for their understanding of what properly elicits their grief or their laughter would seem to be shaped by this powerful experience, an experience they presumably repeat many times throughout childhood and beyond. Perhaps they too start to believe—as Ion and possibly the poet do—that they “know” something thanks to their contact with the divine, such as how war is to be conducted and for what ends, what fidelity in love means, or the character of the gods. None of this would matter much if superb poetry left us unmoved, or in any case as we were. Plato’s critique depends on the assumption that poetry can and does shape the soul.

The “divine inspiration” thesis resolves some problems for Ion (and implicitly for Homer) while postponing others. One problem is indicated by the last few lines of the dialogue, where Socrates offers Ion a choice: either be human, and take responsibility for unfairly avoiding his questions about the nature of his (Ion’s) wisdom; or accept the label “divine” and subscribe to the inspiration thesis. Ion chooses the latter on grounds that it is “lovelier.” It is an invitation to hybris, of course. How easy it would be to confuse divine and human madness (to borrow a distinction from the Phaedrus 244a5–245c4)! And not all of the contenders for the prize Ion has won could be equally worthy of promotion to divine status. By contrast, Socrates characterizes himself in the Apology as not thinking he knows what he does not know, as possessing human rather than divine “wisdom.”[8] Finally, since the poets and their rhapsodes both present views about how things are and ought to be, and seek to persuade their auditors of the same, they cannot escape responsibility for the implicit claim to wisdom and authority they make. For Plato, this means that they must be held accountable. It is philosophy’s mission to force them to give an account of themselves, and to examine its soundness. This would mean that they are required to engage philosophy on its turf, just as Ion has somewhat reluctantly done. The legitimacy of that requirement is itself a point of contention, it is one aspect of the quarrel between philosophy and poetry.[9]

3. Republic, Books II, III, X

3.1 Republic II

In order to respond to the famous challenge put to Socrates by Glaucon and Adeimantus, it is necessary to define justice. Socrates suggests that the task would be easier if justice were first sought in a polis, where it is “writ large.” That strategy accepted, the polis must be created in speech. It turns out that philosophic guardians are to rule the polis, and the next question concerns their education (376e2). The critique of poetry in the Republic grows out of a consideration of the proper education (from their childhood on) of the philosopher-guardians in the “city in speech.” The context for the critique is therefore that of the specific project of the Republic, and this raises a question as to whether the critique is meant to hold whether or not the “city in speech” is possible or desirable.

The concern in book II is very much with the proper education of a citizen, as befits the project of creating a model city. The “myth makers” (377b11; Bloom translates “makers of tales”) who supply the governing stories of the day are like painters (377e2) who make pictures of heroes and gods, and indeed of the relations both among and between the two. From the outset, Socrates treats the poems (those by Hesiod and Homer are singled out, but the critique isn’t meant to be confined to them) as though they contained not just falsehoods, but falsehoods held up as models of good behavior. The poems are taken as educational and thus broadly political texts; persuasion (see 378c7) of a class of the young is very much at stake. The young cannot judge well what is true and false; since a view of things taken on at early age is very hard to eradicate or change, it is necessary to ensure that they hear only myths that encourage true virtue (378d7–e3). The pedagogic motivation in question certainly extends beyond the specific “city in speech” the Republic creates. Thus while the critique of poetry in book II and beyond is in this sense shaped by the contextual concerns, it is not limited to them.

Further, Socrates takes aim at the content of several particularly influential poems, and his arguments against that content do not depend, here, on the project of creating the “best city.” One of his first targets is what he calls their “theology” (379a5–6). Whether in epics, lyrics or tragedies, whether in meter or not (379a8–9, 380c1–2), god must be described accurately, and that turns out to be as unchanging; as good and the cause of only good; as incapable of violence; and as “altogether simple and true in deed and speech,” for god “doesn’t himself change or deceive others by illusions, speeches, or the sending of signs either in waking or dreaming” (382e8–11). For “there is no lying poet in a god” (382d9). In short, the gods accurately conceived are remarkably similar to what Socrates will subsequently call, in Republic V-VII, the “Ideas.” Quite obviously, the dominant “theological” foundation of the world-view prevalent in fourth and fifth century Greece—and also any theological view that does not meet the strictures Socrates specifies—must be abandoned. The scope of the critique is breathtaking.

Along the way Socrates makes yet another point of great importance, namely that the poets ought not be permitted to say that those punished for misdeeds are wretched; rather, they must say that in paying a (just) penalty, bad men are benefited by the god (380b2–6). Socrates is starting to push against the theses that bad people will flourish or that good people can be harmed. The cosmos is structured in such a way as to support virtue. Socrates is attempting to undermine what one might call a “tragic” world view (note that in book X, he characterizes Homer as the “leader” of tragedy; 598d8).

3.2 Republic III

In book III Socrates expands the argument considerably. The concern now is squarely with poetry that encourages virtue in the souls of the young. Courage and moderation are the first two virtues considered here; the psychological and ethical effects of poetry are now scrutinized. The entire portrait of Hades must go, since it is neither true nor beneficial for auditors who must become fearless in the face of death. Death is not the worst thing there is, and all depictions of famous or (allegedly) good men wailing and lamenting their misfortunes must go (or at least, be confined to unimportant women and to bad men; 387e9–388a3). The poets must not imitate (see 388c3 for the term) gods or men suffering any extremes of emotion, including hilarity, for the strong souls are not overpowered by any emotion, let along any bodily desire. Nor do they suffer from spiritual conflict (391c). The rejection of the “tragic” world view becomes explicit: neither poets nor prose writers should be allowed to say that “many happy men are unjust, and many wretched ones just, and that doing injustice is profitable if one gets away with it, but justice is someone else’s good and one’s own loss.” Anybody pronouncing on any of these topics—poetically or not—must say the opposite (392a13–b6). In expanding the scope of the relevant discourse so broadly, Socrates in effect lays down requirements for all persuasive discourse—for what he elsewhere calls “rhetoric”—and makes poetry a subsection thereof.

Having covered the issue of content, Socrates turns to the “style” (“lexis,” 392c6), or as we might say, of the “form” of myth tellers or poets (Socrates again runs these two together). He does so in a way that marks a new direction in the conversation. The issue turns out to be of deep ethical import, because it concerns the way in which poetry affects the soul. Up until now, the mechanism, so to speak, has been vague; now it becomes a little bit clearer. Poetic myth tellers convey their thought through a narrative (diegesis) that is either “simple” (haplos) or imitative (that is, accomplished through “mimesis”). The notion of mimesis, missing from the Ion, now takes center stage. When the poet speaks in his own voice, the narrative is “simple”; when he speaks through a character, as it were concealing himself behind the mask of one of his literary creations, the narrative is imitative or mimetic. For then the poet is likening himself to this character, and trying to make the audience believe that it’s the character speaking. Some poetry (comedy and tragedy are mentioned) proceeds wholly by imitation, another wholly by simple narration (dithyrambs are mentioned), and epic poetry combines the two forms of narrative.

What follows this classificatory scheme is a polemic against imitation. The initial thesis is that every person can do a fine job in just one activity only. Consequently, nobody can do a fine job of imitating more than one thing (for example, an actor cannot be a rhapsode, a comic poet cannot be a tragic poet, if any of these is finely done). Imitation is itself something one does, and so one cannot both imitate X (say, generalship) well and also do the activity X in question (394e-395b). It has to be said that this thesis is set out with little real argument. In any case, the best souls (the guardians, in this case, in the city in speech) ought not imitate anything.

And were they to imitate anything, every care must be taken that they are ennobled rather than degraded as a result. Why? If imitations “are practiced continually from youth onwards,” they “become established as habits and nature, in body and sounds and in thought” (395d1–3). Unlike simple narrative, mimesis poses a particular psychic danger, because as the speaker of the narrative one may take on the character of literary persona in question. It is as though the fictionality of the persona is forgotten; in acting out a part one acts the part, and then one begins to act (in “real life”) as the character would act. One does not actually take oneself to be the fictional character; rather, the “model” or pattern of response or sentiment or thought one has acted out when “imitating” the character becomes enacted. There is no airtight barrier between throwing yourself (especially habitually) into a certain part, body and soul, and being molded by the part; no firm boundary, in that sense, between what happens on and off the stage. By contrast, Socrates argues, a simple narration preserves distance between narrator and narrated.

Before passing onto critiques of music and gymnastic, Socrates concludes this section of his critique of poetry with the stipulation that a poet who imitates all things (both good and bad) in all styles cannot be admitted into the good polis.[10] However, a more “austere” poet and myth teller is admissible, for he confines himself to imitating decent people (when he imitates at all, presumably as infrequently as possible), thus speaking pretty much in the same tone and rhythm, and who accurately represents the nature of the gods, heroes, virtue, and other issues discussed in books II and III (398a1–b4).[11]

This critique of mimetic poetry has struck not a few readers as a bit strange and obtuse, even putting aside the question of the legitimacy of censorship of the arts. It seems not to distinguish between the poet, the reciter of the poem, and the audience; no spectatorial distance is allowed to the audience; and the author is allowed little distance from the characters he is representing. All become the speakers or performers of the poem when they say or think the lines; and speaking the poem, taking it on as it were, is alleged to have real effects on one’s dispositions.

3.3 Republic X

In book II the critique of poetry focused on mimesis understood as representation; the fundamental point was that poets misrepresent the nature of the subjects about which they write (e.g., the gods). They do not produce a true likeness of their topics. In book III, the focus shifts to mimesis understood as what one commentator has called “impersonation”; participating in the “imitation” by taking on the characters imitated was viewed as corrupting in all but a few cases of poetic mimesis.[12] Surprisingly, in book X Socrates turns back to the critique of poetry; even more surprisingly, he not only mischaracterizes the results of the earlier discussion (at 595a5 he claims that all of poetry that was imitative was banished, whereas only part of it was banished; 398a1–b4), but recasts the critique in very different terms. This is due in part to the fact that the intervening discussion has seen the introduction of the “theory of Forms,” a more elaborate analysis of the nature of the soul, and a detailed description of the nature of philosophy. The renewed criticism leads up to the famous statement that there exists an ancient quarrel between poetry and philosophy.

Book X starts us off with a reaffirmation of a main deficiency of poets: their products “maim the thought of those who hear them.” And by means of the following schema, this is now connected to a development of the allegation (repeated at 602b6–8) that poets do not know what they are talking about. Socrates posits that there are Forms (or Ideas) of beds and tables, the maker of which is a god; there are imitations thereof, namely beds and tables, produced by craftsmen (such as carpenters) who behold the Forms (as though they were looking at blueprints); thirdly, there are imitators of the products of the craftsmen, who, like painters, create a kind of image of these objects in the world of becoming. The tripartite schema presents the interpreter with many problems.[13] Certainly, Socrates does not literally mean that poets paint verbal pictures of beds and tables. Subsequently, the scheme is elaborated so as to replace the craftsmen with those who produce opinion in the city (legislators, educators, military commanders, among others), and the painters with “the first teacher and leader of all these fine tragic things” (595b10–c2), that is, Homer. The poets are therefore “at the third generation from nature” or “third from a king and the truth” (597e3–4, 6–7).

Let us focus on one of the implications of this schema, about which Socrates is quite specific. The poets don’t know the originals of (i.e., the truth about) the topics about which they discourse; they appear to be ignorant of that fact; and even worse, just as a trompe-l’oeil painting can deceive the naïve onlooker into believing that the imitation is the original, so too those who take in poetry believe they are being given truth. Imitation now starts to take on the sense of “counterfeit.”[14] Unequipped to put claims to knowledge to the test, the audience buys into the comprehensive picture of “all arts and all things human that have to do with virtue and vice, and the divine things too” that the poet so persuasively articulates (598b-599a). The fundamental point is by now familiar to us: “For it is necessary that the good poet, if he is going to make fair poems about the things his poetry concerns, be in possession of knowledge when he makes his poems” (598e3–5). Even putting aside all of the matters relating to arts and crafts (technai such as medicine), and focusing on the greatest and most important things—above all, the governance of societies and the education of a human being—Homer simply does not stand up to examination (599c-600e). All those “skilled in making” (tous poietikous), along with this educator of Greece and leader of the tragic poets, are painted as “imitators of phantoms of virtue and of the other subjects of their making” (600e4–6).

And what, apart from their own ignorance of the truth, governs their very partial perspective on the world of becoming? Socrates implies that they pander to their audience, to the hoi polloi (602b3–4). This links them to the rhetoricians as Socrates describes them in the Gorgias. At the same time, they take advantage of that part in us the hoi polloi are governed by; here Socrates attempts to bring his discussion of psychology, presented since book III, to bear. The ensuing discussion is remarkable in the way in which it elaborates on these theses.

The example which introduces the last stage of Socrates’ critique of poetry prior to the famous announcement of the “quarrel” is that of deep human suffering; specifically, a parent’s loss of a child (603e3–5). How would a decent person respond to such a calamity? He would fight the pain, hold out against it as much as possible, not let himself be seen when in pain, would be ashamed to make a scene, and would “keep as quiet as possible” knowing that none of “the human things” is “worthy of great seriousness.” Being in pain impedes the rule of reason, which dictates that when we are dealt misfortunes, we must be as unaffected by them as possible, preserving the harmony of our souls (603e-604e). Socrates sketches the character of the decent and good person this way: “the prudent and quiet character, which is always nearly equal to itself, is neither easily imitated nor, when imitated, easily understood, especially by a festive assembly where all sorts of human beings are gathered in a theater. For imitation is of a condition that is surely alien to them” (604e). This may be a sketch of Socrates himself, whose imitation Plato has produced.[15]

By contrast, the tragic imitators excel at portraying the psychic conflicts of people who are suffering and who do not even attempt to respond philosophically. Since their audience consists of people whose own selves are in that sort of condition too, imitators and audience are locked into a sort of mutually reinforcing picture of the human condition. Both are captured by that part of themselves given to the non-rational or irrational; both are most interested in the condition of internal conflict. The poet “awakens this part of the soul and nourishes it,” producing a disordered psychic regime or constitution (politeia, 605b7–8; compare this language to that of the passages at the end of book IX of the Republic). The “childish” part of the soul that revels in the poet’s pictures cannot distinguish truth from reality; it uncritically grants the poet’s authority to tell it like it is. Onlookers become emotively involved in the poet’s drama.

Another remarkable passage follows: “Listen and consider. When even the best of us hear Homer or any other of the tragic poets imitating one of the heroes in mourning and making quite an extended speech with lamentation, or, if you like, singing and beating his breast, you know that we enjoy it and that we give ourselves over to following the imitation; suffering along [‘sympaschontes’, a word related to another Greek word, ‘sympatheia’] with the hero in all seriousness, we praise as a good poet the man who most puts us in this state” (605c10–d5). So the danger posed by poetry is great, for it appeals to something to which even the best—the most philosophical—are liable, and induces a dream-like, uncritical state in which we lose ourselves in the emotions in question (above all, in sorrow, grief, anger, resentment).

As one commentator aptly puts it, “on the one hand, poetry promotes intrapsychic conflict; on the other, it keeps us unconscious of that conflict, for the irrational part of our psyche cannot hear reason’s corrections. That is why poetry, with its throbbing rhythms and beating of breasts, appeals equally to the nondescript mob in the theater and to the best among us. But if poetry goes straight to the lower part of the psyche, that is where it must come from.”[16] Further, the picture of the gods that the Greek poets painted was a projection of the tumultuous and conflictual lower parts of the soul, one which in turn gave sustenance and power to those very same parts of the soul.

The worry, then, is that in experiencing the emotions vicariously—by identifying, so to speak, with the drama—we release emotions better regulated by reason, and become captive to them in “real” life. In a psychological sense, drama supplies what today we would call “role models.” Socrates’ point is not that we think the drama is itself real, as though we cannot distinguish between what takes place on and off the stage; but that “the enjoyment of other people’s sufferings has a necessary effect on one’s own.” Why? “For the pitying part [of the soul], fed strong on these examples, is not easily held down in one’s own sufferings” (606b).[17] And this applies to comedy as well; we get used to hearing shameful things in comic imitation, stop feeling ashamed at them, and indeed begin to enjoy them (606c).[18] Socrates quite explicitly is denying that aesthetic “pleasure” (606b4) can be insulated from the ethical effects of poetry. To put the point with a slight risk of anachronism (since Plato does not have a term corresponding to our “aesthetics”), he does not think that aesthetics is separable from ethics. He does not separate knowledge of beauty and knowledge of good. It is as though the pleasure we take in the representation of sorrow on the stage will—because it is pleasure in that which the representation represents (and not just a representation on the stage or in a poem)—transmute into pleasure in the expression of sorrow in life. And that is not only an ethical effect, but a bad one, for Plato. These are ingredients of his disagreements on the subject with Aristotle, as well as with myriad thinkers since then.[19] He is asserting, though without filling out the psychological mechanisms in the detail for which one would wish, that from childhood up, mimesis shapes our images and our fantasies, our unconscious or semi-conscious pictures and feelings, and thereby shapes our characters, especially that part of our nature prone to what he thinks of as irrational or non-rational.

The poets help enslave even the best of us to the lower parts of our soul; and just insofar as they do so, they must be kept out of any community that wishes to be free and virtuous. Famously, or notoriously, Plato refuses to countenance a firm separation between the private and the public, between the virtue of the one and the regulation of the other. What goes on in the theater, in your home, in your fantasy life, are connected. Poetry unregulated by philosophy is a danger to soul and community.[20]

3.4 Concluding Observations about the Republic’s “quarrel”

The argument in book X cuts across all forms of “poetry,” whether tragic, comic, lyric, in meter or not; indeed, the earlier distinction between imitative and narrative poetry too seems irrelevant here. The conclusion is the same: “We are, at all events, aware that such poetry mustn’t be taken seriously as a serious thing laying hold of truth, but that the man who hears it must be careful, fearing for the regime in himself, and must hold what we have said about poetry” (608a6–b2). So sweeping a conclusion makes many assumptions, of course, one of which is that there is such as thing as “truth” out there, and the theory of Forms or Ideas is part of the metaphysical foundation of that view. The poets have been characterized as making claims to truth, to telling it like it is, that are in fact—contrary to appearances—little more than the poet’s unargued imaginative projections whose tenability is established by their ability to command the applause of the audience. That is, the poets are rhetoricians who are, as it were, selling their products to as large a market as possible, in the hope of gaining repute and influence.

The tripartite schema of Idea, artifact, and imitator is as much about making as it is about imitation. Making is a continual thread through all three levels of the schema. The Ideas too are said to be made, even though that is entirely inconsistent with the doctrine of Ideas as eternal expressed earlier in the Republic itself (and in all the other Platonic dialogues). The suggestion is arguably that the poets are makers (see also 599a2–3, where we are told that poets “produce appearances,” as one might translate), that they move in a world permeated by making. The word “poetry” in Platonic Greek comes from the word “to make” (poiein), a fact upon which Socrates remarks in the Symposium.[21] Making takes place in and contributes to the world of becoming. Philosophers, by contrast, are presented as committed to the pursuit of truth that is already “out there,” independently of the mind and the world of becoming. Their effort has to do with discovery rather than making. Thus stated the contrast is crude, since poets also reflect what they take their audience to (want to) feel or believe—they “imitate” in the sense of represent as well as express—and philosophers make speeches and (as Socrates himself says) they too imitate.[22] Nonetheless, the distinction suggests an interesting possibility, viz. that the quarrel between poetry and philosophy is finally, in Plato’s eyes, about the relative priority of making and discovery. The making/discovery distinction chimes with a number of the dichotomies upon which we have touched: imagination vs. reason, emotion vs. principle, becoming vs. being, artifacts vs. Forms, images vs. originals.

Nowhere in the Republic does Socrates mention the poet’s claim to inspiration. Indeed, that claim is pointedly omitted in the passage in which Socrates talks about the beginnings of the Iliad (392e2–393a5; see Bloom’s note ad loc). Socrates implicitly denies the soundness of that claim here. Given his conception of the divine as Idea, such a claim could not be true, since the Ideas do not speak, let alone speak the things which Homer, Hesiod, and their followers recount. The result is that the poets are fabricators even of the appearance of knowing what they are talking about; this is not inconsistent with the Ion’s characterization of poetry as inspired ignorance.

Does the critique of poetry in the Republic extend beyond the project of founding the just city in speech? I have already suggested an affirmative answer when discussing book II. The concerns about poetry expressed in books III and X would also extend beyond the immediate project of the dialogue, if they carry any water at all, even though the targets Plato names are of course taken from his own times. It has been argued that the authority to speak truth that poets claim is shared by many widely esteemed poets since then.[23] It has also been argued that the debate about the effects on the audience of poetry continues, except that today it is not so much poets strictly speaking, but the makers of others sorts of images in the “mass media,” who are the culprits. Controversies about, say, the effects of graphic depictions of violence, of the degradation of women, and of sex, echo the Platonic worries about the ethical and social effects of art. At least in cases such as these, we retain Plato’s skepticism about the notion of “aesthetic distance.”[24]

4. Gorgias

The Gorgias is one of Plato’s most bitter dialogues in that the exchanges are at times full of anger, of uncompromising disagreement, plenty of misunderstanding, and cutting rhetoric. In these respects it goes beyond even the Protagoras, a dialogue that depicts a hostile confrontation between Socrates and the renowned sophist by the same name.[25] The quarrel between philosophy and rhetoric shows itself as an ugly fight in the Gorgias.

What is the fight about? Socrates asks Gorgias to define what it is that he does, that is, to define rhetoric. And he asks him to do it in a way that helps to distinguish rhetorical from philosophical discourse: the former produces speeches of praise and blame, the latter answers questions through the give and take of discussion (dialegesthai, 448d10) in an effort to arrive at a concise definition, and more broadly, with the intent to understand the subject. The philosopher is happy to be refuted if that leads to better understanding; wisdom, and not just striving to “win” the argument, is the goal (457e-458a).

Gorgias is forced by successive challenges to move from the view that rhetoric is concerned with words (speeches) to the view that its activity and effectiveness happen only in and through words (unlike the manual arts) to the view that its object is the greatest of human concerns, namely freedom. Rhetoric is “the source of freedom for humankind itself and at the same time it is for each person the source of rule over others in one’s own city” (452d6–8). This freedom is a kind of power produced by the ability to persuade others to do one’s bidding; “rhetoric is a producer of persuasion. Its whole business comes to that, and that’s the long and short of it” (453a2–3). But persuasion about what exactly? Gorgias’ answer is: about matters concerning justice and injustice (454b7). But surely there are two kinds of persuasion, one that instills beliefs merely, and another that produces knowledge; it is the former only with which rhetoric is concerned. The analogy of this argument to the critique of poetry is already clear; in both cases, Socrates wants to argue that the speaker is not a truth speaker, and does not convey knowledge to his audience. As already noted, Socrates classifies poetry (dithyrambic and tragic poetry are named) as a species of rhetoric. Its goal is to gratify and please the spectator, or differently put, it is just a kind of flattery. Strip away the rhythm and meter, and you have plain prose directed at the mob. It’s a kind of public speaking, that’s all (502a6–c12).

The rhetorician is a maker of beliefs in the souls of his auditors (455a3–4). And without that skill—here Gorgias begins to wax at length and eloquently—other arts (such as medicine) cannot do their work effectively (456b ff.). Rhetoric is a comprehensive art. But Gorgias offers a crucial qualification that turns out to contribute to his downfall: rhetoric should not be used against any and everybody, any more than skill in boxing should be. Although the rhetorician teaches others to use the skill justly, it is always possible for the student to misuse it. This is followed by another damaging admission: the rhetorician knows what justice, injustice, and other moral qualities are, and teaches them to the student if the student is ignorant of them (460a). It would follow that, in Socrates’ language, the true rhetorician is a philosopher; and in fact that is a position Socrates takes in the Phaedrus. But Gorgias is not a philosopher and does not in fact know—cannot give an account of—the moral qualities in question. So his art is all about appearing, in the eyes of the ignorant, to know about these topics, and then persuading them as is expedient (cf. 459d-e). But this is not something Gorgias wishes to admit; indeed, he allows himself to agree that since the rhetorician knows what justice is, he must be a just man and therefore acts justly (460b-c). He is caught in a contradiction: he claimed that a student who had acquired the art of rhetoric could use it unjustly, but now claims that the rhetorician could not commit injustice.

All this is just too much for Gorgias’ student Polus, whose angry intervention marks the second and much more bitter stage of the dialogue (461b3). A new point emerges that is consistent with the claim that rhetoricians do not know or convey knowledge, viz. that it is not an art or craft (techne) but a mere knack (empeiria, or experience). Socrates adds that its object is to produce gratification. To develop the point, Socrates produces a striking schema distinguishing between care of the body and care of the soul. Medicine and gymnastics truly care for the body, cookery and cosmetics pretend to but do not. Politics is the art that cares for the soul; justice and legislation are its branches, and the imitations of each are rhetoric and sophistry. As medicine stands to cookery, so justice to rhetoric; as gymnastics to cosmetics, so legislation to sophistry. The true forms of caring are arts (technai) aiming at the good; the false, knacks aiming at pleasure (464b-465d). Let us note that sophistry and rhetoric are very closely allied here; Socrates notes that they are distinct but closely related and therefore often confused by people (465c). What exactly their distinction consists in is not clear, either in Plato’s discussions of the matter, or historically. Socrates’s polemic here is intended to apply to them both, as both are (alleged) to amount to a knack for persuasion of the ignorant by the ignorant with a view to producing pleasure in the audience and the pleasures of power for the speaker.

Socrates’ ensuing argument with Polus is complicated and long. The nub of the matter concerns the relation between power and justice. For Polus, the person who has power and wields it successfully is happy. For Socrates, a person is happy only if he or she is (morally) good, and an unjust or evil person is wretched—all the more so, indeed, if they escape punishment for their misdeeds. Polus finds this position “absurd” (473a1), and challenges Socrates to take a poll of all present to confirm the point. In sum: Plato’s suggestion is that rhetoric and sophistry are tied to substantive theses about the irrelevance of moral truth to the happy life; about the conventionality or relativity of morals; and about the irrelevance of the sort of inquiry into the truth of the matter (as distinguished from opinions or the results of polls) upon which Socrates keeps insisting. Socrates argues for some of his most famous theses along the way, such as the view that “the one who does what’s unjust is always more miserable than the one who suffers it, and the one who avoids paying what’s due always more miserable than the one who does pay it” (479e4–6). And if these hold, what use is there in rhetoric? For someone who wishes to avoid doing himself and others harm, Socrates concludes, rhetoric is altogether useless. Tied into logical knots, Polus succumbs.

All this is just too much for yet another interlocutor in the dialogue, Callicles. The rhetoric of the Gorgias reaches its most bitter stage. Callicles presents himself as a no-holds-barred, bare-knuckled, clear-headed advocate of Realpolitik, as we would now call it. Telling it like it is, he draws a famous distinction between nature and convention, and advances a thesis familiar to readers of Republic books I and II: “But I believe that nature itself reveals that it’s a just thing for the better man and the more capable man to have a greater share than the worse man and the less capable man. Nature shows that this is so in many places; both among the other animals and in whole cities and races of men, it shows that this is what justice has been decided to be: that the superior rule the inferior and have a greater share than they” (483c8–d6). This is the “law of nature” (483e3; perhaps the first occurrence in Western philosophy of this famous phrase). Conventional talk of justice, fairness, not taking more than is your share, not pursuing your individual best interest—these are simply ways by which the weak seek to enslave the strong. The art of rhetoric is all about empowering those who are strong by nature to master the weak by nature.

Callicles’ famous diatribe includes an indictment of philosophy as a childish occupation that, if pursued past youth, interferes with the manly pursuit of power, fosters contemptible ignorance of how the real political world works, and renders its possessor effeminate and defenseless. His example is none other than Socrates; philosophy will (he says prophetically) render Socrates helpless should he be indicted. Helplessness in the face of the stupidity of the hoi polloi is disgraceful and pathetic (486a-c). By contrast, what would it mean to have power? Callicles is quite explicit: power is the ability to fulfill whatever desire you have. Power is freedom, freedom is license (492a-c). The capacity to do what one wants is fulfillment in the sense of the realization of pleasure. Rhetoric is a means to that end.

The quarrel between rhetoric and philosophy, thus understood, ultimately addresses a range of fundamental issues. “Rhetoric” is taken here to constitute an entire world view. Its quarrel with philosophy is comprehensive, and bears on the nature of nature; the existence of objective moral norms; the connection (if any) between happiness and virtue; the nature and limits of reason; the value of reason (understood as the rational pursuit of objective purpose) in a human life; the nature of the soul or self; and the question as to whether there is a difference between true and false pleasure, i.e., whether pleasure is the good. It is striking that while Socrates wants to contrast “rhetorical” speech-making with his own approach of philosophical dialogue, in practice the differences blur. Socrates too starts to speak at length, sounds rhetorical at times, and ends the discussion with a myth. Callicles advances a substantive position (grounded in a version of the distinction between nature and convention) and defends it. These transgressions of rhetorical genres to one side, from Socrates’ standpoint the ultimate philosophical question at stake concerns how one should live one’s life (500c). Is the life of “politics,” understood as the pursuit of power and glory, superior to the life of philosophy?

Readers of the dialogue will differ as to whether or not the arguments there offered decide the matter. The nub of the debate is as current today, both in academic and non-academic contexts, as it was in Plato’s day.[26] Even though poetry is here cast as a species of rhetoric, a good deal of work would have to be done to show that the substantive theses to which poetry is committed, according to the Republic, are the same as the substantive theses to which rhetoric is committed, according to the Gorgias.

Is all of rhetoric bad? Are we to avoid—indeed, can we avoid—rhetoric altogether? Even in the Gorgias, as we have seen, there is a distinction between rhetoric that instills belief, and rhetoric that instills knowledge, and later in the dialogue a form of noble rhetoric is mentioned, though no examples of its practitioners can be found (503a-b). The Phaedrus offers a more detailed explanation of this distinction.

5. Phaedrus

Readers of the Phaedrus have often wondered how the dialogue hangs together. The first “half” seems to be about love, and the second about rhetoric. A slightly closer look reveals that any such simple characterization is misleading, because the first half is also about rhetoric, in several different ways. To begin with, the first half of the dialogue contains explicit reflections on rhetoric; for example, Socrates draws the distinction between what we would call the “form” and the “content” of a discourse (235a). Still further, it consists in part in three speeches, at least the first of which (“Lysias’ speech”) is a rhetorical set-piece. The other two are rhetorical as well, and presented as efforts to persuade a young beloved. All three are justly viewed as rhetorical masterstrokes by Plato, but for different reasons. The first is a brilliantly executed parody of the style of Lysias (an orator and speech writer of significant repute). The second speech simultaneously preserves aspects of its fictional frame (the first was a paradoxical sounding address by a “non-lover” to a “beloved”), develops that frame (the non-lover is transformed into a concealed lover), and deepens the themes in an impressive and philosophically enlightening way. The third (referred to as the “palinode” or recantation speech) contains some of the most beautiful and powerful images in all of Greek literature. It is mostly an allegory cast in the form of a myth, and tells the story of true love and of the soul’s journeys in the cosmos human and divine. That is, the rhetoric of the great palinode is markedly “poetic.” Especially noteworthy for present purposes is the fact that the theme of inspiration is repeatedly invoked in the first half of the dialogue; poetic inspiration is explicitly discussed.[27]

The themes of poetry and rhetoric, then, are intertwined in the Phaedrus. It looks initially as though both rhetoric and poetry have gained significant stature, at least relative to their status in the Ion, Republic, and Gorgias. I will begin by focusing primarily on rhetoric, and then turn to the question of poetry, even though the two themes are closely connected in this dialogue.

5.1 Rhetoric in the Phaedrus

The second “half” of the dialogue does not discuss the nature of love thematically, at any length, but it does in effect propose that discourse prompted by the love of wisdom—philosophy—is true rhetoric. As the conversation between one “lover of speeches” (228c1–2) and another evolves, the three rhetorical speeches of the first part of the dialogue are examined from the perspective of their rhetorical artlessness or artfulness. Poetry is once again cast as a kind of speech making (258b3) and, very importantly, Socrates declares that “It’s not speaking or writing well that’s shameful; what’s really shameful is to engage in either of them shamefully or badly” (258d4–5).[28] The proffering of discourses is not in and of itself shameful; what then constitutes honorable speech making?

The answer to this crucial question constitutes one of the most famous contributions to the topic. In essence, Socrates argues that someone who is going to speak well and nobly must know the truth about the subject he is going to discuss. The sort of theory Polus and Callicles maintained in the Gorgias is false (see Phaedrus 259e4–260a4). In order to make good on this sweeping claim, Socrates argues that rhetoric is an “art” (techne), and not just artless practice (the equivalent of the “empeiria” for which rhetoric was condemned in the Gorgias). How to show that it is an art after all? Quite a number of claimants to rhetoric are named and reviewed, and readers who have an interest in the history of Greek rhetoric rightly find these passages invaluable. We are told here that the extant manuals of rhetoric offer the “preliminaries” to the true art of rhetoric, not the thing itself (269b7–8).

Many rhetoricians have artfully and effectively misled their audiences, and Socrates argues—somewhat implausibly perhaps—that in order to mislead one cannot oneself be misled.[29] An artful speech exhibits its artfulness in its structure, one that—since in the best case it embodies the truth—retraces or mirrors the natural divisions of the subject matter itself. It will not only be coherent, but structured in a way that mirrors the way the subject itself is naturally organized. In one of Socrates’ most famous images, a good composition should exhibit the organic unity of a living creature, “with a body of its own; it must be neither without head nor without legs; and it must have a middle and extremities that are fitting both to one another and to the whole work” (264c1–5). This will not be truly accomplished if it only looks that way; to be that way, a discourse’s unity should reflect the unity of its subject.

At this point we might want to ask about the audience; after all, the rhetorician is trying to persuade someone of something. Might not the speaker know the truth of the matter, and know how to embody it artfully in a composition, but fail to persuade anyone of it? Would not a failure to persuade indicate that the speaker lacks the complete art of rhetoric? Socrates in effect responds to this question by postulating that the successful speaker must also know the nature of the human soul, else his skill is just “empeiria” (the term from the Gorgias again) rather than “techne” (270b6). Just as an expert physician must understand both the human body and the body of medical knowledge—these being inseparable—so too the expert speaker must understand both the human soul and what is known about the soul. The reader will immediately recall that the great speech (the palinode) in the first half of the Phaedrus was about the soul in its cosmic context—the soul’s nature, its journeys divine and human, its longings, the objects of its longings, its failures and their consequences, were all part of the same story. Thus it is not surprising that when defining the art of rhetoric Socrates suggests that we cannot “reach a serious understanding of the nature of the soul without understanding the nature of the world as a whole” (270c1–2). The consequence of this approach to rhetoric has now become clear: to possess that art, one must be a philosopher. True rhetoric is philosophical discourse.

But what happened to the question about the audience? “The soul” is not the addressee of a rhetorical discourse. Socrates responds that the artful rhetorician must also know what the types of soul are, what sorts of speeches “work” on each type, and be able to identify which type is being addressed on the given occasion. This last demand is a matter of practice and of the ability to size up the audience on the spot, as it were. The requirements of the true art of rhetoric, which Socrates also calls the “art of dialectic” (276e5–6), are very high indeed. (The reader will find them summarized at 277b5–c6).

If the audience is philosophical, or includes philosophers, how would the true, artful, philosophical dialectician address it? This question is not faced head-on in the Phaedrus, but we are given a number of clues. They are introduced by means of a myth—by a kind of “poetry,” if you will—and they help us understand the sort of discourse a philosopher will on the whole wish to avoid, namely that which is written. According to reflections inaugurated by the Theuth and Thamus myth, the written word is not the most suitable vehicle for communicating truth, because it cannot answer questions put to it; it simply repeats itself when queried; it tends to substitute the authority of the author for the reader’s open minded inquiry into the truth; and it circulates everywhere indiscriminately, falling into the hands of people who cannot understand it. Very importantly, it interferes with true “recollection” (anamnesis, 249c2), that process described at length and (for the most part) poetically in the dialogue’s “palinode,” by which the knowledge latent in the soul is brought out through question and answer (274d-275b). Writing is a clumsy medium, and thus would not match the potential effectiveness of philosophical give and take, the “Socratic dialogue” which best leads the philosophical mind to truth. This desirable rhetoric is “a discourse that is written down, with knowledge, in the soul of the listener; it can defend itself, and it knows for whom it should speak and for whom it should remain silent” (276a5–7). Dialectical speech is accompanied by knowledge, can defend itself when questioned, and is productive of knowledge in its audience (276e4–277a4). Of course, all this raises the question as to the status of Plato’s dialogues, since they are themselves writings; we will return to it briefly below.

Rhetoric is the art of “directing the soul by means of speech” (261a8). Popular rhetoric is not an art, but a knack for persuasion. Artful rhetoric requires philosophy; but does philosophy require rhetoric? Why must philosophical discourse—say, as exemplified in “Socratic dialogue”—have anything to do with rhetoric? The Phaedrus points to the interesting thought that all discourse is rhetorical, even when the speaker is simply trying to communicate the truth—indeed, true rhetoric is the art of communicating the truth (notice the broad sweep of the discussion of discourse at 277e5–278b4). Rhetoric is present wherever and whenever people speak (261d10–e4 and context). Even when one is not sure what the truth is, and even when one is thinking through something by oneself—carrying on an inner dialogue, as it were—discourse and persuasion are present.[30] Of course, a philosopher will question assertions that he or she ought to persuaded of X; but that questioning too, the Phaedrus suggests, is part of a process aimed at warranted persuasion, and inevitably involves a mix of the “persuadability” of the philosopher on the one hand, and the truth (or falsity) of the claims on the other. The bottom line is that there is no escaping from persuasion, and so none from rhetoric—including of course from the very problem of distinguishing between warranted and unwarranted persuasion. Self-deception is an ever-present possibility (as Socrates implies here, and notes at Cratylus 428d). That is a problem about which the philosopher above all worries about. It is always a question of “directing the soul by means of speech,” even where it’s a matter of the soul directing or leading itself (or to use a phrase from earlier in the dialogue, moving itself (245e)).[31]

The Gorgias’ notion that the struggle between (popular) rhetoric and philosophy—or as we might say, unphilosophical and philosophical rhetoric—is one between comprehensive outlooks is clear from the Phaedrus as well. The “great speech” or palinode of the dialogue illustrates the character and range of views upon which the project of philosophical rhetoric (of philosophy, in short) is built. The speech is quite explicitly a retraction of an outlook that does not espouse these views; ordinary rhetoric moves in a very different moral, metaphysical, psychological, and epistemic world. It is an interesting fact that Plato deploys certain elements of poetry (such as myth, allegory, simile, image) in drawing the contrast between these outlooks.

5.2 Rhapsodes, Inspiration, and Poetry in the Phaedrus

That poetry is itself a kind of persuasive discourse or rhetoric has already been mentioned. It comes as no surprise to read that Socrates indicts rhapsodes on the grounds that their speeches proceed “without questioning and explanation” and “are given only in order to produce conviction” (277e8–9). This echoes the Ion’s charge that the rhapsodes do not know what they are talking about. But what about the rationale that the poets and rhapsodes are inspired?

Inspiration comes up numerous times in the Phaedrus. It and the related notions of Bacchic frenzy, madness, and possession are invoked repeatedly almost from the start of the dialogue (228b), in connection with Phaedrus’ allegedly inspiring recitation of Lysias’ text (234d1–6), and as inspiring Socrates’s two speeches (237a7–b1, 262d2–6, 263d1–3). These references are uniformly playful, even at times joking. More serious is the distinction between ordinary madness and divine madness, and the defense of the superiority of divine madness, which Socrates’ second speech sets out to defend. In particular, he sets out to show that the madness of love or eros “is given us by the gods to ensure our greatest good fortune” (245b7–c1). The case is first made by noting that three species of madness are already accepted: that of the prophets, that of certain purifying or cathartic religious rites, and the third that inspiration granted by the Muses that moves its possessor to poetry (244b-245a). As noted, it begins to look as though a certain kind of poetry (the inspired) is being rehabilitated.

And yet when Socrates comes to classify kinds of lives a bit further on, the poets (along with those who have anything to do with mimesis) rank a low sixth out of nine, after the likes of household managers, financiers, doctors, and prophets (248e1–2)! The poet is just ahead of the manual laborer, sophist, and tyrant. The philosopher comes in first, as the criterion for the ranking concerns the level of knowledge of truth about the Ideas or Forms of which the soul in question is capable. This hierarchy of lives could scarcely be said to rehabilitate the poet. The Phaedrus quietly sustains the critique of poetry, as well as (much less quietly) of rhetoric.

6. Plato’s Dialogues as Rhetoric and Poetry

Plato’s critique of writing on the grounds that it is a poor form of rhetoric is itself written. Of course, his Socrates does not know that he is “speaking” in the context of a written dialogue; but the reader immediately discerns the puzzle. Does the critique apply to the dialogues themselves? If not, do the dialogues escape the critique altogether, or meet it in part (being inferior to “live” dialogue, but not liable to the full force of Socrates’ criticisms)? Scholars dispute the answers to these well-known questions.[32]

There is general agreement that Plato perfected—perhaps even invented—a new form of discourse. The Platonic dialogue is a innovative type of rhetoric, and it is hard to believe that it does not at all reflect—whether successfully or not is another matter—Plato’s response to the criticisms of writing which he puts into the mouth of his Socrates.

Plato’s remarkable philosophical rhetoric incorporates elements of poetry. Most obviously, his dialogues are dramas with several formal features in common with much tragedy and comedy (for example, the use of authorial irony, the importance of plot, setting, the role of individual character and the interplay between dramatis personae). No character called “Plato” ever says a word in his texts. His works also narrate a number of myths, and sparkle with imagery, simile, allegory, and snatches of meter and rhyme. Indeed, as he sets out the city in speech in the Republic, Socrates calls himself a myth teller (376d9–10, 501e4–5). In a number of ways, the dialogues may be said to be works of fiction; none of them took place exactly as presented by Plato, several could not have taken place, some contain characters who never existed. These are imaginary conversations, imitations of certain kinds of philosophical conversations. As reader, one is undoubtedly invited to see oneself reflected in various characters, and to that extent identify with them, even while also focusing on the arguments, exchanges, and speeches. Readers of Plato often refer to the “literary” dimension of his writings, or simply refer to them as a species of philosophical literature. Exactly what to make of his appropriation of elements of poetry is once again a matter of long discussion and controversy.[33]

Suffice it to say that Plato’s last word on the critique of poetry and rhetoric is not spoken in his dialogues, but is embodied in the dialogue form of writing he brought to perfection.


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Other Internet Resources


I am grateful to Nicola Moore for her help with the Bibliography, and to Richard Kraut, Marina McCoy, and Stephen Scully for their excellent comments on drafts of the text. I would also like to thank David Roochnik for his help with various revisions along the way.

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