Public Reason

First published Mon May 20, 2013; substantive revision Wed Apr 20, 2022

Public reason requires that the moral or political rules that regulate our common life be, in some sense, justifiable or acceptable to all those persons over whom the rules purport to have authority. It is an idea with roots in the work of Hobbes, Kant, and Rousseau, and has become increasingly influential in contemporary moral and political philosophy as a result of its development in the work of John Rawls, Jürgen Habermas, and Gerald Gaus, among others. Proponents of public reason often present the idea as an implication of a particular conception of persons as free and equal. Each of us is free in the sense of not being naturally subject to any other person’s moral or political authority, and we are equally situated with respect to this freedom from the natural authority of others. How, then, can some moral or political rules be rightly imposed on all of us, particularly if we assume deep and permanent disagreement amongst persons about matters of value, morality, religion, and the good life? The answer, for proponents of public reason, is that such rules can rightly be imposed on persons when the rules can be justified by appeal to ideas or arguments that those persons, at some level of idealization, endorse or accept. But public reason is not only a standard by which moral or political rules can be assessed: it can also provide standards for individual behavior. Because we make moral and political demands of each other, if we are to comply with the ideal of public reason, we must refrain from advocating or supporting rules that cannot be justified to those on whom the rules would be imposed. We should instead, some insist, only support those rules we sincerely believe can be justified by appeal to suitably shared or public considerations—for example, widely endorsed political values such as freedom and equality—and abstain from appealing to religious arguments, or other controversial views over which reasonable people are assumed to disagree. In this way, public reason can be presented as a standard for assessing rules, laws, institutions, and the behavior of individual citizens and public officials.

This entry is structured around questions about the nature of public reason that continue to be the subject of sustained debate in the literature. Section 1 considers competing positions regarding the underlying rationale for public reason. Section 2 identifies different views about the appropriate scope of public reason. Does it apply to all moral rules, only to political rules, or only to some sub-set of political rules? Section 3 considers the question of public reason’s constituency: to whom must our rules be justifiable in order to be considered legitimate or authoritative? The next question, in section 4, concerns the content of public reason; in particular, to what extent is this content determined via a process of philosophical reflection as opposed to actual moral deliberation? Section 5 considers the structure of public reason, with particular focus on whether public reason requires some shared perspective or set of considerations, or whether it can be achieved without any common moral or political perspective. Section 6 addresses the site of public reason: where do its norms properly apply and when do they regulate individual conduct? Section 7 identifies some of the most influential objections that have been pressed against the idea of public reason, and Section 8 concludes with a brief survey of a few further topics.

1. Why Public Reason?

The idea of public reason appears to inhabit a middle ground between two more familiar standards of evaluation in moral and political philosophy. On the one hand, there is consent. Some political philosophers, for example, argue that political legitimacy requires the actual or implied consent of the governed (Otsuka 2003, 89–113; Simmons 1999). On the other hand, there is truth: we can simply ask whether any alleged moral or political principle is true. Public reason does not aim either at consent or truth. Public reason instead requires that our moral or political principles be justifiable to, or reasonably acceptable to, all those persons to whom the principles are meant to apply. An account of public reason must find some way of giving the perspective of individual persons a significant role, without allowing this to collapse into consent: public reason is not simply a way of identifying those principles to which people already consent. But equally, public reason must not define those principles that could be justified to, or be acceptable to, each person as simply those principles that are true. In either case, the idea of public reason would do no independent work.

This apparent middle ground between consent and truth may seem puzzling in several respects. One puzzle is whether there is, in fact, a coherent and stable way of explicating the notion of reasonable acceptability or justification (Raz 1990, 46; Enoch, 2015). But even if we assume the idea of public reason is coherent, we can plausibly ask why we ought to accept this idea, that is, what is the basis for adopting public reason as the relevant standard to evaluate rules and to govern individual conduct? This section considers five different answers to this question (these answers can, of course, also be combined). It is helpful to begin by considering these different positions regarding the basis of public reason, since how one chooses to answer this question often has direct implications for the scope, constituency, content, site, duties, and structure of public reason (see Billingham and Taylor 2020).

Each of the positions below is usually combined with an assumption about pluralism or reasonable disagreement over a wide range of moral, ethical, and other philosophical matters. That is, virtually all proponents of public reason assume that there is deep and intractable disagreement amongst some people, and this disagreement is not simply the result of irrationality, prejudice, or self-interest, but rather arises as a result of the normal functioning of human reasoning under reasonably favorable conditions. This assumption about pluralism or disagreement is an essential part of the rationale for public reason since without it, it is difficult to understand why our moral or political principles ought to be justifiable or acceptable to others, as opposed to simply true or correct. The most influential conception of such pluralism or disagreement is Rawls’s account of the burdens of judgment and the subsequent fact of reasonable pluralism (Rawls 1996, 36–37, 55–57), though this account is controversial, and has been subject to extensive criticism (e.g. Galston 2002, 46–47; Gaus 1996, 131–136; Wenar 1995, 41–48).

1.1 Rationality and Morality

Some philosophers present the idea of public reason, or the public use of reason, as an essential and central part of the nature of rational discourse about moral norms. Habermas’s influential account of discourse ethics (Habermas 1990; Habermas 1996) has been presented by some as grounding a conception of public reason in this way. On this view, the validity of moral and political norms can only be established by an intersubjective and idealized practice of argumentation. Only through an inclusive and noncoercive discursive process where all participants are equally situated can genuinely intersubjectively valid norms emerge. Habermas thus proposes a dialogical principle of universalization, (U), stating that a moral norm “is valid just in case the foreseeable consequences and side-effects of its general observance for the interests and value-orientations of each individual could be jointly accepted by all concerned without coercion” (Habermas 1998, 42). For Habermas, this principle follows from the presuppositions of rational moral discourse. Thus, at least on one interpretation, to engage in reasoned moral or political argument with others is to commit oneself to something like the idea of public reason—to commit oneself to finding norms that could be jointly accepted by all concerned without coercion. On this account, public reason is grounded in the nature of reasoned moral argument: one cannot, without contradiction, avoid the idea of public reason insofar as one wants to engage in reasoned moral or political argument with others.

Although Habermas’s account of discourse ethics has been influential amongst those who favor some version of discursive or deliberative democracy (Bohman 1996; Chambers 1996; Dryzek 1990; Dryzek 2000), its capacity to serve as the basis for public reason is the subject of a number of criticisms. Perhaps most importantly, by grounding public reason in a broader account of truth, validity, and rational argument, public reason becomes tied to a specific and controversial philosophical doctrine. But some proponents of public reason believe its role is to serve as a mechanism of justification amongst persons who reasonably disagree about philosophical and other issues typically embedded in what Rawls calls comprehensive doctrines (Rawls 1996, 13). If one believes the idea of public reason should stand apart from any particular comprehensive doctrine or philosophical theory of truth and rationality, the appeal to the presuppositions of rational discourse will be a problematic basis for public reason (see Rawls 1996, 376–381).

Others, most notably Gaus, argue that the idea of public reason follows from certain basic features of our everyday moral practices and reactive attitudes, along with certain claims about the nature of reasons (Gaus 2011). On this view, social morality involves a particular kind of interpersonal relationship; one where we claim the standing to make demands of others, and where, under the right conditions, we acknowledge the standing of others to make demands on us (Gaus 2011, 184). But for this sort of relationship to exist, we must believe that when we make moral demands of others, those others have sufficient reasons to comply with our demands—if they did not have sufficient reasons to comply, then the reactive attitudes that form an essential part of the interpersonal relationship of social morality would cease to make sense (Gaus 2011, 205–232). If, as Gaus maintains, different people have different reasons depending on their differing epistemic positions and sets of justified beliefs, the practice of making moral demands of others must involve public reason: the moral demands we make on others must be justifiable to those others by appeal to reasons they have, and not simply by appeal to the truth as we see it.

Although it differs from discourse ethics in important respects, this account also promises to ground public reason in a broader account of the nature of social morality and epistemology. It is thus also vulnerable to similar worries about whether public reason ought to be embedded in a comprehensive and controversial philosophical theory of morality and epistemology. For criticisms of the effort to justify public reason in part by appeal to the reactive attitudes see (Tahzib 2019; Taylor 2018).

1.2 Autonomy

On one prominent view, with both Kantian and Rousseauvian roots, freedom requires that we obey only those laws or rules that we could rationally give to ourselves. To be subject to the will of others, or to the arbitrary forces of nature, is to be unfree. We thus express our nature as rational and autonomous beings by acting in accordance with maxims that we could will to be universal laws, or we express our political autonomy by acting in accordance with those laws that appeal only to the common good, and thereby represent the general will of all citizens. Insofar as one holds this conception of autonomy to be of fundamental importance, autonomy might thus provide the basis for public reason. By ensuring that our moral or political principles are justifiable or reasonably acceptable to all those to whom the principles apply, public reason appears to ensure that each of us is, in some important sense, governed only by principles that we can rationally give to ourselves. Some leading philosophers of public reason appear to make this connection between public reason and autonomy. Gaus, for example, appeals to Rousseau’s statement that the fundamental problem to which the social contract is meant to be the solution is to find a way of imposing rules to regulate our common life “in which each, while uniting himself with all, may still obey himself alone, and remain as free as before” (Gaus 2011, 1. Also see Rawls 1996, 219; Neufeld 2022).

But the extent to which the appeal to autonomy can, on its own, justify the various features of public reason is uncertain, and many proponents of public reason do not explicitly present the appeal to Kantian or Rousseauvian autonomy as the sole, or even primary, basis for public reason. This may be partly explained by the fact that this conception of our autonomy, particularly insofar as it is presented as part of a broader account of our nature as rational beings, is controversial and the subject of reasonable disagreement (Weithman 2002, 188–191; Quong 2013). But for an attempt to develop an explicitly political and civic account of autonomy with which to ground public reason see (Neufeld 2022).

1.3 Coercion and Respect

A widely endorsed view regarding the moral basis of public reason appeals to a particular conception of what it means to treat others with the respect they are due. On this view, we treat others as mere means, and not as ends, when we coerce them on the basis of reasons or arguments that they could not reasonably accept. Charles Larmore, for example, argues “to respect another person as an end is to require that coercive or political principles be as justifiable to that person as they presumably are to us” (Larmore 1999, 608). Conversely, “if we try to bring about conformity to a rule of conduct solely by the threat of force, we shall be treating persons merely as means, as objects of coercion, and not also as ends, engaging with their distinctive capacity as persons” (Larmore 1999, 607. Also see Larmore 2002 and Nagel 1987). Public reason is presented as the way of ensuring that our coercion of others is consistent with respecting others as ends: we do this by ensuring our coercive actions and institutions can be justified to all those who are the subjects of coercion. For a different appeal to respect, one that is alleged to render the idea of public reason at least intelligible (rather than ground the idea) see (van Wietmarschen 2021).

By grounding public reason in an account of how coercion can be suitably respectful, this view limits the scope of public reason in ways that may seem troubling. Not all laws and political institutions are coercive, and yet some noncoercive political institutions may seem appropriate topics of public reason. For example, which forms of marriage, if any, ought to be granted legal recognition, or how the proceeds of a state-run lottery ought to be spent, might seem important topics of public reason, but fall outside the scope of public reason on this basis (Bird 2014; Quong 2013). A related worry is this: if coercive actions uniquely stand in need of public justification, then this may make it difficult, or even impossible, for the state to legitimately pursue many goals that are widely perceived to be permissible (Lister 2010; Lister 2013).

1.4 Community or Civic Friendship

An alternative, though largely neglected, basis for public reason appeals to the importance of a particular conception of political community or civic friendship (Ebels-Duggan 2010; Leland 2019; Leland and van Wietmarschen, 2017; Lister 2013). On this account, the practice of public reason is a constitutive part of a valuable relationship. This relationship might be characterized in several ways. The relationship might have the same structure as other communitarian relationships. In the same way relationships between co-nationals might be intrinsically valuable, and constituted by particular social practices (e.g. shared language and cultural traditions), membership in a pluralistic political community might be valuable, and constituted, in part, by a practice of public reasoning amongst citizens with regard to political rules and institutions. Only when our political community is regulated by laws that can be justified to each of us, despite our diverse perspectives, do we stand in the appropriate sort of valuable communal relationship with our fellow citizens (Lister 2013, ch. 5). A related, but slightly different view, appeals to a conception of reciprocity that obtains when people are willing to propose and abide by fair principles of cooperation acceptable to others, provided those others are likewise willing (Rawls 1996, 49–50). Rawls suggests that one role for this criterion of reciprocity ‘as expressed in public reason…is to specify the nature of the political relationship in a constitutional democratic regime as one of civic friendship’ (Rawls 1996, li. Also see Leland and van Wietmarschen, 2017). Rawls has presented public reason as part of the idea of democracy itself, especially the relationship in a democratic society between free and equal citizens (Rawls 1996, 213; Rawls 1999b, 573). On this view, “the idea of public reason specifies at the deepest level the basic moral and political values that are to determine a constitutional democratic government’s relationship to its citizens and their relation to one another. In short, it concerns how the political relation [of free and equal citizens] is to be understood” (Rawls 1999b, 574). The value of this relationship might thus provide at least part of the moral basis for public reason.

This potential basis for public reason is currently one of the less well-developed in the literature, and thus important features of the view require elaboration. For example, does this view presuppose a particular and controversial conception of the good life? And why should we believe that the value of civic friendship has enough weight to ground a very particular conception of the type of reasons that can be appropriately deployed in political deliberation? A full evaluation of this alleged basis for public reason would need to consider these and other issues.

1.5 Justice

On one common view, public reason is a distinctively political idea: it paradigmatically applies to the laws and other political institutions of our society. One way to explain its distinctively political nature is to ground the idea of public reason in the value of justice (Quong 2013; Rawls 1996). On this view we begin with an ideal of society as a fair system of social cooperation between free and equal citizens. As Rawls says, this ideal “provides a publicly recognized point of view from which all citizens can examine before one another whether their political and social institutions are just. It enables them to do this by citing what are publicly recognized among them as valid and sufficient reasons singled out by that conception itself…the aim of justice as fairness, then, is practical: it presents itself as a conception of justice that may be shared by citizens as a basis of a reasoned, informed, and willing political agreement. It expresses their shared and public political reason” (Rawls 1996, 9). Ensuring that the principles that regulate our shared political life can be justified to each citizen by reference to this common point of view—showing these principles can be the subject of public reason—is how we can know that the terms that regulate our political institutions are fair, and therefore just. If our political principles were instead justified by appeal to some reasonably contested moral, philosophical, or religious doctrine, the terms of our public life would not be fair. Public reason, on this view, is the only way to achieve justice given certain assumptions about the nature of well-ordered liberal democratic societies. This rationale for public reason has several advantages (Quong 2013). First, it explains the distinctively political focus of public reason. Second, justice is widely agreed to be an important value, arguably “the first virtue of social institutions” (Rawls 1999a, 1), and thus if public reason is grounded in the value of justice, this would also explain what some take to be an important feature of public reason, namely, that its conclusions ought to have a certain deliberative priority for citizens. Finally, the value of justice can be endorsed by people from diverse religious, moral, and philosophical backgrounds, and so the value of justice can provide a relatively uncontentious basis for public reason.

But this view of the basis of public reason also faces important objections. Some will deny that political principles, even under conditions of reasonable pluralism or disagreement, need to be justifiable to each (reasonable) citizen in order to be fair or just. Others will object that this account does not provide the real foundation for public reason—it merely shifts the focus to the value of justice. Unless we can explain the basis for giving justice such practical importance, we lack an account of the importance of public reason. Others may object, more strongly, that justice cannot have deliberative priority or practical importance when restricted to those principles capable of being the subject of public reason. Some of these objections are considered in greater detail in section 7.

2. Scope

What is the scope of public reason? To which topics or domains of moral and political life does the idea of public reason apply? On Rawls’s influential account, the idea of public reason applies to what he calls the constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice within a liberal democratic society, “but not in general for all the questions for all the questions to be settled by the legislature within a constitutional framework” (Rawls 2001, 91). Rawls suggests that “citizens and legislators may properly vote their more comprehensive views when constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice are not stake; they need not justify by public reason why they vote as they do” (Rawls 1996, 235). Constitutional essentials, for Rawls, include: the principles that structure the government and political process (e.g. rules determining who may vote, and whether a system is parliamentary or presidential), and the basic rights and liberties of citizens (Rawls 1996, 227). Matters of basic justice involve principles regulating the distribution of important resources (e.g. income, wealth) not covered by the list of basic rights and liberties (Rawls 1996, 228–229).

This proposal about the scope of public reason has been subject to two main challenges. First, some doubt that there is a coherent way of drawing the distinction between constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice on the one hand, and matters of ordinary political legislation on the other (Greenawalt 1994, 685–86). Almost everything the government chooses to do (or not to do) would seem to have an impact, even if indirect, on the basic rights and liberties of citizens, or else on the distribution of resources in society. Second, assuming a satisfactory answer to the first question is possible; we can ask why public reason should be restricted in the way Rawls proposes? Why not extend public reason to all instances where citizens exercise political power over one another? Rawls offers no well-developed answer to this question, though a number of possible arguments can be found in his work. These arguments appeal either to the special importance of the basic structure of society, or to the basic interests of citizens, or to the importance of public reason being complete, that is, of being capable of generating at least one determinate answer to important political questions. But some deny any of these arguments, or some conjunction of them, can in fact justify restricting the scope of public reason to constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice (Quong 2011, 273–289. But see Neufeld 2022, 59–60; and Watson and Hartley 2018, 62–87 for defenses of the narrow scope view).

An alternative view—derived from the account of respect and coercion discussed in sect. 1.3—expands the scope of public reason to cover all instances where some person or group exercises coercive power over another person or group (Larmore 1996, 137; Larmore 1999, 607–608; Nagel 1991, 159). On this view, the scope of public reason extends to almost all state action and activity, since the state’s actions are backed by coercive power, but it will also extend to include the non-political use of coercion by private actors. Although this account may seem more clearly defined, it is also vulnerable to the charge of being both over and under inclusive. It seems underinclusive, as mentioned in sect. 1.3, because some state activities are expressive or symbolic, rather than coercive, but may still seem to stand in need of public justification. But it may also seem overinclusive because private individuals sometimes exercise coercive power over one other in contexts (e.g. private associations or the workplace) where the idea of public reason may seem inappropriate.

Finally, an even broader account extends the scope of public reason to the whole of social morality, that is, “the set of social-moral rules that require or prohibit action, and so ground moral imperatives that we direct to each other to engage in, or refrain from, certain lines of conduct” (Gaus 2011, 2). On this view, the idea of public reason ought to apply whenever we purport to have the standing to tell others how they ought to behave. Being the most ambitious conception of the scope of public reason, this view is naturally vulnerable to worries that it is too expansive, including parts of morality that are in fact governed by different standards (e.g. religious standards of conduct). As noted in sect. 1.1, it is also an account that depends on a particular philosophical conception of epistemology and moral psychology.

3. Constituency

To whom do the relevant rules or principles need to be justified? Which persons, that is, are to be included in the constituency of public reason? The most obvious answer is that everyone to whom the rules are meant to apply must be included in the constituency of public reason. But this simple answer requires clarification. For example, it seems that rules prohibiting murder and rape do not need to be justifiable to, or acceptable to everyone, including those persons who sincerely wish to engage in these actions and would prefer that such actions be permissible. Similarly, those who hold racist and sexist views may not find certain rules prohibiting discrimination justified or acceptable, but that does not seem to bear on the normative status of those rules. For this reason, among others, virtually all proponents of public reason favor an idealized account of the constituency of public reason. Members of the constituency can be epistemically idealized, normatively idealized, or both.

On Rawls’s influential account, reasonable persons represent the constituency of public reason. Reasonable persons are defined by their acceptance of two main ideas. First, reasonable persons are, when among equals, “ready to propose principles and standards as fair terms of cooperation and to abide by them willingly, given the assurance that others will likewise do so. Those norms they view as reasonable for everyone to accept and therefore as justifiable to them; and they are ready to discuss the fair terms that others propose” (Rawls 1996, 49). Second, reasonable persons accept what Rawls calls the burdens of judgment and “accept their consequences for the use of public reason in directing the legitimate exercise of political power in a constitutional regime” (Rawls 1996, 54). The burdens of judgment are the many “hazards involved in the correct (and conscientious) exercise of our powers of reason and judgment in the ordinary course of political life,” (Rawls 1996, 55–56) which explain how reasonable and rational people will permanently disagree about many matters of value and ethics. Rawls’s list of the burdens includes the following facts: (a) empirical and scientific evidence is often complex and conflicting; (b) we may reasonably disagree about the relative weight of different considerations; (c) concepts are vague and subject to hard cases; (d) the way we assess evidence and weigh values can be shaped by our total life experience; (e) different normative considerations on different sides can make overall assessment difficult; and (f) the number of values any social institution can incorporate is limited (Rawls 1996, 56–57). The burdens of judgment explain why reasonable and rational people will be permanently divided over matters of philosophy, religion, and other aspects of the good life. Because reasonable persons accept these two ideas, Rawls suggests they will also accept the idea of public reason—the only terms of social cooperation that will seem fair given the burdens of judgment will be terms that can be justified by appeal to ideals or arguments that all reasonable persons can accept. Reasonable persons will thus eschew appeals to religious ideas or other controversial claims over which reasonable persons are assumed to disagree, and instead appeal only to those public or political ideas that are part of a liberal democratic political culture and can be assumed acceptable to all persons as reasonable and rational (Rawls 1996, 217).

This Rawlsian account of the constituency of public reason is both epistemically and normatively idealized. We can assume the constituency of public reason includes only those persons who are rational and so objections to proposed rules or principles cannot fail the test of public reason simply because some people have irrational views or have made clearly faulty inferences. But this epistemic idealization is tempered by the fact that reasonable persons accept the burdens of judgment; controversial claims about religion, morality, or philosophy cannot be part of public reason. And there is also normative idealization: the constituency includes only those who accept certain political values or ideals (e.g. the idea of citizens as free and equal, or society as a fair system of social cooperation). Both idealizations have been the subject of much scrutiny and criticism. Some suggest, for example, that there is no need for reasonable persons to accept the burdens of judgment (Lecce 2008, 162–182; McKinnon 2002, 45–56; Wenar 1995, 41–48). Others have argued that Rawls’s conception of the reasonable person includes too much normative content (Bohman 2003; Habermas 1995, 126–129). Some further issues will be discussed in sections 7 and 8 below.

A somewhat less idealized view of the constituency of public reason is offered by Gaus (2011), who suggests that we should conceptualize the members of this constituency—he calls them Members of the Public—as moderately idealized counterparts of the real people to whom our moral and political rules apply. These Members of the Public “are not so idealized that their reasoning is inaccessible to their real-world counterparts” (Gaus 2011, 276), but instead are idealized in the following sense: they hold the beliefs that their real-world counterparts would be justified in holding after engaging in a “respectable amount” of good reasoning (Gaus 2011, 250)—reasoning that starts from the evaluative commitments of the real-world agents they represent and from the level of Kohlbergian moral reasoning those agents are capable of (Gaus 2011, 277). This modest level of idealization ensures that the constituency of public reason will be far more diverse than the one envisaged by Rawls. This constituency will include members who adhere to different standards of rationality and have widely divergent sets of normative beliefs, including very divergent beliefs about basic matters of justice. This conception of the constituency of public reason thus purchases inclusivity, and greater approximation to real people’s moral judgments. But this may come with a substantial cost, since it is less clear how such a diverse constituency may agree on any rules at all, let alone rules that we can be confident would reflect our considered judgments about morality and justice (Quong 2014).

On yet a different view, the constituency of public reason should be even more inclusive with very few, if any, standards that need to be met before one qualifies as someone to whom rules or principles must be justified. For example, some suggest that everyone affected by some proposed norm should be a participant in the public use of reason regarding the validity of that norm, provided they are willing to engage in a respectful justificatory dialogue with others (e.g. Bohman 2003). Support for this more inclusive conception can be provided by Habermas’s account of discourse ethics (see sect. 1.1 above), since on this account norms can only be valid when they can be the appropriate object of a suitable intersubjective agreement amongst all affected parties. The same worries about indeterminacy and normative content that apply to Gaus’s moderately idealized Members of the Public would appear apply with even greater force to this view.

4. Content

The debate over the constituency of public reason has direct implications regarding public reason’s content. The greater the degree to which the constituency of public reason is idealized, the more we are restricting the content of public reason, that is, the pool of ideas or arguments that could be reasonably endorsed by the members of the relevant constituency. And if the content of public reason is restricted in this way, it may be possible to determine which rules or principles are conclusively publicly justified via philosophical analysis, without recourse to any actual deliberations amongst citizens. Conversely, the less idealized our account of public reason’s constituency, the more the content of public reason will be determined by some actual process of deliberation between agents in the real world, or at least more realistic idealizations of such agents.

On Rawls’s view, the content of public reason has two parts (Rawls 1996, 224). The first part consists of the principles of a political conception of justice. Although Rawls accepts that citizens can and will reasonably disagree about the specific content of this conception, he claims that this disagreement will be limited to a “family” of liberal political conceptions, all of which share the following features: (1) a list of basic rights, liberties, and opportunities; (2) an assignment of special priority to these rights, liberties, and opportunities, especially when compared with policies aimed at the general good or perfectionist values; and (3) measures ensuring all citizens have adequate all-purpose means to make use of their freedoms (Rawls 1996, 223; Rawls 1999b, 581–582). Conceptions of justice, to be political, must apply to society’s basic social and political institutions, must be able to be presented independently of any particular view of the good life, and must be worked out by appeal to ideas implicit in the public political culture of a constitutional democracy (Rawls 1999b, 584). Thus, for Rawls, some of the paradigmatic examples of the political values of justice and public reason would include: the idea of equal basic liberties; the idea of equality of opportunity; and principles concerning a just distribution of income and wealth (Rawls 1999b, 584). The second part of public reason, at least as presented by Rawls in Political Liberalism, are guidelines of inquiry which include principles of reasoning and rules of evidence to determine how substantive principles are to be applied, as well as important civic virtues such as reasonableness and civility (Rawls 1996, 224). Together, these two components provide both the normative content and the guidelines for citizens when engaged in public reason with one another about fundamental political matters.

Those who adopt a more inclusive view of the constituency of public reason object that the normative content of public reason cannot be as determinate as Rawls suggests (e.g. Benhabib 2002, 108–112; Gaus 2011, 36–46; Habermas 1995, 126–131). On Habermas’s view, for example, the normative content of public reason is not something that is determined via philosophical analysis or argument. Rather, philosophy provides a set of ideal rules or guidelines for the conduct of public reasoning. The ideal guidelines for public reasoning would ensure that the discussion is inclusive, public, and free from any internal or external coercion, that anyone may raise a point that they believe is relevant to the topic at hand, that any participant is allowed to challenge the rules for agenda setting, and that discussion continues until a consensus is reached (Habermas 1996, 304–305). But on this account, the philosopher “leaves substantial questions that must be answered here and now to the more or less enlightened engagement of participants, which does not mean that philosophers may not also participate in the public debate, though in the role of intellectuals, not of experts” (Habermas 1995, 131). In a similar vein, Gaus suggests that without making controversial assumptions, or else idealizing the constituency of public reason in a way that excludes too much of the diversity to which public reason is meant to be the solution, the normative content of public reason is largely indeterminate, that is, many different possible rules can be justified as better than anarchy, but no philosophical argument or analysis can establish a determinate set of rules as being uniquely capable of meeting the test of public reason (Gaus 2011, 43–44). On his account, the content of public reason is given determinate content not by philosophical argument, nor necessarily by deliberation amongst real citizens, but rather via a path-dependent evolutionary process, whereby stable norms evolve and are selected by virtue of their capacity to make cooperative life possible.

Although much of the debate regarding public reason’s content has focused on the question of normative content, there are also important questions about the other aspect of public reason’s content—what Rawls describes as the guidelines of inquiry. Rawls suggests that these guidelines of inquiry direct citizens to abstain from appealing to “comprehensive religious or philosophical doctrines—to what we as individuals or members of associations see as the whole truth—nor to elaborate economic theories of general equilibrium, say, if these are in dispute”. Instead he suggests citizens must rely on “plain truths now widely accepted, or available, to citizens generally,” which include the conclusions of science when not controversial (Rawls 1996, 224–225). One interesting issue is how testimony from scientists and other experts is to be incorporated into the guidelines of inquiry (see Donahue 2020). There is at least one other puzzling aspect of this proposal. As Rawls concedes, one of the things that reasonable people disagree about is the nature of truth itself. There are competing philosophical theories of truth, and public reason is meant to abstain from appealing to particular philosophical doctrines. Rawls thus famously suggests that his account of political liberalism, of which the idea of public reason is a central part, “does without the concept of truth” (Rawls 1996, 94). But without a concept of truth, how can we make sense of what Rawls says about the guidelines of inquiry, in particular his claim that citizens should rely on “plain truths now widely accepted”? Some argue that Rawls is mistaken, and political philosophy cannot abstain from at least some controversial claims about the nature of truth (Estlund 1998; Raz 1990). Others accept that political philosophy must abstain from controversial philosophical theories of truth, but insist that public reason requires a “political” (as opposed to philosophical) account of the truth (Cohen 2008). This is discussed further in section 7.

5. Structure

In order for some proposed principle or rule, X, to meet the test of public reason, do the reasons or arguments that justify X need to be shared by all members of the constituency of justification, or can X meet the test of public reason by being justified to different people by appeal to different arguments? This is a question about the structure of public reason, in particular, about whether that structure must involve a kind of consensus, or whether it can allow different people to converge on the same rule or principle for entirely different reasons (D’Agostino 1996, 30–31; Nagel 1987, 218–219).

One possible view would require strong consensus in order for X to meet the test of public reason. On this account, each member of the constituency of public reason would have to be justified in accepting X for the very same reason or set of reasons. If members of the constituency do not share the same justification for X, then X would not pass the test of public reason. Habermas might be endorsing the strong consensus view when he says “the consensus brought about through argument must rest on identical reasons able to convince the parties in the same way” (Habermas 1996, 339).

A second view requires only weak consensus. On this view, it is not necessary that each person shares the very same justification for accepting X, but it is necessary that each person’s justification for accepting X should depend only on shared or public reasons, that is, reasons that all other members of the justificatory constituency could accept as valid considerations that provide a plausible basis for accepting X, even if there is disagreement among the members as to which set of shared reasons in fact provides the appropriate justification for endorsing X. To illustrate, Albert might believe X is justified because it follows from a commitment to equality of opportunity, whereas Betty might believe X is justified because it is a necessary means of protecting individuals’ rights to freedom of religion, but so long as both these considerations—equality of opportunity and the right to freedom of religion—are accepted as valid normative considerations by all members of the constituency and provide a plausible or reasonable basis of support for X, then X can meet the test of public reason despite the fact that different members believe X to be justified for different reasons. The weak consensus view of public reason’s structure seems to reflect Rawls’s position, and has been explicitly defended by others (Macedo 2010 (Other Internet Resources); Quong 2011, 261–273; Watson and Hartley 2018, 40–61).

It may be helpful to connect this view regarding the structure of public reason to Rawls’s discussion of the related concepts of public justification and the idea of an overlapping consensus. For Rawls, public justification is achieved “when all the reasonable members of political society carry out a justification of the shared political conception by embedding it in their several reasonable comprehensive views” (Rawls 1996, 387). When each reasonable person has found a sufficient comprehensive or non-shared justification of a political liberal conception of justice, then we can say that an overlapping consensus on a political conception of justice exists, and as a result of this consensus, there is a public justification of our shared political conception of justice. But Rawls is clear that “while the public justification of the political conception…depends on reasonable comprehensive doctrines, it does so only in an indirect way. That is, the express contents of the doctrines have no normative role in public justification; citizens do not look into the content of others’ doctrines…Rather, they take into account and give some weight only to the fact—to the existence—of the reasonable overlapping consensus itself” (Rawls 1996, 387). For Rawls, public justification thus depends on the fact that all reasonable persons can endorse a political conception of justice from within their non-public or comprehensive doctrines, but public reason itself makes no reference to the content of those nonpublic doctrines—it depends only on the shared political ideas found within the political conception of justice.

By contrast, convergence accounts of public reason’s structure allow for the possibility that a principle or rule may meet the test of public reason even in the absence of any shared or public reasons (Billingham 2016; Billingham 2017; Gaus 2009; Gaus 2011, 276–292; Gaus and Vallier 2009, Stout 2004, 72–73; Vallier 2014; Vallier 2016). Here is an illustration of the convergence view. X is justified for Albert by appeal to reason Ra, but this reason is drawn from Albert’s religious doctrine. Ra is, we can temporarily assume, only normative for Albert and others who adhere to this religious doctrine. For Betty, on the other hand, X can be justified by appeal to Rb, a reason drawn from her different religious doctrine. Suppose Albert and Betty are the only members of the justificatory constituency and suppose there are no shared reasons that would justify accepting X. Under these conditions, the convergence account holds that X meets the test of public reason because Albert and Betty each have a sufficient justification for X, even though the reasons supporting their convergent justifications are not shared. Note that proponents of the convergence view need not (and typically do not) deny that shared justifications of the sort described in the preceding paragraphs are also a successful way for a proposed rule to meet the test of public reason—they simply insist, contra proponents of consensus views, that convergent justifications are also an acceptable structure for public reason.

The convergence view appears to depend on the assumption that justifications and reasons can be relative to particular persons, that is, what constitutes a justification for Albert may not succeed as a justification for Betty, and vice versa. But some have argued that this means the convergence view depends on a controversial philosophical position that is the subject of reasonable disagreement. Unless this controversial view is assumed, the convergence view cannot assure us that Albert and Betty can each sincerely believe that the other is justified in accepting X. The convergence view, according to this critique, thus either depends on a reasonably disputed philosophical thesis, or else it fails to show that all parties to a convergent justification are indeed justified in endorsing the rule in question (Quong 2011, 261–273). Other critics of the convergence view argue that it has unwelcome institutional implications regarding the interpretation and application of laws, and that unlike consensus approaches, it fails to provide citizens with the type of mutual assurance that others are committed to the project of public reasoning about fundamental political matters (Macedo 2010, Other Internet Resources; Watson and Hartley 2018, 58–60). Others argue that the convergence account faces a dilemma: it either runs the risk of self-defeat, or else it involves a form of moral authoritarianism to which it purports to be opposed (Wall 2013).

For their part, proponents of the convergence view argue that what matters for public reason is that rules or laws be justified to each individual person to whom the rules or laws apply. If, as proponents of the convergence model insist, different people can be justified in endorsing the same rule for entirely different reasons, then proponents of public reason have no principled basis to oppose convergent forms of justification. Defenders of the view also insist that the requirement for consensus or shared reasons is overly demanding, and fails to be consistent with the pluralistic forms of reasoning that are possible amongst the relevant members of the constituency of public reason. Part of the point of public reason, on this view, is to accommodate the diverse forms of reasoning that are bound to exist among any reasonably competent group of reasoners (Gaus 2011, 288–292; Vallier, 2014; Vallier, 2016).

6. Site and Duties

What duties, if any, does the idea of public reason impose on individuals? And in what domains or parts of our life do the requirements of public reason apply?

Rawls argues that public reason imposes a moral duty of civility on all citizens to explain to one another how, at least with regard to constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice, the political positions “they advocate and vote for can be supported by the political values of public reason” (Rawls 1996, 217). Citizens, Rawls suggests, should think of themselves as if they were legislators, supporting only those political positions that they believe could be justified by appeal to reasons that all reasonable persons could endorse, and holding government officials to this standard (Rawls 1999b, 576–577). But Rawls appears to believe that public reason imposes greater duties on public officials: elected officials and those who run for office, their staff, and judges. This is because, in these roles, these people work at what Rawls considers the main site of public reason, namely, the public political forum. This forum has three parts: (1) the discourse of judges, (2) the discourse of government officials, and (3) the discourse of candidates for public office and their campaign managers (Rawls 1999b, 575). The public political forum is the arena where our fundamental political principles and institutions are shaped and debated—it is where collective political power is most directly exercised—and thus it is the most appropriate site for the application of individual duties of public reason. When engaged in discourse in this arena, officials are to refrain from appealing to religious or other comprehensive doctrines over which reasonable persons are assumed to disagree, and instead make arguments that appeal to our shared political values. Rawls does, however, qualify this duty by appeal to what he refers to as the “wide view” of public political culture, which permits officials and citizens to introduce their religious or otherwise comprehensive views into political discussion at any point, provided appropriate public reasons are provided in due course (Rawls 1999b, 591). It is also important to note that the duty of civility is, on Rawls’s view, a moral but not a legal duty—it cannot be coercively imposed—and it does not apply to the discussions citizens may have outside the public political forum, for example, the discussions individuals have qua members of private associations, or family members, or discussions within universities, religious institutions, or other parts of what Rawls calls the background culture (Rawls 1996, 220).

Rawls’s account of the duty of civility and the site of public reason has been subject to a number of criticisms, some of which will be discussed in section 7 below. But even setting these objections aside, not all proponents of public reason believe that it ought to directly regulate the behavior of individual citizens in the manner suggested by Rawls. Some argue that the aims of public reason are best served by permitting ordinary citizens, and perhaps even elected officials, to debate and deliberate unconstrained by the duty of civility (e.g. Benhabib 2002, 108–112; Bohman 2003; Gaus 2009; Gaus and Vallier 2009; Vallier 2014; Vallier 2016). Some argue for this less restrictive view because they hold different conceptions of the constituency and content of public reason; the more philosophically indeterminate those conceptions are, the less plausible it is to impose a restrictive duty of civility on individual citizens, since only by allowing citizens to engage in a fairly unconstrained discourse can the content of public reason emerge (Benhabib 2002; Bohman 2003). Others reject the duty of civility because they endorse a different account of the structure of public reason. If, for example, the convergence view of public reason’s structure is correct, then citizens and officials need not refrain from appealing to religious or otherwise comprehensive arguments in political deliberations, since those reasons might succeed in justifying a proposed law to some members of the public, even if others cannot reasonably accept those reasons. Those who endorse consensus conceptions of public reason’s structure, however, are likely to protest that abandoning the duty of civility in this way is to effectively abandon the idea of public reason, since there would no longer be any requirement that public policies be justified by appeal to shared or common reasons.

Different accounts of public reason thus yield sharply different views regarding the duties of citizens and public officials. On Rawls’s view, and other similar views, citizens and public officials should generally refrain from relying on ideas or reasons that other reasonable citizens reject, and must always show how the political positions they support can be justified by appeal to shared political values. On other accounts, the idea public reason may regulate the way we design our democratic institutions, and may be a standard by which particular principles and laws can be assessed, but it imposes few, if any, moral restrictions on the behavior of citizens and perhaps even elected officials.

7. Objections

This section considers some of the most prominent objections to the idea of public reason. The list below is not exhaustive, and some of the objections below apply to some conceptions of public reason, but not others.

7.1 Idealization

As we have seen above, all conceptions of public reason involve a certain amount of idealization. The persons to whom rules must be justified are not persons as they actually are, with all their prejudices, biases, and irrational beliefs. Instead, the constituency of public reason is typically idealized on both moral and epistemic dimensions. Critics of public reason sometimes object to this idealization (Enoch 2013; Enoch 2015; Raz 1990). The objection is best presented in the form of a dilemma. On the one hand, if the degree of idealization is kept to a minimum, then public reason may result in anarchy, or may fail to deliver minimally acceptable results; for example, rules prohibiting discrimination on the basis of race or sex may not be justifiable to only modestly idealized parties. On the other hand, if the degree of idealization is very substantial, this creates two different worries. First, it’s no longer clear in what sense the resulting rules are justifiable to the real persons bound by the rules. The whole apparatus of public justification might seem superfluous (Van Schoelandt 2015); it would be simpler and more accurate to simply present certain principles or reasons as true, and declare that anyone who refuses to acknowledge their truth is making an error. Second, and relatedly, too much idealization may implausibly entail that almost all real persons are excluded from the constituency of public reason (Enoch 2015, 122–23). The dilemma is nicely summarized by Raz:

It seems tempting to say that our duty to act only on political principles to which the reasonable consent is simply the duty to act on well-founded, valid principles. For that is what the reasonable consent to. This eliminates the independent role of consent . . . The puzzle is how one can give consent a viable role, without saying that only principles already agreed to by all can be relied on. One must find a reasonable interpretation of the intuitively appealing idea that political principles must be accessible to people as they are . . . Politics must take people as they come and be accessible to them, capable of commanding their consent without expecting them to change in any radical way. But at the same time, justified political principles may be controversial, and may fail to command actual consent. Nagel and Rawls offer interpretations of this intuition which aim to be both coherent and attractive. Their failure suggests that the underlying idea may at bottom be unstable and incoherent. There may be no middle way between actual (including implied) agreement and rational justification. (Raz 1990, 46).

In response, several strategies are available to the proponent of public reason. First, the proponent might aim for a Goldilocks solutions; locate a degree of idealization that is substantial enough to avoid the first horn of the dilemma, without being so substantial as to generate the problems associated with the second horn (Vallier 2014, 145–180). Second, proponents of public reason might embrace either horn of the dilemma. On the one hand, they might argue that accounts of public reason cannot be judged by independent moral standards. We have to follow the process of public justification wherever it goes, even if this entails only a minimal set of rules are publicly justifiable. On the other hand, proponents of public reason might embrace the consequences of a great deal of idealization. In particular, if we bear in mind that the category of the “unreasonable” (those excluded from the constituency of public reason) is a technical term with no necessary implications regarding moral and political rights, there may be nothing so counterintuitive about declaring many persons to be unreasonable. Finally, proponents of public reason might resist the assumption, on which the dilemma appears to rest, that one of public reason’s central aims is to mimic the normative role that actual consent can play in legitimating authority. If public reason is not intended to be some pale form of consent, then it’s no longer an objection to point out that substantial idealization might yield conclusions that depart dramatically from what many real persons would accept.

7.2 Self-Defeating

The idea of public reason tells us that, for some set of moral or political rules, the rules in question are not legitimate, or lack normative authority, unless the rules in question can be justified, or are reasonably acceptable, to all those to whom the rules apply. Some critics argue that the idea of public reason is self-defeating because the idea itself cannot be justified to all those to whom the idea applies (Enoch 2013, 170–73; Mang 2017; Raz 1998, 29–30; Wall 2002). Public reason, the critic points out, is a moral or political rule like any other, and so surely it ought to be subject to the same test of moral and political rules which proponents of public reason advocate. But, the critic continues, the idea of public reason will be unable to pass this test.

There are, broadly, two ways one might defend the idea of public reason from this objection. First, one might deny that the idea of public reason does indeed apply to itself. On some formulations, the idea of public reason is a constraint on the exercise of political power, or a constraint on the exercise of coercion, but not itself an exercise of political power, nor an exercise of coercion. When the proponent of public reason states that political or moral rules must be publicly justifiably to be legitimate, she does not exert power or coercion over anyone, she merely states a condition that any purportedly legitimate exercises of power or coercion must meet to be legitimate (Bajaj 2017). The success of this reply, however, may depend on a controversial presumption in favor of states of affairs where political power or coercion is not exercised. It seems to assume, for example, that refusals to aid others, and other non-coercive choices, need not meet the test of public reason. Proponents of public reason might also argue that the principle of public reason does not apply to itself because it is a “meta” claim about the appropriate conditions for moral or political justification, and not a first order normative claim within that discourse (Gaus 2011, 227–228). But this line of reply is also open to challenge, since the idea of public reason does sometimes appear to operate as a first order normative claim, for example, it can be deployed to justify why one person cannot permissibly coerce another, or why the latter person is justified in forcefully resisting that coercion.

The second way to defend public reason from the objection is to concede that the idea ought to apply to itself (Estlund 1998) and argue that it does so successfully. This strategy might be pursued in several ways. The proponent of public reason may point to some allegedly public or shared ideal—moral autonomy or respect for persons—and argue that this ideal both justifies a commitment to public reason and is publicly justifiable by virtue of being a suitably public or shared ideal. This strategy, however, faces two related challenges. If the ideal in question is formulated in a sufficiently detailed or rich way, such that a commitment to public reason is plausibly entailed by the ideal, then the ideal runs the risk of being one that is no longer suitably public or shared. This defense thus runs the risk of grounding public reason in some reasonably contested moral ideal or claim about philosophical truth, though some argue this is the only appropriate way to defend the idea (Estlund 1998). On the other hand, if the alleged ideal is pitched at a level of abstraction that ensures it does remain suitably public, it may no longer be obvious that the ideal does in fact entail a commitment to public reason (Wall 2002, 390–391). Alternatively, a proponent might argue that public reason can successfully meet its own test by appeal to a convergence form of justification. On this view, the idea of public reason is justifiable or acceptable to all the relevant members of the constituency because each member has his or her own nonpublic reasons to accept the idea. For example, all reasonable people might converge on the importance of the value of justice for nonpublic reasons, and then the advocate of public reason need only establish that justice, at least under conditions of reasonable pluralism, requires a commitment to public reason (see sect. 1.5 above). But this line of response may be vulnerable to the charge that it can only succeed by stipulation—by defining the relevant members of the constituency as those who converge on the importance of public reason (Mang 2017).

7.3 Truth

Many accounts of public reason, most notably Rawls’s, recommend that we assess moral and political rules while abstaining, in several ways, from claims about truth. On Rawls’s account, for example, philosophical theories of the truth are the sort of thing over which reasonable people are assumed to disagree, and so an account of public reason cannot purport to deliver moral or political principles that are “true” according to some particular philosophical conception of truth; rather it can only deliver principles that are “reasonable” (Rawls 1996, 94). Many accounts of public reason also tell citizens that they must refrain, when engaged in public reasoning with others, from appealing to the whole truth as they see it. Regardless of what you may believe is true about religion or the good life, citizens must abstain from appeals to such truths, and instead appeal only to those public or political considerations that can be endorsed by other reasonable members of the moral or political community.

These two ways in which public reason limits appeals to truth generate several distinct objections. First, some worry that if a system of moral or political justification ignores the whole truth, the resulting moral or political principles may be false. For example, if it is true that all sinners will go to hell when they die, but we are precluded from appealing to this truth in developing our political principles, we may endorse a political principle that permits people to engage in various sinful activities. If we could appeal to the whole truth about hell, however, we would see that this political principle is false. Others worry that without some appeal to truth, any agreement on political principles will amount to a mere modus vivendi (Hampton 1989, 806–07). A related worry—that precluding the appeal to certain truths will render us unable to solve certain problems—is considered in section 7.3 below.

Second, we might worry that if an account of moral or political justification seeks to validate conclusions without contradicting anything that a diverse group of people believe to be true—for example, without contradicting anyone’s reasonable religious views—such an account will be “committed to the view that it is desirable to propagate false beliefs or unsound inferences” (Raz 1998, 42).

Third, some critics focus on Rawls’s claim that the content of public reason—the principles of a political conception of justice—can be presented as merely reasonable, but not true. If these principles are merely reasonable, but not presented as true, then why should individuals accord these principles priority in their decisions about how to behave, particularly when these principles come into conflict with religious or other requirements that individuals believe to be true, and not merely reasonable (Raz 1990, 23)?

Fourth, it might seem that public reason cannot successfully abstain from some claims about moral or political truth. In order to explain why we ought to accept a principle of public reason or public justification, we cannot simply say it ought to be accepted because the principle itself can be publicly justified. Such a claim might be trivially true—its truth established by restricting the constituency of public reason to those who endorse the idea of public reason—but this does not vindicate the principle, nor does it distinguish a principle of public reason from similarly “insular” principles that appear clearly dubious, for example, a principle mandating that moral principles are valid only when endorsed by Albert, who also happens to endorse this principle granting him exclusive moral authority (Estlund 1998).

Fifth, other critics have suggested that the idea of public reason entails that individuals must doubt, or be skeptical about, their religious or otherwise nonpublic beliefs (Barry 1995, 901–914; McCabe 2000, 316–324; Wall 1998, 91–94; Wenar 1995, 41–48), or at least must accept that their nonpublic beliefs can be disputed by fully competent reasoners (Leland and van Wietmarschen 2012). Some argue this is entailed by the Rawlsian appeal to the burdens of judgment or the fact of reasonable pluralism (see sect. 3). Others claim that only if we were skeptical about the truth of our nonpublic beliefs would it make sense to bracket those beliefs when deliberating about moral and political matters. If skepticism is entailed for either of these reasons, this poses two potential problems. One is that this looks to be the sort of controversial epistemological view that Rawls and others want to avoid in constructing an account of public reason. The other is that many otherwise apparently reasonable and well-motivated people are not skeptical about their religious or nonpublic beliefs, but then does this mean such people cannot endorse the idea of public reason? These worries lead some to conclude that there is no coherent way to explain how reasonable persons can (a) accept something like the fact of reasonable pluralism, (b) believe her own non-public doctrine is true, and (c) be suitably motivated to endorse a principle of public reason (Enoch 2017).

Proponents of public reason have offered various responses to the objections described above. First, and most generally, not all conceptions of public reason purport to do without the concept of truth entirely, in the way that Rawls’s particular account aims to do. Second, even those who endorse Rawls’s account, or one similar to it, argue that it can meet the objections pressed against it. According to some, this is because it is a mistake to suppose that a theory of public reason or political justification must also justify the deliberative priority of its conclusions. On this view, it is up to individuals to decide whether, and why, to accord to deliberative priority to the conclusions of public reason. If deliberative priority is not something a theory of public reason should be expected to supply, the third, fourth, and fifth objections above can be defused (Quong 2011, 221–242). Third, proponents of public reason point out that when methods of justification require participants to refrain from appealing to the whole truth, this does not entail the conclusions reached will not be true, or that the method is somehow indifferent with regard to the truth of the conclusions reached (Mendus 2002, 26–28; Rawls 1996, 150). Certain appeals to truth—for example, hearsay—are not permitted in a courtroom, but this does not show that we are unconcerned with the truth of the conclusions we reach in criminal trials. Fourth, and relatedly, in contexts when we aim at truth or justification, we also recognize the importance of other considerations and allow these considerations to constrain the means by which truth is pursued, for example, spouses cannot be required to testify against one another (Freeman 2007, 233–235; Rawls 1996, 218). Finally, some might argue, following Rawls, that we do not need to affirm any given political principle or rule as true, only as the most reasonable one available in light of our commitment to certain public political values; this is sufficient to show why we ought to endorse the principle or rule in question, at least insofar as we see ourselves as reasonable citizens.

7.4 Incompleteness

One of the most important objections pressed against the idea of public reason concerns its capacity to provide solutions to all, or almost all, of the important moral and political questions we face, that is, the question of whether public reason is complete (Rawls 1996, 244–246; Rawls 1999b, 585–586). A number of critics argue that public reason lacks the resources to offer solutions to many important moral or political questions because the answers to these questions depend on appeal to controversial moral, religious, or metaphysical claims of the sort over which reasonable people disagree and that are excluded from many conceptions of public reason, particularly those conceptions that adopt a consensus approach to the structure of public reason (Horton 2003: Kramer 2017, 92–155; de Marneffe 1994; Reidy 2000: Sandel 1998).

There are two ways in which public reason might be incomplete (Gaus 1996, 151–158: Schwartzman 2004). First, public reason might be indeterminate, that is, it may be unable to deliver any clear conclusions about a particular question. In these cases, it is sometimes said that public reason “runs out”: its content simply proves insufficient to yield an answer to the question posed. Second, public reason might be inconclusive with regard to some question, that is, a plurality of different answers might be apparently justified by appeal to public reason, and public reason alone cannot clearly tell us which answer is correct or the most reasonable alternative.

Indeterminacy is the more serious charge, but critics maintain that even if public reason was only inconclusive with regard to many questions, this would also be a serious, perhaps fatal, objection to public reason. Some of the topics with regard to which critics allege public reason is either inconclusive or indeterminate include: abortion, stem-cell research, gay marriage, prostitution, justice for future generations, the treatment of animals, and other issues where critics allege getting the right moral or political answer depends upon religious or metaphysical claims about personhood, or else on controversial claims about human flourishing or the good life. Some critics believe that virtually all moral or political questions depend, to a certain extent, on truths about personhood, metaphysics, or human flourishing, and so these critics are likely to see the charge of incompleteness as a deep and pervasive problem for public reason.

What responses are available to the proponent of public reason? With regard to the charge of inconclusiveness, most advocates of public reason are inclined to accept the charge, but deny that it represents an objection (Freeman 2007, 242–243; Gaus 2011, 303–333; Quong 2011, 204–212, 285–287; Rawls 1996, 240–241; Schwartzman 2004; A. Williams 2000). If, for a given moral or political question, public reason seems to yield a number of equally reasonable answers, we should find an appropriate way to choose between these competing answers. If we do so, the idea of public reason is upheld, rather than undermined. On this view, the critics wrongly suppose that the point of public reason is to deliver a unique answer to each question we face; the point is rather to ensure that the rules or principles that we adopt can be reasonably justified to all. Showing that some rule we currently apply is not the only rule that can meet the test of public reason is no objection, provided the mechanism by which different public justifiable rules are selected can itself be reasonably justified. The charge of indeterminacy seems more serious: if public reason can provide no answer to a given moral or political question, we are apparently left with no alternative but to rely on nonpublic forms of reasoning. In response to this objection, there are two main strategies. One is to insist that public reason is unlikely to be indeterminate in many cases, or at least to rebut specific attempts by critics to show that public reason is indeterminate with regard to a particular question (Bell 2002; Freeman 2007, 241–251; Schwartzman 2004, 205–208; A. Williams 2000, 205–208). The second strategy is to insist that, even if public reason is indeterminate with regard to a given question, this does not suffice to establish that it is permissible to resort to nonpublic forms of reasoning. Alternative solutions—deferring decisions if possible, finding forms of mutual accommodation, or random decision-making procedures—may be preferable to resorting to nonpublic reasoning (Schwartzman 2004, 209–214; A. Williams 2000, 209–211).

7.5 Exclusion

Some critics argue that the idea of public reason—again particularly Rawls’s conception—is in some way unfair or unduly exclusionary. This complaint is most often made on behalf of those who would rely on religious arguments when deliberating about important moral and political questions (Eberle 2002; Greenawalt 1995; Smith 2010; Stout 2004; Vallier 2014; Weithman 2002), though the objection is also sometimes made more generally on behalf of those who are excluded from the constituency of public reason on normative grounds (Bohman 2003; Friedman 2000). There are many different versions of this objection, and the list that follows is not exhaustive. Put most forcefully, public reason is a sham: it purports to be an impartial or neutral method of moral or political justification, but it is, in fact, a form of sectarian secularism or modern liberalism masquerading as something more inclusive. A second, less strident, version of this objection points out that even those theories of public reason that are not explicitly secular will nevertheless make it more difficult, on balance, for religious citizens to justify their favored views. Public reason cannot help but tilt in a secular direction given its requirement that principles or rules be reasonably justifiable to all members of the community. Everyone can understand and endorse a variety of secular considerations, but there is no religious idea or argument that all reasonable people can accept, and thus public reason has an in-built bias against religious doctrines and those who believe such doctrines are relevant to moral and political argument. A third version of the objection queries why controversial religious arguments, claims about the good life, or metaphysical arguments, are excluded from playing a role in public reason, but controversial arguments about justice or individual rights are not similarly excluded. If, as the critic alleges, nothing can justify this asymmetric treatment of controversial arguments from different domains of inquiry, then the idea of public reason is unjustifiably biased against those who rely on religious, metaphysical, or perfectionist arguments. This objection is sometimes called the asymmetry objection (Brower 1994, 21–22; Caney 1995, 258; Sandel 1998, 202–210; Waldron 1999, ch. 7). A variant of this objection focuses on the claim that reasons must be “accessible” in order to qualify as public. The critics allege that, however the notion of accessibility is defined, there will be no clear grounds for declaring that many religious arguments are not accessible and thus nonpublic when compared to various apparently public non-religious arguments (Eberle 2002, 255–260). Fourth, some critics worry that Rawls’s moral duty of civility (see sect. 6 above) will either discourage some citizens from engaging in legitimate acts of religious expression and association, or at least will create a political atmosphere where religious arguments and those who espouse them are treated as less valuable when compared with purely “public” reasons and those who restrict themselves to such arguments (Vallier 2014, 59–64). Finally, some critics argue that public reason is not the only way, and perhaps not the best way, to show respect for others, or show civility, when engaged in moral and political dialogue. There are equally plausible conceptions of respect and civility which favor presenting others with the whole truth as we see it when engaged in moral or political debate, rather than restricting ourselves to shared or common reasons. If this is true, then those who ground their moral or political arguments only in religious or otherwise nonpublic reasons are not being unreasonable or disrespectful: they are simply following a different, but equally plausible, interpretation of what respect or civility requires (Eberle 2002; Pallikkathayil 2019; Stout 2004, 67–85; Weithman 2002).

A variety of different replies are available for the proponent of public reason. In response to the first charge, defenders of public reason can point out that it is not only religious doctrines that are deemed “nonpublic” by leading theories of public reason such as Rawls’s. Secular doctrines such as utilitarianism or controversial secular claims about the good life are also deemed nonpublic. Thus it seems unfair to allege that public reason is simply a fig leaf for a secular agenda. In response to the second objection, theorists of public reason may concede that there is a sense in which public reason tilts in a secular direction, but insist this is not an arbitrary bias, but rather the justifiable result of the requirement that certain principles or rules be justifiable to all those who are bound by them. The charge of bias thus in fact depends on a much deeper objection to the public reason project, and so the critic who presses the charge of bias must be prepared to rebut the more fundamental arguments offered in favor of public reason.

Several different responses have been offered in reply to the third objection: the asymmetry objection. Some argue the objection can be defused by constructing an account of public reason (or the closely related idea of a political liberalism) without appeal to what Rawls calls the burdens of judgment, or other apparently epistemological premises (see sect. 1 above) (Lecce 2008, ch. 6). Others deny that public reason should include an accessibility requirement (Vallier 2011). Finally, others argue that it is a mistake to suppose that religious arguments are excluded from public reason because they are controversial or the subject or reasonable disagreement amongst citizens, since the same can be said for many non-religious arguments. Rather, on this view, they are excluded because the disagreements or controversies over religious and other comprehensive doctrines are deeper or more foundational and lack the normative common ground that characterize reasonable disagreements over matters of justice and individual rights (Quong 2011, 192–220).

In response to the fourth charge—that an ideal of public reason will directly or indirectly discourage religious expression, or create the perception that those who invoke religious arguments are, in some sense, second class citizens—the proponent of public reason can offer at least two replies. First, not all theories of public reason share Rawls’s view regarding the moral duty of civility. As we saw in section 6, some accounts of public reason entail fewer, if any, direct restrictions on the behavior of individual citizens. Second, Rawls’s own view does not prohibit citizens from offering religious or nonpublic arguments for their favored positions; it only requires that individuals who do so eventually supplement these arguments with public reasons (again see sect. 6). Finally, proponents of public reason are likely to deny that there are plausible alternative conceptions of civility or respect that would allow religious and other non-shared arguments to play a more central role in moral or political justification (Quong 2013), or else they may deny that the grounds of public reason are in fact best explicated by appeal to notions of civility or respect (see sect. 1).

7.6 Antidemocratic

A further objection to the idea of public reason—again particularly Rawls’s account—is that it is antidemocratic. On Rawls’s account, the content of public reason is partly fixed via philosophical argument, prior to any actual democratic deliberation amongst citizens (see sect. 5). Seyla Benhabib thus complains that “public reason in Rawls’s theory is best viewed not as a process of reasoning among citizens, but more as a regulative principle, imposing certain standards upon how individuals, institutions, and agencies ought to reason about public matters. The standards of public reason are set by a political conception of liberalism” (Benhabib 2002, 108). Similarly, Habermas argues that Rawls’s theory does not take seriously enough the importance of democratic or political autonomy, and by giving public reason determinate content in the shape of certain liberal principles “generates a priority of liberal rights which demotes the democratic process to an inferior status” (Habermas 1995, 128). Although these complaints are made about Rawls’s account, the objection obviously applies, with greater or lesser force, to any conception of public reason that fixes the content of public reason, to some extent, prior to any actual democratic debate.

The response on behalf of Rawls’s account and similar views is likely to take the following form. First, Rawls does not purport to offer a determinate account of public reason’s content; rather he suggests that the content of public reason is given by a family of political conceptions of justice. His theory thus “does not try to fix public reason once and for all in the form of one favored political conception of justice” (Rawls 1999b, 582). Second, insofar as the content of public reason is partly determinate—for example, Rawls claims it must include certain basic rights and liberties for all persons—this does not appear particularly objectionable, nor does it seem a problematic restriction of the democratic process, unless one believes that democratic majorities can permissibly vote to deny the basic rights of certain individuals (Quong 2013). Finally, since all conceptions of public reason aim at the public justification of moral or political rules, it is not strange to suppose that the content of public reason might be partly determinate prior to any actual discussion and deliberation. It is plausible to believe that certain basic rules prohibiting non-consensual harming of innocent persons, or protecting certain minimal rights of bodily integrity, must be justifiable to all members of the constituency of public reason, provided we assume those members are committed to certain minimal ideals of freedom and equality (Cohen 2010, 272–277). To assume otherwise—as those who press the antidemocratic objection appear to do—would be to concede that we cannot be certain, in advance of actual deliberation amongst real persons, that our most basic moral and political commitments are publicly justifiable. If this assumption were true, it seems more likely to count against the very idea of public reason, as opposed to something that counts against Rawls’s particular conception of public reason.

8. Further Issues

This section briefly lists some further topics that have either received relatively little attention in the literature to date, or have only recently become the focus of sustained work. Again, the list is not exhaustive.

8.1 Non-ideal Conditions

The idea of public reason is often presented as a normative ideal, as the way our moral or political rules ought, ideally, to be justified, and also as the way individuals ought, ideally, to engage in deliberation and discussion. Rawls, for example, stipulates that his account of public reason “belongs to a conception of a well-ordered constitutional democratic society” (Rawls 1999b, 573), by which he means a society where: (a) everyone accepts, and knows that others accept, the same conception of justice (or at least everyone accepts some member from the family of liberal conceptions); (b) the basic structure of society is publicly known to satisfy this conception and; (c) citizens have a normally effective sense of justice (Rawls 1996, 35).

But what does public reason entail in non-ideal circumstances, such as our own, where arguably none of the three conditions listed above are met (Boettcher 2012, 174–175)? Some proponents of public reason encourage us to observe the moral duty of civility in our political life, but if the duty of civility has been designed for ideal conditions, it is unclear whether or how it might apply under less than ideal conditions (Donahue 2021; Lister 2017). For example, many accounts of public reason include a sincerity principle that directs individuals to only support those principles or rules they sincerely believe meet the test of public reason (Gaus 1996, 139–140; Rawls 1996, 241–242; Schwartzman 2011. For an alternative view see Carey 2018). But does this requirement still apply in conditions where many of those with whom we are debating do not embrace the idea of public reason, and may behave only strategically or cynically? Similarly, if we believe our existing political institutions are not publicly justifiable or do not meet certain minimal requirements of justice, do the requirements of public reason nevertheless apply to our political deliberations and discourse, or do those requirements only apply once reasonably just institutions have been secured (Rawls 1996, 247–252)?

8.2 Problems of Extension

As we saw in section 7.3, an important objection to the idea of public reason is that it will prove incomplete; that it lacks the theoretical resources necessary to provide answers to many of the important moral or political questions we face. Although this objection is often voiced by critics of public reason, the existing literature provides relatively little in the way of detailed case-by-case analysis of the plausibility of the charge (exceptions include J. Williams 2015; J. Williams 2017, Other Internet Resources; Greenawalt 1988). In particular, the charge of incompleteness seems most plausible when we consider certain “problems of extension”, that is, topics where it is unclear whether public reason can be extended to provide reasonable answers (Rawls 1996, 244–246). Some examples of these problems include: What principles should regulate our treatment of future generations? What principles should regulate our treatment of animals and nature? What principles should apply to decisions about the provision of health care? For each of these questions, there is a plausible prima facie case that our deliberations must be informed by considerations that go beyond the limits of public reason and appeal to controversial claims about the moral status of animals, or future persons, or particular claims about what constitutes human flourishing. But whether this is indeed the case with regard to these issues, among others, is something that awaits more sustained analysis.

8.3 Global Public Reason

Another issue that Rawls lists as a problem of extension is the topic of international relations. But the topic of international relations may not simply be a problem of extension, that is, it may not simply be a question of whether some existing account of public reason can be extended to provide the necessary answers to questions about international relations or global justice. There is also the further question as to whether the principles that regulate international or global justice require an independent or separate conception of global public reason. The case in favor of a distinct account of global public reason might appeal to at least three facts. First, if the fundamental ideas that form the basis of “domestic” public reason draw on the shared public or political culture of a constitutional democracy (Rawls 1999b, 584), global public reason appears to require a different basis, since either there is no shared political culture spanning the globe, or else that shared culture looks very different to that of a constitutional democracy. Second, if the relevant agents in the global or international arena are not primarily individual persons, but are rather states or other collective entities, then global public reason may require a very different conception of the constituency of public reason. Third, and relatedly, if we assume that a global society regulated by a conception of global public reason is comprised of different states, which are each internally regulated by their own domestic forms of public reason, we face several questions regarding the relationship between these domestic and global principles, for example, can these principles come into conflict, and if so, how do we adjudicate such conflicts? Each of these assumptions, however, is open to dispute, and thus some might plausibly insist that there is no need for a distinct account of global public reason.

Although the topic of global justice has been the subject of much recent philosophical attention, comparatively little recent work has focused on the idea of a global public reason, with some notable exceptions (Cohen 2010, 319–372; Porter 2012; Rawls 1999b, 529–564; Smith 2011; Wenar 2008; J. Williams 2017).

8.4 Assurance, Stability, Publicity, and Trust

Although the idea of public reason is primarily a view about the justification of moral or political rules, it may have other important social functions. Paul Weithman suggests that public reason also plays an essential role—at least in Rawls’s Political Liberalism—in establishing mutual assurance with regard to a commitment to a public conception of justice amongst citizens who are deeply divided about religious, moral, and philosophical matters (Weithman 2010, 326–335). On this view, citizens need to be assured that others are committed to justice in order to know that acting from their own sense of justice is not something to regret. Without this assurance, citizens might reasonably worry that acting justly conflicts too deeply with their narrow conception of the good, in which case society would not be stable and well-ordered in Rawls’s senses (see also Hadfield and Macedo 2012; Macedo 2010, Other Internet Resources).

The extent to which the idea of public reason does or can perform this social function depends on the answers to several further questions (Kogelman and Stich 2016; Lister 2017; Thrasher and Vallier 2015). For example, the potential of public reason to function as a mechanism of mutual assurance depends on how we interpret the duties that public reason imposes on ordinary citizens. How can ordinary citizens provide satisfactory assurance to one another that they are, in fact, sincerely committed to a conception of public reason? Is there an answer to this latter question that also meets the criterion of publicity, that is one where the specific duties of public reason are something each person can know, and where the conformity of each with those requirements can be common knowledge (for this construal of publicity, see Rawls 1999a, 48–49)? Some argue that while Rawls’s conception of public reason cannot serve as an effective assurance mechanism, convergence models of public reason can more successfully perform this role (Kogelman and Stich 2016). Others have argued that a form of public justification is necessary to facilitate sufficient trust amongst citizens in a diverse society (Vallier 2019).

8.5 Gender Justice

One topic that has recently received renewed attention in the literature on public reason concerns the extent to which the idea of public reason is compatible with a robust commitment to political principles of gender equality and gender justice. Skeptics have long worried that the aspiration to justify political principles to all reasonable persons would constrain the pursuit of gender justice. Many if not most of the largest religions in the world endorse inegalitarian ideals regarding the roles of men and women. If the constituency of public reason includes persons who endorse such religious doctrines, then it might seem strongly egalitarian principles of gender justice will not be publicly justifiable (Okin 1994; Okin 2004).

A number of scholars, however, have argued that more robust principles of gender justice can be derived from within the framework of liberal public reason (Baehr 2008; Chambers 2018, 48–55; Hartley and Watson 2010; Lloyd 1998; Neufeld and Van Schoelandt 2014; Schouten 2013; Schouten 2017; Schouten 2019; Watson and Hartley 2018). These arguments are developed in different ways, but they generally converge on the thesis that shared public political values provide a sufficient basis to publicly justify a range of policies designed to mitigate or eliminate gender-based inequalities.

8.6 Perspectival Diversity, Anti-Sectarianism, and Perfectionism

A different topic that has only recently begun to receive sustained attention concerns perspectival diversity. Theories of public reason are explicitly designed to address the fact of reasonable pluralism or disagreement, but the disagreement is often assumed to be only about normative or ethical matters. But persons’ diverse perspectives can also lead to disagreement regarding how to categorize or describe the world. Different parties to a dispute might all agree, for example, that gratuitous harm is wrong, but disagree about whether hate speech constitutes harm, or disagree about whether certain creatures are capable of suffering harm. Without a shared account of the world, it might seem the project of public reason faces grave difficulties. Even if certain moral or political rules can be publicly justified, our understanding and application of these rules might radically diverge given sufficient perspectival diversity regarding what the world looks like. Gerald Gaus and Ryan Muldoon confront this challenge for theories of public reason in recent work (Gaus 2016; Gaus 2017; Muldoon 2016). Both suggest that perspectival diversity is not necessarily an obstacle to be overcome, but can also deliver important epistemic benefits. But both also suggest existing accounts of public reason, which often emphasize the importance of persons or citizens sharing a common perspective, are ill-suited to realizing these benefits.

In a closely related vein some argue that, other things being equal, theories of public reason that include a wider diversity of viewpoints in the constituency of justification are preferable to those that include a narrower set of views in the justificatory constituency. This idea is sometimes referred to as anti-sectarianism, and it has been advanced as a desideratum that speaks in favor of convergence models of public reason and against at least some consensus models (Gaus 2012; Vallier 2017; Vallier and Muldoon 2021). But for criticism of anti-sectariarianism as a desideratum see (Quong 2012, 51–58; Tahzib 2021).

The debate over anti-sectarianism also bears on the question of whether, and to what extent, theories of public reason are compatible with perfectionism in political morality. Perfectionists hold that political power may legitimately be used by appeal to claims about the intrinsic or inherent value of certain activities of ways of life (Wall 2021). It has been widely assumed that perfectionism is incompatible with the idea of public reason since the constituency of persons to whom exercises of political power must be justified can be assumed to disagree in deep and permanent ways about matters of the good life. This widespread assumption has recently been challenged, however (Kim 2016; Tahzib 2019. Also see Chan 2000). These authors suggest that the constituency of justification can and should be idealized to incorporate certain ideas about the good life. Whether, and to what extent, this reconciliation of public reason and perfectionism is plausible depends in part on one’s views about anti-sectarianism as a desideratum.


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Thanks to Samuel Freeman, Andrew Lister, Micah Schwartzman, Rebecca Stone, and Jeremy Williams for comments and suggestions.

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