Notes to Publicity

1. See the citation for Kant 1795 in the Bibliography for a link to an online translation of Perpetual Peace. Here is a link to a translation of Appendix II, where one can look for the statement of the publicity test: Of the Harmony Which the Transcendental Concept of Public Right Establishes Between Morality and Politics. See also Davis 1991, 1992; Luban 1996.

2. Kant writes

Alle auf das Recht anderer Menschen bezogene Handlungen, deren Maxime sich nicht mit der Publizität verträgt, sind unrecht (1795 [1923: 381]).

The English translation here is from Luban (1996: 155). However, unless stated otherwise, the quotes below are taken from the online English translation noted in note 1 and cited in the Bibliography under Kant 1795.

This principle is distinct from another one not discussed here: “All maxims which stand in need of publicity in order not to fail their end, agree with politics and right combined” (1795 [1923: 386]).

3. Davis 1991: 410. On the connection between publicity and universalizability: Davis 1991; Luban 1996: 180–182.

4. Kant 1795 [1923: 381–382]). For an interpretation according to which passing the test constitutes both a necessary and sufficient condition of rightness: Davis 1991: 409/415–416.

5. For an argument to the effect that although the Kantian test does not necessarily require actual publicity, there are good reasons to think that Kant will value actual publicity whenever possible: Chambers 2004.

6. Kant claims that

Every legal claim must be capable of publicity. Since it is easy to judge whether it is so in a particular case, i.e., whether it can be compatible with the principles of the agent, this gives an easily applied criterion found a priori in reason, by which the falsity (opposition to law) of the pretended claim (preatensio iuris) can, as it were, be immediately known by an experiment of pure reason (1795 [1923: 381]).

The insistence on easiness does not seem compatible with a rich “post-deliberative acceptability/acceptance” test.

7. An interesting question in this respect is whether it is possible to enrich the content of the publicity test without jeopardizing at the same time its ability to serve as an independent test of maxims. See Luban 1996: 171.

8. E.g., “The only public capable of fulfilling the role as the standard to be used in the principle of publicity is the one of rational agents who demand nothing more than action which respects the right of humanity (…)” (Davis 1992: 180).

9. One question is whether we should expect such a reference to an ideal public to result in outcomes different from the reference to an (individual) ideal observer. In the same vein, Walzer (1989/90: 184) has questioned the importance of the idea of a hypothetical conversation, for once it is designed in an ideal way, it is not clear anymore why any conversation would still be needed.

10. Note that in the course of his discussion, Sidgwick (1874: 483–484) develops an interesting argument bridging the problem of lying and the one of vote secrecy to which we will return later.

11. See Sidgwick:

… there may be rules of social behaviour of which the general observance is necessary to the well-being of the community, while yet a certain amount of non-observance is rather advantageous than otherwise (1874: 484)


we must admit the case where the belief that the action in question will not be widely imitated is an essential qualification of the maxim which the Kantian principle is applied to test (1874: 485).

12. Sidgwick:

A universal refusal to propagate the human species would be the greatest of conceivable crimes from a Utilitarian point of view. (…). But Common Sense (in the present age at least) regards such preference [for celibacy] as within the limits of right conduct; because there is no fear that population will not be sufficiently kept up, as in fact the tendency to propagate is thought to exist rather in excess than otherwise (1874: 485).

13. For further developments on this “self-effacement” argument: Luban 1996: 165.

14. Kant: “Now we need to know the condition under which these maxims, agree with the law of nations, for we cannot infer conversely that the maxims which bear publicity are therefore just, since no one who has decidedly superior power needs to conceal his plans” (1795 [1923: 385]).

15.Phillippi v. CIA, 546 F. 2d 1009, 1011 (D.C. Cir. 1976) (referred to as the Glomar Explorer Case)

16. Compare Luban,

the idea that a policy of concealing public justifications for policies of secrecy might itself be publicly justifiable has no real-world plausibility at all. Such a policy amounts to permitting officials not merely to make secret decisions, but to conceal the very fact that they have awarded this permission to themselves. Decisions to keep secrets are therefore removed from oversight by publicly established mechanisms of checks and balances. It is hard to imagine why someone who approved of such a policy would accept the publicity principle in the first place (1996: 190–191).

The existence of a Glomar doctrine does not prevent however the existence of a public debate on the general grounds that would make a Glomar response legitimate.

17. “Singer asked why the bare fact that a maxim would be self-frustrating if it were publicized should count as a moral objection to it” (Luban 1996: 191, note 27). For related discussion, see Kogelmann 2021. 

18. Interestingly enough, the right to access (and publish) official documents held by the administration has been part of the Swedish Constitution since 1766 (Fundamental Act on the Freedom of the Press, art. 10). For a historical account of the French 18th century origins of open government: Ives 2003.

19. Among the rich sources on the matter, see Eagles, Taggart, and Liddell 1992. For an illustration of the way in which FoI can be used, see Dinges 2004 and Fuchs et al. 2004, in the Other Internet Resources section. For a European example, see Bourcier 2003.

20. For an argument against executive privilege, see Griffin 2003.

21. Another way to express this distinction consists for Mill (and others) in contrasting viewing the franchise as a right (that we could dispose of and sell for example) or as a trust (insofar as the franchise implies a power over others). See Mill (1861 [1991: 353–354]), e.g., at 354:

His vote is not a thing in which he has an option; it has no more to do with his personal wishes than the verdict of a juryman. It is strictly a matter of duty; he is bound to give it according to his best and most conscientious opinion of the public good;

and Park 1931: 76 and 82. For related distinctions, see Brennan and Pettit 1990: 313ff. (preference v. judgment ideals of voting behavior) and Elster 1986 (the market v. the forum).

22. On the distinction between representation of all v. representation of the majority only, see Mill 1861: VII.

23. Mill (1861 [1991: 359–360]) also discusses (and rejects) the objection according to which if non-electors are fit to influence electors, they ought necessarily to have the franchise.

24. This latter argument means that as the franchise extends, the case for publicity may weaken a little. Still, historically, the extension of the franchise also coincided with demands for shifting to secret ballots, as we shall see.

25. In The Spirit of Laws (II.2), Montesquieu (1748 [1973: 135]) argues in favor of open ballots for citizens (assuming that it is important to remain able to enlighten them) and secret ballots for members of the Senate in a democracy as well as for the nobles in an aristocracy (since then we only need to prevent intrigues).

Contrast Montesquieu’s position with James Mill’s opposite view (open ballots for representatives, secret ballots for citizens):

The member of parliament, who has an interest in abusing, for his own advantage, the powers of government entrusted to him, needs to be restrained. Restraint is found in the power of publicity. The electors, who have an interest in good representatives, need to be saved from the influence of men, who, if returned under that influence, would not be good. They can be saved by secrecy. (1830 [1992: 256])

26. In The Social Contract (IV.4), Rousseau (1761 [1964: 452–453]) argues in favor of secret ballots to prevent vote buying. He also disagrees with Cicero’s analysis insofar as the latter claims that this factor was key in leading to the end of the Republic.

27. Tocqueville 1835 [1988: 210–232]; testimony of June 22, 1835 to the Select Committee of the English House of Commons on Bribery at Elections, containing a rich discussion on the practical arrangements in place to guarantee vote secrecy in France, including an interesting issue: whether such arrangements not only allow the voter to keep his vote secret, but also whether they should prevent him to make it public. Tockqueville (1853 [2003: 1076–1077]); Letter to William Rathbone Greg from July 27, 1853 in which he discusses the ballot’s ability to effectively guarantee secrecy, depending on the size of the electoral circumscription.

28. For a fascinating historical account of the English 19th century debates on whether secret ballots should be introduced (which even led, e.g., to the formation of the Ballot Society in 1853), see Park 1931. For further discussion of Mill’s view, see McCabe 2021: 213–218. 

29. Note that ballot at that time meant “secret ballot”.

30. Brennan and Pettit: “if the vote is unveiled the desire for social acceptance will play a larger role in your decision as to how to vote; and in a pluralistic society the surest way of winning social acceptance will be to vote in a way that you can discursively support” (1990: 326). For further discussion, see Vandamme 2018. 

31. Park 1931: 75–76, 82; discussing the view of George J. Holyoake who defended the secret ballot against J. S. Mill, arguing that how, for whom and why people vote is not their neighbor’s business since each of us has an equal right to vote. See as well supra note 21 (Mill on trust/right).

32. Mill 1830 [1992: 237]. Other occurrences of the idea of trust can be found at pages 229 and 235.

33. Mill: “Not only is there no degradation in secret voting, but it saves from all the degradation inseparable from prostitute voting” (1830 [1992: 248]). For a broader discussion of Mill the Father’s views: Stimson and Milgate 1993, especially 902–903. For empirical discussion: Mueller, Gerber, and Schaub 2021. 

34. To illustrate the distinction, Bentham adds about friendship:

If this motive lead me to serve my friend at the expense of my own interest, it is social and tutelary: if it lead me to serve him at the expense of the general good, the same motive becomes anti-social and seductive. (1843: 145)

Bentham also writes:

Publicity is the only means of subjecting the voters to the tribunal of public opinion, and of holding them to their duty by the restraint of honour. (1843, 144, our italics)

See as well James’s interestingly complex account of Bentham’s view on voting and the public interest:

Removed by secrecy from corruptive influence, the elector would be free to vote in accordance with what Bentham called his “genuine” or “non-spurious” will, as opposed to acting as the mere instrument of another’s will. His inclination would be, of course, to vote in such a way as to promote his particular interest most effectively. Yet any candidate for election who promised to promote the particular interest of any elector would be certain to lose. To stand any chance of being elected, each candidate would have to promise to support the common interests of the electors, i.e., the public interest. The elector would therefore calculate that his interest would be best served if he voted for the candidate who seemed likely to promote the public interest most effectively. The secret ballot was, then, a means of neutralizing the normal predominance of the individual’s particular interest over his share of the public interest and of ensuring that he would vote to promote the latter. (James 1981: 55)

Contrast this with the views of Brennan and Pettit (1990: 314); claiming that Bentham and Mill the Father are representatives of what they refer to as the preference view on the ideal of voting.

35. For an interesting discussion—based in part on contemporary empirical evidence—of the advantages and disadvantages of open and secret vote, see Brennan and Pettit 1990: 324ff.

36. See as well note 25 supra (Montesquieu’s position).

37. Thanks to D. Naurin for attracting our attention on this point.

38. For empirical evidence that, in the case of public opinion surveys, interviews with secret ballots may significantly reduce the percentage of “undecided” voters—suggesting reluctance among some of them to uncover their choice: Benson 1941.

39. See for a different view on this: Brennan and Pettit 1990: 331–332; arguing that “there might be an independent tribunal established for determining when and where secrecy should be ensured” and that

the sort of intimidating government envisaged in the objection would scarcely be inhibited in any case by a secret vote. It would already be in a position to gerrymander electorates, stuff ballot boxes and, in the last resort, dismantle the apparatus of democracy.

40. For an interesting distinction between the “additively” and the “multiplicatively” valuable nature of discussion: Fearon 1998: 50. Notice however that publicity of deliberation might both increase and reduce the range of arguments tested in discussion. For reduction comes from the fact that some more particularistic arguments may not be accepted as part of public discussion, hence be excluded from it. On the reduction of the range of arguments: see § 2.2.2 (research by Meade and Stasavage 2008) and § 3.1 (idea of public reason).

41. See as well Fearon (1998: 59) for a presentation of a related Millian view.

42. See as well: “The best side of their character is that which people are anxious to show, even to those who are no better than themselves” (1861 [1991: 362]).

43. For a critical account: Kuran 1997.

44. Elster 1998a: 101–102; idea of “formal impartiality”.

45. On this, see Chambers 2004 note 6. For a distinction between selfishness and particularism, see Chambers 2004. See as well Goodin 1992: 134–135; distinguishing an external pressure from an internalization mechanism on the speaker’s side.

46. Elster 1998a: 110. For a critical view: Naurin 2003: 24–26; claiming that publicity would generate both less bargaining and less arguing. For an interesting example: Goodin 1992: 133. For a discussion on the desirability of bargaining, see Chambers 2004: 21ff.

47. Luban claims that “Hypocritical action (…) cannot withstand the publicity principle: hypocrisy is the antithesis of publicity” (1996: 165). He may be right when it comes to assessing whether what one says conforms with what one does. What is at stake here however is whether what one says corresponds with what one believes, which will remain out of sight whenever our thoughts do not translate into observable behavior.

48. As pointed out by Naurin (2003: 33, note 5) there is some connection between this consistency norm and the public’s negative attitude towards hesitation.

49. See Festinger (1957), Higgins and Rholes (1978). Notice that this “saying is believing” type of mechanism is distinct from the one of “deciding to believe” present in the idea of Pascalian control of belief, to the extent that the latter derives from a voluntary decision (see, e.g., Elster 1979: 47ff.; B. Williams 1973 [1994: 136–151]). Compare this with Peirce’s “method of tenacy” (1877: §5) to fix beliefs. This time expressing one’s view may be used for the sake of remaining convinced by what one has been believing since the very beginning. Finally, on a connection with the issue of “political correctness”, Nagel writes:

To some extent it is possible to exercise collective power over people’s inner lives by controlling the conventions of expression, not by legal coercion but by social pressure (1998: 23).

50. Goodin 1992: 137. In fact, Elster would also agree with this view since he writes: “if all appeals to the public interest were hypocritical and were known to be so, they could not persuade anyone and nobody would bother to make them” (1998a: 104). This can be connected as well with our discussion above re. the importance of the uncertainty as to who is concerned with the public interest and who is not (§ 2.1.2).

51. See Naurin’s own discussion on this issue (2004: sect. 2.2).

52. Letter from James Madison to Thomas Jefferson, July 18, 1787, quoted in Stasavage 2004: 20 and in Elster 1998a: 109–110. See as well Alan Greenspan’s statements on the same matter quoted in Meade and Stasavage 2008: 703–705 and Chambers 2004.

53. For such a distinction, see Stasavage 2004: 28. On the former worry:

(…) open-door bargaining also encourages representatives to posture by adopting overly aggressive bargaining positions that increase risks of breakdown in negotiations (2004: 30).

See as well Naurin who stresses that “negotiators can use publicity to tie themselves to a position, in order to pressure their opponent to yield” (2004: sect. 2.2).

54. The idea of “frankness and candour” is interesting in that respect. It is widely referred to as one possible ground for denying access to documents in FoI regimes. My suspicion is that despite the ambiguity of the word “frankness”, it refers more to the need for a spontaneous discussion, than to the need for a sincere one. Sincerity may sometimes matter in the context of public deliberation (e.g., in order to be able to predict the likelihood of future courses of action on the basis of present declarations by politicians), but certainly not for exactly the same reasons and to the same extent as it does in private relationships. To put things differently, it may matter that deliberating parties truly engage in the discussion with the view of looking for a solution that would be reasonable to all parties or candidly represent the position of their department in the case of civil servants representing a State department (and in this sense there is some form of sincerity at play), without necessarily expecting that deliberating parties actually unveil what they personally think about the issue (and in this sense, there is no need for sincerity).

55. For an analysis of the importance of hesitation at the French Conseil d’Etat: Latour 2002: 104/161/202.

56. See, e.g., Stasavage 2004: 28 and Chambers 2004; distinction between exchanging ideas and delivering speeches.

57. One of the practices that secrecy allows is “double language” (saying one thing during the secret deliberation, and the opposite to the general public). Whether double language in politics is necessarily unacceptable should be assessed on the basis of a normative theory of democracy. For evidence of secrecy allowing for double language in the European context: Stasavage 2004: 29.

58. The dissent problem can also take another form in which it is not the authority of one of the discussant, but rather the one of the group as a whole that is at stake. See Fearon (1998: 57),

For example, imagine a culture in which people feel tremendous shame, displeasure, and anger if they publicly advocate a position that is not in the end collectively chosen. In such a culture, public discussions would be a prescription for intense conflict.

Connect this as well with Sunstein’s views on group polarization, and especially with what he refers to as the social comparison mechanism, susceptible of operating even in the absence of publicity about what happens within a group: Sunstein 2002: 179.

59. On the distinction between Socratic and democratic effects, see Chambers 2004: 390–391.

60. Note that Bentham claims that “to take the opposite direction—that is to say, to proceed from secret voting to open voting—would be wrong. The natural order is to pass from the false, or what is suspected to be false, to the true” (1843 [1999: 148]).

61. Chambers (2004: 405f.) defends a two-tiered model involving a back and forth movement between, on the one hand, closed discussion that can be bargain-oriented (rather than a deliberation-oriented) but that due to an internal diversity of opinions will at least avoid the risk of relying on particularistic reasons, and on the other hand open public debate.

62. This inhibition on appealing to certain valid reasons is sometimes called anti-perfectionism. Anti-perfectionism is simply the denial of perfectionism, according to which “there is no fundamental principled inhibition on governments acting for any valid moral reason” (Raz 1989: 1230). See entry on perfectionism in moral and political philosophy.

63. This idea has a long historical pedigree, including within the work of Rousseau, whose “fundamental question” concerns whether it is possible to reconcile the importance of protecting a citizen’s freedom with the fact that his relationship to the state is both nonvoluntary and coercive, see Cohen 1986: 274–88.

64. On some interpretations of Rawls, political autonomy also requires self-governance. In this vein, Samuel Freeman claims that political autonomy also requires that

democratic citizens “legislate” principles for themselves, meaning that they should be able, as reasonable citizens, to understand liberal principles of justice as given to themselves by themselves in their capacity as free and equal citizens (2007a: 234).

65. Following Paula Casal, we might say that, whereas the idea of public reason is source-based, the idea of public rules is end-stage-based (2015: 820).

66. In fact, Rawls goes much further than this. He requires not only mutual knowledge of the principles of justice; he also requires mutual acceptance of those principle. In Rawls’s words, the success of the principles of must be consistent with the possibility that “everyone accepts and knows that the others accept the same principles of justice” (Rawls 1999a: 4). See also Kelly 2013: 4239. For objections, see de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2010.

67. Rawls criticizes the principle of utility on these grounds, see Rawls 1999a: 281–282.

68. This interpretation is controversial, with critics of the doctrine of public rules often favouring the individualised interpretation of this demand, whereby it requires widespread knowledge of the extent to which each citizen discharges her duties, see Lippert-Rasmussen 2008: 41–42; G. A. Cohen 2008: 347.

69. Indeed, many legal systems include duties of this kind. For example, best available technology (BAT) regulation requires firms to make a good faith effort to use the available technology that releases the fewest pollutants.

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