Collapse Theories
Quantum mechanics, with its revolutionary implications, has posed innumerable problems to philosophers of science. In particular, it has suggested reconsidering basic concepts such as the existence of a world that is, at least to some extent, independent of the observer, the possibility of getting reliable and objective knowledge about it, and the possibility of taking (under appropriate circumstances) at least some properties to be objectively possessed by physical systems. It has also raised many others questions which are well known to those involved in the debate on the interpretation of this pillar of modern science. One can argue that most of the problems are not only due to the intrinsic revolutionary nature of the phenomena which have led to the development of the theory. They are also related to the fact that, in its standard formulation and interpretation, quantum mechanics is a theory which is excellent (in fact it has an unprecedented success in the history of science) in telling us everything about what we observe, but it meets with serious difficulties in telling us what there is. We are making here specific reference to the central problem of the theory, usually referred to as the measurement problem, which is accompanying quantum theory since its birth. It is just one of the many attempts to overcome the difficulties posed by this problem that has led to the development of Collapse Theories, i.e., to the Dynamical Reduction Program (DRP). As we shall see, this approach consists in accepting that the dynamical equation of the standard theory should be modified by the addition of stochastic and nonlinear terms. The nice fact is that the resulting theory is capable, on the basis of a single dynamics which is assumed to govern all natural processes, to account at the same time for all wellestablished facts about microscopic systems as described by the standard theory, as well as for the socalled postulate of wave packet reduction (WPR), which accompanies the interaction of a microscopic system with a measuring device. As is well known, such a postulate is assumed in the standard scheme just in order to guarantee that measurements have outcomes but, as we shall discuss below, it meets with insurmountable difficulties if one tries to derive it by assuming the measurement itself to be a process governed by the linear laws of the theory. Finally, the collapse theories account in a completely satisfactory way for the classical behavior of macroscopic systems.
Two specifications are necessary in order to make clear from the beginning what the limitations and the merits of the program are. The only satisfactory explicit models of this type (the model proposed by Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber (1986), usually referred to as the GRW theory, as well as all subsequent developments) are phenomenological attempts to solve a foundational problem. At present, they involve phenomenological parameters which, if the theory is taken seriously, acquire the status of new constants of nature. Moreover, the problem of building satisfactory relativistic generalizations of collapse models is very difficult, though some improvements have been made, which have elucidated some crucial points.
In spite of their phenomenological character, Collapse Theories are assuming a growing relevance, since they provide a clear resolution for the difficulties of the formalism, to close the circle in the precise sense defined by Abner Shimony (1989). Moreover, they have allowed a clear identification of the formal features which should characterize any unified theory of micro and macro processes.
Last but not least, Collapse Theories qualify themselves as rival theories of quantum mechanics and one can easily identify some of their physical implications which, in principle, would allow crucial tests discriminating between the two. Getting stringent indications from such tests requires experiments, whose technology has been developed only very recently. Actually, it is just due to remarkable improvements in the field of optomechanics and cold atoms, as well as nuclear physics, that specific bounds have already been obtained for the parameters characterizing the theories under investigation; more important, precise families of physical processes in which a violation of the linear nature of the standard formalism might emerge have been clearly identified and are the subject of systematic investigations which might lead, in the end, to relevant discoveries.
 1. General Considerations
 2. The Formalism: A Concise Sketch
 3. The MacroObjectification Problem
 4. The Birth of Collapse Theories
 5. The Original Collapse Model
 6. The Continuous Spontaneous Localization Model (CSL)
 7. CSL and Experiments
 8. Some Remarks about Collapse Theories
 9. Relativistic Dynamical Reduction Models
 10. Collapse Theories and Definite Perceptions
 11. The Interpretation of the Theory and its Primitive Ontologies
 12. The Problem of the Tails of the Wave Function
 13. The Status of Collapse Models and Recent Positions about them
 14. Summary
 Bibliography
 Academic Tools
 Other Internet Resources
 Related Entries
1. General Considerations
A very natural question, which all scientists who are concerned about the meaning and the value of science have to face, is whether one can develop a coherent worldview that can accommodate our knowledge of natural phenomena as it is embodied in our best theories. Such a program meets serious difficulties with quantum mechanics, essentially because of two formal aspects of the theory according to its standard formulation, which are common to all of its versions, from the original nonrelativistic formulations of the 1920s, to current quantum field theories: the linear nature of the state space and of the evolution equation; in other words: the validity of the superposition principle and the related phenomenon of entanglement, which, in Schrödinger’s words:
is not one but the characteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought (Schrödinger 1935: 807).
These two formal features have embarrassing consequences, since they imply
 objective indefiniteness of physical properties both at the micro and macro level, unless the state collapses;
 objective chance in natural processes, i.e., the nonepistemic nature of quantum probabilities; and
 objective entanglement between spatially separated and noninteracting constituents of a composite system, entailing a sort of holism and a precise kind of nonlocality.
For the sake of generality, we shall first of all present a very concise sketch of ‘the rules of the quantum game’.
2. The Formalism: A Concise Sketch
Let us recall the axiomatic structure of quantum theory:

States of physical systems are associated with normalized vectors in a Hilbert space, a complex, infinitedimensional, complete and separable linear vector space equipped with a scalar product. Linearity implies that the superposition principle holds: if \(\ket{f}\) is a state and \(\ket{g}\) is a state, then (for \(a\) and \(b\) arbitrary complex numbers) also
\[ \ket{K} = a\ket{f} + b\ket{g} \]is a state. Moreover, the state evolution is linear, i.e., it preserves superpositions: if \(\ket{f,t}\) and \(\ket{g,t}\) are the states obtained by evolving the states \(\ket{f,0}\) and \(\ket{g,0}\), respectively, from the initial time \(t=0\) to the time \(t\), then \(a\ket{f,t} + b\ket{g,t}\) is the state obtained by the evolution of \(a\ket{f,0} + b\ket{g,0}\). Finally, the completeness assumption is made, i.e., that the knowledge of its statevector represents, in principle, the most accurate information one can have about the state of an individual physical system.

Observable quantities are represented by selfadjoint operators \(B\) on the Hilbert space containing the possible states of the system. The associated eigenvalue equations \(B\ket{b_k} = b_k \ket{b_k}\) and the corresponding eigenmanifolds (the linear manifolds spanned by the eigenvectors associated to a given eigenvalue, also called eigenspaces) play a basic role for the predictive content of the theory. In fact:
 The eigenvalues \(b_k\) of an operator \(B\) represent the only possible outcomes in a measurement of the corresponding observable.
 The square of the norm (i.e., the length) of the projection of the normalized statevector (i.e., of length 1) describing the state of the system onto the eigenmanifold associated to a given eigenvalue gives the probability of obtaining the corresponding eigenvalue as the outcome of the measurement of that observable. In particular, it is useful to recall that when one is interested in the probability of finding a particle at a given place, one has to resort to the socalled configuration space representation of the statevector. In such a case the statevector becomes a squareintegrable function of the position variables of the particles of the system, whose square modulus yields the probability density for the possible outcomes of position measurements.
We stress that, according to the above scheme, quantum mechanics makes only conditional probabilistic predictions (conditional on the measurement being actually performed) for the outcomes of prospective (and in general incompatible among themselves) measurement processes. Only if a state belongs to an eigenmanifold of the observable, which is going to be measured, already before the act of measurement, one can predict the outcome with certainty. In all other cases—if the completeness assumption is made—one has objective nonepistemic probabilities for different outcomes.
The orthodox position gives a very simple answer to the question: what determines the outcome, when different outcomes are possible? The answer is “nothing”—the theory is complete and therefore it is illegitimate to raise any question about properties possessed prior to a measurement, when different outcomes of a measurement of an observable have nonvanishing probabilities of occurring, if the measurement is actually performed. Correspondingly, the referents of the theory are only the results of measurements. These are to be described in classical terms and involve in general mutually exclusive physical conditions.
Regarding the legitimacy of attributing properties to physical systems, one could say that quantum mechanics warns us against attributing too many properties to physical systems. However—with Einstein—one can adopt a sufficient condition for the existence of an objective individual property the possibility to predict with certainty the outcome of a measurement. This implies that, whenever the overall statevector factorizes into the state of the Hilbert space of the physical system \(S\) times the state for the rest of the universe, \(S\) does possess some properties (actually a complete set of properties, i.e., those associated to appropriate maximal sets of commuting observables).
Before concluding this section some comments about the measurement process are of relevance. Quantum theory was created to describe the behavior of microscopic phenomena as was emerging from observations. In order to obtain information about system at the molecular and (sub) atomic scale, one must be able to establish strict correlations between the states of the microscopic system and the states of the measuring devices, which we directly perceive. Within the formalism, this is described by considering appropriate micromacro interactions. The fact that when the measurement is completed one can make statements about the outcome is accounted for by the already mentioned WPR postulate (Dirac 1935): a measurement always causes a system to jump in an eigenstate of the observed quantity. Correspondingly, also the statevector of the apparatus ‘jumps’ into the manifold associated to the recorded outcome.
3. The MacroObjectification Problem
We shall now clarify why the formalism we have just presented gives rise to the measurement problem. To this purpose we shall, first of all, discuss the standard oversimplified argument based on the socalled von Neumann ideal measurement scheme.
Let us begin by recalling how measurements are described in the standard formalism:
Suppose that a microsystem \(S\), immediately before the measurement of one of its observables, say \(B\), is in the eigenstate \(\ket{b_j}\) of the corresponding operator. The apparatus (a macrosystem) used to gain information about \(B\) is initially assumed to be in a precise macroscopic state, its ready state, corresponding to a definite macro property—e.g., its pointer points at 0 on a scale. Since the apparatus \(A\) is made of elementary particles, atoms and so on, it should be possible to describe it within quantum mechanics, which will associate a well defined state vector \(\ket{A_0}\) to it (at least in principle). One then assumes that there is an appropriate systemapparatus interaction lasting for a finite time, such that when the initial state of the apparatus is triggered by the state \(\ket{b_j}\), it ends up in a final configuration \(\ket{A_j}\), which is macroscopically distinguishable from the initial one and from the other configurations \(\ket{A_k}\) in which it would end up if triggered by a different eigenstate \(\ket{b_k}\). Moreover, for simplicity one assumes that the system is left by the measurement in its initial state. In brief, one assumes that one can dispose things in such a way that the systemapparatus interaction can be described as:
\[\begin{align} \tag{1} (\textit{initial state}){:}\ & \ket{b_k} \ket{A_0} \\ (\textit{final state}){:}\ & \ket{b_k} \ket{A_k} \end{align}\]Equation (1) and the hypothesis that the superposition principle governs all natural processes tell us that, if the initial state of the microsystem is a linear superposition of different eigenstates (for simplicity we will consider only two of them), one has:
\[\begin{align} \tag{2} (\textit{initial state}){:}\ & (a\ket{b_k} + b\ket{b_j})\ket{A_0 } \\ (\textit{final state}){:}\ & (a\ket{b_k} \ket{A_k} + b\ket{b_j} \ket{A_j}). \end{align}\]Some remarks about this are in order:
 Clearly, the above scheme is highly idealized, both because it takes for granted that one can prepare the apparatus in a precise state, which is impossible since we cannot have control over all its degrees of freedom, and because it assumes that the apparatus registers the outcome without altering the state of the measured system. However, as we shall discuss below, these assumptions are by no means essential to derive the embarrassing conclusion we have to face, i.e., that the final state is a linear superposition of two states corresponding to two macroscopically different states of the apparatus. Since we know that the + representing linear superpositions cannot be replaced by the logical alternative either … or, the measurement problem arises: what meaning can one attach to a state of affairs in which two macroscopically and perceptively different states occur simultaneously?
 As already mentioned, the standard solution to this problem is given by the WPR postulate: in a measurement process reduction occurs: the final state is not the one appearing in the second line of equation (2) but, since macroobjectification takes place, it is
Nowadays, there is a general consensus that this solution is absolutely unacceptable. It corresponds to assuming that the linear nature of the theory is broken at some point, without clearly specifying when. Thus, quantum theory is unable to explain how it can happen that apparatuses behave as required by the WPR postulate (which is one of the axioms of the theory), instead of satisfying the Schrödinger equation. Even if one were to accept that quantum mechanics has a limited field of applicability, so that it does not account for all natural processes and, in particular, it breaks down at the macrolevel, it is clear that the theory does not contain any precise criterion for identifying the borderline between micro and macro, linear and nonlinear, deterministic and stochastic, reversible and irreversible. To use the words of J.S. Bell, there is nothing in the theory fixing such a borderline and the split between the two above types of processes is fundamentally shifty.
If one looks at the historical debate on this problem, one can easily see that it is precisely by continuously resorting to this ambiguity about the split that adherents of the Copenhagen orthodoxy or easy solvers (Bell 1990) of the measurement problem have rejected the criticism of the heretics (Gottfried 2000). For instance, Bohr succeeded in rejecting Einstein’s criticisms at the Solvay Conferences by stressing that some macroscopic parts of the apparatus had to be treated fully quantum mechanically; von Neumann and Wigner displaced the split by locating it between the physical processes and the consciousness (but what is a conscious being, from the physical point of view?), and so on.
It is not our task to review here the various attempts to solve the above difficulties. One can find many exhaustive treatments of this problem in the literature. We conclude this section by discussing how the measurement problem is indeed a consequence of very general, in fact unavoidable, assumptions on the nature of measurements, and not specifically of the assumptions of von (oversimplified) von Neumann’s model. This was established in a series of theorems of increasing generality, notably the ones by Fine (1970), d’Espagnat (1971), Shimony (1974), Brown (1986) and Busch & Shimony (1996). Possibly the most general and direct proof is given by Bassi and Ghirardi (2000), whose results we briefly summarize. The assumptions of the theorem are:
 A microsystem can be prepared at least in two different eigenstates of an observable (for example the spin component along the zaxis) and in a superposition of two such states;
 One has a sufficiently reliable way of ‘measuring’ such an observable, meaning that when the measurement is triggered by each of the two above eigenstates, the process leads in the vast majority of cases to macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the universe. This requirement allows for cases in which the experimenter does not have perfect control of the apparatus, the apparatus is entangled with the rest of the universe, the apparatus makes mistakes, or the measured system is altered or even destroyed in the measurement process;
 All natural processes obey the linear laws of quantum theory.
From these very general assumptions one can show that, repeating the measurement on systems prepared in the superposition of the two given eigenstates, in the great majority of cases one ends up in a superposition of macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the whole universe. This, again, is the measurement problem of quantum mechanics, which calls for a resolution.
4. The Birth of Collapse Theories
The debate on the macroobjectification problem continued for many years after the early days of quantum mechanics. In the early 1950s an important step was taken by D. Bohm who presented (Bohm 1952) a mathematically precise deterministic completion of quantum mechanics (see the entry on Bohmian Mechanics), which was anticipated by de Broglie in the 1920s. In the area of Collapse Theories, one should mention the contribution by Bohm and Bub (1966), which was based on the interaction of the statevector with WienerSiegel hidden variables. But let us come to Collapse Theories in the sense currently attached to this expression.
Important investigations during the 1970s can be considered as preliminary steps for the subsequent developments. In the years 1970 the school of L. Fonda in Italy concerned with quantum decay processes and in particular with the possibility of deriving, within a quantum context, the exponential decay law (Fonda, Ghirardi, and Rimini 1978). Some features of this approach turned out to be relevant for the subsequent development of Collapse Theories:
 The focus is on individual physical systems, not ensembles;
 The statevector is supposed to undergo random processes at random times, inducing sudden changes, which drive it either within the linear manifold of the unstable state or within that of the decay products;
 To make the treatment quite general (the apparatus is insensitive of which kind of unstable system it is testing) one is led to identify the random processes with localization processes of the relative coordinates of the decay fragments. Such an assumption, combined with the peculiar resonant dynamics characterizing an unstable system, yields, completely in general, the desired result. The ‘relative position basis’ is the preferred basis of this theory;
 Analogous ideas have been applied to measurement processes;
 The final equation for the evolution at the ensemble level is of the quantum dynamical semigroup type and has a structure extremely similar to the final equation of the GRW theory.
Obviously, in these papers the considered reduction processes were not assumed to be ‘spontaneous and fundamental’ natural processes, but due to system environment interactions. Accordingly, these attempts did not represent original proposals for solving the macroobjectification problem, yet they have paved the way for the elaboration of the GRW theory.
Around the same years, P. Pearle (1976, 1979), and subsequently N. Gisin (1984a,b) and Diosi (1988), had developed models which accounted for the reduction process in terms of stochastic differential equations. While they were looking for a new dynamical equation offering a solution to the macroobjectification problem, they did not succeed in identifying the states to which the dynamical equation should lead. The these states were assumed to depend on the particular measurement process one was considering, leaving the program of formulating a universal dynamics accounting for the quantum properties of microscopic systems together the classical properties of macroscopic objects incomplete. In those years N. Gisin formulated subsequently an interesting argument (Gisin 1989) according to which nonlinear modifications of the Schrödinger equation in general are unacceptable, since they imply the possibility of sending superluminal signals. This argument eventually proved that only a very specific class of nonlinear (and stochastic) modifications of the Schrödinger equation is physically acceptable (Caiaffa, Smirne & Bassi 2017, and references therein), the class which collapse models belong to.
5. The Original Collapse Model
As already mentioned, the Collapse Theory we are going to describe amounts to accepting a modification of the standard evolution law of quantum theory such that microprocesses and macroprocesses are governed by a single dynamics. Such a dynamics must imply that the micromacro interaction in a measurement process leads to WPR. Bearing this in mind, recall that the characteristic feature distinguishing the quantum evolution from WPR is that, while Schrödinger’s equation is linear and deterministic (at the wave function level), WPR is nonlinear and stochastic. It is then natural to consider, as was suggested for the first time in the above quoted papers by P. Pearle, the possibility of nonlinear and stochastic modifications of the standard Schrödinger dynamics. Such modifications, to be universal, must satisfy one important requirement, called the trigger problem by Pearle (1989): the reduction mechanism must become more and more effective in going from the micro to the macro domain. The solution to this problem constitutes the central feature of Collapse Theories of the GRW type. To discuss these points, let us briefly review the GRW model, first consistent model to appear in the literature.
Within such a model, initially referred to as QMSL (Quantum Mechanics with Spontaneous Localizations), the problem of the choice of the preferred basis is solved by noting that the most embarrassing superpositions, at the macroscopic level, are those involving different spatial locations of macroscopic objects. Actually, as Einstein has stressed, this is a crucial point which has to be faced by anybody aiming at taking a macroobjective position about natural phenomena: ‘A macrobody must always have a quasisharply defined position in the objective description of reality’ (Born 1971: 223). Accordingly, QMSL considers the possibility of spontaneous processes, which are assumed to occur instantaneously and at the microscopic level, which tend to suppress the linear superpositions of differently localized states. The required trigger mechanism must then follow consistently.
The key assumption of QMSL is the following: each elementary constituent of any physical system is subjected, at random times, to random and spontaneous localization processes (which we will call hittings) around appropriate positions. To have a precise mathematical model one has to be very specific about the above assumptions, making explicit HOW the process works (which modifications of the wave function are induced by the localizations), WHERE it occurs (what determines the occurrence of a localization at a certain position rather than at another one), and finally WHEN (at what times), it occurs. The answers to these questions are now presented.
Let us consider a system of \(N\) distinguishable particles and let us denote by \(F(\boldsymbol{q}_1, \boldsymbol{q}_2 , \ldots ,\boldsymbol{q}_N )\) the coordinate representation (wave function) of the state vector (we disregard spin variables since hittings are assumed not to act on them).
 The answer to the question HOW is: if a hitting occurs for the
\(i\)th particle at point \(\boldsymbol{x}\), the wave function is
instantaneously multiplied by a Gaussian function (appropriately
normalized)
\[ G(\boldsymbol{q}_i, \boldsymbol{x}) = K
\exp[\{1/(2d^2)\}(\boldsymbol{q}_i \boldsymbol{x})^2], \]
where \(d\) represents the localization accuracy. Let us denote as
\[ L_i (\boldsymbol{q}_1, \boldsymbol{q}_2, \ldots, \boldsymbol{q}_N ; \boldsymbol{x}) = F(\boldsymbol{q}_1, \boldsymbol{q}_2, \ldots, \boldsymbol{q}_N) G(\boldsymbol{q}_i, \boldsymbol{x}) \]the wave function immediately after the localization, as yet unnormalized.
 As for WHERE the localization occurs, it is assumed that the probability density \(P(\boldsymbol{x})\) of its taking place at the point \(\boldsymbol{x}\) is given by the square of the norm of the state \(L_i\) (the length, or to be more precise, the integral of the modulus squared of the function \(L_i\) over the \(3N\)dimensional space). This implies that hittings occur with higher probability at those places where, in the standard quantum description, there is a higher probability of finding the particle if a measurement were performed (but remember that in our case there is no measurement being performed; hittings are spontaneous processes). Note that the above prescription introduces nonlinear and stochastic elements in the dynamics. The constant \(K\) appearing in the expression of \(G(\boldsymbol{q}_i, \boldsymbol{x})\) is chosen in such a way that the integral of \(P(\boldsymbol{x})\) over the whole space equals 1.
 Finally, the question WHEN is answered by assuming that the hittings occur at randomly distributed times, according to a Poisson distribution, with mean frequency \(f\).
It is straightforward to see that the hitting process leads, when it occurs, to the localization of states of the particle, which are initially delocalized over distances greater than \(d\). As a simple example we can consider a single particle whose wavefunction is different from zero only in two small and far apart regions \(h\) and \(t\). Suppose that a localization occurs around \(h\); the state after the hitting is then appreciably different from zero only in a region around \(h\) itself. A completely analogous argument holds if the hitting takes place around \(t\). Regarding the possibility for the state to collapse around points, which are far from both \(h\) and \(t\), one easily sees that the probability density for such hittings , according to the multiplication rule determining \(L_i\), is practically zero; moreover, that if such a hitting were to occur, after it is normalized, the wave function of the system would remain almost unchanged.
We can now discuss the most important feature of the theory: the Trigger Mechanism. To understand the way in which the spontaneous localization mechanism is enhanced by increasing the number of particles which are in far apart spatial regions (as compared to \(d)\), one can consider, for simplicity, the superposition \(\ket{S}\), with equal weights, of two macroscopic pointer states \(\ket{H}\) and \(\ket{T}\), corresponding to two different pointer positions \(H\) and \(T\), respectively. Taking into account that the pointer is ‘almost rigid’ and contains a macroscopic number \(N\) of microscopic constituents, the state can be written, in obvious notation, as:
\[\tag{4} \ket{S} = [\ket{1 \near h_1} \ldots \ket{N \near h_N} + \ket{1 \near t_1} \ldots \ket{N \near t_N}], \]where \(h_i\) is near \(H\), and \(t_i\) is near \(T\). The states appearing in first term on the righthand side of equation (4) are different from zero only when their arguments \((1,\ldots ,N)\) are all near \(H\), while those of the second term are different from zero only when they are all near \(T\). It is now evident that if any of the particles (say, the \(i\)th particle) undergoes a hitting process, for example around \(h_i\), the multiplication prescription leads practically to the suppression of the second term in (4). Thus, any spontaneous localization of any of the constituents amounts to a localization of the pointer. The hitting frequency is therefore effectively amplified proportionally to the number of constituents. Notice that, for simplicity, the argument refers to an almost rigid body, one for which all particles are around \(H\) in one of the states of the superposition and around \(T\) in the other state. It should however be obvious that what really matters in amplifying the reductions is the number of particles which are in different positions in the two states appearing in the superposition itself.
Under these premises we can now proceed to choose the parameters \(d\) and \(f\) of the theory, i.e., the localization accuracy and the mean localization frequency. The argument given above suggests how one can choose the parameters in such a way that the quantum predictions for microscopic systems remain fully valid while the embarrassing macroscopic superpositions in measurementlike situations are suppressed in very short times. Accordingly, as a consequence of the unified dynamics governing all physical processes, individual macroscopic objects acquire definite macroscopic properties. The choice suggested in the GRWmodel is:
\[\begin{align} \tag{5} f &= 10^{16} \text{ s}^{1} \\ d &= 10^{5} \text{ cm} \end{align}\]It follows that a microscopic system undergoes a localization, on average, every hundred million years, while a macroscopic one undergoes a localization every \(10^{7}\) seconds. With reference to the challenging version of the macroobjectification problem presented by Schrödinger with the famous example of his cat, J.S. Bell comments (1987: 44): [within QMSL] the cat is not both dead and alive for more than a split second. Besides the extremely low frequency of the hittings for microscopic systems, also the fact that the localization width is large compared to the dimensions of atoms (so that even when a localization occurs it does very little violence to the internal economy of an atom) plays an important role in guaranteeing that no violation of welltested quantum mechanical predictions is implied by the modified dynamics.
Contrary to standard quantum mechanics, the GRW theory allows to locate precisely the ‘split’ between micro and macro, reversible and irreversible, quantum and classical. This is another way of saying that GRW solved the measurement problem. The transition between the two types of ‘regimes’ is governed by the number of particles, which are localized by the collapse process. A consequence of this is that GRW makes predictions, which are different from standard quantum mechanical predictions. We will come back on this important issue.
Concerning the choice of the parameters of the model, it has to be stressed that, as it is obvious, the just mentioned transition region from micro to macro depends crucially on their values. departing from the original choice of GRW, Adler (2003) has suggested to increase the value of \(f\) by a factor of the order of \(10^9\). The reasons for this derive from requiring that during latent image formation in photography, the collapse becomes effective right after a grain of the emulsion has been excited; this is equivalent to requiring that when a human eye is hit by few photons (the perceptual threshold being very low) reduction takes place in the rods of the eye (Bassi, Deckert and Ferialdi 2010). As we will discuss in what follows, if one takes the original GRW value for \(f\), reduction cannot occur in the rods (because a relatively small number of molecules—less than \(10^5\)—are affected), but only during the transmission along the nervous signal within the brain, a process which involves the displacement of a number of ions of the order of \(10^{12}\).
It is interesting to remark that the drastic change suggested by Adler (2003) has physical implications which have already been experimentally falsified, see Curceanu, Hiesmayr, and Piscicchia 2015; Bassi, Deckert, and Ferialdi 2010; Vinante et al. 2016; and Toroš and Bassi 2018.
6. The Continuous Spontaneous Localization Model (CSL)
The model just presented (QMSL) has a serious drawback: it does not allow to deal with systems containing identical constituents, because it does not respect the symmetry or antisymmetry requirements for such particles. A quite natural idea to overcome this difficulty is to relate the hitting process not to the individual particles but to the particle number density averaged over an appropriate volume. This can be done by introducing a new phenomenological parameter in the theory which however can be eliminated by an appropriate limiting procedure (see below).
Another way to overcome this problem derives from injecting the physically appropriate principles of the GRW model within the original approach of P. Pearle. This line of thought has led to what is known as the CSL (Continuous Spontaneous Localization) model (Pearle 1989; Ghirardi, Pearle, and Rimini 1990) in which the discontinuous jumps which characterize QMSL are replaced by a continuous stochastic evolution in the Hilbert space (a sort of Brownian motion of the statevector).
The basic working principles are CSL are similar to those of the GRW model, though the technical detail might different significantly. For a review see (Bassi and Ghirardi 2003; Adler 2007, Bassi, Lochan, et al. 2013). At this regard, it is interesting to note (Ghirardi, Pearle, & Rimini 1990) that for any CSL dynamics there is a hitting dynamics which, from a physical point of view, is ‘as close to it as one wants’. Instead of entering into the details of the CSL formalism, it is useful, for the discussion below, to analyze a simplified version of it.
With the aim of understanding the physical implications of the CSL model, such as the rate of suppression of coherence, we make now some simplifying assumptions. First, we assume that we are dealing with only one kind of particles (e.g., the nucleons), secondly, we disregard the standard Schrödinger term in the evolution and, finally, we divide the whole space in cells of volume \(d^3\). We denote by \(\ket{n_1, n_2 ,\ldots}\) a Fock state in which there are \(n_i\) particles in cell \(i\), and we consider a superposition of two states \(\ket{n_1, n_2 , \ldots}\) and \(\ket{m_1, m_2 , \ldots}\) which differ in the occupation numbers of the various cells of the universe. With these assumptions it is quite easy to prove that the rate of suppression of the coherence between the two states (so that the final state is one of the two and not their superposition) is governed by the quantity:
\[\tag{6} \exp\{f [(n_1  m_1)^2 + (n_2  m_2)^2 +\ldots]t\}, \]all cells of the universe appearing in the sum within the square brackets in the exponent. Apart from differences relating to the identity of the constituents, the overall physics is quite similar to that implied by QMSL.
Equation 6 offers the opportunity of discussing the possibility of relating the suppression of coherence to gravitational effects. In fact, with reference to this equation we notice that the worst case scenario (from the point of view of the time necessary to suppress coherence) is that corresponding to the superposition of two states for which the occupation numbers of the individual cells differ only by one unit. In this case the amplifying effect of taking the square of the differences disappears. Let us then ask the question: how many nucleons (at worst) should occupy different cells, in order for the given superposition to be dynamically suppressed within the time which characterizes human perceptual processes? Since such a time is of the order of \(10^{2}\) sec and \(f = 10^{16}\text{ sec}^{1}\), the number of displaced nucleons must be of the order of \(10^{18}\), which corresponds, to a remarkable accuracy, to a Planck mass. This figure seems to point in the same direction as Penrose’s attempts to relate reduction mechanisms to quantum gravitational effects (Penrose 1989).
7. CSL and Experiments
By modifying the quantum dynamics, CSL like all collapse models makes predictions, which slightly differ from the standard quantum mechanical ones. We review the most important cases.
Effects in superconducting devices. A detailed analysis has been presented in (Ghirardi & Rimini 1990). As shown there and as follows from estimates about possible effects for superconducting devices (Rae 1990; Gallis and Fleming 1990; Rimini 1995), and for the excitation of atoms (Squires 1991), it turns out not to be possible, with present technology, to perform clearcut experiments allowing to discriminate the model from standard quantum mechanics.
Loss of coherence in diffraction experiments with macromolecules. The Viennese groups of A. Zeilinger first, and then of M. Arndt, have performed important diffraction experiments involving macromolecules. The most relevant ones involve C\(_{60}\), (720 nucleons) (Arndt et al. 1999), C\(_{70}\), (840 nucleons) (Hackermueller et al. 2004) and more complex molecules (over 10,000 nucleons, Eibenberger et al. 2013, Fein et al. 2019). So far these experiments are not capable of testing the proposal of Alder, therefore even less the weaker proposal of GRW, for the collapse rate (Toroš, Gasbarri, and Bassi 2017). Significant technological development is necessary in order to probe these values, possibly by realizing the experiment in outer space where coherences can be maintained for longer times (Kaltenbaek, Hechenblaikner, et al. 2012).
Loss of coherence in optomechanical interferometers. Recently, an interesting proposal of testing the superposition principle by resorting to an experimental setup involving a (mesoscopic) mirror has been advanced (Marshall et al. 2003). This stimulating proposal has led a group of scientists directly interested in Collapse Theories (Bassi, Ippoliti & Adler 2005; Adler, Bassi & Ippoliti 2005) to check whether the proposed experiment might be a crucial one for testing dynamical reduction models versus quantum mechanics. The problem is extremely subtle because the extension of the oscillations of the mirror is much smaller than the localization accuracy of GRW, so that the localizations processes become almost ineffective. However, quite recently a detailed reconsideration of the physics of such systems has been performed and it has allowed to draw the relevant conclusion that the proposal by Adler (2007) of changing the frequency of the GRW theory of a factor like the one he has considered is untenable.
Noninterferometric tests in optomechanical systems. In 2003, an interesting proposal of testing the superposition of a mesoscopic mirror was put forward (Marshall et al. 2003). This stimulating proposal faced strong technical difficulties, such as environmental decoherence, which prevents the detection of the superposition. There is, however, a side effect of collapse theories that can be exploited in such systems. Indeed, the collapse of the wavefunction leads to an effective noise on the center of mass of the system (Collett & Pearle 2003), which can be eventually bounded through experiments. The optomechanical application has been proposed (Bahrami, Paternostro, et al. 2014; Nimmrichter, et al. 2014; Diosi 2015) to test such an effect, and various experiments showed the potential of this technique. They range from nanomechanical cantilever cooled to millikelvin temperature (Vinante, Bahrami, et al. 2016; Vinante, Mezzena, et al. 2017) to the gravitational wave detectors LIGO, AURIGA and LISA Pathfinder (Carlesso, Bassi, et al. 2016; Helou et al. 2017) as well as optically or magnetically levitated systems at room temperature (Zheng et al. 2020; Pontin et al. 2019 [Other Internet Resources]). Recently, several proposals were presented to push even further the bounds on the collapse parameters, which now place constrains just below f = 10^{−8} sec^{−1} at d = 10^{−7} m. These proposals exploit different possible modification of current experiments, for example a multilayer structure of the test mass (Carlesso, Vinante, et al. 2018) would amplify the bound for particular values of d. One can also consider different degrees of freedom, for example the rotational ones could in principle be more sensitive to collapse effects (Carlesso, Paternostro, et al. 2018; Schrinski, Stickler, & Hornberger 2017). A first application was implemented in a torsional experiment (Komori et al. 2020).
Noninterferometric experiments with cold atoms. The recent advances in trapping, cooling and manipulating ensembles of atoms paved the way for testing collapse models with cold atoms. Similarly to optomechanical systems, bounds on the collapse parameters are derived by quantifying the Brownian noise induced by the collapse process. The focus is on the energy increase or the position diffusion. To make an example, if the atomic cloud can freely evolve, the energy will grow linearly with time, while the position spread goes with the cubic power. Experimental bounds were obtained from both variables and analyzed in Laloe, Muillin, and Pearle 2014 and Bilardello et al. 2016 respectively.
Spontaneous Xray emission from Germanium. Collapse models not only forbid macroscopic superpositions to be stable, they share several other features which are forbidden by the standard theory. One of these is the spontaneous emission of radiation from otherwise stable systems, like atoms. While the standard theory predicts that such systems—if not excited—do not emit radiation, collapse models allow for radiation to be produced, as a consequence of the interaction between the system and the noise responsible for the collapse. The emission rate has been computed for free charged particles (Fu 1997; Adler, Bassi, & Donadi 2013), an harmonic oscillator (Bassi & Donadi 2014; Donadi, Deckert, & Bassi 2014) and for hydrogenic atoms (Adler et al. 2007). A formula for the radiation emission from a generic system is given in (Donadi & Bassi 2014). The theoretical predictions are compatible with current experimental data (Fu 1997). At any rate, the importance of such experiments lies in the fact that—so far—they provide the strongest upper bounds on the collapse parameters (Adler & Bassi 2007). But this is not the whole story: very recently (Curceanu, Hiesmayr, & Piscicchia 2015; Curceanu, Bartalucci, et al. 2016; Piscicchia et al. 2017), following this line of research, it was proven experimentally that the proposal by Adler (2007) of a drastic change of the frequency of the localizations with respect to those of the original GRW paper is definitely incompatible with the experimental data, unless the CSL model is modified by taking a nonwhite noise (which is actually a reasonable assumption, if the noise is physical).
CSL and conscious perceptions. One interesting feature of CSL is that when conscious perceptions are involved, the collapse time of two brain states in a superposition and the time which is necessary for the emergence of a definite perception, are quite similar, and this has some (small but significant) implications concerning the probabilities of the outcomes. This point has been analyzed in detail and explicitly evaluated by resorting to a simple model of a quantum system subjected to reduction processes (Ghirardi & Romano 2014). The idea is to consider a spin 1/2 particle whose spin rotates around the xaxis with a frequency of about one hundreth of the one of the random measurements ascertaining whether its spin is UP or DOWN with respect to the zaxis. It turns out that for a superposition with amplitudes \(a\) and \(b\) of the two eigenstates of S\(_z\), the probability of the two supervening perceptions associated to the two outcomes will differ of about 1% from those predicted by quantum mechanics, i.e. \(\lvert a\rvert^2\) and \(\lvert b\rvert^2\), respectively.
The test would be quite interesting also for the general meaning of collapse theories because it will give some practical evidence concerning the fact that, in the case in which a superposition of two microscopic different states which are able to trigger two precise (and different) perceptions, the brain actually collapses the wavefunction yielding only one perception, an clearcut indication that the standard theory cannot run the whole process.
Summarizing, due to fast technological improvements, experiments in which one might test the deviations from Standard Quantum Theory implied by Collapse Models, seems to have become more and more feasible.
8. Some Remarks about Collapse Theories
A. Pais famously recalls in his biography of Einstein:
We often discussed his notions on objective reality. I recall that during one walk Einstein suddenly stopped, turned to me and asked whether I really believed that the moon exists only when I look at it. (Pais 1982: 5)
In the context of Einstein’s remarks in Albert Einstein, PhilosopherScientist (Schilpp 1949), we can regard this reference to the moon as an extreme example of ‘a fact that belongs entirely within the sphere of macroscopic concepts’, as is also a mark on a strip of paper that is used to register the outcome of a decay experiment, so that
as a consequence, there is hardly likely to be anyone who would be inclined to consider seriously […] that the existence of the location is essentially dependent upon the carrying out of an observation made on the registration strip. For, in the macroscopic sphere it simply is considered certain that one must adhere to the program of a realistic description in space and time; whereas in the sphere of microscopic situations one is more readily inclined to give up, or at least to modify, this program. (1949: 671)
However,
the ‘macroscopic’ and the ‘microscopic’ are so interrelated that it appears impracticable to give up this program in the ‘microscopic’ alone. (1949: 674)
One might speculate that Einstein would not have taken the DRP seriously, given that it is a fundamentally indeterministic program. On the other hand, the DRP allows precisely for this middle ground, between giving up a ‘classical description in space and time’ altogether (the moon is not there when nobody looks), and requiring that it be applicable also at the microscopic level (as within some kind of ‘hidden variables’ theory). It would seem that the pursuit of ‘realism’ for Einstein was more a program that had been very successful rather than an a priori commitment, and that in principle he would have accepted attempts requiring a radical change in our classical conceptions concerning microsystems, provided they would nevertheless allow to take a macrorealist position matching our definite perceptions at this scale.
In the DRP, we can say of an electron in an EPRBohm situation that ‘when nobody looks’, it has no definite spin in any direction , and in particular that when it is in a superposition of two states localised far away from each other, it cannot be thought to be at a definite place (see, however, the remarks in Section 11). In the macrorealm, however, objects do have definite positions and are generally describable in classical terms. That is, in spite of the fact that the DRP program is not adding ‘hidden variables’ to the theory, it implies that the moon is definitely there even if no sentient being looks at it. In the words of J. S. Bell, the DRP
allows electrons (in general microsystems) to enjoy the cloudiness of waves, while allowing tables and chairs, and ourselves, and black marks on photographs, to be rather definitely in one place rather than another, and to be described in classical terms. (Bell 1989a: 364)
Such a program, as we have seen, is implemented by assuming only the existence of wave functions, and by proposing a unified dynamics that governs both microscopic processes and ‘measurements’. With reference to the latter, no vague definitions are needed. The new dynamical equations govern the unfolding of any physical process, and the macroscopic ambiguities that would arise from the linear evolution are theoretically possible, but only of momentary duration, of no practical importance and no source of embarrassment.
We have not yet analyzed the implications about locality, but since in the DRP program no hidden variables are introduced, the situation can be no worse than in ordinary quantum mechanics: ‘by adding mathematical precision to the jumps in the wave function’, the GRW theory ‘simply makes precise the action at a distance of ordinary quantum mechanics’ (Bell 1987: 46). Indeed, a detailed investigation of the locality properties of the theory becomes possible as shown by Bell himself (Bell 1987: 47). Moreover, as it will become clear when we will discuss the interpretation of the theory in terms of mass density, the QMSL and CSL theories naturally account for the behaviour of macroscopic objects, corresponding to our definite perceptions about them, the main objective of Einstein’s requirements.
The achievements of the DRP which are relevant for the debate about the foundations of quantum mechanics can also be concisely summarized in the words of H.P. Stapp:
The collapse mechanisms so far proposed could, on the one hand, be viewed as ad hoc mutilations designed to force ontology to kneel to prejudice. On the other hand, these proposals show that one can certainly erect a coherent quantum ontology that generally conforms to ordinary ideas at the macroscopic level. (Stapp 1989: 157)
9. Relativistic Dynamical Reduction Models
As soon as the GRW proposal appeared and attracted the attention of J.S. Bell, it stimulated him to look at it from the point of view of relativity theory. As he stated subsequently:
When I saw this theory first, I thought that I could blow it out of the water, by showing that it was grossly in violation of Lorentz invariance. That’s connected with the problem of ‘quantum entanglement’, the EPR paradox. (Bell 1989b: 1)
Actually, he had already investigated this point by studying the effect on the theory of a transformation mimicking a nonrelativistic approximation of a Lorentz transformation and he arrived at a surprising conclusion:
… the model is as Lorentz invariant as it could be in its nonrelativistic version. It takes away the ground of my fear that any exact formulation of quantum mechanics must conflict with fundamental Lorentz invariance. (Bell 1987: 49)
What Bell had actually proved by resorting to a twotimes formulation of the Schrödinger equation is that the model violates locality by violating outcome independence and not, as deterministic hidden variable theories do, parameter independence.
Indeed, with reference to this point we recall that, as extensively discussed in the literature (Suppes & Zanotti 1976; van Fraassen 1982; Jarrett 1984; Shimony 1984; see also the entry on Bell’s Theorem), Bell’s locality assumption is equivalent to the conjunction of two other assumptions, viz., in Shimony’s terminology, parameter independence and outcome independence. In view of the experimental violation of Bell’s inequality, one has to give up either one or both these assumptions. The above splitting of the locality requirement into two logically independent conditions is particularly useful in discussing the different status of CSL and deterministic hidden variable theories with respect to relativistic requirements. Actually, as proved by Jarrett himself, when parameter independence is violated, if one had access to the variables which specify completely the state of individual physical systems, one could send fasterthanlight signals from one wing of the apparatus to the other. Moreover, in Ghirardi and Grassi (1996) it has been proved that it is impossible to build a genuinely relativistically invariant theory which, in its nonrelativistic limit, exhibits parameter dependence. Here we use the term genuinely invariant to denote a theory for which there is no (hidden) preferred reference frame. On the other hand, if locality is violated only by the occurrence of outcome dependence then fasterthanlight signaling cannot be achieved (Eberhard 1978; Ghirardi, Rimini, & Weber 1980). Few years after the just mentioned proof by Bell, it has been shown in complete generality (Ghirardi, Grassi, Butterfield, & Fleming 1993) that the GRW and CSL theories, just as standard quantum mechanics, exhibit only outcome dependence. This is to some extent encouraging and shows that there are no reasons of principle making unviable the project of building a relativistically invariant DRM.
Let us be more specific about this crucial problem. P. Pearle was the first to propose (Pearle 1990) a relativistic generalization of CSL to a quantum field theory describing a fermion field coupled to a meson scalar field enriched with the introduction of stochastic and nonlinear terms. A quite detailed discussion of this proposal was presented in (Ghirardi, Grassi & Pearle 1990) where it was shown that the theory enjoys of all properties which are necessary in order to meet the relativistic constraints. Pearle’s approach requires the precise formulation of the idea of stochastic Lorentz invariance.
In this model, one considers a fermion field coupled to a meson field and puts forward the idea of inducing localizations for the fermions through their coupling to the mesons with a stochastic dynamical reduction mechanism acting on the meson variables. In practice, working in the interaction picture, one considers the standard Heisenberg evolution equations for the two coupled fields and a TomonagaSchwinger CSLtype evolution equation with a skewhermitian coupling to a cnumber stochastic potential for the state vector. This approach has been systematically investigated by Ghirardi, Grassi, and Pearle (1990), to which we refer the reader for a detailed discussion. Here we stress that, under specific approximations, one obtains in the nonrelativistic limit a CSLtype equation inducing spatial localization. However, due to the white noise nature of the stochastic potential, novel renormalization problems arise: the increase per unit time and per unit volume of the energy of the meson field is infinite due to the fact that infinitely many mesons are created. This point has also been lucidly discussed by Bell (1989c [2007]) in the talk he delivered at Trieste on the occasion of the 25th anniversary of the International Centre for Theoretical Physics. This talk appeared under the title The Trieste Lecture of John Stewart Bell. For these reasons one cannot consider this as a satisfactory example of a relativistic reduction model.
In the years following the just mentioned attempts there has been a flourishing of researches aimed at getting the desired result. Let us briefly comment on them. As already mentioned, the source of the divergences is the assumption of point interactions between the quantum field operators in the dynamical equation for the statevector, or, equivalently, the white character of the stochastic noise. Having this aspect in mind, P. Pearle (1989), L. Diosi (1990) and A. Bassi and G.C. Ghirardi (2002) reconsidered the problem from the beginning by investigating nonrelativistic theories with nonwhite Gaussian noises. The problem turns out to be very difficult from the mathematical point of view, but steps forward have been made. In recent years, a precise formulation of the nonwhite generalization (Bassi & Ferialdi 2009a and 2009b) of the socalled QMUPL model, which represents a simplified version of GRW and CSL, has been proposed. Moreover, a perturbative approach for the CSL model has been worked out (Adler & Bassi 2007, 2008). Further work is necessary. This line of thought is very interesting at the nonrelativistic level; however, it is not yet clear whether it will lead to a real step forward in the development of relativistic theories of spontaneous collapse.
In the same spirit, Nicrosini and Rimini (2003) tried to smear out the point interactions without success because, in their approach, a preferred reference frame had to be chosen in order to circumvent the nonintegrability of the TomonagaSchwinger equation
Other interesting and different approaches have been suggested. Among them we mention the one by Dove and Squires (1996) based on discrete rather than continuous stochastic processes and those by Dowker and Herbauts (2004) and Dawker and Henson (2004) formulated on a discrete spacetime.
Precisely in the same years similar attempts to formulate a relativistic generalization of Bohmian Mechanics were ongoing, encountering difficulties. Relevant steps are represented by a paper (Dürr 1999) resorting to a preferred spacetime slicing, by the investigations of Goldstein and Tumulka (2003) and by other scientists (Berndl et al. 1996). However, we must acknowledge that no one of these attempts has led to a fully satisfactory solution of the problem of having a theory without observers, like Bohmian mechanics, which is perfectly satisfactory from the relativistic point of view, precisely due to the fact that they are not genuinely Lorentz invariant in the sense we have made precise before. Mention should be made also of the attempt by Horton and Dewdney (2001) to build a relativistically invariant model based on particle trajectories.
Let us come back to the relativistic DRP. Some important changes have occurred quite recently. Tumulka (2006a) succeeded in proposing a relativistic version of the GRW theory for N noninteracting distinguishable particles, based on the consideration of a multitime wavefunction whose evolution is governed by Dirac like equations and adopts as its Primitive Ontology (see the next section) the one which attaches a primary role to the space and time points at which spontaneous localizations occur, as originally suggested by Bell (1987). To our knowledge this represents the first proposal of a relativistic dynamical reduction mechanism, which satisfies all relativistic requirements. In particular it is free from divergences and foliation independent. However, it is formulated only for systems containing a fixed number of noninteracting fermions.
D. Bedingham (2011) following strictly the original proposal by Pearle (1990) of a quantum field theory inducing reductions based on a Tomonaga Schwinger equation, has worked out an analogous model which, however, overcomes the difficulties of the original model. In fact, Bedingham has circumvented the crucial problems arising from point interactions by (paying the price of) introducing, besides the fields characterizing the Quantum Field Theories he is interested in, an auxiliary relativistic field that amounts to a smearing of the interactions whilst preserving Lorentz invariance and frame independence. Adopting this point of view and taking advantage also of the proposal by Ghirardi (2000) concerning the appropriate way to define objective properties at any spacetime point \(x\), he has been able to work out a fully satisfactory and consistent relativistic scheme for quantum field theories in which reduction processes may occur.
Taking once more advantage of the ideas of the paper by Ghirardi (2000), various of the just quoted authors (Bedingham, Duerr, Ghirardi, et al. 2014), have been able to prove that it is possible to work out a relativistic generalization of Collapse models when their primitive ontology is taken to be the one given by the mass density interpretation for the nonrelativistic case we will present in what follows.
In view of these results and taking into account the interesting investigations concerning relativistic Bohmianlike theories,the conclusions that Tumulka has drawn concerning the status of attempts to account for the macroobjectification process from a relativistic perspective are wellfounded:
A somewhat surprising feature of the present situation is that we seem to arrive at the following alternative: Bohmian mechanics shows that one can explain quantum mechanics, exactly and completely, if one is willing to pay with using a preferred slicing of spacetime; our model suggests that one should be able to avoid a preferred slicing of spacetime if one is willing to pay with a certain deviation from quantum mechanics, (Tumulka 2006a: 842)
a conclusion that he has rephrased and reinforced in Tumulka (2006c: 350):
Thus, with the presently available models we have the alternative: either the conventional understanding of relativity is not right, or quantum mechanics is not exact.
Very recently, a thorough and illuminating discussion of the important approach by Tumulka has been presented by Tim Maudlin (2011) in the third revised edition of his book Quantum NonLocality and Relativity. Tumulka’s position is perfectly consistent with the present ideas concerning the attempts to transform relativistic standard quantum mechanics into an ‘exact’ theory in the sense which has been made precise by J. Bell. Since the only unified, mathematically precise and formally consistent formulations of the quantum description of natural processes are Bohmian mechanics and GRWlike theories, if one chooses the first alternative one has to accept the existence of a preferred reference frame, while in the second case one is not led to such a drastic change of position with respect to relativistic concepts but must accept that the ensuing theory disagrees with the predictions of quantum mechanics and acquires the status of a rival theory with respect to it.
In spite of the fact that the situation is, to some extent, still open and requires further investigations, it has to be recognized that the efforts which have been spent on such a program have made a better understanding of some crucial points possible and have thrown light on some important conceptual issues. First, they have led to a completely general and rigorous formulation of the concept of stochastic invariance. Second, they have prompted a critical reconsideration, based on the discussion of smeared observables with compact support, of the problem of locality at the individual level. This analysis has brought out the necessity of reconsidering the criteria for the attribution of objective local properties to physical systems. In specific situations, one cannot attribute any local property to a microsystem: any attempt to do so gives rise to ambiguities. However, when dealing with macroscopic systems, the impossibility of attributing to them local properties (or, equivalently, the ambiguity associated to such properties) lasts only for time intervals necessary for the dynamical reduction to take place. Moreover, no objective property corresponding to a local observable, even for microsystems, can emerge as a consequence of a measurementlike event occurring in a spacelike separated region: such properties emerge only in the future light cone of the considered macroscopic event. Finally, recent investigations (Ghirardi & Grassi 1996; Ghirardi 2000) have shown that the very formal structure of the theory is such that it does not allow, even conceptually, to establish causeeffect relations between spacelike events.
The conclusion of this section, is that the question of whether a relativistic dynamical reduction program can find a satisfactory formulation seems to admit a positive answer.
Connected to collapses and relativity, a paper by Conway and Kochen (2006a, 2006b [Other Internet Resources]) is of relevance. The first and most important aim of the paper is the derivation of what the authors have called The Free Will Theorem, putting forward the provocative idea that if human beings are free to make their choices about the measurements they will perform on one of a pair of faraway entangled particles, then one must admit that also the elementary particles involved in the experiment have free will. A detailed discussion of what the Free Will theorem implies would be needed; for us here the relevant fact is that the authors claim that their theorem implies, as a byproduct, the impossibility of elaborating a relativistically invariant dynamical reduction model. A lively debate has arisen. At the end, Goldstein et al. (2010) have made clear why the argument of Conway and Kochen is not pertinent. We may conclude that nothing in principle forbids a perfectly satisfactory relativistic generalization of the GRW theory, and, actually, as repeatedly stressed, there are many elements which indicate that this is actually feasible.
10. Collapse Theories and Definite Perceptions
Some authors (Albert & Vaidman 1989; Albert 1990, 1992) have raised an interesting objection concerning the emergence of definite perceptions within Collapse Theories. The objection is based on the fact that one can easily imagine situations leading to definite perceptions, that nevertheless do not involve the displacement of a large number of particles up to the stage of the perception itself. These cases would then constitute actual measurement situations which cannot be described by the GRW theory, contrary to what happens for the idealized (according to the authors) situations considered in many presentations of it, i.e., those involving the displacement of some sort of pointer. To be more specific, the above papers consider a ‘measurementlike’ process whose output is the emission of a burst of few photons triggered by the position in which a particle hits a screen. This can easily be devised by considering, e.g., a SternGerlach setup in which a spin 1/2 microsystem, according to the value of its spin component, hits a fluorescent screen in different places and excites a small number of atoms which subsequently decay, emitting a small number of photons.
The argument goes as follows: if one triggers the apparatus with a superposition of two spin states, since only a few atoms are excited, since the excitations involve displacements which are smaller than the characteristic localization distance of GRW, since GRW does not induce reductions on photon states and, finally, since the photon states immediately overlap, there is no way for the spontaneous localization mechanism to become effective in suppressing the ensuing superposition of the states ‘photons emerging from point \(A\) of the screen’ and ‘photons emerging from point \(B\) of the screen’. On the other hand, since the visual perception threshold is quite low (about 6–7 photons), there is no doubt that the naked eye of a human observer is sufficient to detect whether the luminous spot on the screen is at \(A\) or at \(B\). The conclusion follows: in the case under consideration no dynamical reduction can take place and as a consequence no measurement is over, no outcome is definite, up to the moment in which a conscious observer perceives the spot.
Aicardi et al. (1991) have presented a detailed answer to this criticism: it is agreed that in the considered case the superposition persists for long times (actually the superposition must persist since, being the system under consideration microscopic, one could perform interference experiments which everybody would expect to confirm quantum mechanics). However, to deal in the appropriate and correct way with such a criticism, one has to consider all the systems which enter into play (electron, screen, photons and brain) and the universal dynamics governing all relevant physical processes. A simple estimate of the number of ions which are involved in the transmission of the nervous signal up to the higher virtual cortex makes perfectly plausible that, in the process, a sufficient number of particles are displaced by a sufficient spatial amount to satisfy the conditions under which, according to the GRW theory, the suppression of the superposition of the two nervous signals will take place within the time scale of the perception.
This analysis by no means amounts to attributing a special role to the conscious observer or to the perception process. The observer’s brain is the only system present in the setup in which a superposition of two states involving different locations of a large number of particles occurs. As such it is the only place where the reduction can and actually must take place according to the theory. It is extremely important to stress that if in place of the eye of a human being one puts in front of the photons’ beam a spark chamber or a device leading to the displacement of a macroscopic pointer, or producing ink spots on a computer output, reduction will equally take place. In the given example, the human nervous system is simply a physical system, a specific assembly of particles, which performs the same function as any other device, if no other such device interacts with the photons before the human observer does. It follows that it is incorrect and seriously misleading to claim that the GRW theory requires a conscious observer in order for measurements to have a definite outcome.
A further remark may be appropriate. The above analysis could be taken by the reader as indicating a very naive and oversimplified attitude towards the deep problem of the mindbrain correspondence. There is no claim and no presumption that GRW allows a physicalist explanation of conscious perception. It is only pointed out that, based on what we know about the purely physical aspects of the process, one can state that before the nervous pulses reach the higher visual cortex, the conditions guaranteeing the suppression of one of the two signals are verified. In brief, a consistent use of the dynamical reduction mechanism in the above situation accounts for the definiteness of the conscious perception, even in the extremely peculiar situation devised by Albert and Vaidman.
11. The Interpretation of the Theory and its Primitive Ontologies
As stressed in the opening sentences of this contribution, the most serious problem of standard quantum mechanics lies in its being extremely successful in telling us about what we observe, but being basically silent on what there is. This specific feature is closely related to the probabilistic interpretation of the statevector, combined with the completeness assumption of the theory. Notice that what is under discussion is the probabilistic interpretation, not the probabilistic character, of the theory. Also collapse theories have a fundamentally stochastic character but, due to their most specific feature, i.e., that of driving the statevector of any individual physical system into appropriate and physically meaningful manifolds, they allow for a different interpretation. One could even say (if one wants to avoid that they too, as the standard theory, speak only of what we find) that they require a different interpretation, one that accounts for our perceptions at the appropriate, i.e., macroscopic, level.
We must admit that this opinion is not universally shared. According to various authors, the ‘rules of the game’ embodied in the precise formulation of the GRW and CSL theories represent all there is to say about them. However, this cannot be the whole story: stricter and more precise requirements than the purely formal ones must be imposed for a theory to be taken seriously as a fundamental description of natural processes (an opinion shared by J. Bell). This request of going beyond the purely formal aspects of a theoretical scheme has been denoted as (the necessity of specifying) the Primitive Ontology (PO) of the theory in an extremely interesting paper (Allori, et al. 2008). The fundamental requisite of the PO is that it should make absolutely precise what the theory is fundamentally about.
This is not a new problem; as already mentioned it has been raised by J. Bell since his first presentation of the GRW theory. Let me summarize the terms of the debate. Given that the wavefunction of a manyparticle system lives in a (highdimensional) configuration space, which is not endowed with a direct physical meaning connected to our experience of the world around us, Bell wanted to identify the ‘local beables’ of the theory, the quantities on which one could base a description of the perceived reality in ordinary threedimensional space. In the specific context of QMSL, he (Bell 1987: 45) suggested that the ‘GRW jumps’, which we called ‘hittings’, could play this role. In fact they occur at precise times in precise positions of the threedimensional space. As suggested in (Allori, et al. 2008) we will denote this position concerning the PO of the GRW theory as the ‘flashes ontology.’
However, later Bell himself suggested that the most natural interpretation of the wavefunction in the context of a collapse theory would be that it describes the ‘density […] of stuff’ in the 3Ndimensional configuration space (Bell 1990: 30), the natural mathematical framework for describing a system of \(N\) particles. Allori et al. (2008) appropriately have pointed out that this position amounts to avoiding commitment about the PO ontology of the theory and, consequently, to leaving vague the precise and meaningful connections it permits to be established between the mathematical description of the unfolding of physical processes and our perception of them.
The interpretation which, in our opinion, is most appropriate for collapse theories, has been proposed in (Ghirardi, Grassi, & Benatti 1995) and has been referred in Allori et al. 2008 as ‘the mass density ontology’. Let us briefly describe it.
First of all, various investigations (Pearle & Squires 1994) had made clear that QMSL and CSL needed a modification, i.e., the characteristic localization frequency of the elementary constituents of matter had to be made proportional to the mass characterizing the particle under consideration. In particular, the original frequency for the hitting processes \(f = 10^{16}\) sec\(^{1}\) is the one characterizing the nucleons, while, e.g., electrons would suffer hittings with a frequency reduced by about 2000 times. Unfortunately we have no space to discuss here the physical reasons which make this choice appropriate; we refer the reader to the above paper, as well as to the detailed analysis by Peruzzi and Rimini (2000). With this modification, what the nonlinear dynamics strives to make ‘objectively definite’ is the mass distribution in the whole universe. Second, a deep critical reconsideration (Ghirardi, Grassi, & Benatti 1995) has made evident how the concept of ‘distance’ that characterizes the Hilbert space is inappropriate in accounting for the similarity or difference between macroscopic situations. Just to give a convincing example, consider three states \(\ket{h} , \ket{h^*}\) and \(\ket{t}\) of a macrosystem (let us say a massive macroscopic bulk of matter), the first corresponding to its being located here, the second to its having the same location but one of its atoms (or molecules) being in a state orthogonal to the corresponding state in \(\ket{h}\), and the third having exactly the same internal state of the first but being differently located (there). Then, despite the fact that the first two states are indistinguishable from each other at the macrolevel, while the first and the third correspond to completely different and directly perceivable situations, the Hilbert space distance between \(\ket{h}\) and \(\ket{h^*}\), is equal to that between \(\ket{h}\) and \(\ket{t}\).
When the localization frequency is related to the mass of the constituents, then, in completely generality (i.e., even when one is dealing with a body which is not almost rigid, such as a gas or a cloud), the mechanism leading to the suppression of the superpositions of macroscopically different states is fundamentally governed by the integral of the squared differences of the mass densities associated to the two superposed states. Actually, in the original paper the mass density at a point was identified with its average over the characteristic volume of the theory, i.e., \(10^{15}\) cm\(^3\) around that point. It is however easy to convince oneself that there is no need to do so and that the mass density at any point, directly identified by the statevector (see below), is the appropriate quantity on which to base an appropriate ontology. Accordingly, we take the following attitude: what the theory is about, what is real ‘out there’ at a given space point \(\boldsymbol{x}\), is just a field, i.e., a variable \(m(\mathbf{x},t)\) given by the expectation value of the mass density operator \(M(\boldsymbol{x})\) at \(\boldsymbol{x}\) obtained by multiplying the mass of any kind of particle times the number density operator for the considered type of particle and summing over all possible types of particles which can be present:
\[\begin{align} \tag{7} m(\boldsymbol{x},t) &= \langle F,t \mid M(\boldsymbol{x}) \mid F,t \rangle; \\ M(\boldsymbol{x}) &= {\sum}_{(k)} m_{(k)}a^*_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x})a_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x}). \end{align} \]Here \(\ket{F,t}\) is the statevector characterizing the system at the given time, and \(a^*_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x})\) and \(a_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x})\) are the creation and annihilation operators for a particle of type \(k\) at point \(\boldsymbol{x}\). It is obvious that within standard quantum mechanics such a function cannot be endowed with any objective physical meaning due to the occurrence of linear superpositions which give rise to values that do not correspond to what we find in a measurement process or what we perceive. In the case of GRW or CSL theories, if one considers only the states allowed by the dynamics one can give a description of the world in terms of \(m(\boldsymbol{x},t)\), i.e., one recovers a physically meaningful account of physical reality in the usual 3dimensional space and time. To illustrate this crucial point we consider, first of all, the embarrassing situation of a macroscopic object in the superposition of two differently located position states. We have then simply to recall that in a collapse model relating reductions to mass density differences, the dynamics suppresses in extremely short times the embarrassing superpositions of such states to recover the mass distribution corresponding to our perceptions. Let us come now to a microsystem and let us consider the equal weight superposition of two states \(\ket{h}\) and \(\ket{t}\) describing a microscopic particle in two different locations. Such a state gives rise to a mass distribution corresponding to 1/2 of the mass of the particle in the two considered space regions. This seems, at first sight, to contradict what is revealed by any measurement process. But in such a case we know that the theory implies that the dynamics running all natural processes within GRW ensures that whenever one tries to locate the particle they will always find it in a definite position, e.g., one and only one of the Geiger counters which might be triggered by the passage of the proton will fire, just because a superposition of ‘a counter which has fired’ and ‘one which has not fired’ is dynamically forbidden.
This analysis shows that one can consider at all levels (the micro and the macroscopic ones) the field \(m(\mathbf{x},t)\) as accounting for ‘what is out there’, as originally suggested by Schrödinger with his realistic interpretation of the square of the wave function of a particle as representing the ‘fuzzy’ character of the mass (or charge) of the particle. Obviously, within standard quantum mechanics such a position cannot be maintained because
wavepackets diffuse, and with the passage of time become infinitely extended … but however far the wavefunction has extended, the reaction of a detector … remains spotty (Bell 1990: 39).
As we hope to have made clear, the picture is radically different when one takes into account the new dynamics which succeeds perfectly in reconciling the spread and sharp features of the wavefunction and of the detection process, respectively.
It is also extremely important to stress that, by resorting to the quantity (7) one can define an appropriate ‘distance’ between two states as the integral over the whole 3dimensional space of the square of the difference of \(m(\boldsymbol{x},t)\) for the two given states, a quantity which turns out to be perfectly appropriate to ground the concept of macroscopically similar or distinguishable Hilbert space states. In turn, this distance can be used as a basis to define a sensible psychophysical correspondence within the theory.
12. The Problem of the Tails of the Wave Function
There has been a lively debate around a problem which has its origin, according to some of the authors which have raised it, in the fact that even though the localization process which corresponds to multiplying the wave function times a Gaussian, thus leading to wave functions strongly peaked around the position of the hitting, they allow nevertheless the final wavefuntion to be different from zero over the whole space. The first criticism of this kind was raised by A. Shimony (1990) and can be summarized by his sentence,
[one should not] tolerate“tails” which are so broad that different parts [...] can be discriminated by the senses, even if very low probability amplitude is assigned to the tail (1990: 53)
After a localization of a macroscopic system, typically the pointer of the apparatus, its centre of mass will be associated to a wave function which is different from zero over the whole space. If one adopts the probabilistic interpretation of the standard theory, this means that even when the measurement process is over, there is a nonzero (even though extremely small) probability of finding its pointer in an arbitrary position, instead of the one corresponding to the registered outcome. This is taken as unacceptable, as indicating that the DRP does not actually overcome the macroobjectification problem.
Let us state immediately that the (alleged) problem arises entirely from keeping the standard interpretation of the wave function unchanged, in particular assuming that its squared modulus gives the probability density of the position variable. However, as we have discussed in the previous section, there are much more serious reasons of principle which require to abandon the probabilistic interpretation and replace it either with the ‘flash ontology’, or with the ‘ mass density ontology’ which we have discussed above.
Before entering into a detailed discussion of this subtle point we need to focus the problem better. Suppose one adopts, for the moment, the conventional quantum position. We agree that, within such a framework, the fact that wave functions never have strictly compact spatial support can be considered puzzling. However this is an unavoidable problem arising directly from the mathematical features (spreading of wave functions) and from the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, and not at all a problem peculiar to dynamical reduction models. Indeed, the fact that, e.g., the wave function of the center of mass of a pointer or of a table has not a compact support has never been taken to be a problem for standard quantum mechanics. When, e.g., the center of mass of a table is extremely well peaked around a given point in space, it has always been accepted that it describes a table located at some position, and that this corresponds in some way to our perception of it. It is obviously true that, for the given wave function, the quantum rules entail that if a measurement were performed the table could be found (with an extremely small probability) to be kilometers far away, but this is not the measurement or the macroobjectification problem of the standard theory. The latter concerns a completely different situation, i.e., that in which one is confronted with a superposition with comparable weights of two macroscopically separated wave functions, both of which possess tails (i.e., have noncompact support) but are appreciably different from zero only in faraway narrow intervals. This is the really embarrassing situation which conventional quantum mechanics is unable to make understandable. To which perception of the position of the pointer (of the table) does this wave function correspond?
Within GRW, the superposition of two states which, when considered individually, are assumed to lead to different and definite perceptions of macroscopic locations, are dynamically forbidden. If some process tends to produce such superpositions, then the reducing dynamics induces the localization of the centre of mass (the associated wave function being appreciably different from zero only in a narrow and precise interval). Correspondingly, the possibility arises of attributing to the system the property of being in a definite place and thus of accounting for our definite perception of it. Summarizing, we stress once more that the criticism about the tails as well as the requirement that the appearance of macroscopically extended (even though extremely small) tails be strictly forbidden is exclusively motivated by uncritically committing oneself to the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, even for what concerns the psychophysical correspondence: when this position is taken, states assigning nonexactly vanishing probabilities to different outcomes of position measurements should correspond to ambiguous perceptions about these positions. Since neither within the standard formalism nor within the framework of dynamical reduction models a wave function can have compact support, taking such a position leads to conclude that it is just the linear character of the Hilbert space description of physical systems which has to be given up.
It ought to be stressed that there is nothing in the GRW theory which forbids or makes problematic to assume that the localization function has compact support, but it also has to be noted that following this line would be totally useless: since the evolution equation contains the kinetic energy term, any function, even if it has compact support at a given time, will instantaneously spread, acquiring a tail extending over the whole space. If one sticks to the probabilistic interpretation and one accepts the completeness of the description of the states of physical systems in terms of the wave function, the tail problem cannot be avoided.
The solution to the tails problem can only derive from abandoning completely the probabilistic interpretation and from adopting a more physical and realistic interpretation relating ‘what is out there’ to, e.g., the mass density distribution over the whole universe. In this connection, the following example will be instructive. Take a massive sphere of normal density and mass of about 1 kg. Classically, the mass of this body would be totally concentrated within the radius of the sphere, call it \(r\). In QMSL, after the extremely short time interval in which the collapse dynamics leads to a ‘regime’ situation, and if one considers a sphere with radius \(r + 10^{5}\) cm, the integral of the mass density over the rest of space turns out to be an incredibly small fraction (of the order of 1 over 10 to the power \(10^{15})\) of the mass of a single proton. In such conditions, it seems quite legitimate to claim that the macroscopic body is localised within the sphere.
However, also this quite reasonable conclusion has been questioned and it has been claimed (Lewis 1997), that the very existence of the tails implies that the enumeration principle (i.e., the fact that the claim ‘particle 1 is within this box & particle 2 is within this box & … & particle \(n\) is within this box & no other particle is within this box’ implies the claim ‘there are \(n\) particles within this box’) does not hold, if one takes seriously the mass density interpretation of collapse theories. This paper has given rise to a long debate which would be inappropriate to reproduce here.
We conclude this brief analysis by stressing once more that, in our opinion, all the disagreements and the misunderstandings concerning this problem have their origin in the fact that the idea that the probabilistic interpretation of the wave function must be abandoned has not been fully accepted by the authors who find some difficulties in the proposed mass density interpretation of the Collapse Theories. For a more recent reconsideration of the problem we refer the reader to the paper by Lewis (2003).
13. The Status of Collapse Models and Recent Positions about them
We recall that, as stated in Section 3, the macroobjectification problem has been at the centre of the most lively and most challenging debate originated by the quantum view of natural processes. According to the majority of those who adhere to the orthodox position such a problem does not deserve a particular attention: classical concepts are a logical prerequisite for the very formulation of quantum mechanics and, consequently, the measurement process itself, the dividing line between the quantum and the classical world, cannot and must not be investigated, but simply accepted. This position has been lucidly summarized by J. Bell himself:
Making a virtue of necessity and influenced by positivistic and instrumentalist philosophies, many came to hold not only that it is difficult to find a coherent picture but that it is wrong to look for one—if not actually immoral then certainly unprofessional. (1981: 45)
The situation has seen many changes in the course of time, and the necessity of making a clear distinction between what is quantum and what is classical has given rise to many proposals for ‘easy solutions’ to the problem which are based on the possibility, for all practical purposes (FAPP), of locating the splitting between these two faces of reality at different levels.
Then came Bohmian mechanics, a theory which has made clear, in a lucid and perfectly consistent way, that there is no reason of principle to require a dichotomic description of the world. A universal dynamical principle runs all physical processes and even though ‘it completely agrees with standard quantum predictions’, it accounts for the standard wavepacket reduction in micromacro interactions as well as the classical behaviour of macroscopic objects.
As we have mentioned, the other consistent proposal, at the nonrelativistic level, of a conceptually satisfactory solution of the macroobjectification problem is represented by the Collapse Theories which are the subject of these pages. Contrary to Bohmian mechanics, they are rival to quantum mechanics, since they make different predictions (even though quite difficult to put into evidence) concerning various physical processes.
A common criticism makes reference to the fact that within any collapse model the ensuing dynamics for the statistical operator can be considered as the reduced dynamics deriving from a unitary (and, consequently, essentially a standard quantum) dynamics for the states of an enlarged Hilbert space of a composite quantum system \(S+E\) involving, besides the physical system \(S\) of interest, an ancilla \(E\) whose degrees of freedom are completely unaccessible. Due to the quantum dynamical semigroup nature of the evolution equation for the statistical operator, any GRWlike model can always be seen as a phenomenological model deriving from a standard quantum evolution on a larger Hilbert space. In this way, the unitary deterministic evolution characterizing quantum mechanics would be fully restored.
Apart from the obvious remark that such a critical attitude completely fails to grasp the most important feature of collapse theories, i.e., of dealing with individual quantum systems and not with statistical ensembles and of yielding a perfectly satisfactory description, matching our perceptions concerning individual macroscopic systems, invoking an unaccessible ancilla to account for the nonlinear and stochastic character of GRWtype theories is once more a purely verbal way of avoiding facing the real puzzling aspects of the quantum description of macroscopic systems.
Other reasons for ignoring the dynamical reduction program have been put forward within the quantum information community. We will not spend too much time in analyzing and discussing the new position about the foundational issues which have motivated the elaboration of collapse theories. The crucial fact is that, from this perspective, one takes the theory not to be about something real ‘occurring out there’ in a real word, but simply about information. This point is made extremely explicit by Zeilinger (2002: 252):
information is the most basic notion of quantum mechanics, and it is information about possible measurement results that is represented in the quantum state. Measurement results are nothing more than states of the classical apparatus used by the experimentalist. The quantum system then is nothing other than the consistently constructed referent of the information represented in the quantum state.
It is clear that if one takes such a position almost all motivations to be worried by the measurement problem disappear, and with them the reasons to work out what Bell has denoted as ‘an exact version of quantum mechanics’. The most appropriate reply to this type of criticisms is to recall that J. Bell (1990) has included ‘information’ among the words which must have no place in a formulation with any pretension to physical precision. In particular he has stressed that one cannot even mention information unless one has given a precise answer to the two following questions: Whose information? and Information about what?
A much more serious attitude is to call attention, as many serious authors do, to the fact that since collapse theories represent rival theories with respect to standard quantum mechanics they lead to the identification of experimental situations which would allow, in principle, crucial tests to discriminate between the two. As we have discussed above, presently, fully discriminating tests are not out of reach.
14. Summary
We presented a comprehensive picture of the ideas, the implications, the achievements and the problems of the DRP. We conclude by stressing once more our position with respect to Collapse Theories. Their interest derives entirely from the fact that they have given some hints about a possible way out from the difficulties characterizing standard quantum mechanics, by proving that explicit and precise models can be worked out, which agree with all known predictions of the theory and nevertheless allow, on the basis of a universal dynamics governing all natural processes, to overcome in a mathematically clean and precise way the basic problems of the standard theory. In particular, Collapse Models show how one can work out a theory that makes perfectly legitimate to take a macrorealistic position about natural processes, without contradicting any of the experimentally tested predictions of standard quantum mechanics. Finally, they might give precise hints about where to look in order to put into evidence, experimentally, possible violations of the superposition principle.
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