The Consistent Histories Approach to Quantum Mechanics

First published Thu Aug 7, 2014; substantive revision Wed Jun 19, 2024

The consistent histories, also known as decoherent histories, approach to quantum interpretation is broadly compatible with standard quantum mechanics as found in textbooks. However, the concept of measurement by which probabilities are introduced in standard quantum theory no longer plays a fundamental role. Instead, all quantum time dependence is probabilistic (stochastic), with probabilities given by the Born rule or its extensions. By requiring that the description of a quantum system be carried out using a well-defined probabilistic sample space (called a “framework”) this approach resolves many well-known quantum paradoxes of quantum foundations. In particular, quantum mechanics is local and consistent with special relativity. Classical mechanics emerges as a useful approximation to the more fundamental quantum mechanics under suitable conditions. The price to be paid for this is a set of rules for reasoning resembling, but very much simpler than, those of quantum logic. An important philosophical implication is the absence of a single universally-true state of affairs at each instant of time. However, there is a correspondence limit in which the new quantum logic becomes standard logic in the macroscopic world of everyday experience, and the laws of classical mechanics emerge as a good approximation to an underlying, and in principle more exact, quantum description.

In the article that follows, “Consistent Histories” is sometimes abbreviated as “CH”, and occasionally shortened to “histories”. The reader is assumed to be familiar with (and probably a bit confused by and frustrated by) the fundamentals of quantum mechanics found in introductory textbooks.

1. Introduction

The consistent histories interpretation of quantum mechanics was introduced by Griffiths (1984), and discussed by Omnès in a series of papers beginning with (Omnès 1988). The decoherent histories approach that first appeared in Gell-Mann & Hartle (1990) contains very similar ideas. In what follows, “Consistent Histories” (CH), or simply “histories”, is understood to include “decoherent histories”, with the understanding that at points where the two approaches might differ, the former is intended.

The histories approach extends the calculational methods found in standard textbooks and gives them a microscopic physical interpretation which the textbooks often lack. It is not intended as an alternative to, but as a fully consistent and clear statement of basic quantum mechanics: “Copenhagen done right”. In particular, measurements are treated in the same way as all other physical processes and play no special role in the interpretation. Thus there is no measurement problem, and under appropriate conditions one can discuss the microscopic properties revealed by measurements: measurements actually measure something, answering Bell’s tirade “Against Measurement” (Bell 1990).

All the usual quantum paradoxes (double slit, Schrödinger cat, Hardy, three box, etc.) are resolved using the histories approach, or one might better say “tamed”: they are no longer unsolved difficulties casting doubt upon the reliability and completeness of the quantum formalism, but instead they illustrate striking differences between quantum and classical physics. In particular, there is no conflict between quantum theory and relativity: superluminal influences cannot carry information or anything else for the simple reason that they do not exist. In appropriate regimes (large systems, strong decoherence) the laws of classical physics provide a very good approximation, valid for all practical purposes, to the more fundamental and more exact laws of quantum mechanics.

But at what price? The histories approach introduces a variety of concepts that go beyond textbook quantum theory, and these can be summarized under two headings. First, quantum dynamics is treated as stochastic or probabilistic. Not just when measurements are carried out, but always. Deterministic time evolution is the exceptional case in which certain probabilities are equal to 1. Born’s rule, together with its extensions, is a fundamental axiom of quantum theory. The task of Schrödinger’s time-dependent equation is to assist in assigning probabilities, as originally proposed by Born (1926). Second, as per §III.5 of Neumann (1932), quantum properties, which are what the probabilities refer to, are associated with subspaces of the quantum Hilbert space represented by projectors (orthogonal projection operators). But when projectors do not commute with each other—the fundamental divide that separates the mathematics of quantum from classical physics—new logical principles are required, which are related to, but conceptually much simpler than, the quantum logic initiated by Birkhoff & Neumann (1936).

Since textbook quantum mechanics already contains certain rules for calculating probabilities, the first innovation of the histories approach, stochastic dynamics, is not very startling and by itself causes few conceptual difficulties. It is the second innovation, in the domain of logic and ontology, that represents the most radical departure from classical thinking. However, the new quantum logic reduces to the old familiar classical propositional logic in the same domain where classical mechanics is a good approximation to quantum mechanics. That is to say, the old logic is perfectly good for all practical purposes in the macroscopic domain where classical mechanics is perfectly good for all practical purposes. A consistent, fully quantum, analysis explains why this is so.

2. Quantum Properties

2.1 Quantum and Classical Properties

A classical mechanical system can be described using a phase space \(\Gamma\) with points denoted by \(\gamma\). A classical property \(P\) is a collection of points \({\mathcal P}\) from the phase space, and can be conveniently described by an indicator function \(P(\gamma )\) which is equal to 1 if \(\gamma \in {\mathcal P}\) and 0 otherwise. It will cause no confusion to use \(P\) for both the property and its indicator function. The negation \(\lnot P\) of a property \(P\) corresponds to the complement \({\mathcal P}^c\) of the set \({\mathcal P}\), consisting of points in \(\Gamma\) that are not in \({\mathcal P}\). Its indicator is \(I-P\), where the identity indicator \(I(\gamma ) =1\) for all \(\gamma\). For example, the phase space of a one-dimensional harmonic oscillator is the real plane with a point \(\gamma = (x,p)\) indicating that the particle is at \(x\) and has momentum \(p\). The property that its energy

\[ E=p^2/2m + m\omega ^2 x^2/2 \label{eqn1} \]

is less than or equal to some fixed value \(E_r\) corresponds to the set of points contained in the ellipse \(E=E_r\) centered at the origin of the \(x,p\) plane, and the indicator is the function that is 1 on the points inside (and on the boundary) of the ellipse and 0 outside. Its negation, the property that the energy is greater than \(E_r\), corresponds to all the points lying outside this ellipse.

The quantum counterpart of a phase space is a Hilbert space \({\mathcal H}\): a complex vector space with an inner product. If infinite dimensional it must be complete—Cauchy sequences have limits. But for our purposes finite-dimensional spaces will suffice for discussing the major conceptual difficulties of quantum theory and how the histories approach resolves them. (Some examples use a harmonic oscillator with an infinite dimensional Hilbert space simply because it is fairly simple and familiar.) We use Dirac notation in which an element of \({\mathcal H}\), a “ket”, is denoted by \(|\psi\rangle\), where \(\psi\) is a label, and \(\langle\phi|\psi\rangle\) denotes the inner product of \(|\phi\rangle\) with \(|\psi\rangle\). The simplest quantum physical property, the counterpart of a point \(\gamma\) in the classical phase space, is a one-dimensional subspace of the Hilbert space, a ray, consisting of all multiples \(c|\psi\rangle\) of some nonzero \(|\psi\rangle\), with \(c\) an arbitrary complex number. The ray uniquely determines and is uniquely determined by the corresponding projector

\[ P = [\psi] = |\psi\rangle\langle\psi|, \label{eqn2}\]

assuming \(|\psi\rangle\) is normalized, \(\langle\psi|\psi\rangle =1\). In Dirac notation \(|a\rangle\langle b|\) is an operator which when applied to an arbitrary ket \(|\phi\rangle\) yields the ket \(|a\rangle \langle b|\phi\rangle =(\langle b|\phi\rangle ) |a\rangle\). The square bracket in \eqref{eqn2} is not standard Dirac notation, but is very convenient and will be used later.

In addition to rays, a Hilbert space of dimension \(d\) also contains subspaces of dimension 2, 3, etc., up to \(d\) (the entire space). These larger subspaces also represent quantum properties and are the analogues of sets of more than one point in a classical phase space. Each subspace \({\mathcal P}\) corresponds to a unique projector \(P\), a Hermitian operator \(P=P^\dagger =P^2\) such that \(P|\phi\rangle =|\phi\rangle\) if and only if \(|\phi\rangle\) belongs to \({\mathcal P}\). A quantum projector behaves in many ways like a classical indicator function, e.g., its eigenvalues can only be 0 or 1. Using the same symbol \(P\) for the property and the projector should cause no confusion. Following §III.5 of Neumann (1932), we identify the negation \(\lnot {\mathcal P}\) of a quantum property \({\mathcal P}\), projector \(P\), with its orthogonal complement \({\mathcal P}^\perp\) consisting of the kets in \({\mathcal H}\) which are orthogonal to all the kets in \({\mathcal P}\). The projector on \({\mathcal P}^\perp\) is \(I-P\), again analogous to the classical case.

Consider the example of a one-dimensional quantum harmonic oscillator. As is well known, its energy \(E\) can take on only discrete values \((n+1/2)\hbar\omega\), where \(n=0, 1,\ldots\) is any nonnegative integer and \(\omega\) is its angular frequency, as in \eqref{eqn1}. We denote the corresponding normalized ket by \(|n\rangle\). The projector \([n]=|n\rangle\langle n|\) then represents the property that the energy is equal to \((n+1/2)\hbar\omega\). The property that the energy is less than or equal to \((N+1/2)\hbar\omega\) for some integer \(N\) is given by the projector

\[P = \sum_{n=0}^N [n] = \sum_{n=0}^N|n\rangle\langle n|, \label{eqn3}\]

while the corresponding sum from \(n=N+1\) to \(\infty\) represents its negation, \(I-P\), the property that \(E\) is greater than \((N+1/2)\hbar\omega\).

Despite the close analogy between classical and quantum properties there is actually a profound difference. For a particular classical property \(P\), every point \(\gamma\) in the phase space lies either inside the set \({\mathcal P}\), so that the property is true for this \(\gamma\), or else it lies in the complementary set \({\mathcal P}^c\), and the property \(P\) is false. However, given a nontrivial (neither 0 nor the entire space) subspace \({\mathcal P}\) of the quantum Hilbert space \({\mathcal H}\), there are always kets \(|\phi\rangle\) with corresponding rays \([\phi]\) which lie neither in \({\mathcal P}\) nor in \({\mathcal P}^\perp\). For example, \(|\phi\rangle = (|N\rangle + |N+1\rangle )/\sqrt{2}\) for \(P\) given by \eqref{eqn3}. How is one to think about these? That is a key question in quantum foundations.

2.2 Conjunction and Disjunction

The conjunction \(P\land Q\), or \(P\) AND \(Q\), of two classical properties corresponds to the intersection \({\mathcal P}\cap{\mathcal Q}\) of the sets that represent them on the phase space, and the indicator for this set is the product \(P(\gamma )Q(\gamma )\) of the two indicator functions. What about the quantum case? In quantum logic \(P\land Q\) is identified with the intersection \({\mathcal P}\cap{\mathcal Q}\) of the two Hilbert subspaces, which is itself a subspace and thus a quantum property. The histories interpretation identifies \(P\land Q\) with the product \(PQ\) of the projectors \(P\) and \(Q\) provided the two projectors commute, that is, provided \(PQ=QP\). When and only when this condition is fulfilled is the product \(PQ\) itself a projector, and it projects onto the subspace \({\mathcal P}\cap{\mathcal Q}\), in agreement with quantum logic. However, if \(PQ\neq QP\) the conjunction \(P\land Q\) is undefined or meaningless in the sense that the histories interpretation assigns it no meaning. In the same way the disjunction \(P\lor Q\), the nonexclusive \(P\) OR \(Q\), is represented by the projector \(P+Q-PQ\) when \(PQ=QP\), but is otherwise undefined.

The refusal to define the conjunction or disjunction when \(PQ\neq QP\) should be thought of as a syntactical rule, analogous to that in ordinary logic that says an expression like \(P\land\lor\, Q\) is meaningless because it has not been formed according to the rules used to construct meaningful sentences. In this connection it is important to distinguish “meaningless” from “false”. A proposition which is false is meaningful and its negation is true, whereas the negation of a meaningless statement is equally meaningless. Once the commutativity restriction for meaningful combinations of quantum propositions or properties is in place the usual logical rules apply together with the intuition that goes along with them. This will be further codified using the single framework rule defined in §2.4 below.

2.3 Example of Spin Half

Let us apply these ideas to a specific example, that of the spin degree of freedom of a spin-half particle, such as an electron or a proton, or a silver atom in its electronic ground state. The operator \(S_z\) for the \(z\) component of spin angular momentum acts on a 2-dimensional Hilbert space and has eigenvalues \(+1/2\) and \(-1/2\) in units of \(\hbar\). If \(|z^+\rangle\) and \(|z^-\rangle\) are the corresponding eigenkets, the projectors corresponding to \(S_z=\pm 1/2\) are \([z^+] =|z^+\rangle\langle z^+|\) and \([z^-] =|z^-\rangle\langle z^-|\). The product of these projectors in either order is the zero operator \(0\), which is the property that is always false, the quantum counterpart of the empty subset of a classical phase space. Their sum \([z^+] + [z^-] =I\) is the identity operator, the property that is always true. In physical terms, \(S_z\) is either positive or negative: it cannot be both, since \([z^+]\cdot [z^-] =0\), and it must be one or the other, since \([z^+] + [z^-] =I\). This explains the outcome of the Stern-Gerlach experiment.

In the same way the \(x\) component \(S_x\) of angular momentum can take only two values \(+1/2\) or \(-1/2\), corresponding to the projectors \([x^+] = |x^+\rangle\langle x^+|\) and \([x^-] = |x^-\rangle\langle x^-|\) formed from its eigenkets \(|x^+\rangle\) and \(|x^-\rangle\). Consequently, what was stated in the previous paragraph about \(S_z\) can also be said about \(S_x\). However—here we arrive at a central feature of the histories interpretation—it is not meaningful to combine discussions of \(S_z\) with discussions of \(S_x\), because neither \([x^+]\) nor \([x^-]\) commutes with \([z^+]\) or \([z^-]\). There is no way of associating the property “\(S_z=+1/2\) AND \(S_x=+1/2\)” with a subspace of the two-dimensional quantum Hilbert space. One way to see this is that every one-dimensional subspace of this Hilbert space has a physical interpretation: \(S_w=+1/2\) for some direction \(w\) in space, so there are no possibilities left over which could correspond to “\(S_z=+1/2\) AND \(S_x=+1/2\)”. But might one assign the zero-dimensional subspace, the proposition that is always false, to “\(S_z=+1/2\) AND \(S_x=+1/2\)”? This is the approach of quantum logic. However, taking the negation of this proposition that is always false has the consequence that the proposition“\(S_z=-1/2\) OR \(S_x=-1/2\)” is always true, which to a physicist seems extremely odd. In quantum logic this unpleasant consequence is blocked by a special rule needed to render the approach internally consistent. However, that also makes it very difficult to use quantum logic to reason in physical terms about what is going on in a quantum system. By contrast, the logic needed for the histories approach can be taught—albeit with some effort and some exercises—to college students.

2.4 PDIs, Frameworks, and the Single Framework Rule

The previous example is easily generalized to a Hilbert space of any finite dimension \(d\). A discussion of quantum properties is always based upon a collection \(\{P^j\}\) of mutually-orthogonal projectors that sum to the identity \(I\), a projective decomposition of the identity or PDI:

\[I = \sum_j P^j,\quad P^j = (P^j)^\dagger = (P^j)^2,\quad P^j P^k = \delta _{jk} P^j. \label{eqn4}\]

Here the superscript \(j\) is a label, not an exponent, which should cause no confusion, since a projector is equal to its square. (The subscript position will be used later for other purposes.) These projectors represent mutually-exclusive properties, such as the pair \(\{[x+],[x-]\}\) in the preceding example. However, for \(d\geq 3\) a PDI may contain projectors of rank (i.e., trace) greater than 1, and these play a significant role in the histories approach.

For example, in the case of a quantum harmonic oscillator, a PDI might consist of the two projectors \(\{P^1,P^2\}\)

\[P^1 = [0] + [1],\quad P^2 = I-P^1 \label{eqn5}\]

where we can, using the carelessness allowed to theoretical physicists, make the Hilbert space finite-dimensional by throwing away the \([n]\) with \(n > 10^{10}\), or any convenient number, so that \(P^2\) has finite rank.

When discussing quantum observables, which is to say Hermitian or self-adjoint operators \(A=A^\dagger\), there is a PDI associated with the operator, namely the collection of projectors which appear in its spectral representation:

\[A = \sum_j\alpha _j P^j, \label{eqn6}\]

where the \(\alpha _j\) are the distinct eigenvalues, \(\alpha _j\neq\alpha _k\) for \(j\neq k\), and \(P^j\) has the physical interpretation that “the value of \(A\) is equal to \(\alpha _j\)”.

Given a PDI it makes sense to talk about properties represented by the individual projectors as well as projectors which are sums of different projectors belonging to the PDI. A coarsening of the PDI is a new PDI in which each projector is either a member of or a sum of members of the original set. The reverse operation of refining consists of replacing one or more projectors of rank greater than 1 with projectors which sum to them—note that a collection of projectors whose sum is a projector are necessarily orthogonal to each other. Two PDIs \(\{P^j\}\) and \(\{Q^k\}\) are said to be compatible if and only if all the projectors in one commute with all of the projectors in the other. If this is the case then there is a common refinement, a PDI consisting of all the nonzero products \(\{P^jQ^k\}\). Otherwise \(\{P^j\}\) and \(\{Q^k\}\) are said to be incompatible: at least one \(P^j\) does not commute with some \(Q^k\). These definition extend in an obvious way to collections of three or more PDIs. Similarly two quantum observables \(A\) and \(B\) are compatible if the PDIs in their spectral representations, such as \eqref{eqn6}, are compatible, which is equivalent to saying that they commute: \(AB=BA\). Again, these definitions extend in an obvious way to three or more observables.

A central principle of the histories approach is that quantum propositional reasoning must always employ a single PDI, referred to as a framework. While the choice may be implicit, it is often helpful to make it explicit when carrying out a logical argument. The single framework rule states that any logical argument must use a particular framework; combining results from two incompatible frameworks is illegitimate. Before entering into a more general discussion, let us see how the single framework rule applies to the spin-half example discussed above. Suppose it is known for some reason that a spin-half particle has \(S_x=+1/2\). What can one say about \(S_z\) in this situation? According to the single framework rule, the answer is “nothing”. To discuss \(S_z\), one must use the \(\{ [z^+],[z^-] \}\) framework, and neither operator commutes with \([x^+]\). Something like “\([x^+]\) AND \([z^-]\)” is meaningless, for the two projectors do not commute.

A more interesting example arises in the case of a quantum harmonic oscillator. Consider the PDI

\[{\mathcal F}_1:\ \{ R, I-R \}.\quad R := [0]+[1]. \label{eqn7}\]

The physical meaning of \(R\) is “the energy is not greater than \((3/2)\hbar\omega\)”. Is this not the same thing as saying that the energy is either \((1/2))\hbar\omega\) or else it is \((3/2))\hbar\omega\)? No, it is not, because the projectors \([0]\) and \([1]\) needed to make sense of such a statement are not present in the PDI \eqref{eqn7}. The single framework rule excludes making mention of properties which are neither members nor sums of members of the PDI under discussion. Thus if one wants to discuss which of the two possible energies is the case, it is necessary to use a refinement of \eqref{eqn7} consisting of the three projectors

\[{\mathcal F}_2:\ \{ [0],\ [1],\ I-[0]-[1] \}. \label{eqn8}\]

Using \({\mathcal F}_2\) allows a discussion of whether \([0]\) or \([1]\) is the case, given \(R=[0]+[1]\).

But is not insisting on the use of \({\mathcal F}_2\) rather than \({\mathcal F}_1\) an absolutely trivial matter best left to esoteric discussions among philosophers? No it is not, as can be seen by introducing a third framework:

\[\begin{equation} \begin{aligned}[t] {\mathcal F}_3 & :\ \{ [+],\ [-],\ I-[+]-[-]\};\\ |+\rangle & := (|0\rangle +|1\rangle )/\sqrt{2},\\ |-\rangle & := (|0\rangle -|1\rangle )/\sqrt{2}. \end{aligned} \label{eqn9} \end{equation} \]

Since \(R|+\rangle = |+\rangle\) and \(R|-\rangle = |-\rangle\), both of these have the property \(R\). On the other hand, neither has a precise, well defined energy. Since the time development of a state with a precisely defined energy is rather trivial—it does not change—when one is interested in a situation with significant time development the discussion may require the use of something like the framework \({\mathcal F}_3\). Obviously \({\mathcal F}_2\) and \({\mathcal F}_3\) are incompatible, though both are refinements of \({\mathcal F}_1\). Ignoring quantum incompatibility, which has no counterpart in classical physics, can easily lead to quantum paradoxes.

One thing the single framework rule specifically rules out is a case in which separate steps in a logical argument are carried out using two or more different frameworks, and then combined despite the fact that the different frameworks are incompatible. Typically the mistake is made by starting the reasoning process using a PDI \(\{P^j\}\), then noting that one or more of these projectors are also present in a PDI \(\{Q^k\}\), and using this to bridge the logical argument from \(\{P^j\}\) to \(\{Q^k\}\) without noticing that, because of other projectors which are not the immediate focus of attention, these two PDIs are incompatible. Continuing on in this fashion can eventually lead to a logical inconsistency or paradox; for some specific instances see §8.2.2.

While paying close attention to the framework being employed in a particular argument is essential in order to avoid falling into quantum paradoxes, this does not restrict the physicist to using just one framework when thinking about some particular physical situation of interest. Indeed, it is often very helpful to look at matters from a variety of different angles or perspectives. What the single framework rule forbids is combining incompatible perspectives or frameworks.

The concept of a framework and the single framework extends to quantum histories as discussed in §4.2, where the projectors making up a PDI act on a history Hilbert space, and to these the single framework rule applies in an obvious way. However, again as discussed in §4.2, there are situations in which combining two families of histories is allowed in that the projectors commute, but probabilities cannot be assigned to the combination in the case of a closed quantum system because the consistency conditions are violated. Again one says that the single framework rule prohibits the combination.

It is convenient to summarize the single framework rule as a set of four basic principles:

  • R1. Liberty. The physicist is free to employ as many frameworks as desired when constructing descriptions of a particular quantum system, provided the principle R3 below is strictly observed.
  • R2. Equality. No framework is more fundamental than any other; in particular, there is no “true” framework, no framework that is “singled out by nature”.
  • R3. Incompatibility. Incompatible frameworks are never to be combined into a single quantum description. A (perhaps probabilistic) reasoning process starting from assumptions (or data) and leading to conclusions must be carried out using a single framework.
  • R4. Utility. Some frameworks are more useful than others for answering particular questions about a quantum system.

A typical quantum reasoning process employing these principles contains the following steps. It begins with some initial data, which may reflect some knowledge of the system under discussion or may be purely hypothetical. Here “initial” refers to the beginning of a logical argument, not necessarily to the initial state of a quantum system, though the latter is often included in the initial data. These data must then be expressed in appropriate quantum terms as some sort of property or properties, subspaces of an appropriate Hilbert space, all belonging to a single framework, principle R3. Then as the argument proceeds this initial framework or PDI can be refined in various ways, some of which may be incompatible with others. The physicist (or anyone) carrying out this reasoning process is free to use (R1 and R2) any refinement in order to draw conclusions, but conclusions drawn from different incompatible frameworks cannot be combined, R3, as this leads to paradoxes. It is utility, R4, which guides the choice of a framework; from a fundamental point of view all frameworks are equally good.

From the CH perspective, the key difference between ordinary “classical” reasoning and that needed to make sense of the quantum world is the existence of incompatible frameworks that cannot be combined, and the possibility of employing different ones when analyzing the same experimental setup or situation. Let us call this pluricity, in contrast to classical unicity. The latter is epitomized by the classical phase space in which a single point represents the exact state of a system at any given time, while the discussion of the quantum harmonic oscillator given above illustrates the former. For further details and illustrations see Griffiths (2014)

3. Quantum Probabilities

3.1 Introduction

Probabilities in the histories interpretation of quantum mechanics are standard (Kolmogorov), not some kind of quasiprobability that could, for example, take negative values. Consequently, much of the intuition that applies to probabilities as used in ordinary classical physics can be used in the quantum case. The major difference is that the quantum sample space, always a PDI, must be specified, at least implicitly, and incompatible PDIs cannot be combined in violation of the single framework rule.

A probabilistic model as used in classical physics and other sciences can be thought of as a triple \(({\mathcal S},{\mathcal E},{\mathcal M})\): a sample space \({\mathcal S}\), an event algebra \({\mathcal E}\) and a probability measure \({\mathcal M}\). When a die is rolled the sample space \({\mathcal S}\) consists of six mutually exclusive possibilities, one and only one of which actually occurs. The event algebra can be set equal to the collection of all \(2^6\) subsets of \({\mathcal S}\), including the empty set and \({\mathcal S}\) itself; it forms a Boolean algebra under complements and intersections. Finally, the measure \({\mathcal M}\) assigns probabilities, real numbers between 0 and 1, to the different sets in \({\mathcal E}\) according to certain rules. Again we need only consider the simplest situation in which \({\mathcal S}\) is finite or countable, and a nonnegative number \(p_j\) is assigned to each \(j\in{\mathcal S}\) in such a manner that \(\sum_j p_j = 1\). The probability for some \(E\in {\mathcal E}\) is then given by the formula

\[\Pr(E) = \sum_{j\in E} p_j. \label{eqn10}\]

Note that the mathematical rules of probability theory do not constrain the choice of the \(p_j\), aside from the requirement that they be nonnegative and sum to 1. It is up to the scientist constructing the model to come up with appropriate values, which may be done using a variety of considerations; among them pure guesswork, or carefully fitting parameters using results of previous experiments, or the application of some theoretical principles.

The histories interpretation of quantum mechanics employs probability theory in exactly the same way as in the other sciences once a sample space \({\mathcal S}\) has been specified. A quantum sample space \({\mathcal S}\) is always a PDI, see \eqref{eqn4}, where the orthogonality of the projectors means the properties represented are mutually exclusive. The event algebra consists of all projectors which are members of, or sums of members of this PDI. Quantum theory does not in general specify the probability \(p_j\) to be assigned to the projector \(P^j\) in \({\mathcal S}\), aside from the requirement that it be nonnegative, and that the \(p_j\) sum to 1. (But see §4 concerning time dependence.) Thus, for example, to the element \(P^1+P^3\) of \({\mathcal E}\) one assigns the probability \(p_1+p_3\). The intuitive interpretation of probabilities introduced in this way is the same as in the other sciences which employ probability theory, as long as a single framework is in view. What is distinctly different in the quantum case is the existence of multiple incompatible frameworks which cannot be combined.

In standard probability theory random variables are typically functions on the sample space, and in the case of real-valued functions the natural quantum counterpart is an observable, as in \eqref{eqn6}. Complex-valued functions have their counterpart in normal quantum operators. As always, trouble can be expected if the single-framework rule is ignored.

3.2 Density Operators and Pre-Probabilities

A density operator \(\rho\), sometimes referred to as a density matrix, is an observable with non-negative eigenvalues and whose trace is 1. It is often referred to as the state of a quantum system, analogous to a classical probability distribution or density on a classical phase space. If one interprets the projectors in its spectral representation as a PDI it is natural to think of its eigenvalues as constituting a probability distribution on the sample space defined by the PDI of its spectral representation. On the other hand, it is often thought of as inducing a probability distribution on some other PDI \(\{Q^k\}\) by means of the formula

\[\Pr(Q^k) = {\rm Tr}(\rho Q^k). \label{eqn11}\]

While either interpretation is legitimate, they need to be distinguished, and this author’s preferred terminology for the one represented by \eqref{eqn11} is that \(\rho\) is a pre-probability: it is not itself a probability distribution, but induces such a distribution on some PDI of interest. Of course \(\rho\) could be a projector on a pure state, and thus a pure state can also play the role of a pre-probability.

4. Quantum Time Development

4.1 Unitary and Stochastic Time Development

For a closed quantum system there is a collection of unitary operators \(T(t',t)\), labeled by the two times \(t\) and \(t'\), such that a solution \(|\psi(t)\rangle\) to Schrödinger’s time-dependent equation satisfies

\[|\psi(t)\rangle = T(t,t_0) |\psi_0\rangle , \label{eqn12}\]

given a state \(|\psi_0\rangle\) at some time \(t_0\). (In the case of a time-independent Hamiltonian \(H\), \(T(t',t)=\exp[-i(t'-t)H/\hbar]\).) In the same year that Schrödinger published his equation, Born (1926) proposed that its solution was not a simple representation of physical reality, but should instead be understood as a way to compute probabilities for a stochastic, that is random, time evolution. Schrödinger never accepted Born’s proposal, although he himself showed that unitary or deterministic time development leads to various paradoxes, such as his famous cat, which he was unable to resolve. In his book von Neumann (1932) endorsed Born’s approach and proposed a “collapse” of the quantum wavefunction when a measurement takes place, a point of view reflected in physics textbooks.

In the physics laboratory, on the other hand, stochastic (random) time development occurs all the time, such as in the decay of radioactive nuclei or in scattering processes, which are often understood as having occurred in advance of a measurement, or as being the cause of a later measurement outcome. (Measurements are discussed below in §6.) The histories approach assumes that quantum time development is always stochastic, and is only deterministic in particular cases in which appropriate probabilities are equal to 1.

4.2 Quantum Histories

Let us call a quantum property at a particular moment of time an event, and label it with a projector \(E_n^{\alpha _n}\), where the subscript labels the time \(t_n\) at which the event occurs, and the superscript labels the quantum property. In the simplest situation the collection \(\{E_n^{\alpha _n}\}\) for a fixed \(n\) and different \(\alpha _n\) form a PDI, though more complicated cases are sometimes of interest. Given a sequence of times \(t_0,t_1,\ldots t_f\) the operator

\[Y^\alpha = E_0^{\alpha _0} \odot E_1^{\alpha _1}\odot \cdots E_f^{\alpha _f}, \label{eqn13}\]

where \(\alpha = (\alpha _0,\alpha _1,\ldots \alpha _f)\), defines a quantum history, a succession of events that occur at these different times. It is the quantum analog of a particular realization of a classical stochastic process, such as tossing a coin three times in a row, which might result in \(H\odot T\odot T\). In \eqref{eqn13} the \(\odot\) symbol can be regarded as a time separator, but also as indicating a tensor product, thus a variant of the usual \(\otimes\). That makes \(Y^\alpha\) a projector on a history Hilbert space

\[\breve {\mathcal H}= {\mathcal H}_0\odot {\mathcal H}_1 \odot \dots {\mathcal H}_f, \label{eqn14}\]

where \({\mathcal H}_n\) is the system Hilbert space \({\mathcal H}\), with the subscript indicating the time, thus providing a physical interpretation. Of course there are many projectors on \(\breve{\mathcal H}\) which are not of the product form \eqref{eqn13}, but thus far little use has been made of them in the histories literature.

A family (framework) of histories is a collection \(\{Y^\alpha \}\) of mutually orthogonal history projectors which sum to the history identity \(\breve I=I\odot I\odot \cdots I\), thus a PDI for the history Hilbert space. Orthogonality is in the usual sense appropriate for a tensor product: \(Y^\alpha\) and \(Y^\beta\) are orthogonal if there is at least one time \(t_n\) such that \(E_n^{\alpha _n}E_n^{\beta _n}=0\). As with any collection of orthogonal projectors summing to the identity (in this case \(\breve I\)), one can regard a family of histories as a probabilistic sample space to which probabilities can be assigned.

In the case of a closed quantum system with unitary time development given by \(T(t',t)\), the generalized Born rule assigns probabilities in the following way. Define the chain operator—note that it operates on \({\mathcal H}\) and not \(\breve{\mathcal H}\)—associated with \(Y^\alpha\) in \eqref{eqn13}

\[ \begin{equation} \begin{split} K(Y^\alpha ) := E^{\alpha _f}_f T(t_f,t_{f-1}) E^{\alpha _{f-1}}_{f-1} T(t_{f-1},t_{f-2}) \\ \cdots E^{\alpha _1}_1 T(t_1,t_0) E^{\alpha _0}_0 \end{split} \label{eqn15} \end{equation} \]

(Note that since \(T(t,t')=T(t',t)^\dagger\), the adjoint \(K(Y^\alpha )^\dagger\) of \(K(Y^\alpha )\) is the analogous expression in which the order of the operators is reversed, with time increasing from left to right.) If the consistency conditions

\[{\rm Tr}[K(Y^\alpha ) K(Y^\beta )^\dagger ] = 0 \text{ for $\alpha \neq\beta $ } \label{eqn16}\]

are satisfied, the extended Born rule assigns weights

\[W(\alpha ) = {\rm Tr}[K(Y^\alpha ) K(Y^\alpha )^\dagger ] \label{eqn17}\]

to each of the histories that make up this family. These weights, in turn, can be used to generate probabilities when suitably normalized. For example, if it is known that the system at time \(t_0\) has the property \(E_0^1\), then the weights \(W(\alpha )\) for histories with \(\alpha _0=1\), divided by \({\rm Tr}(E_0^1)\), are the probabilities of histories which start with \(E_0^1\).

If the only histories of interest are those that begin with a single normalized pure state \(|\psi_0\rangle\) at \(t_0\), the preceding formulas can be simplified through the use of a chain ket

\[ \begin{equation} \begin{split} |\Psi^\alpha \rangle = E^{\alpha _f}_f T(t_f,t_{f-1}) E^{\alpha _{f-1}}_{f-1} T(t_{f-1},t_{f-2})\\ \cdots E^{\alpha _1}_1 T(t_1,t_0) |\psi_0\rangle , \end{split} \label{eqn18} \end{equation} \]

with consistency conditions \eqref{eqn16} replaced by

\[\langle\Psi^\alpha |\Psi^\beta \rangle = \delta _{\alpha \beta }, \label{eqn19}\]

and the weight \eqref{eqn17} by the probability

\[\Pr(Y^\alpha ) = \langle\Psi^\alpha |\Psi^\alpha \rangle \label{eqn20}\]

for history \(Y^\alpha\).

Families for which the consistency conditions are satisfied are called consistent families, and it is only for this restricted class that the unitary quantum dynamics of a closed system assigns meaningful probabilities in a way that does not give rise to paradoxes. For two-time histories, \(f=1\), and assuming that \(\{E_0^{\alpha _0}\}\) and \(\{E_1^{\alpha _1}\}\) are PDIs, the consistency conditions, \eqref{eqn16} or \eqref{eqn19}, are always satisfied, and the probabilities obtained from \eqref{eqn17} or \eqref{eqn20} agree with the usual Born rule. But for three or more times, \(f\geq2\), the restriction \eqref{eqn16} is far from trivial, and the probabilities obtained from \eqref{eqn17} constitute the generalized Born rule. It is important to note that measurements, so essential to textbook treatments, never enter into the discussion. (Physical measurements can be analyzed as quantum processes using fundamental principles which make no reference to “measurement”, as discussed in §6.)

In classical physics there is no difficulty in imagining events actually occurring inside a closed system, with no observers or measuring apparatus present. The difficulty in the quantum case is shown by the numerous paradoxes which arise if one simply employs classical ideas with no regard to Hilbert space mathematics. The CH approach shows how it is possible to discuss “unobserved” microscopic events provided attention is paid to rules which are absent from classical physics but needed to make sense of the quantum world while avoiding paradoxes.

Two additional comments. First, two consistent families \({\mathcal F}_a\) and \({\mathcal F}_b\) may be such that the history projectors in one commute with those in the other, but still the coarsest common refinement does not satisfy the dynamical consistency conditions \eqref{eqn16} or \eqref{eqn19} for a closed system, in which case these history families are said to be incommensurate and cannot be combined, at least if one wishes to use the dynamical laws of quantum mechanics to assign probabilities. It is then natural to extend the single framework rule, §2.4, to include a prohibition of combining these families, each regarded as a framework. Second, the histories approach is time symmetrical in the sense that the rules for assigning probabilities do not single out a particular “direction” or sense of time. This symmetry is obvious from \eqref{eqn15}, \eqref{eqn16}, and \eqref{eqn17}, since taking the adjoint of the chain operator reverses the sense of time.

5. Classical Physics

The histories approach assumes that the same fundamental quantum mechanical laws apply to systems of any size, from quarks to jaguars to quasars. Classical mechanics is a very good approximation to the more exact quantum laws in appropriate circumstances, and can be described using quasiclassical frameworks.

The first task is to identify suitable quantum PDIs which can represent macroscopic physical properties at a given time using projectors which commute “for all practical purposes”, i.e., the commutators are negligibly small. One expects these to be Hilbert-space projectors of enormous rank, e.g., 10 raised to the power \(10^{16}\). That one can find descriptions that are effectively classical is suggested by the example of a spin \(S\) particle, where \(S\) can take any positive integer or half-integer value. The standard commutation relations, using units in which \(\hbar=1\), take the form

\[ [S_x,S_y]= i S_z, \label{eqn21}\]

and likewise for other components. If one divides both sides of \eqref{eqn21} by \(S\), the result is

\[ [(S_x/S),(S_y/S)] = i (S_z/S^2). \label{eqn22}\]

For extremely large values of \(S\), such as might be associated with a spinning golf or soccer ball, the normalized operators \(S_x/S\) are of order \(1\), so the right side of \eqref{eqn22} is negligible, and the normalized operators effectively commute. This suggests that it is not unreasonable to expect that projectors of enormous rank can be found which provide a quasiclassical framework, a close-to-classical but fully quantum-mechanical description of the world which is adequate “for all practical purposes”, to borrow a phrase from John Bell. Work of the sort found in Gell-Mann & Hartle (1993) makes these ideas plausible, though more needs to be done to put them on a firmer basis. At the very least one can say that studies have not revealed any serious difficulties with this approach.

However, there are cases in which one would not expect a classical description to emerge from quantum theory. In particular, in a regime in which a classical analysis predicts chaos (positive Lyapunov exponents), quantum “fluctuations” are likely to be amplified to where they play a non-negligible role. But this is also a situation in which deterministic classical time development is not to be taken seriously, due to the sensitive dependence upon initial conditions, so there is no reason to suppose that these represent a breakdown of fundamental quantum principles.

Further advances in relating classical to quantum physics will likely depend upon a better understanding of open quantum systems and the role decoherence plays in quasiclassical descriptions. Decoherence removes the effects of quantum interference of the sort that might otherwise render a quasiclassical family inconsistent, so it is certainly significant. Model calculations support its role, but work still remains to be done in coming to a full understanding of decoherence in quantum terms. Invoking decoherence by itself outside the framework provided by the histories approach does not solve the conceptual difficulties of quantum theory; see, e.g., (Adler 2003).

6. Quantum Measurements and Preparations

6.1 Introduction

The principles discussed above provide a resolution of the measurement problem of quantum foundations: that is, how to analyze the measurement process itself in fully quantum mechanical terms. A measurement of the sort considered here consists of an amplification of some microscopic quantum property so that the result—traditionally referred to as the position of a pointer—is visible to the naked eye, or at least is in a form which can be recorded in a (classical) computer memory: thus something quasiclassical, §5. Understanding measurements in this way gives rise to two somewhat distinct problems:

  • MP1: How can the macroscopic outcome of the measurement (the pointer position) be described in quantum terms?
  • MP2: How is this outcome related to the earlier microscopic property the apparatus was designed to measure? In particular, does knowing the outcome make it possible for the experimenter to infer its earlier microscopic quantum cause?

6.2 Measurement Model

The way in which the histories approach deals with MP1 and MP2 can be understood by considering a simple schematic measurement model, extending some ideas that go back to Neumann (1932, VI.3). It corresponds to what is called a projective measurement, understood as one in which each outcome corresponds to, or is caused by, a quantum property, represented by a projector on the Hilbert space \({\mathcal H}_s\) of the measured system, hereafter referred to as a particle, at an earlier time before it interacts with a macroscopic measurement apparatus, Hilbert space \({\mathcal H}_M\), so the total Hilbert space is \({\mathcal H}_s\otimes {\mathcal H}_M\). Let \(\{|s^j\rangle \}\) be an orthonormal basis of \({\mathcal H}_s\). The purpose of the measurement is to determine which of these microscopic states leads to a particular macroscopic output: If the initial particle property is \([s^j]\), the measurement interaction will result in the apparatus having a property represented by the projector \(R^j\) that corresponds to the apparatus pointer at position \(j\). Note that \(R^j\) is a quasiclassical projector, §5, of enormous dimension, and that \(R^j R^k=0\) if \(j\neq k\): if the pointer is in a particular position it is not in some other position. Thus if we augment the collection \(\{R^j\}\) with \(R^0 = I_M-\sum_j R^j\), \(I_M\) the identity on \({\mathcal H}_M\), the result will be a PDI for the apparatus. In the following discussion superscripts on kets and projectors are labels, not exponents, while subscripts label the time.

The histories of interest involve three times \(t_0 < t_1 < t_2\). There is no time change in the state of the particle between \(t_0\) and \(t_1\), whereas the system and apparatus interact with each other between \(t_1\) and \(t_2\). Assume that at \(t_0\) there is an initial state:

\[\begin{align} |\Psi_0\rangle &=|\sigma _0\rangle \otimes |M_0\rangle , \label{eqn23}\\ |\sigma _0\rangle &:= \sum_j c_j |s^j\rangle , \label{eqn24} \end{align}\]

where the \(c_j\) are complex coefficients, with \(\sum_j|c_j|^2=1\).

Next assume unitary time development:

\[ \begin{equation} \begin{aligned} T(t_1,t_0) &= I_s\otimes U_M, \\ |M_1\rangle & = U_M |M_0\rangle, \\ |s^j_1\rangle & = |s^j\rangle ,\\ T(t_2,t_1) (|s^j_1\rangle \otimes |M_1\rangle ) & = |w^j_2\rangle \otimes |M^j_2\rangle,\\ \end{aligned} \label{eqn25} \end{equation} \]

where \(I_s\) is the identity operator on \({\mathcal H}_s\), while \(U_M\) is a unitary time development operator acting on \({\mathcal H}_M\); its precise structure will not be of concern, as we are only interested in what happens during the time interval between \(t_1\) and \(t_2\) when the apparatus interacts with the particle. The \(|w^j_2\rangle\) are normalized, but otherwise arbitrary states of the particle; see the remarks in §6.3 below. Finally, assume that the apparatus states at \(t_2\) satisfy

\[R^j|M^k_2\rangle = \delta _{jk} |M^k_2\rangle . \label{eqn26}\]

This means that the apparatus at time \(t_2\) possesses the (macroscopic) property \(R^j\) if at \(t_1\) the particle had the property \([s^j]\): the later pointer position is correlated with the earlier particle property as one might expect for an ideal measurement.

Unitary time evolution \eqref{eqn25} leads to

\[ |\Psi_1\rangle = T(t_1,t_0) |\Psi_0\rangle ,\quad |\Psi_2\rangle = T(t_2,t_1) |\Psi_1\rangle . \label{eqn27} \]

We can use these states to define a unitary family of histories

\[{\mathcal F}_u:\;\;[\Psi_0]\;\odot \; \{[\Psi_1],I-[\Psi_1]\}\;\odot \; \{[\Psi_2], I-[\Psi_2]\}, \label{eqn28}\]

with \(I=I_s\otimes I_M\) the identity operator on the total Hilbert space. The family \eqref{eqn28} should be interpreted as a set of four mutually exclusive histories obtained by choosing at \(t_1\) one of the projectors inside the first pair of curly brackets, and at \(t_2\) one inside the second pair. The corresponding chain kets, \eqref{eqn18}, are zero except for the single history \([\Psi_0]\odot [\Psi_1] \odot [\Psi_2]\), which is assigned probability 1 by \eqref{eqn20}.

The unitary family \({\mathcal F}_u\) is of no use for resolving the first measurement problem MP1, because it does not include the projectors \(\{R^j\}\) for the pointer positions at time \(t_2\) needed to discuss the measurement outcome, nor can it be refined to include them, because \([\Psi_2]\) will not commute with some of the \(R^j\), assuming at least two of the \(c_j\) in \eqref{eqn24} are nonzero. This is the basic reason why the first measurement problem MP1 is an enormous difficulty for quantum interpretations in which the only possible time dependence for a closed quantum system is that given by Schrödinger’s equation. By contrast, the histories approach allows the physicist the liberty to use a different pointer family \({\mathcal F}_p\) of histories \(\{Y^k\}\) whose base, the histories not immediately assigned zero probability, consists of

\[{\mathcal F}_p: Y^k=[\Psi_0]\;\odot \;[\Psi_1] \;\odot \; R^k_2 \label{eqn29}\]

in place of \({\mathcal F}_u\). Note that \(R^k\) is understood as \(I_s\otimes R^k\), using a common physicist’s convention. In addition the projector \(R^0=I_M-\sum_j R^j\) should be included among the possibilities at the final time \(t_2\), but as it occurs with zero probability it can be ignored. The consistency of the family \({\mathcal F}_p\) is easily demonstrated, and the probability \(|c_j|^2\) for the final position \(R^j\) (the usual Born rule) is an immediate consequence of \eqref{eqn17}.

However, the second measurement problem MP2, relating the outcome of the measurement to the property of the particle before the measurement took place, cannot be discussed using the family \({\mathcal F}_p\), because the properties of interest, the \([s^j]\), are not included among the possibilities at time \(t_1\), and in general will not commute with \([\Psi_1]\), so cannot be added to this history family. To discuss them requires a measurement family

\[{\mathcal F}_m: Y^{jk} = [\Psi_0] \;\odot \; [s_1^j] \;\odot \; R^k_2, \label{eqn30}\]

where \([s^j]\) at \(t_1\) means \([s^j]\otimes I_M\). Showing that \({\mathcal F}_m\) is consistent is straightforward, as is calculating the joint probability distribution

\[\Pr([s_1^j],R^k) = \Pr(Y^{jk}) = |c_j|^2 \delta _{jk}, \label{eqn31}\]

from which it follows that the marginals and conditionals are given by

\[\begin{align} \Pr([s_1^j]) &= \Pr(R^j_2) = |c_j|^2 \label{eqn32}\\ \Pr(R^k_2\boldsymbol{\mid}[s_1^j]\,) &=\Pr(\,[s_1^j]\boldsymbol{\mid}R^k_2) =\delta _{jk}. \label{eqn33} \end{align}\]

What we learn from \eqref{eqn33} is that if at time \(t_1\) the particle is in the state \([s^j]\), then with certainty at time \(t_2\) the pointer will be in location \(j\), and also that if the pointer is later in location \(k\), the particle earlier had the corresponding property \([s^k]\) that the measurement was designed to reveal.

The family \({\mathcal F}_m\) in \eqref{eqn30} can be generalized in various ways. In particular, one can replace \(\{[s^j]\}\) at time \(t_1\) in \eqref{eqn30} with a more general PDI \(\{S^j\}\) for the particle, provided the particle apparatus interaction results in \(S^j\) at \(t_1\) leading the corresponding pointer property at \(t_2\), a condition which can be written in the somewhat awkward form:

\[\hat S^j_2 := T(t_2,t_1) (S^j_1 \otimes [M_1]) T(t_1,t_2),\quad R^l \hat S^j_2 R^l = \delta _{jl} \hat S^j_2. \label{eqn34}\]

The consistency conditions will then be satisfied, with the result that equations \eqref{eqn32} and \eqref{eqn33} are replaced with:

\[\begin{align} \Pr(S^j_1) & = \Pr(R^j_2) \label{eqn35}\\ \Pr(R^k_2\boldsymbol{\mid}S^j_1) &= \Pr(S^j_1 \boldsymbol{\mid}R^k_2) = \delta _{jk}. \label{eqn36} \end{align}\]

Again, the earlier property at time \(t_1\) can be inferred from the measurement outcome at time \(t_2\). In addition, the pure initial state \([\bar M_0]\) at time \(t_0\) can, with of course suitable restrictions, be replaced with a projector of higher rank, or with a density operator. Such extensions are discussed by Griffiths (2002: chs 17 & 18; 2017).

The conditional probabilities in \eqref{eqn33} and \eqref{eqn36} serve to justify inferences made every day in physics laboratories by experimenters who interpret measurement results in terms of earlier microscopic causes, having carried out various checks to ensure that the apparatus is functioning as designed. Unfortunately, laboratory practice is not supported by the inadequate discussions found in current textbooks, in which, as Bell (1990) complained many years ago, measurements never measure anything. The textbooks do agree that incompatible observables cannot be measured simultaneously. This is confirmed by the histories approach, since incompatible PDIs obviously cannot be combined, and what cannot be represented in the quantum Hilbert space does not exist in the laboratory. Thus CH resolves both of the problems MP1 and MP2 of §6.1. Unlike various competing interpretations it has no measurement problem. It is, however, worth noting that the consistency conditions require a nontrivial choice of projectors \(\{[s^j]\}\) or \(\{S^j\}\) at the intermediate time \(t_1\). In this sense there is a certain uniqueness about the choice of causes of measurement outcomes.

6.3 Wavefunction Collapse

A particular type of projective measurement is one in which for every \(j\) \(|w^j_2\rangle =|s^j_1\rangle\) in \eqref{eqn25}. The idea, which goes back to von Neumann, is to have a measurement which can be immediately repeated, with the second measurement result confirming the first. Such nondestructive measurements sometimes occur in laboratory practice, but are relatively rare. Sometimes the measured particle no longer exists, as in the case of photons, or its final state is not of interest. For example, particle physicists are interested in determining the property of a mu meson before it passes through their detector; what happens later is of little concern.

Unfortunately, measurements with the special property \(|w^j_2\rangle =|s^j_1\rangle\) tend to dominate textbook discussions and much of the literature devoted to quantum foundations, giving rise to the mistaken idea that all quantum measurements are of this sort. A related idea which is not totally incorrect but can badly mislead, is that of wavefunction collapse: the initial state \(|\sigma _0\rangle\) propagates up to the time just before the measurement takes place—replace \([s^j_1]\) with \([\sigma _1]=[\sigma _0]\) in \eqref{eqn30}—and then, given outcome \(R^j\), is transformed or “collapsed” into \([w^j_2] = [s^j_1]\). The corresponding histories family or framework is consistent, but cannot be used to infer the earlier property \([s^j_1]\) from the later outcome \(R^j\). Various features tend to confuse. First, if “collapse” is regarded as some sort of physical process, one ends up with the spurious notion that a measurement made at one location on an entangled system can instantaneously change something at a distant location. (See the discussion of nonlocality paradoxes in §8.5 below.) One occasionally encounters discussions of the “time required for the collapse”, though nowadays they seldom appear in print. But perhaps the most damaging consequence of textbook discussions of collapse is that students are not taught how simple measurements reveal microscopic causes, something needed in order to make sense of many laboratory experiments.

6.4 Generalized (POVM) and Weak Measurements

One is often interested in generalized measurements or POVMs (positive operator valued measures) where the measurement outcome corresponds not to a specific property but instead to a positive (semi-definite) operator for the measured system at an earlier time. A POVM is a collection of positive (Hermitian or self-adjoint, nonnegative eigenvalues) operators \(\{Q^j\}\)—again, \(j\) is a label, not an exponent—that sum to the identity operator on \({\mathcal H}_s\):

\[Q^j = (Q^j)^\dagger ,\quad \sum_j Q^j = I_s. \label{eqn37}\]

Using an appropriate unitary \(T(t_2,t_1)\) that represents the interaction between the macroscopic apparatus and the measured system in this time interval, one can infer from the outcome (pointer position) \(R^k\) at time \(t_2\) that the system was, in an appropriate sense, characterized by \(Q^k\) at the earlier time \(t_1\). For details of how this works see Griffiths (2017). While the mathematics is relatively straightforward, the physical meaning of \(Q^j\) is not easy to understand, so here are some comments that will assist. In the case in which \(Q^k\) is proportional to a projector, the interpretation is exactly the same as in the case of a projective measurement: at the earlier time the measured system had the property corresponding to this projector. In the more general situation one notes that the operator

\[\hat\rho^k = Q^k/{\rm Tr}(Q^k) \label{eqn38}\]

is a density operator (positive, trace 1), and if the immediately prior state at time \(t_1\) in \eqref{eqn30} is a density operator \(\hat\rho_1\), which could be a pure state \([\sigma _1]\), then the probability of the later macroscopic outcome \(k\) is given by:

\[\Pr(R^k) = {\rm Tr}(\hat\rho^k \rho_1). \label{eqn39}\]

Even though this is not as precise a result as in the case of a projective measurement, it may still provide some helpful information about the state of the microscopic system just before it interacted with macroscopic measurement apparatus. Thus, for example, there may be a projector \(P\) on \({\mathcal H}_s\) such that \(P Q^k = Q^k\), in which case one can be sure that the system had property \(P\) at time \(t_1\). (This of course requires making use of a framework at \(t_1\) in which \(P\) makes sense, the simplest being the PDI \(\{P,I_s-P\}\), and paying attention to the single-framework rule so as not to generate paradoxes.)

Generalized measurements are often thought of in the following way. Instead of interacting directly with the measurement apparatus, the system to be measured first interacts with another microscopic system, a probe, prepared in a known quantum state. Then the probe is subjected to a projective measurement or POVM, and from its outcome one learns something about the original system. If the interaction between the probe and the system of interest is very weak this is called a weak measurement. Sometimes a hybrid measurement is employed, in which, following its interaction with a probe, the original system is itself subjected to another (typically projective) measurement. Both the weak measurement and the hybrid are examples of generalized measurements, and can be discussed in the manner indicated above.

A single weak measurement, corresponding to a weak interaction between particle and probe, will in general not yield much information about the particle. Hence it may require several repeated runs, with the particle prepared in the same initial state each time, in order to extract useful information from the random outcomes. It is sometimes assumed that because the interaction is weak, in none of the runs will the state of the particle change significantly. But that is not necessarily the case. Weakness of the interaction is also consistent with the particle’s state being drastically altered in a small fraction of the runs. An interesting example is provided by Feynman, chapter 1 of Feynman, Leighton, & Sands (1965), in his discussion of a weak light source used to determine which of two holes an electron passes through on its way to a distant screen where successive arrivals display a two-hole (double slit) interference pattern. If the light source is very weak, only for a small fraction of the runs does a scattered photon reveals which hole the electron went through. But if one collects data for these rare instances one finds a very large effect: in these runs the interference pattern is completely washed out.

Finally, there is a sizable literature in which weak measurements are discussed in terms of so-called weak values of quantum observables. These weak values need have nothing to do with the eigenvalues of the corresponding quantum observable, and can, for example be complex numbers, or negative for an observable for which all the eigenvalues are non-negative. That weak values can nonetheless contribute some useful insight into the behavior of quantum systems is possible, but not obvious.

6.5 Concluding Remarks

In summary, the histories approach resolves both quantum measurement problems MP1 and MP2 by introducing appropriate stochastic families of histories. In order to describe the measurement outcome as a pointer position one needs an appropriate projective decomposition of the identity, \(\{R^j\}\) of §6.2—associated with distinct macroscopic outputs, “pointer positions”. Similarly, to discuss how properties of the microscopic particle before the measurement are related to the later outcome, one needs a decomposition of the particle identity at a time \(t_1\) preceding the measurement, that represents these properties: the \(\{[s^j]\}\) of \eqref{eqn30} to \eqref{eqn33}, or the more general projectors \(\{S^j\}\) of \eqref{eqn34}. There is no fundamental quantum principle that forces one to use these decompositions. The choice is based on utility, and illustrates the importance of principle R4 in §2.4. If one wants to discuss measurements as processes that actually measure something, one needs to adopt a framework in which the associated concepts make sense. And—worth emphasizing, since it is often misunderstood—neither the validity nor the utility of a particular framework is in any way reduced by the existence of other frameworks which are incompatible (or incommensurate) with it: the choice of an appropriate framework is a choice made by the physicist in order to evaluate different aspects of the situation.

In the case of projective measurements, using an appropriate framework allows the experimenter to infer the earlier microscopic cause of the later macroscopic outcome. However, the case of generalized measurements or POVMs is more complicated, §6.4, in that a given pointer position cannot in general be associated with a single earlier microscopic property. The macroscopic outcome may nonetheless, depending on what else is known, provide some useful insights.

The models employed here are, to be sure, simplistic in comparison to the experimental situations often encountered in a laboratory. However, extending them to something more realistic poses difficulties no worse than those encountered when introducing quasiclassical descriptions, §5. Thus, rather than a pure initial state for the apparatus in \eqref{eqn23} it might be more realistic to use a macroscopic projector of the quasiclassical type, §5, or else an initial density operator. These changes present no difficulty in principle, and some of them are discussed by Griffiths (2002: ch. 17). The role of decoherence is to allow a consistent quasiclassical description, as noted in §5.

Finally, while wave function collapse is a legitimate calculational procedure in certain circumstances, it can always be replaced by an analysis using an appropriate quantum framework with well-defined probabilities. Doing so avoids falling into the trap of treating the collapse as some mysterious quantum process.

7. Quantum Information

Quantum information is at present a very active field of research, one in which quantum foundational issues continually arise. One reason for current interest is the hope of building quantum computers that are capable, assuming they can be made to work properly, of carrying out certain information-processing tasks faster and more efficiently than is possible using ordinary classical computers. To be sure, if the entire world is quantum mechanical then our current “classical” computers must in some real sense be quantum computers. What is the difference? At least to a first approximation, classical computation is the kind where a single quasiclassical framework, §5, suffices for describing the carriers of information (e.g., on-off states of transistors) and the way information is processed, whereas quantum computation is what cannot be so described. Further clarifying this distinction is one of the unfinished tasks of quantum information theory.

Classical information theory as developed by Shannon and his successors employs standard (Kolmogorov) probability theory. The histories approach to quantum mechanics also uses standard probability theory, and thus it is plausible that as long as one sticks to a single quantum framework, both the mathematical structure and the intuition associated with classical information theory can be directly translated into the quantum domain. This is indeed the case, and since a quantum framework is not limited to quasiclassical states; it can also include microscopic quantum states.

This makes it possible for the histories approach to answer two questions raised by Bell (1990) as objections to using information theory to address foundational issues in quantum mechanics: “Whose information? Information about what?” The answers in reverse order: information is always about quantum properties or, more generally, properties at different times, thus histories. And it is possessed by someone who can build a reliable piece of apparatus and interpret the (macroscopic) outcome by applying consistent quantum principles.

Note that the single framework rule forbids combining incompatible frameworks, but allows one to compare them or work out relationships that hold between results in different frameworks. Therefore one can say that, at least in some general sense, problems at the frontiers of quantum information theory have to do with comparisons of incompatible frameworks. This does not mean that CH possesses the tools needed resolve these problems, but it should help prevent their study from degenerating into the endless disagreements and paradoxes that beset much present work in quantum foundations.

8. Quantum Paradoxes

8.1 Introduction

Paradoxes have a useful function in scientific research, as they point to unresolved issues worthy of further experimental or theoretical study. Unresolved paradoxes can indicate a serious lack of understanding. In the quantum foundations literature one finds a large number of paradoxes, and little or no consensus on how to deal with them. The histories approach resolves, or one might say “tames”, many quantum paradoxes, indeed every paradox to which it has been thus far been applied. In the sense that it provides a clear explanation of why certain results that seem peculiar from the perspective of classical physics are consistent with quantum theory, and why applying classical ideas without regard to quantum principles has led to confusion. From this perspective the most basic source of paradoxes is the vain attempt to use classical ideas in situations where quantum principles are essential; in particular ignoring noncommutation of projectors. There are a large number of quantum paradoxes in the literature. What follows is a sample chosen to illustrate some of the main types, and how the use of CH identifies the quantum principles which have been ignored, and thus how to resolve the paradox. Detailed discussions of a selection of paradoxes will be found in Griffiths (2002: chs 19 to 25).

8.2 Noncommutation (contextuality) paradoxes

There are a vast and ever increasing number of quantum paradoxes which come about by supposing that quantum observables represented by operators that do not commute are instead functions on a classical phase space. Sometimes this is done by supposing that quantum measurements reveal (classical) “hidden variables” which commute with each other, unlike the relevant quantum projectors. The obvious solution to such paradoxes is to use proper Hilbert space concepts rather than classical ideas. In the CH approach this is enforced through the single framework rule, and more generally, the consistency conditions for assigning probabilities to histories. For those discussed in the present subsection time development actually plays no role, though the fact that it is often invoked via a faulty understanding of quantum measurements tends to conceal this fact.

While a number of different examples are discussed below, others with very much the same structure are treated later in §8.5 because they lie behind some specific, and incorrect, claims that quantum mechanics implies the existence of superluminal influences.

8.2.1 Schrödinger’s Cat and Many Worlds

The paradox of Schrödinger’s (1935) cat is a particularly striking way of stating the unresolved difficulties associated with attempts to understand quantum mechanics while ignoring the problem of noncommutation of Hilbert-space projectors. The problem arises when trying to ascribe a physical significance to a coherent superposition of pure states, one that corresponds to a live and the other to a dead cat. To understand where the difficulty lies, one can go back to the simple situation of a spin-half particle discussed in §2.3, where a coherent superposition of two states \(|x^+\rangle\) and \(|x^-\rangle\) to give \(|z^+\rangle\), corresponding to \(S_z=+1/2\), cannot be interpreted as meaning both \(S_x=+1/2\) and, simultaneously, \(S_x=-1/2\), one of which is the negation of the other. The conclusion is that Schrödinger’s superposition cannot represent either a live or a dead cat, much less a cat that is both dead and alive. Indeed, it cannot represent a cat, because typical cat-like properties, such as the location in space of its heart, must be represented by quasi-classical projectors that do not commute with the weird superposition.

One finds a vastly enlarged version of the cat paradox in the Many Worlds interpretation, in which the supposed wavefunction of the universe is regarded as a superposition of a multitude of states corresponding to totally different macroscopic situations. The fact that a linear superposition of quantum states cannot be identified with any of the states making up the superposition immediately turns what might be called Schrödinger’s tiger into a quantum myth, at least for those who take the quantum Hilbert space seriously.

8.2.2 Peres-Mermin and Kochen-Specker

While the single framework rule easily disposes of both cat and tiger, there are more challenging paradoxes in which noncommutation is better concealed. This is the case with the Kochen-Specker paradox (Kochen & Specker 1967). But the analogous Peres-Mermin square (Mermin 1993) is much simpler to analyze. It involves a system of two spin-half particles \(a\) and \(b\), and a set of \(9\) operators arranged in a \(3\times 3\) square:

\[\begin{matrix} \sigma _{ax} & \sigma _{bx} & \sigma _{ax}\sigma _{bx} \\ \sigma _{by} & \sigma _{ay} & \sigma _{ay}\sigma _{by} \\ \sigma _{ax}\sigma _{by} & \sigma _{ay}\sigma _{bx} & \sigma _{az}\sigma _{bz} \end{matrix} \label{eqn40}\]

Here \(\sigma _{ax}=2S_{ax}\) is the Pauli spin operator for particle \(a\), and similarly for the other spin operators. Using the fact that spin operators for particles \(a\) and \(b\) commute with each other, and the standard product relationships, such as \(\sigma _{ax}^2=I_a\) and \(\sigma _{ax}\sigma _{ay} = i\sigma _{az}\), one can show that the three operators in a given row commute with each other, as well as the three operators in any given column. In addition, the product of the three operators in each row is the identity \(I=I_a\otimes I_b\). Likewise the product of the operators in the first column is \(I\), and the same for those in the second, but for the third column the product is \(-I\). These facts have the consequence that there is no way to simultaneously assign a value of \(+1\) or \(-1\) to each of the nine entries in a way that satisfies these row and column constraints. Hence the paradox.

The key to identifying the source of the paradox is the observation that it has been constructed with the reader’s attention focused on the fact that operators in a particular row commute with each other, and hence can be simultaneously assigned values, and the same for the operators in any given column. What has not been mentioned, but is readily apparent from looking at \eqref{eqn40}, is that pairs of operators that are not in the same row or the same column are incompatible: they do not commute. Consequently the argument leading to the paradox does not satisfy the single framework rule of CH: it violates a fundamental rule of quantum reasoning.

One way to view the construction of the paradox is to think of it as “chaining” together logical arguments which employ incompatible PDIs, by focusing on common elements where the two are compatible. Thus the first row in \eqref{eqn40} is based on a particular 4-element PDI of the 4-dimensional Hilbert space, as is the first column, and the eigenvalues of \(\sigma _{ax}\), where the first row and column intersect, correspond to two 2-dimensional subspaces. These are then refined in different ways to construct two incompatible PDIs, one appropriate for the first row and the other for the first column. That the first row and the first column only intersect in \(\sigma _{ax}\) makes it easy to overlook the fact that the second element in the first row quite obviously does not commute with the second element in the first column. This kind of problem never arises in the sorts of analysis needed for classical physics, where there is no problem chaining together different pieces of a logical argument in this manner. One is reminded of how magicians can trick their audiences by focusing attention on one thing so that something else going on elsewhere is not consciously observed. Alas, quantum magicians are able to trick themselves.

8.2.3 Contexts and contextuality

Noncommutation paradoxes are often discussed in terms of contexts and contextuality, in an attempt to connect them to discussions of measurement as found in textbooks. Measurements are not needed, but their use in connection with paradoxes of this sort has become widespread, and so it is helpful to comment on why this is the case, and how to think more clearly about these matters.

The basic idea (though not the term “context”, which was invented later) goes back to Bell (1966), whose presentation is not easy to follow. A clear discussion is found in Mermin (1993). Consider three observables \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\), such that \(A\) and \(B\) are compatible, and likewise \(A\) and \(C\), but \(B\) and \(C\) are incompatible. In terms of commutators, \([A,B]=0 = [A,C]\), while \(BC\neq CB\). Thus it is possible to arrange to measure both \(A\) and \(B\) in a single run of an experiment, or \(A\) along with \(C\), but not all three together in a single run. Bell’s proposal—one could call it Bell contextual—was that the outcome of measuring \(A\) might be influenced by whether it is measured along with \(B\) or along with \(C\).

But this is not the case because, as discussed in §6.2, projective measurements of the sort under discussion reveal the properties possessed by the measured particle before it interacts with the measurement apparatus. As discussed in Griffiths (2019), one can set up an apparatus with a switch which can be thrown just before the measurement takes place in order to select whether \(B\) or \(C\) is to be measured along with \(A\). Since the \(A\) outcome (pointer position) reveals the value of this quantity at a time before the particle begins to interact with the apparatus, including the switch, its value will not be affected by the later decision of the experimenter to choose to measure it along with \(B\) or with \(C\). A key notion, as discussed in §6.2, is that simple (projective) measurements actually measure things. The conclusion that quantum mechanics is not Bell contextual also follows from an analysis based on the proper use of counterfactual reasoning, §8.3. And it is worth noting that were quantum mechanics contextual in the Bell sense, laboratory measurements would be impossible to interpret, since apparatus is tested and calibrated in terms of the observable the experimenter wants to measure, without reference to what else might, more-or-less accidentally, happen to be measured at the same time.

There nonetheless continues to be a widespread belief that the Kochen-Specker and Peres-Mermin paradoxes have demonstrated that quantum mechanics is contextual, and from this it is concluded that, quite generally, quantum measurements cannot reveal pre-existing microscopic values. But as shown in the previous discussion, the real issue is noncommutation of quantum projectors, and consequently it is best to focus, as in the case of the Peres-Mermin square, on the properties of a quantum system at a single time, not on how these properties are measured.

Consider an arbitrary collection \({\mathcal K}\) of projectors on some Hilbert space, with the only restriction that if \(P\) is present in \({\mathcal K}\), so is its negation \(I-P\). If \(P\) belongs to a PDI \({\mathcal P}\), we call \({\mathcal P}\) a context of \(P\). In general \(P\) will belong to various different contexts, and some may be incompatible with others. Next assume that some density operator \(\rho\), which may be a pure state, is used to assign a number

\[\Pr(P) = {\rm Tr}(P\rho) \label{eqn41}\]

to every member of \({\mathcal K}\). If a specific context, say \({\mathcal P}_1\), is specified, then the numbers assigned to its members using \eqref{eqn41} will constitute a probability distribution satisfying the usual rules. However, assuming that the entire collection of numbers generated by \eqref{eqn41} somehow constitute a probability distribution on some \({\mathcal K}\) does not, in general, make sense because some of the projectors do not commute with others.

The point of these remarks is that many, though perhaps not all, discussions of contextuality found in the foundations literature can be viewed more simply by getting rid of measurements and focusing on what can and cannot be said, e.g., which paradoxes one can generate, using the sort of structure discussed above. Identifying the source of paradoxes in the noncommutation of specific PDIs or observables without invoking the complication of measurements would do much to improve the clarity of many discussions in the foundations literature.

8.3 Counterfactuals and the Multiple Runs Fallacy

A counterfactual argument begins by imagining another world which resembles the actual world in certain respects and differs from it in others, and asking the question: “What would be the case if instead of …it were true that …”. For example, “What would the weather be like in Pittsburgh in January if the city were 1000 kilometers closer to the equator?” In general, counterfactual reasoning is not easy to analyze, and this gives rise to difficulties when trying to understand quantum paradoxes stated in counterfactual form. The basic principle governing counterfactual reasoning in the histories approach is the single framework rule, with the requirement that a comparison between the real and the counterfactual world be carried out using the same framework for both. Detailed arguments will be found in Griffiths (1999; 2002: ch. 19).

An important misapplication of counterfactual reasoning in a quantum context arises in the following way. Suppose a series of measurements is carried out in which on some runs a certain observable is measured, for example \(S_x\) for a spin-half particle, while on other runs an incompatible observable, e.g. \(S_y\), is measured, while the initial preparation and everything else except the final choice of measurement outcome is left unchanged. While everyone agrees that it is impossible in a single run to measure both \(S_x\) and \(S_y\), it is tempting to suppose that on runs in which \(S_y\) was measured, \(S_x\) actually possessed a value. This is classical reasoning that assumes unicity: In the classical world it makes perfectly good sense to think that other properties are present or absent in runs in which they are not measured. But a quantum spin-half particle cannot simultaneously have both an \(S_x\) and an \(S_y\) value. Consequently one must segregate the two sets of runs: It is invalid to use the results of runs in which \(S_x\) is measured in some sort of analysis that explicitly or implicitly assumes that \(S_y\) actually had a value, even though not measured. Let us call this as the multiple runs fallacy. It is employed in derivations of the Bell inequalities, such as CHSH, discussed below in §8.5.

8.4 Intermediate Time (Interference) Paradoxes

The best known of the interference paradoxes is the double slit. How can successive quantum particles passing through the slit system and later detected at specific points in the interference zone build up a pattern showing interference of a sort that depends on the separation of the slits, even though measurements carried out directly behind the slits will show that on each run the particle passed through one or the other, but not both? Feynman’s discussion (Feynman et al. 1965: ch. 1, where two holes replace the two slits) is superb. What is essentially the same paradox, but in a form somewhat easier to analyze, is the one in which a particle passes through the two arms of a Mach-Zehnder interferometer. In the case of the double slit, projectors at an intermediate time which identify which slit the particle passes through do not commute with a projector representing the coherent state of the particle and needed to discuss the later interference pattern when the particle is detected; and similarly for projectors which identify which arm of the Mach-Zehnder the particle passes through before reaching the second beamsplitter.

To be more specific, a discussion of which slit the particle passes through at an intermediate time requires a family of histories which satisfy the consistency conditions, §4.2, and these are violated if the final state corresponds to arrival of the particle at a final position where there is interference. The discussion of the Mach-Zehnder case is technically a bit simpler, since there are only two output ports followed by detectors. Chapter 13 of Griffiths (2002) provides an extensive discussion of how the histories approach using a simplified model deals with different possibilities in a consistent way that avoids paradoxes while producing analogs of all the interesting effects discussed by Feynman.

In the somewhat more complicated three-box paradox (Aharonov & Vaidman 1991), there are three distinct and non-overlapping possible positions of the particle at an intermediate time, \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\) (referred to as “boxes”, hence the name). Given an initial state of the particle and a specific final state, one can, using a particular consistent family, call it \({\mathcal F}_A\), argue that at the intermediate time the particle was in box \(A\), hence absent from its complement, the union of boxes \(B\) and \(C\). But there is another consistent family call it \({\mathcal F}_B\) with the roles of \(A\) and \(B\) interchanged, in which the particle was actually in box \(B\), and hence not in the union of \(A\) and \(C\). The obvious paradox is that, using \({\mathcal F}_A\) the particle was in and not outside box \(A\), whereas using \({\mathcal F}_B\) it was in and not outside box \(B\). The resolution of the paradox—for details see §22.5 of Griffiths (2002)— consists in noting that these two families cannot be combined into a single consistent family which contains all three possibilities \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\) at the intermediate time, as then the consistency conditions are not satisfied. Once again it is the single-framework rule of §2.4 that disposes of (or one might say “tames”) the paradox by showing that it results from violating basic quantum principles.

The methods of disentangling these multiple-time paradoxes can be applied to various other examples, such as Hardy’s paradox (Griffiths 2002: ch. 25), and those related to claims of mysterious quantum nonlocality, discussed next.

8.5 Nonlocality Paradoxes

8.5.1 Introduction

An extensive literature in quantum foundations is devoted to the subject of nonlocality. Much of it is connected to the widespread but mistaken belief in nonlocal influences in which an action, typically a measurement, carried out at one location instantly changes the physical state-of-affairs at some distant location, in violation of special relativity. At the same time there is general acknowledgment that these supposed influences cannot be used to send signals, so they cannot be detected in an experiment. The discussion that follows shows how these supposed influences, sometimes invoked to explain the experimental violation of Bell inequalities, arise out of mistaken theoretical analyses in which classical ideas are used instead of quantum principles, leading to results which, not surprisingly, are violated in experiments. The explanation of why such nonlocal influences cannot carry signals is actually quite simple: they do not exist.

Before going further it is helpful to distinguish the notion of (spurious) nonlocality under discussion from other uses of “nonlocal” in a quantum context. One of these goes under the heading of “Nonlocality without entanglement”. Here the topic is the inability to distinguish certain non-entangled bipartite states using correlations of measurement outcomes at separate locations, along with the possibility of sending classical signals between the locations. While not completely unrelated, the issues here are actually quite distinct from those associated with violations of Bell inequalities. Yet another use of “nonlocal” refers to a collection of statistical correlations between separated systems that cannot be reproduced by a classical model. A better and less confusing adjective would be “nonclassical”.

The following discussion begins with the famous Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen paradox as formulated in a much simpler and easier to understand version by David Bohm. It is followed by remarks about Bell inequalities, in particular the CHSH version, which have been subjected to experimental test and shown to be violated by the results, which are in full agreement with Hilbert-space quantum mechanics. The mistaken nonlocality claim is the result of applying classical ideas in a quantum regime where they do not work. The Greenberger-Horn-Zeilinger paradox involving three systems can be unraveled using the same set of tools. Finally, on a positive note, a notion of Einstein Locality, based on sound quantum principles, rules out a very general class of (supposed) nonlocal influences.

8.5.2 Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen-Bohm & Bell inequalities

The Bohm version (Bohm 1951: ch. 22) of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen paradox (Einstein, Podolsky, & Rosen 1935) is based on the spin singlet state

\[|\Psi\rangle = \bigl(|z^+_a,z^-_b\rangle - |z^-_a,z^+_b\rangle \bigr)/\sqrt{2} \label{eqn42}\]

of two spin-half particles \(a\) and \(b\), using the notation of §2.3, with subscripts to identify the two particles, and \(|z^+_a,z^-_b\rangle\) the tensor product \(|z^+_a\rangle \otimes |z^-_b\rangle\) on \({\mathcal H}_a\otimes {\mathcal H}_b\). It is said to be an entangled state because \(|\Psi\rangle\) is not a product state of the form \(|\psi_a\rangle \otimes |\phi_b\rangle\). It is easy to show that the corresponding projector \([\Psi]\) does not commute with any projector representing a nontrivial property of particle \(a\), such as \([z^+_a]\), or of particle \(b\). (The trivial properties are the identity and the zero projector.) Thus a quantum description that contains \([\Psi]\) as a property cannot at the same time represent any nontrivial properties of either of the particles.

This is a mathematical fact which makes no reference to where the particles are located in space. It is true for the electronic ground state of a helium atom, in which the two electrons in a spin singlet state are on top of each other, as well as for the situation we consider next in which particle \(a\) is in Alice’s laboratory and \(b\) in Bob’s laboratory some distance away. Suppose that Alice measures \(S_{az}\) for her particle and Bob measures \(S_{bz}\) for his. Then using \([\Psi]\) as a pre-probability, §3.2, one can show that the outcomes, although they are random, will always be opposite: if Alice obtains \(+1/2\) (in units of \(\hbar\)), Bob will find \(-1/2\); if Alice obtains \(-1/2\), Bob will find \(+1/2\).

Correlated outcomes are by themselves not surprising once one accepts the idea that quantum time development is stochastic, not deterministic. And of course correlations are not the same as causes. Here is a classical analogy: Charlie in Chicago places a red slip of paper in an opaque envelope and a green slip in a second identical envelope, and after shuffling the envelopes chooses one at random and mails it to Alice in Atlanta and the other to Bob in Boston. Upon opening her envelope and finding a red slip, Alice can at once conclude from her knowledge of the protocol that Bob’s envelope contains a green slip of paper. There is no need to invoke some nonlocal influence or cause in order to explain this.

Her reasoning is exactly the same in the case where Charlie prepares a spin singlet state \eqref{eqn42} at the center of the laboratory and sends the two particles in opposite directions towards apparatuses constructed by Alice and Bob, both competent experimentalists, and Alice measures \(S_{az}\). From her measurement outcome, and because she has checked her apparatus, she is entitled to conclude that before the measurement took place particle \(a\) possessed the value of \(S_{az}\) indicated by the later pointer position; see the discussion in §6.2. Assume for the sake of discussion that this was \(S_{az} = +1/2\). Then from her knowledge of the protocol (initial singlet state) she can assign a state \(S_{bz}=-1/2\) to Bob’s particle and use this (as a pre-probability) to assign a probability to his outcome of a measurement of \(S_{bz}\). She employs a scheme of probabilistic inference appropriate to the quantum world; there is no need to invoke wave function collapse except, perhaps, as a handy calculational tool.

But suppose Bob rather than measuring \(S_{bz}\) measures some other component \(S_{bw}\) of the spin of particle \(b\), where \(w\) could be \(x\) or \(y\) or some arbitrary direction in space? Again, Alice on the basis of her measurement outcome can still assign an \(S_{bz}\) value to Bob’s particle before measurement, and use this to calculate a probability for Bob’s measurement outcome. Conversely, given the outcome of his \(S_{bw}\) measurement and knowledge of the protocol, Bob can assign a state \(S_{aw}\) to Alice’s particle before it is measured, and use that to predict the probability of the outcome of a measurement of \(S_{az}\). Both reasoning processes follow the rules indicated in §2.4, but when \(w\) is neither \(z\) nor \(-z\) the single framework rule means they cannot be combined. It is at this point that quantum principles must be used, unlike the analysis applicable to colored slips of paper, where one can employ the single quasiclassical framework (§5) appropriate for macroscopic physics.

If Alice measured \(S_{az}\), then surely she could have instead measured \(S_{ax}\) perhaps making the choice between this and \(S_{az}\) at the very last instant, even after Bob has completed his measurement; what would have occurred in that situation? See the discussion of counterfactuals and the multiple-runs fallacy in §8.3.

Quantum theory predicts correlations for bipartite measurements of the spin-singlet state \eqref{eqn42} that violate the CHSH inequality, which is based on the quantity

\[ \begin{equation} \begin{aligned} S & =A_0 B_0+A_0 B_1+A_1 B_0-A_1B_1 \\ & =(A_0+A_1)B_0 + (A_0-A_1)B_1.\\ \end{aligned} \label{eqn43} \end{equation} \]

If the \(A_j\) and \(B_k\) are numbers taking the values \(+1\) or \(-1\), \(S\) takes on the values \(+2\) and \(-2\), and hence if it is a random variable its average will lie within the bounds

\[-2 \leq \langle S\rangle \leq 2. \label{eqn44}\]

If, on the other hand, the \(A_j\) and \(B_k\) are Hermitian operators, each with eigenvalues \(\pm 1\) on the \(2\)-dimensional Hilbert spaces corresponding to the spins of particles \(a\) and \(b\), one can choose them so that the corresponding operator \(S\)—note that it is Hermitian, since \([A_j,B_k]=0\)—has eigenvalues \(\pm 2\sqrt{2}\) and \(0\), and if the initial quantum state corresponds to, say, the eigenvalue \(+2\sqrt{2}\), a suitable projective measurement will yield a value for \(S\) outside the limits \eqref{eqn44}. Thus the experimental violation of the CHSH inequality \eqref{eqn44} by the expected amount is a demonstration that microscopic physical properties are correctly described by Hilbert-space quantum projectors, and that ignoring their noncommutation can lead to mistaken conclusions.

8.5.3 Greenberger-Horne-Zeilinger

The Greenberger-Horne-Zeilinger (GHZ) paradox can be thought of as an extension of the Peres-Mermin strategy to the case of three spin-half particles \(a\), \(b\), and \(c\), whose properties can be discussed using the Pauli operators \(\sigma _{ax} = 2S_{ax}/\hbar\), \(\sigma _{ay}=2S_{ay}/\hbar\), and similarly for particles \(b\) and \(c\). Simultaneous measurements of the three particles are carried out by Alice, Bob and Charlie at three separate locations, given an initial entangled state

\[|\Psi\rangle = (|000\rangle - |111\rangle )/\sqrt{2}, \label{eqn45}\]

where \(|0\rangle\) and \(|1\rangle\) are eigenstates of \(\sigma _z\) with eigenvalues \(+1\) and \(-1\). It is a straightforward to show that

\[ \begin{equation} \begin{aligned}[t] \sigma _{ax}\sigma _{bx}\sigma _{cx}|\Psi\rangle & = -|\Psi\rangle , \\ \sigma _{ay}\sigma _{by}\sigma _{cx}|\Psi\rangle & = \sigma _{ay}\sigma _{bx}\sigma _{cy}|\Psi\rangle \\ & = \sigma _{ax}\sigma _{by}\sigma _{cy}|\Psi\rangle \\ & = +|\Psi\rangle .\\ \end{aligned} \label{eqn46} \end{equation} \]

Now suppose experiments are carried out in which Alice, Bob and Charlie randomly measure either \(\sigma _x\) or \(\sigma _y\), and statistics are collected for runs in which (i) all three measure \(\sigma _x\), with a result \((X_a,X_b,X_c)\), each entry \(+1\) or \(-1\); and (ii) one party measures \(\sigma _x\) and the other two \(\sigma _y\), with results \((X_a,Y_b,Y_c)\), etc. It follows from \eqref{eqn46} that

\[ X_a X_b X_c = -1 \label{eqn47} \] \[ \begin{equation} \begin{aligned}[t] Y_a Y_b X_c & = Y_a X_b Y_c \\ & =X_a Y_b Y_c \\ & =+1 \end{aligned} \label{eqn48} \end{equation} \]

If one takes the product of the three items in \eqref{eqn48} and uses \(Y_a^2=Y_b^2=Y_c^2=1\), the result is

\[X_a X_b X_c = +1, \label{eqn49}\]

which obviously contradicts \eqref{eqn47}. This is the paradox. Its source is readily apparent, since in order to arrive at \eqref{eqn49} one must combine results in \eqref{eqn48} in which values of both \(S_x\) and \(S_y\) are assigned to the same particle. If, in order to escape this, one asserts that \(\sigma _{ax}\) and \(\sigma _{ay}\) will be measured in different runs, the reply is that there is no reason to suppose that in different runs \(\sigma _{by}\) will have the same value; see the discussion of the multiple runs fallacy in §8.3.

8.5.4 Einstein Locality Principle

Not only does the CH approach undermine claims of quantum nonlocality based upon violations of CHSH inequalities or the GHZ paradox, it establishes the following principle of Einstein Locality (Griffiths 2011):

Objectively real internal properties of an isolated individual system do not change when something is done to another non-interacting system.

This statement is to be understood in the following way. Let \({\mathcal H}_S\) be the Hilbert spaces of an isolated individual system \(S\), \({\mathcal H}_R\) that of the rest of the world, so \({\mathcal H}={\mathcal H}_S\otimes {\mathcal H}_R\) is the Hilbert space of the total system. The properties of \(S\) must be represented by a PDI of \({\mathcal H}_S\), or by a consistent family of events in \({\mathcal H}_S\). That \(S\) is isolated means there is no interaction between \(S\) and \(R\), which is to say that for any two times \(t\) and \(t'\) during the period of interest the time development operator of the total system factors:

\[T(t',t)=T_S(t',t)\otimes T_R(t',t). \label{eqn50}\]

Something done to another system might be, for example, the choice between measuring \(S_{bx}\) and \(S_{bz}\) for a particle \(b\) which is part of \(R\), with the measuring apparatus and whatever makes the measurement choice, e.g., a quantum coin (Griffiths 2002: §19.2) also part of \(R\).

9. Quantum Interpretations

9.1 Difficulties Facing Quantum Interpretations

At the present time there are a number of different interpretations of quantum mechanics which take as their point of departure what one finds in typical textbooks: in particular, deterministic (unitary) time development, and stochastic measurement outcomes with wavefunction collapse. Each interpretation then seeks to modify features of the textbook approach that it finds defective, or add items which it thinks are missing. One should not assume that textbook writers themselves are necessarily content with their presentations. Many of them probably share some of the doubts and misgivings set forth in the extensive discussions by Laloë (2019, 2022), a useful and fairly up-to-date exposition of unsolved problems which remain nearly a century after the advent of modern quantum theory in 1925–1926, along with various attempts to deal with them.

While most of these interpretations accept the general mathematical machinery of the quantum Hilbert space and unitary time development as presented in textbooks, their complaints and proposed modifications generally lie in two distinct areas, labeled MP1 and MP2 in §6.1, of the infamous “measurement problem”. To begin with MP1, the complaint is that if unitary time evolution is universal, what justifies suddenly introducing probabilities when a measurement is carried out in order to get around the embarrassing coherent superposition of pointer positions? More generally, how does classical physics emerge from quantum mechanics if one assumes that the latter is valid at all length scales? As for MP2—understanding the causes of these macroscopic outcomes in terms of earlier microscopic properties—the basic issue is that of constructing an ontology for the microscopic quantum world: What is it that is really there?

9.2 The Consistent Histories Approach to these Difficulties

The CH approach is firmly based upon the use of the projectors on the quantum Hilbert space to represent physical properties, as discussed in §2. The fact that two quantum projectors may not commute with each other underlies the standard uncertainty relations and thus distinguishes quantum mechanics from classical physics, as discussed in §2.2. Von Neumann was aware that noncommutation must be taken seriously, and in Birkhoff & Neumann (1936) he and Birkhoff proposed a new logic to deal with it. The CH approach to this problem, which is distinct from most other quantum interpretations, follows von Neumann, but employs a much simpler logic, §2, which can be taught to college seniors. It includes the use of frameworks and the single framework rule of §2.2.

A second CH distinctive is that quantum time development is always stochastic, and only deterministic in special cases in which some probabilities are equal to 1, see §4. These probabilities are standard (Kolmogorov), and use sample spaces (frameworks) which are PDIs, projective decompositions of the quantum Hilbert space identity operator, §2.4, or the history space identity, §4.2. Of course, stochastic time development is not a new concept: it was introduced by Born (1926) and considered essential by Neumann (1932). However, its consistent use for time development in a closed system requires both the use of quantum histories and the restrictions imposed by consistency conditions.

A third distinctive is that in the CH approach classical physics is given a quantum description, §5, using a quasiclassical framework of projectors that commute for all practical purposes. As noted there, this is a plausible idea, but a firm theoretical foundation needs additional work.

These three distinctives come together in the CH solution to the measurement problems MP1 and MP2 of §6.1. The first, MP1, getting the macroscopic pointer to stay still, is discussed to some degree in many quantum interpretations, albeit in a way which is often very confusing and may involve the use of human agents to look at the pointer. The second, MP2, identifying the microscopic cause of the later measurement outcome, remains unsolved, apart from special cases, in all interpretations known to this author, aside from CH. While the seriousness of this problem has sometimes been recognized, e.g., by Bell (1990), the failure of most interpretations to supply an adequate quantum explanation for standard laboratory practice remains a serious obstacle to taking them seriously.

Along with MP1 and MP2, the CH analysis resolves a significant number of quantum paradoxes, §8, along with other conceptual difficulties. If there are fatal flaws they have yet to be discovered. Improvements may well be possible, and someday someone may come up with a different and superior approach to resolving the quantum mysteries. But there are good reasons to consider CH the best currently available.

A good physical theory should (ideally) be simple, intelligible, internally consistent, and agree with what observation and experiment tells us about the world. But in addition a theory to be acceptable to the physics community should be “good physics”, a subjective qualification which should not, however, be underestimated. Objections have been raised to the CH approach on all of these and perhaps other grounds, and it is impossible to treat all of these concerns in a short space. Nonetheless it is helpful to consider some of them. As for agreement with experiment, CH and various other interpretations are consistent with most laboratory work as long as one is concerned with macroscopic features of preparation, apparatus functioning, measurement outcomes, and the like. The differences arise at the level of interpreting what is happening in the macroscopic world in terms of microscopic quantum properties and events.

9.3 Criticisms of and Objections to Consistent Histories

Any physical theory can give rise to various kinds of conceptual difficulty. Problems may arise because of lack of familiarity with, or misunderstanding of, new ideas. Most students upon their first encounter with calculus or with special relativity have difficulties of this sort, which can be cleared up by additional study, working through examples, and the like. In addition theories may be internally inconsistent. This is often the case when they are relatively new and under development, but can also be true of more mature theories. Indeed certain theories turn out to be of great usefulness despite the fact that they contain serious flaws or inconsistencies. (Standard textbook quantum mechanics is a prime example!) And even theories which are properly understood and are internally consistent can be rejected, either by individual scientists or the community as a whole, because they are not “good physics”, a term whose importance should not be underestimated even if it cannot be given a precise definition. The histories interpretation of quantum theory has given rise to conceptual difficulties that fall in all of these areas, and while it is impossible in a few words to discuss each of them, the following remarks are intended to indicate the general nature of some of the more serious objections raised by critics, along with some responses.

The issue of internal consistency was raised by Kent (1997) and by Bassi & Ghirardi (1999, 2000) on the grounds that the rules for reasoning using histories, see §2.4, lead to contradictions: certain assumptions allow one to derive both a proposition and its negation. Equivalently, a quantum property can be assigned, on the basis of the same initial data, probabilities of both 0 and 1. These criticisms have been addressed in Griffiths & Hartle (1998), and in Griffiths (2000a, 2000b), and are related to the issue of incommensurate families discussed at the end of §4. One point of confusion is that the term consistent can be used either with reference to the consistency conditions which need to be respected in order to assign probabilities to histories in a closed quantum system, §4, or to the overall consistency of the entire histories approach as a logical framework for analyzing quantum phenomena. There is a general argument for consistency in this second sense in Griffiths (2002: ch. 16), which serves to refute the claim of inconsistency by Maudlin (2011). The key point, easily overlooked as it has no close analogy in classical physics, is the single framework rule of §2.4. In situations that involve quantum properties at a single time the use of a single framework means the use of a particular projective decomposition of the identity and the associated Boolean event algebra. When reasoning is restricted to this algebra the usual rules of propositional logic apply, so an inconsistency at this level would imply the inconsistency of standard logic. If the framework in question consists of a family of histories of a closed system, it cannot be assigned probabilities using the generalized Born rule, §4.2, unless the consistency conditions are satisfied. But in those cases where probabilities can be assigned they satisfy the usual rules of probabilistic reasoning, thus ruling out contradictions.

The single framework rule, §2.4, itself lies at the center of a large number of objections to the histories approach, which is hardly surprising since in an important sense noncommutation marks the boundary between classical and quantum physics. As noncommutation is absent from classical physics and not adequately discussed in current quantum textbooks, the single framework rule, which forbids combining incompatible descriptions, is unfamiliar, and one has to work through various examples in order to gain an intuitive as well as a formal understanding of how it deals with the various paradoxes and other conceptual difficulties of quantum theory. The four principles R1 to R4 found in §2.4 should help in understanding how frameworks are to be thought of and how they should be used. It is of particular importance that the single framework rule does not imply that there is only one way available to the physicist to think about or discuss a particular situation. What it forbids is not the construction of many, perhaps mutually incompatible, frameworks, but combining them in the fashion characteristic of the paradoxes discussed above in §8.2. Indeed, the single framework rule rather than being a restriction actually extends the Liberty of the theoretical physicist to describe the quantum world in a consistent way without the danger of running into insoluble paradoxes. But Liberty is coupled to a denial of the unicity of the world, §2.4, which is perhaps the most important philosophical implication of quantum mechanics from the histories perspective, as well as the principal stumbling block in the way of a wider acceptance of CH as a satisfactory interpretation of quantum theory.

An objection first raised by Dowker & Kent (1996), and subsequently repeated by Kent (1998), Schlosshauer (2005), and Wallace (2008), among others, is that quasiclassical frameworks are by no means the only possible consistent families of histories in a closed quantum system. In particular, one can have consistent families in which there is quasiclassical behavior up to some time followed by something which is not at all quasiclassical at a later time. This would be a serious objection if quantum historians were claiming that there must be a unique family of histories which can be used to describe the world, but such is not the case. The physicist is at Liberty to choose a family whose histories closely resemble those of classical mechanics, and the existence of alternative frameworks in no way diminishes the validity of such a quasiclassical description, for reasons indicated in §4.2 of Griffiths (2013). One senses that underlying such criticisms is the expectation that any good physical theory must satisfy the principle of unicity, to which we now turn.

In a probabilistic theory the limiting cases of a probability equal to 1 or 0 are equivalent to asserting that the corresponding proposition (e.g., “the system has property \(P\)”) is, respectively, true or false. In the histories approach probabilities are linked to frameworks, and for this reason the notions of “true” and “false” are also framework dependent. This cannot lead to inconsistencies, a proposition being both true and false, because of the single framework rule. But it is contrary to a deeply rooted intuition, shared by philosophers, physicists, and the proverbial man in the street, that at any point in time there is one and only one state of the universe which is “true”, and with which every true statement about the world must be consistent: what is here called unicity. In §2.4, it was argued that because of the noncommutation of quantum projectors, classical unicity must be replaced by quantum pluricity.

Abandoning unicity is certainly a radical proposal, which can only be justified if by doing so one obtains a more coherent and internally consistent understanding of the quantum world, together with a resolution of some of its major problems and paradoxes, such as those described above in §8. In this connection it is worth noting that according to CH the use of a quasiclassical quantum framework, §5, allows one to understand why unicity works so well in the macroscopic quantum world, and hence why its failure in the microscopic domain can be so counterintuitive and hard to grasp. To be sure, there may be other ways of dealing with the quantum mysteries, and it is up to future research to determine whether CH runs into serious problems or continues to resolve the quantum paradoxes to which it is applied. It is also not a foregone conclusion that the quantum Hilbert space, though basic nowadays in almost all applications of quantum theory—quantum foundations is the only notable exception—will continue this leading role or be replaced by something else. Should that occur it would, of course, require the revision or abandonment of any quantum interpretation, such as CH, based firmly on Hilbert space mathematics.


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